Supplement to Trinity

History of Trinitarian Doctrines

1. Introduction

This supplementary document discusses the history of Trinity theories. Although early Christian theologians speculated in many ways on the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit, no one clearly and fully asserted the doctrine of the Trinity as explained at the top of the main entry until around the end of the so-called Arian Controversy. (See 3.2 below and section 3.1 of the supplementary document on unitarianism.) Nonetheless, proponents of such theories always claim them to be in some sense founded on, or at least illustrated by, biblical texts.

Sometimes popular antitrinitarian literature paints “the” doctrine as strongly influenced by, or even illicitly poached from some non-Christian religious or philosophical tradition. Divine threesomes abound in the religious writings and art of ancient Europe, Egypt, the near east, and Asia. These include various threesomes of male deities, of female deities, of Father-Mother-Son groups, or of one body with three heads, or three faces on one head (Griffiths 1996). However, similarity alone doesn’t prove Christian copying or even indirect influence, and many of these examples are, because of their time and place, unlikely to have influenced the development of the Christian doctrine of the Trinity.

A direct influence on second century Christian theology is the Jewish philosopher and theologian Philo of Alexandria (a.k.a. Philo Judaeus) (ca. 20 BCE–ca. 50 CE), the product of Alexandrian Middle Platonism (with elements of Stoicism and Pythagoreanism). Inspired by the Timaeus of Plato, Philo read the Jewish Bible as teaching that God created the cosmos by his Word (logos), the first-born son of God. Alternately, or via further emanation from this Word, God creates by means of his creative power and his royal power, conceived of both as his powers, and yet as agents distinct from him, giving him, as it were, metaphysical distance from the material world (Philo Works; Dillon 1996, 139–83; Morgan 1853, 63–148; Norton 1859, 332–74; Wolfson 1973, 60–97).

Another influence may have been the Neopythagorean Middle Platonist Numenius (fl. 150), who posited a triad of gods, calling them, alternately, “Father, creator and creature; fore-father, offspring and descendant; and Father, maker and made” (Guthrie 1917, 125), or on one ancient report, Grandfather, Father, and Son (Dillon 1996, 367). Moderatus taught a similar triad somewhat earlier (Stead 1985, 583).

Justin Martyr (d. ca. 165) describes the origin of the logos (= the pre-human Jesus) from God using three metaphors (light from the sun, fire from fire, speaker and his speech), each of which is found in either Philo or Numenius (Gaston 2007, 53). Accepting the Philonic thesis that Plato and other Greek philosophers received their wisdom from Moses, he holds that Plato in his dialogue Timaeus discussed the Son (logos), as, Justin says, “the power next to the first God”. And in Plato’s second letter, Justin finds a mention of a third, the Holy Spirit (Justin, First Apology, 60). As with the Middle Platonists, Justin’s triad is hierarchical or ordered. And Justin’s scheme is not, properly, trinitarian. The one God is not the three, but rather one of them and the primary one, the ultimate source of the second and third.

Justin and later second century Christians influenced by Platonism take over a concept of divine transcendence from Platonism, in light of which

no one with even the slightest intelligence would dare to assert that the Creator of all things left his super-celestial realms to make himself visible in a little spot on earth. (Justin, Dialogue, 92 [ch. 60])

Consequently, any biblical theophany (appearance of a god) on earth, as well as the actual labor of creation, can’t have been the action of the highest god, God, but must instead have been done by another one called “God” and “Lord”, namely the logos, the pre-human Jesus, also called “the angel of the Lord”.

Another influence may have been the Neoplatonist Plotinus’ (204–70 CE) triad of the One, Intellect, and Soul, in which the latter two mysteriously emanate from the One, and “are the One and not the One; they are the one because they are from it; they are not the One, because it endowed them with what they have while remaining by itself” (Plotinus Enneads, 85). Plotinus even describes them as three hypostases, and describes their sameness using homoousios (Freeman 2003, 189). Augustine tells us that he and other Christian intellectuals of his day believed that the Neoplatonists had some awareness of the persons of the Trinity (Confessions VIII.3; City X.23).

Many thinkers influential in the development of trinitarian doctrines were steeped in the thought not only of Middle Platonism and Neoplatonism, but also the Stoics, Aristotle, and other currents in Greek philosophy (Hanson 1988, 856–869). Whether one sees this background as a providentially supplied and useful tool, or as an unavoidably distorting influence, those developing the doctrine saw themselves as trying to build a systematic Christian theology on the Bible while remaining faithful to earlier post-biblical tradition. Many also had the aim of showing Christianity to be consistent with the best of Greek philosophy. But even if the doctrine had a non-Christian origin, it would would not follow that it is false or unjustified; it could be, that through Philo (or whomever), God revealed the doctrine to the Christian church. Still, it is contested issue whether or not the doctrine can be deduced or otherwise inferred from the Christian Bible, so we must turn to it.

2. The Christian Bible

2.1 The Old Testament

No trinitarian doctrine is explicitly taught in the Old Testament. Sophisticated trinitarians grant this, holding that the doctrine was revealed by God only later, in New Testament times (c.50–c.100) and/or in the Patristic era (c. 100–800). They usually also add, though, that with hindsight, we can see that a number of texts either portray or forshadow the co-working of the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit.

For example, in Genesis 18, Yahweh appears to Abraham as three men, and the text has often been read as though the men spoke as one, with one voice. What is this, they urge, if not an appearance of, or even a triple temporary incarnation of the three persons within God’s nature? (Other interpretations identify Yahweh with one of the men, the one who stays behind while the others travel to Sodom in Genesis 19.)

In numerous other passages, many Christian readers hold, the preincarnate Son of God is mentioned, or even appears in bodily form to do the bidding of his Father, and is (so they believe) sometimes called the “angel of the Lord”. Some have even identified the preincarnate Christ as Michael, protecting angel over Israel mentioned in the books of Daniel, Jude, and Revelation.

