Notes to Sorites Paradox

1. Other parts of speech—e.g., verbs, adverbs, names, even indexicals—also appear to be soritical, but predicates have received the most attention in the literature. See, e.g., Ellis 2004 for relevant discussion.

2. Williamson contends that, unlike tolerance principles, margin for error principles do not generate a paradox (1992: 161).

3. Williamson’s defense of epistemicism leans heavily on the claim that other resolutions of the paradox are untenable, but some of his principal negative arguments are viewed as question-begging; see e.g. Wright 1994: 135-8 and Raffman 2014: 95–96, for discussion.

4. Graff Fara writes: “[I]n conversations where we have occasion to use vague expressions like ‘tall’…it will simply be a brute fact that there will be a least height…of which it is true to say that it [is tall]…Any lesser amount [of height] simply cannot be the same for whatever purposes are in place” (Graff 2000: 70).

5. In Fara 2008, Graff Fara explains that the characterization of her view in Graff 2000 was misleading. In fact, the boundaries shift as a function of changes in “what best satisfies our interests—given our standing interest in efficiency resulting from…a change in what is being actively considered” (2008: 328). Stanley (2003) voices doubts about the idea that vague predicates express interest-relative properties; Graff Fara responds in Fara 2008.

6. Though see the reference to Burns 1991 in §3.3.4.

7. Epistemicists represent borderline cases in the usual way, as neither definitely \(\Phi\) nor definitely not \(\Phi\), but they interpret the definiteness operator epistemically: borderlines are neither knowably \(\Phi\) nor knowably not \(\Phi\)

8. Bivalence is preserved largely by means of an incompatibilist analysis of borderline cases that defines them in terms of an opposition between incompatible predicates like ‘old’ and ‘middle-aged’ rather than contradictories like ‘old’ and ‘not old’ (Raffman 2014: ch.2).

9. Here, a context is defined by coordinates such as decisive dimensions, comparison classes, and contrastive categories; it may also include purposes, speaker interests, and standards of application, among others.

10. Support for (II) is extrapolated from experiments by Raffman and colleagues on the use of color predicates (2014: ch.5). One could of course question whether use of a non-observational term like ‘old’ or ‘rich’ would yield the same results.

11. These are of course empirical claims that would need to be tested.

Copyright © 2018 by
Dominic Hyde
Diana Raffman <>

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