Notes to Philosophy of Systems and Synthetic Biology

1. Systems theory is the study of generic properties of complex systems through mathematical or formal representations. The aim to identify principles shared by a class of systems with a similar organization is also important to some modern systems biologists. For an analysis of the connection between systems theory and modern systems biology, see e.g. (Drack 2015; Drack & Wolkenhauer 2011; Green & Wolkenhauer 2013; Mekios 2016; Wolkenhauer & Mesarović 2005).

2. They also emphasize the differences between bottom-up and top-down strategies. The former is commonly understood as model construction based on detailed experimental analysis, akin to strategies in molecular biology. In contrast, top-down strategies are often understood as pattern-detection and functional inference based on larger, but also coarser-grained, datasets (see also MacLeod & Nersessian 2013a,b, 2015).

3. The term scale-free signifies that the connectivity pattern—described mathematically as a power law distribution—is invariant across the scale (or size) of the network (Barabási & Albert 1999).

4. Another candidate of artificial life with a different “design” than living systems, as we know them, is a type of protocells whose metabolic processes operate at the cell surface (Rasmussen et al. 2008).

5. Among the important precursors is the classical Miller-Urey experiment showing that organic compounds (amino acids) can originate from inorganic substrates under prebiotic conditions (Miller 1953).

6. A related example shows that the cellular context may play adaptive roles in ensuring robustness. A synthetic model of a dual-feedback oscillator surprisingly outperformed the mathematical model by exhibiting robust oscillations for wider range of parameters than predicted (Stricker et al. 2008; Knuuttila & Loettgers 2013a).

7. Note also that some approaches are compatible with a form of modular reductionism, e.g., the aim to design simpler synthetic systems allowing for assembly of modular parts (Endy 2005; Güttinger 2013).

8. A related aspect is the focus on quantitative features, including concentration, that may require an extension of traditional mechanistic accounts (Love & Nathan 2015).

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