And in several passages, Yahweh refers to himself, or is referred to using plural terms. Non-trinitarians usually read this as a plural of majesty, a form of speech which occurs in many languages, or a conversation between God and angels, while trinitarians often read this as a conversation between the persons of the Trinity.

In sum, Christians read the Old Testament through the lens of the New. For example, the former speaks of God as working by his “word”, “wisdom”, or “spirit”. Some New Testament passages call Jesus Christ the word and wisdom of God, and in the Gospel of John, Jesus talks about the sending of another comforter or helper, the “Holy Spirit”. Thus, some Christians claim the door was open to positing two divine intelligent agents in addition to “the Father”, by, through, or in whom the Father acts, one of whom was incarnated in the man Jesus. In opposition, other Christian readers have taken these passages to involve anthropomorphization of divine attributes, urging that Greek speculations unfortunately encouraged the aforementioned hypostasizations.

2.2 The New Testament

The New Testament contains no explicit trinitarian doctrine. However, many Christian theologians, apologists, and philosophers hold that the doctrine can be inferred from what the New Testament does teach about God. But how may it be inferred? Is the inference deductive, or is it an inference to the best explanation? And is it based on what is implicitly taught there, or on what is merely assumed there? Many Christian theologians and apologists seem to hold it is a deductive inference.

In contrast, other Christians admit that their preferred doctrine of the Trinity not only (1) can’t be inferred from the Bible alone, but also (2) that there’s inadequate or no evidence for it there, and even (3) that what is taught in the Bible is incompatible with the doctrine. These Christians believe the doctrine solely on the authority of later doctrinal pronouncements of the True Christian Church (typically one of: the Catholic Church, the Eastern Orthodox tradition, or the mainstream of the Christian tradition, broadly understood). Some Catholic apologists have argued that this doctrine shows the necessity of the teaching authority of the Church, this doctrine being constitutive of Christianity but underivable from the Bible apart from the Church’s guidance in interpreting it. This stance is not popular among Christians who are neither Catholic nor Eastern Orthodox. (2) would be the main sticking point, although some groups deny all three.

Many Christian apologists argue that the doctrine of the Trinity is “biblical” (i.e. either it is implicitly taught there, or it is the best explanation of what is taught there) using three sorts of arguments. They begin by claiming that the Father of Jesus Christ is the one true God taught in the Old Testament. They then argue that given what the Bible teaches about Christ and the Holy Spirit, they must be “fully divine” as well. Thus, we must, as it were, “move them within” the nature of the one God. Therefore, there are three fully divine persons “in God”. While this may be paradoxical, it is argued that this is what God has revealed to humankind through the Bible.

The types of arguments employed to show the “full divinity” of Christ and the Holy Spirit work as follows.

  1. S did action A.
  2. For any x, if x does action A, x is fully divine.
  3. Therefore, S is fully divine.

E.g., A = non-culpably pronouncing the forgiveness of sins, non-culpably receiving worship, raising the dead, truly saying “Before Abraham was, I am”, creating the cosmos.

  1. The Bible applies title or description “F” to S.
  2. For any x, if the Bible applies title “F” to x, then x is fully divine.
  3. Therefore, S is fully divine.

E.g., F = the first and the last, a god, the God, our savior

  1. S has quality Q.
  2. For any x, if x has quality Q, then x is fully divine.
  3. S is fully divine.

E.g., Q = sinlessness, omniscience, the power to perform miracles, something Christians should be baptized in the name of

While such arguments are deductively valid, they suffer from a crucial ambiguity: What is meant by “fully divine”? Until this is made clear, it isn’t clear which of the trinitarian theories is being argued for. A person being “fully divine” might, according to various theorists, amount to being constituted by the matter-like divine nature, being identical to God, being a mind of God, being a way God relates to himself or the world, and so on. Further, the epistemic status of each argument’s second premise may depend on what “divine” means.

Opponents of these sorts of argument typically give biblical counterexamples to the second premise (e.g., humans who are called “gods” but aren’t divine in the relevant sense, humans who are authorized by God to forgive sins but aren’t divine in the relevant sense). In other cases, they also challenge the first premise (e.g., Jesus denied being omniscient, there are inadequate grounds to say that the Son of God created the cosmos).

Another form of argument runs as follows.

  1. Passage E is a true prophecy predicting that the God of Israel, Yahweh, will do action A.
  2. Passage F truly asserts that the prophecy in E was fulfilled in the life of Jesus Christ.
  3. Therefore, Jesus Christ just is the God of Israel, Yahweh.

Opponents reply that this argument is invalid; it is possible for the premises to be true even though the conclusion is false. Even though the prediction “George W. Bush will conquer Iraq” may be said to be fulfilled by the actions of General Smith, it doesn’t follow that Smith and Bush are one and the same. Rather, Smith acted as the agent of Bush. Similarly, Yahweh acts through his servant Jesus. Another disadvantage of this argument is that even if it is sound, the conclusion is undesirable. If Jesus and God are held to be (numerically) identical, and one adds that the Father is “fully divine” in this same sense, i.e. the Father is numerically identical to God, then it logically follows that Jesus just is (is numerically identical to) the Father. And yet, according to any trinitarian, some things are true of one that are not true of the other. This is why nearly all trinitarian theories decline to identify more than one of the three persons with God. On the other hand, some embrace this as a mystery —something which appears contradictory but is in fact true. (See main entry section 4.2.)

This traditional case for the divinity of Jesus and the Holy Spirit may be best construed not as a collection of deductive arguments, but rather as an inference to the best explanation, an attempt to infer what best explains all the biblical texts considered together. In this genre, however, alternate explanations are rarely explored in any detail, much less shown to be inferior.

