Notes to Tense and Aspect

1. For a thorough discussion of these issues we refer the reader to Comrie (1985).

2. But see Lecarme (2008) for possible exceptions.

3. But note that verbs, verb phrases or sentences may be nominalized and this nominalization process may transfer verbal properties to nominals. We will not discuss these linguistic subtleties here.

4. For further evidence from Hausa and Chichewâ see Spencer (1991: chapter 1.3).

5. Krifka's examples

John saw a zebra (for an hour)/(*in an hour).
John saw zebras (for an hour)/(*in an hour).

show that see is a verb which differs from drink with respect to the thematic roles it assigns to its arguments.

6. The actions and fluents are assumed to be used uniquely. It is, for instance, not possible that Shoot and Smoke are identical actions. Technically, this can be guaranteed by adding a set of uniqueness-of-names-axioms (see e.g., Shanahan 1997). For simplicity, we will leave them out.

7. In Fernando (2015), Fernando uses a finite state system based on fluents to formalize temporal and aspectual notions.

8. Precise definitions of logic programs and their completions can be found in Doets (1994) and Nienhuys-Cheng and de Wolf (1997).

9. To be complete we also have to show how to compute the completion of a rule (cf. van Lambalgen and Hamm 2005: definition 14). To give an idea of how this works we will illustrate the completion of two propositional rules with the same head (\(p_1 , \ldots ,p_n, r_1 , \ldots ,r_m, q\) all are propositions):

\(p_1 \wedge \ldots \wedge p_n \rightarrow q\)
\(r_1 \wedge \ldots \wedge r_m \rightarrow q\)

The completion is:

\(q \leftrightarrow(p_1 \wedge \ldots \wedge p_n) \vee(r_1 \wedge \ldots \wedge r_m)\)

This means that \(q\) is false iff neither of the rules i(a) or i(b) is true.

10. This agrees with Vendler’s philosophical position in chapter five of Vendler 1967.

11. See our discussion of example (8a) in section 3.

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Friedrich Hamm <>
Oliver Bott <>

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