Many arguments of the above types date back to ancient times, and have been repeated in similar forms whenever mainstream trinitarianism has been attacked (Beckwith 2007; Bowman 2007; Bowman and Komoszewski 2007; George 2006; Stuart 1834; Waterland 1856a-e). A number of well developed refutations of these arguments dating from the 17th to 19th centuries have been largely forgotten by present-day theologians, philosophers, and apologists (Burnap 1845; Clarke 1978; Crellius Racovian; Crellius 1691; Emlyn 1746; Haynes 1797; Lardner 1793; Lindsey 1776, 1818; Norton 1859; Nye 1691b; Priestley 1791a-c; Wilson 1846).

3. Development of Creeds

3.1 Up to 325 CE

3.1.1 The One God in the Trinity

Early Christianity was theologically diverse, although as time went on a “catholic” movement, a bishop-led, developing organization which, at least from the late second century, claimed to be the true successors of Jesus’ apostles, became increasingly dominant, out-competing many gnostic and quasi-Jewish groups. Still, confining our attention to what scholars now call this “catholic” or “proto-orthodox” Christianity, it contained divergent views about the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit. No theologian in the first three Christian centuries was a trinitarian in the sense of a believing that the one God is tripersonal, containing equally divine “persons”, Father, Son, and Holy Spirit.

The terms we translate as “Trinity” (Latin: trinitas, Greek: trias) seem to have come into use only in the last two decades of the second century; but such usage doesn’t reflect trinitarian belief. These late second and third century authors use such terms not to refer to the one God, but rather to refer to the plurality of the one God, together with his Son (on Word) and his Spirit. They profess a “trinity”, triad or threesome, but not a triune or tripersonal God. Nor did they consider these to be equally divine. A common strategy for defending monotheism in this period is to emphasize the unique divinity of the Father. Thus Origen (ca. 186–255),

The God and Father, who holds the universe together, is superior to every being that exists, for he imparts to each one from his own existence that which each one is; the Son, being less than the Father, is superior to rational creatures alone (for he is second to the Father); the Holy Spirit is still less, and dwells within the saints alone. So that in this way the power of the Father is greater than that of the Son and of the Holy Spirit, and that of the Son is more than that of the Holy Spirit… (Origen, First, 33–4 [I.3])

Many scholars call this strain of Christian theology “subordinationist”, as the Son and Spirit are always in some sense derivative of, less than, and subordinate to their source, the one God, that is, the Father. One may also call this theology unitarian, in the sense that the one God just is the Father, and not equally the Son and Spirit, so that the one God is “unipersonal”.

While views about the Spirit remained comparatively undeveloped, and as in the New Testament the Spirit was not worshiped, in the second and third centuries catholic Christianity came to attribute a “a divine nature” to Jesus, and to firmly establish his being called “God”. Language which had been very unusual in the first century (Harris 1992) now became the norm; Jesus was now “God” or “a god”, but not the one true God. (e.g. Novatian, Trinity, ch. 31; Justin First, ch. 13) This divine Son (i.e. the pre-human Jesus) was mysteriously “generated” by God either just before creation (late 2nd to early 3rd c. “logos theologians” or in timeless eternity (from Origen on).

While these developments were new, the worship of Jesus was not. As against earlier theories that it developed only slowly and because of Gentile influence, recent work has shown that Jesus was worshipped alongside God in the earliest known Christianity (Hurtado 2003, 2005). While the basis cited for this practice in the New Testament is God’s post-resurrection exaltation of Jesus (Hurtado 2003, 640–1), it was now assumed that its basis was Jesus’ having something divine within him.

3.1.2 Tertullian

An important transitional figure is the pugnacious but philosophically sophisticated Tertullian (ca. 160–225). He was pressed on one side by catholic Christians who objected to late second century logos christology on which the pre-human Jesus (the “Word”, Greek: logos of John 1) was God’s instrument of creation. They considered this scheme of two creators and a divine Jesus to be inconsistent with monotheism (Tertullian Praxeas, ch. 3). He was pressed on the other side by catholics now called “monarchians” who held that the divine element in Jesus was the Father himself. Some of these thought Jesus to be a man empowered and indwelt by God, while others thought that Jesus and the Father were one and the same—the same self and the same god (Heine 1998). Tertullian mocked as “patripassians”, for the implication of (at least the second sort of view) that the Father suffered when Jesus was crucified, something widely assumed to be impossible.

In opposition to these he asserted and developed logos christology in a unique way. Here is a graphic illustration of Tertullian’s trinity—not a triune God, but rather a triad or group of three, with God as the founding member.

A representation of the trinity of Tertullian

Under the influence of Stoic philosophy, Tertullian believes that all real things are material. God is a spirit, but a spirit is a material thing made out of a finer sort of matter. At the beginning, God is alone, though he has his own reason within him. Then, when it is time to create, he brings the Son into existence, using but not losing a portion of his spiritual matter. Then the Son, using a portion of the divine matter shared with him, brings into existence the Spirit. And the two of them are God’s instruments, his agents, in the creation and governance of the cosmos.

The Son, on this theory, is not God himself, nor is he divine in the same sense that the Father is. Rather, the Son is “divine” in that he is made of a portion of the matter that the Father is composed of. This makes them “one substance” or not different as to essence. But the Son isn’t the same god as the Father, though he can, because of what he’s made of, be called “God”. Nor is there any tripersonal God here, but only a tripersonal portion of matter - that smallest portion shared by all three. The one God is sharing a portion of his stuff with another, by causing another to exist out of it, and then this other turns around and does likewise, sharing some of this matter with a third.

Against the common believers concerned with monotheism, Tertullian argues that although the above process results in two more who can be called “God”, it does not introduce two more gods - not gods in the sense that Yahweh is a god. There is still, as there can only be, one ultimate source of all else, the Father. Thus, monotheism is upheld. The one God is unipersonal both at the start and the end of this process. Nor are the persons equally divine; Tertullian holds that the Son is “ignorant of the last day and hour, which is known to the Father only” (Tertullian, Praxeas, ch. 27; Matthew 24:36).

What is Tertullian’s answer to his “monarchian” critics? First, he strongly emphasizes that these are truly three; none of the three is identical to any other. They are “undivided” in the sense that the Father, in sharing some of his matter, never loses any; rather, that matter comes to simultaneously compose more than one being. The chart above might suggest that this portion of matter is one thing with three parts; but it is conceived of merely as a quantity of matter. The Father is one entity, the Son is a second, and the Spirit is a third. Nor are they parts of any whole; the latter two simply share some of the Father’s divine stuff. Tertullian does not argue that the three compose or otherwise are the one God. Instead, Tertullian replies that a king may share his one kingdom with subordinate rulers, and yet it may still be one kingdom. Likewise, God (i.e. the Father) may share the governance of the cosmos with his Son (Praxeas, ch. 4)

Despite these fundamental differences from later orthodoxy, Tertullian is now hailed by trinitarians for his use of the term “Trinity” (Latin: trinitas) and his view that it (at the last stage) consists of three persons with a common or shared “substance”.

3.2 325–381: The Arian Controversy

It was only in response to the controversy sparked by the Alexandrian presbyter Arius (ca. 256–336) that a critical mass of bishops rallied around what eventually became standard language about the Trinity. This controversy was complex, and has been much illuminated by recent historians (Ayres 2004; Freeman 2008; Hanson 1988; Pelikan 1971; Rubenstein 1999; Williams 2001). It can be briefly summarized as follows. Arius taught, in accordance with an earlier subordinationist theological tradition, that the Son of God was a creature, made by God from nothing a finite time ago. Some time around 318–21 a controversy broke out, with Arius’ teaching opposed initially by his bishop Alexander of Alexandria (d. 326). Alexander examined and excommunicated Arius. Numerous churchmen, adhering to subordinationist traditions about the Son rallied to Arius’ side, while others, favoring theologies holding to the eternal existence of the Son and his (in some sense) ontological equality with the Father, joined his opponents. The dispute threatened to split the church, and a series of councils ensued, variously excommunicating and vindicating Arius and his defenders, or their opponents. Each side successively tried to win the favor of the then-current emperor, trying to manipulate imperial power to crush its opposition.

From the standpoint of later catholic orthodoxy, a key episode in this series occurred in 325, when a council of bishops convened by the Emperor Constantine (ca. 280–337) decreed that the Father and Son were homoousios (same substance or essence). Arius and his party were excommunicated. The intended meaning of ousia here was far from clear, given the term’s complex history and use, and the failure of the council to disambiguate it (Stead 1994, 160–72). They most likely settled on the term because it was disagreeable to the party siding with Arius. This new and ambiguous formula fanned the flames of controversy, as subordinationists and anti-subordinationists understood the phrase differently when signing on to it, and later argued for conflicting interpretations of it.

By the time of the council of Constantinople (381 CE), an anti-subordinationist reading, vigorously championed by Alexandrian bishop Athanasius (d. 373) had the upper hand; homoousios was understood as asserting the Father and Son to not merely be similar beings, but in some sense one being. While it stopped short of saying that the Holy Spirit was homoousios with the Father and Son, the council did say that the Holy Spirit “is worshiped and glorified together with the Father and the Son”, and added in a letter accompanying their creed that the three share “a single Godhead and power and substance” (Leith 1982, 33; Tanner 1990, 24, 28). Over the ensuing period the same sorts of arguments used to promote the divinity of the Son, were reapplied to the Holy Spirit, and eventually inhibitions to applying homoousios to the Holy Spirit evaporated.

Athanasius and others in the prevailing party argued that the salvation of humans requires the Son and Holy Spirit to be equally divine with the Father. This kind of argument depends on various controversial models of salvation, such as the one on which salvation involves the “deification” or “divinization” of humans, which can only be accomplished by one who is himself divine (Rusch 1980, 22–23). Despite shifting convictions about what salvation is and how God accomplishes it, this basic sort of argument remains popular—that if Christ and/or the Holy Spirit were not in some sense “fully divine”, then humanity couldn’t be saved by their actions. (For an influential medieval argument, see Anselm Cur.) Perhaps the most currently popular such argument is that our forgiveness by God, an infinitely valuable being, requires an atoning sacrifice of infinite value. Hence, Christ has to be fully divine, as only a fully divine being has infinite value.

3.3 The pro-Nicene Consensus

Around the time of the very messy Council of Constantinople (Freeman 2008, 91–104; Hanson 1988, 791–823), as imperial and ecclesial forces began to systematically extinguish subordinationist groups in the eastern and western empires (Wiles 1996, 27–40), the kind of trinitarianism which finally prevailed within the mainstream institutions of Christianity began to gel into a recognizable form. Following Hanson (1988) and Ayres (2004) we call this the “pro-Nicene consensus”. This consensus spanned the east-west (Greek-Latin) divide. Thus, to present this view we summarize the accounts of two influential theorists, one from each side of this cultural and linguistic divide: Gregory of Nyssa, and Augustine of Hippo.

3.3.1 Gregory of Nyssa

Gregory of Nyssa (ca. 335–ca. 395) is now known as one of the Cappadocian Fathers, the other two being his older brother Basil of Caesarea (ca. 329–79) and Gregory Nazianzus (329–89). These three active bishops are credited with establishing a consistent terminology for the Trinity, namely using hypostasis or prosopon for what God is three of, and ousia (along with phusis) for what God is one of. (On their lives, careers, and extant writings, see Ayres 2004 and Hanson 1996.) We look briefly at Nyssa’s views here, as illustrating several points about the pro-Nicene consensus.

Nyssa notoriously compares the Trinity to three human beings (Nyssa Answer, 256). Largely on this basis, he (and the other Cappadocians) have been interpreted as proto-social trinitarians (see section 2.1 of the main text), holding the three persons to be three subjects of consciousness and action, of the same kind, homoousios in the way that any two examples of a natural kind are, such as two humans (Plantinga 1986). However, it has been objected that the three human analogy was suggested by his opponents; it is neither Nyssa’s only nor his main analogy for the Trinity (Coakley 1999).

In Nyssa’s letter An Answer to Ablabius: That We Should Not Think of Saying There are Three Gods he responds to an objection passed on by his correspondent, the younger bishop Ablabius: even though three men share a single humanity, we call them “three men”, so if Father, Son, and Holy Spirit share a single divinity, why shouldn’t we call them “three gods”? (Nyssa Answer, 256–7) After a flippant answer, he argues that both ways of speaking are on a par, but they are both incorrect; that is, both talk of many gods and of many men involve “a customary misuse of language” (257). In both cases, he argues that the general term refers to the single, common nature. More accurately, he adds, the term “godhead” refers only to a divine operation of seeing or beholding, as “His nature cannot be named and is ineffable” (259). Moreover, the Bible ascribes this operation equally to each of the three (260). Does it not follow that there are three seers, “three gods who are beheld in the same operation” (261)? Nyssa argues that it does not.

In the case of men… since we can differentiate the action of each while they are engaged in the same task, they are rightly referred to in the plural….With regard to the divine nature, on the other hand, it is otherwise….Rather does every operation which extends from God to creation… have its origin in the Father, proceed through the Son, and reach its completion by the Holy Spirit. For the action of each in any matter is not separate and individualized. But whatever occurs… occurs through the three Persons, and is not three separate things….we cannot enumerate as three gods those who jointly, inseparably, and mutually exercise their divine power… (261–2; cf. 266, Nyssa On the Holy Trinity))

We’re unable to differentiate, Nyssa thinks, any distinct works of the persons. The word “deity” (or “Godhead”) signifies only a certain work. Therefore, we’re unable to count, and shouldn’t speak of three distinct deities (261–4).

A problem with Nyssa’s argument is that words like “work”, “operation”, and “action” can refer to either an activity (exercise of a thing’s powers) or the result thereof. Thus, a series of plannings and drawings, etc., or the resulting building can be called what a certain architect did (or his work, operation, action). And one thing or event may be the result of a great many activities by different agents, as when dozens of construction workers contribute their actions to one result, such as a building (or the coming into existence of a building). Nyssa siezes on examples of the actions of the Father, Son, and Spirit having a single result. But though their “operation” (i.e. result) is one, it doesn’t follow that they or their actions are one. Moreover, Nyssa speaks of the divine persons in the plural, and holds them to differ. While the divine nature is “undifferentiated”, the three persons differ causally.

To say that something [i.e. the Father] exists without generation explains the mode of its existence. But what it is is not made evident by the expression. (267)

Thus, while it is left unclear what the persons are, it is emphasized that a distinction between them hasn’t been obliterated. Being a Platonist about universals, he holds that the Three share one universal nature (i.e. deity). But he is hard pressed to show why it doesn’t follow that there are three gods (264–6). In the end, his main aim is simply to uphold the mysterious tradition passed down to him (257; cf. Nyssa Great, ch. 1–3).

The bedrock of pro-Nicene trinitarianism is a metaphysics of God as unique, simple (lacking any sort of parts, composition, or differing intrinsic aspects), and therefore incomprehensible (we can’t grasp all truths about God, or any truths about God’s essential nature) and ineffable (such that no human concept applies literally to it). Thus as Ayres notes,

Pro-Nicenes assume that one can draw no analogies between God and creation that will either deliver knowledge of God’s essence or that can involve us in grasping clearly where and why an analogy fails. (Ayres 2004, 284)

Any analogy offered is therefore quickly supplemented by others. Its opponents view this as obfuscation, while its proponents consider the differing analogies to be complimentary and in some sense informative. While pro-Nicenes hold the persons to be (somehow) distinct, they show little interest in developing a metaphysical account of what it is to be a divine person. In sum, the Nicene pattern of speech and thought about the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit is held by them to be spiritually beneficial, but it doesn’t admit of clarification. This view is strongly mysterian (see main entry, section 3).

3.3.2 Augustine

Augustine is arguably a one-self trinitarian. For him, the one God is the Trinity. And this one God is almost always addressed and described using personal pronouns. He is an object of our love, as much as our neighbors and ourselves, and he has all the features of a self described in the main entry, section 1.1. He is a simple, timeless, and perfect self, a subject of complete knowledge, who freely creates all other things, and who exists in a truer or deeper way. The true believer can not say “that there are not three somethings [in the Trinity], because Sabellius fell into heresy by saying precisely that.” (Augustine, Trinity, 227 [VII.3.9]; cf. City 425 [X.24], 462 [XI.10]) One must say “three persons”, but for Augustine these are not three selves.

His mammoth On the Trinity (Latin: De Trinitate) has been endlessly mined by later theologians. In it, Augustine is concerned to defend Pro-Nicene trinitarianism against lingering “Arianism” and other heresies, confessing that this “is also my faith inasmuch as it is the Catholic faith” (70 [I.2.7]). He argues that the Bible implicitly teaches this sort of trinitarianism, on which the rest of the book is an extended meditation. This meditation, he concedes, fails to yield much by way of understanding. He holds that sin has corrupted our minds, so that we can’t understand the doctrine, which we should still hope to understand in the next life (230–2 [VII.4], 430 [XV.6.45], 435 [XV.6.50]). At the end he confesses “among all these things that I have said about that supreme trinity… I dare not claim that any of them is worthy of this unimaginable mystery” (434 [XV.6.50]). Indeed, near the beginning he pictures the whole book as a grudging concession to certain unnamed Christians, “talkative reason-mongers who have more conceit than capacity”, who conclude that their teachers don’t know what they are talking about, simply because those teachers are reluctant to speak of deep truths (67 [I.1]). Augustine’s goal is not so much to understand the Trinity and communicate this to others, but rather to say some things that will deliver a small shred of understanding, which may entice the reader to pursue the experience of God (434–7 [XV.6.50–1]). Because of this dim view of what humans are equipped to understand, much of the book is actually about how to talk about the Trinity, rather than about the Trinity itself. We may at least confess the correct doctrine, even if only later we come to understand what we’ve been saying.

Despite this pronounced negative mysterian note (see section 3.1 of the main entry), Augustine dose seem to have a rudimentary metaphysics of the Trinity, which he uncritically receives, and does not think can be significantly developed.

Augustine suggests that the standard creedal term “person” (Greek: hypostasis or prosopon; Latin: persona) is adopted simply so that something may be said in answer to the question “What is God three of?” (224–30 [VII.3], 241 [VIII.1.1], 398 [XV.1.5]) The term “person”, he thinks, signifies a genus, but it is one for which we can provide no species. In contrast, “divine essence” names neither a genus nor a species, and functions somewhat like a mass-term. It is supposed to be one in the items which share it, and to make them, in some sense, numerically one (Cross 2007).

On the Trinity is famous for what later authors call its “psychological analogies” of the Trinity. Augustine reasons that if we can’t catch intellectual sight of the Trinity directly, at least we can see reflections, images, or indications of the Trinity in the created realm, above all in the highest part of human beings (the mind), who are made “in the image and likeness of God” (Augustine Trinity, 231 [VII.4.12]; Genesis 1:26). In the human mind we may encounter several “trinities”, given here in the order that they somehow correspond to the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit:

  • lover, loved object, the lover’s love for that object (255 [VIII.5.13])
  • the mind, its knowledge, its love (272–5 [IX.1])
  • the mind’s remembering itself, understanding itself, and willing itself (298–9 [X.4])
  • memory, understanding, and will (374–82 [XIV.2–3)
  • the mind’s remembering God, understanding God, and willing God (383–92 [XIV.4–5])
  • existing, knowing that one exists, loving the fact that one exists (Augustine City, 483–4 [XI.26];cf. Confessions 264–5 [XIII.11])

These are taken to be “images” of the Trinity, with the final three being in some sense the most accurate. (He also discusses a few “trinities” or threefold processes which he doesn’t hold to be images of the Trinity.) Although he apparently considers the contemplation of these to be helpful in the pursuit of God, in the last section (Book XV) of On the Trinity, Augustine emphasizes that even these are “immeasurably inadequate” to represent God (428 [XV.6.43]). The main reason is that these three are activities which a person does or faculties a person has, whereas God “just is” his memory, understanding, and will; the doctrine of divine simplicity thus renders the mental analogies at best minimally informative. Further, temporal processes seem ill-suited to represent the nature of an essentially immutable God.

Augustine holds that God is simple and thus essentially immutable. Words which are predicated “accidentally” of creatures, such as good or wise, are predicated of God essentially. Applied to us, these words signify properties we happen to possess, and which we might have not possessed, but applied to God, they all indicate the same thing, God’s simple essence. What about terms such as “Father” and “Son”? As God can’t have accidental features, these can’t be predicated accidentally. But Augustine doesn’t want to say that they are essentially predicated either. He suggests that they are relationally predicated, that is, applied to God not because of his essence or accidents, but rather because of how God is related to himself. He explores but ultimately rejects the idea that all true predication of God is relational (Books V-VII). He finally holds that some terms apply equally to each of the three divine persons, whereas certain relational terms apply primarily to one of the three. In sum,

This Trinity is one God: it is simple even though it is a Trinity… because it is what it has, except insofar as one Person is spoken of in relation to another. (Augustine City, 462 [XI.10])

The Trinity, and also each “person” has as it were only one ingredient: the divine essence which is the one God. It is mysterious how extrinsic relations, the sole subject of which is this simple entity, could make it contain three inter-related “persons”. But Augustine thinks that no what understands what those are anyway; the doctrine is in the end a negative mystery. See main entry, section 3 on mysterianism. See Thom 2012, ch 2 for a formal treatment of Augustine’s theory.

Most later trinitarinas interact in some way with Augustine’s huge body of work on the topic, and many consider that they are following in his footsteps. (See sections 4.1, on Thomas Aquinas, and 4.2, on John Duns Scotus, below, and section 2.1 of the main text.) Augustine’s medieval successors all reject three-self approaches to the Trinity (Cross 2012, 26–7).

Important medieval philosopher-theologians not discussed here who develop Augustine’s trinitarianism include Boethius (ca. 480–525), Anselm of Canterbury (1033–1109) (Marenbon 2003, 66–95; Mann 2004), and Peter Abelard (1079–1142) (Brower 2005; Marenbon 2007).

3.3.3 The “Athanasian” Creed

The so-called Athanasian Creed (also known by the Latin words it begins with, as the Quicumque vult) is a widely adopted and beloved formulation of the doctrine. It shows strong Augustinian influence, and is thought to be the product of an unknown early 6th century writer. Contemporary philosophical discussions often begin with this creed, at it puts pro-Nicene trinitarianism into a memorably short and palpably paradoxical form.

It reads, in part,

Whoever wants to be saved should above all cling to the catholic faith. Whoever does not guard it whole and inviolable will doubtless perish eternally. Now this is the catholic faith: We worship one God in trinity and the Trinity in unity, neither confusing the persons nor dividing the divine being. For the Father is one person, the Son is another, and the Spirit is still another. But the deity of the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit is one, equal in glory, coeternal in majesty. What the Father is, the Son is, and so is the Holy Spirit. Uncreated… infinite… eternal… And yet there are not three eternal beings, but one who is eternal… Almighty is the Father… And yet there are not three almighty beings, but one who is almighty. Thus the Father is God; the Son is God; the Holy Spirit is God: And yet there are not three gods, but one God….not three lords, but one Lord. As Christian truth compels us to acknowledge each distinct person as God and Lord, so catholic religion forbids us to say that there are three gods or lords. The Father was neither made nor created nor begotten; the Son was neither made nor created, but was alone begotten of the Father; the Spirit was neither made nor created, but is proceeding from the Father and the Son. Thus there is one Father, not three fathers; one Son, not three sons; one Holy Spirit, not three spirits. And in this Trinity, no one is before or after, greater or less than the other; but all three persons are in themselves, coeternal and coequal; and so we must worship the Trinity in unity and the one God in three persons. Whoever wants to be saved should think thus about the Trinity. (Anonymous Athanasian)

By the latter part, it follows by the indiscernibility of identicals that no person of the Trinity is identical with any other. And by the earlier part, it seems to follow that there are thus at least three eternal (etc.) things. But it asserts there’s only one eternal thing. Hence, the creed seems contradictory, and has been attacked as such (Biddle 1691, i; Nye 1691a, 11; Priestley 1871, 321). Showing where the above argument for inconsistency goes wrong is a major motivation of recent Trinity theories (see sections 1 and 2 of the main entry). In contrast, mysterians hold that it somehow goes wrong, though no one can say quite where.(See section 3 of the main entry.) Finally, some simply reject the creed.

4. Medieval Theories

Church council decisions are treated by Catholicism and Orthodoxy much like supreme court decisions in American jurisprudence. While early rulings may be bent and twisted to meet new needs, they are at least in theory inviolable precedents. Thus, the structure of Christian churches ensured that these boundaries weren’t violated, and theorizing about the Trinity from around 400 CE until the Reformation (ca. 1517) was forcibly kept within the bounds of creedal orthodoxy. Thus, most medieval trinitarian theories are essentially elaborations on the pro-Nicene consensus in a more confident and metaphysical mode. That is, they adhere strictly to the creedal statements as well as writings of their tradition’s most authoritative church fathers, but are less reticent to give fuller accounts of what the persons are and how they are related to one another and to God or the divine essence.

There were short-lived exceptions to this conformity; periodically, allegedly tritheistic trinitarian theologies were proposed and quickly suppressed (Erismann 2008; Pelikan 1978, 264–7; Pohle 1919, 255–63; Tavard 1997; see also the section on Tritheism in the entry on John Philoponus).

4.1 Thomas Aquinas

Thomas Aquinas sets out a highly developed and difficult trinitarian theory (Summa Contra Gentiles 4.1–26, Summa Theologiae I.27–43). God is “pure act”, that is, he has no potentialities of any kind. God is also utterly simple, with no distinct parts, properties, or actions. We may truly say, though, that God understands and wills. These divine processes are reflexive relations which are the persons of the Trinity. The Word eternally generated by God is a hypostasis, what Aristotle calls a first substance, which shares the essence of God, but which is nonetheless “relationally distinct” from God. The persons of the Trinity, as they share the divine essence, are related more closely than things which are merely tokens of a kind (e.g., identical twins), but he seems to hold that none are identical to either of the others (they are truly three). Aquinas develops Augustine’s idea that the “persons” of the Trinity are individuated by their relations. For Aquinas, the relations Paternity, Sonship, and Spirithood are real and distinct things in some sense “in” God, which “constitute and distinguish” the three persons of the Trinity (Hughes 1989, 197). The persons are distinct per relationes (as to their relations) but not distinct per essentiam (as to their essence or being). In the words of one commenter,

[For Aquinas,] relations both constitute and distinguish the divine persons: insofar as relations are the divine essence (secundum res) [i.e. they’re the same thing], they constitute those persons, and insofar as they are relations with converses, they distinguish those persons. (Hughes 1989, 217)

But how may these relations be, constitute, or somehow give rise to three divine hypostaseis when each just is the divine essence? For if each is the divine essence, won’t it follow that each just is (i.e. is identical to) both of the others as well? Aquinas holds that it does not follow—that would amount to modalism, not orthodox trinitarianism. To show why it doesn’t follow, he distinguishes between identitas secundum rem et rationem (sameness of thing and of concepts) and mere identitas secundum rem (sameness of thing). To the preceding objection, then, Aquinas says that the alleged consequence would follow only if the persons were the same both in thing and in concept. But they are not; they are merely the same thing.

This move is puzzling. Aquinas holds that the three are not merely similar or derived from the same source, but are in some strong sense the same, but not identical (i.e. numerically the same) which he appears to understand as sameness in both thing and concept. Even this last is surprising; one would think that for Aquinas “sameness in thing” just is identity, and that “sameness in concept” would mean that we apply the same concept to some apparent things (whether or not they are in fact one or many). Christopher Hughes holds that Aquinas is simply confused, his desire for orthodoxy having led him into this (and other) necessary falsehoods. On Hughes’s reading, Aquinas does think of “sameness in thing” as identity, but he incoherently holds it to be non-transitive (i.e. if A and B are identical, and B and C are identical, it doesn’t follow that A and C are identical), while in some contexts assuming (correctly) that it is transitive (Hughes 1989, 217–40).

The interpretation of Aquinas on these points is difficult. Other recent philosophers, more sympathetic to Aquinas’ trinitarian theory, have not tried to salvage the entire theory, but have, with the help of various distinctions not explicitly made by Aquinas, sought to salvage his basic approach. This involves developing and trying to vindicate his apparently mode-based approach to the persons (which seem to be God’s relating to himself in three ways), showing how these relations may in fact be substantial persons, or specifying a relation which the persons may each bear to the divine essence which is something short of (classical, absolute) identity but much like it. (See sections 1 and 2.1 of the main entry.)

4.2 John Duns Scotus

Richard Cross argues that John Duns Scotus (1265/6–1308) has “one of the most compelling and powerfully coherent accounts of the Trinity ever constructed” (Cross 2005, 159).

Realists about universals hold that in addition to individual humans, there is a universal thing, or “common nature” called “humanity” (Each individual human, for example Peter, is an “instance of” this common nature, humanity. Similarly, the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit are three “exemplifications” of the “universal” called “divinity”.) However, divinity, unlike humanity, is not “divided in” its instances or exemplifications; that is, while three instances of humanity amount to three humans, three exemplifications of divinity don’t amount to three divine beings. Rather, each of the three exemplifications (Father, Son, and Holy Spirit) is the one God. Thus, the persons are related to God somewhat as concrete things are related to the universals of which they are examples (Cross 1999, 61–71). Indeed, the divine nature or essence is a universal, although it is also a substance (a.k.a. substantial individual, subsistent thing, thing with per se existence) (Cross 2005, 181). Further, though it is a substance, it is also “that power in virtue of which a divine person can produce other divine persons” (Cross 2005, 206).

How are the persons related to each other? They have the divine nature in common. They are related to each other in a way somehow similar to two physical objects which are simultaneously made of the same stuff or matter (this is merely an analogy—Scotus doesn’t believe God or any divine person to be partly composed of matter). The persons, as it were, partially but don’t entirely “overlap”, as each is also partly composed of a unique personal property, not had by the two others. Each person, in Scotus’s terms, is “essentially identical” with the divine essence, but not “formally” or “hypostatically” identical. In the same way, Peter is essentially identical with humanity, but isn’t formally identical with it, having his own haecceity (his own individual essence, or “thisness”) not had by any other human. But whereas Peter and Paul are “really distinct”, the persons of the Trinity are not, at least if being “really distinct” implies being separable (Cross 1999, 69). Further, as Cross explicates this view, the divine nature or essence is nothing more than “the overlap of” the persons, which saves it from being some fourth divine thing in God (Cross 2005, 166). Nonetheless, it is metaphysically “prior to” the persons, in the sense of being the form in virtue of which the three relations obtain. Moreover, this essence “immediately determines” the Father, and only through him is it determined to the Son and Spirit. This process is causal, but does not imply, Scotus holds, that the Son and Spirit are subordinate to the Father, or that they are imperfect or less divine than he (Cross 2005, 176–80, 245–8).

The Son and Spirit are produced willingly but necessarily, the Son being the divine Word as generated by God’s memory, as had by the Father. The Holy Spirit is God’s love for his own essence. Like Augustine, he holds that the persons are distinguished by their relational properties, but he does this on the basis of church tradition, not because he finds anything impossible in the supposition that the persons are distinguished by absolute (non-relational) properties. While the relational properties of paternity, sonship, and being spirated constitute the three persons, he denies that those are their only unique properties (Cross 1999, 62–7). These properties are supposed to explain why the persons, unlike the divine essence, are not communicable (Cross 2005, 163).

Is it possible for anything to be related as Scotus thinks the members of the Trinity are to the divine essence? As Cross asks, “if the divine essence is indivisible, how can it be instantiated by three different persons?” (Cross 1999, 68) Scotus claims that the divine essence is “repeatable” or “communicable” without being “divisible” (Cross 1999, 68). He gives a soul-body analogy: just as the intellective soul is equally in each organ without being “divided” or composed of parts, so the divine essence relates to the three persons. But the divine essence is the only universal, he holds, which is commmunicable in this way.

Scotus gives some perfect-being and other arguments to the effect that there must be two and only two productions within God, and only one unproduced producer (the Father, not the divine nature in him). Moreover, the divine essence, being a “quiddity” (exemplifiable or communicable thing) exists in or as some non-exemplifiable thing or suppositum, here, the person of the Father (Cross 2005, 127–52).

This theory hasn’t been much discussed; few Christian thinkers past or present have claimed to understand it. Since the Reformation era, many theologians and philosophers have been impatient with this sort of confident metaphysical speculation, preferring to dismiss it as learned nonsense. However, Cross has painstakingly laid out its motivations and content. See Thom 2012, ch. 10 for formally explication of the theory and Paasch 2012 for critical evaluation and comparison with other medieval theories.

5. Post-Medieval Developments

Starting in the great upheaval of the sixteenth century Protestant Reformation many Christians re-examined the New Testament and rejected many later developments as incompatible with apostolic doctrine, lacking adequate basis in it, and often as contrary to reason as well. Initially, many Reformation leaders de-emphasized the trinitarian doctrine, and seemed unsure whether or not to confine it to the same waste bin as the doctrines of papal authority and transubstantiation (Williams 2000, 459–60). In the end, though, those in what historians call the “Magisterial Reformation” decisively fell in line on behalf of creedal orthodoxy (roughly in line with the pro-Nicene consensus), while other groups, now described as the “Radical Reformation”, either downplayed it, ignored it, or denied it as inconsistent with the Bible and reason. This led to several controversies between creedal trinitarians and what came to be called “unitarians” (earlier, “Socinians”) about biblical interpretation, christology, and the Christian doctrine of God, from the mid 16th to the mid 19th centuries. (See the supplementary document on unitarianism.)

As history played out, the practically non-trinitarian groups and some of the antitrinitarian groups evolved into trinitarian ones. Although unitarian and alternative views of the Trinity have repeatedly re-emerged in various Christian and quasi-Christian movements, the vast majority of Christians and Christian groups today at least in theory adhere to the authority of the Constantinopolitan and “Athanasian” creeds. At the same time, theologians have lamented that many Christian groups are arguably functionally non-trinitarian (though not antitrinitarian) or nearly so in their piety and preaching.

In recent theology, the Trinity has become a popular subject for speculation, and its practical relevance for worship, marriage, gender relations, religious experience, and politics, has been repeatedly asserted. (See section 2.2 of the main text.) It has fallen to Christian philosophers and philosophically aware theologians to sort out what precisely the doctrine amounts to, and to defend it against charges of inconsistency and unintelligibility.

The doctrine’s basis or lack of basis in the New Testament, so vehemently debated from the 16th through the 19th centuries, is not presently a popular topic of debate. This is probably because some theologians hold the attempt to derive the doctrine from the Bible to be hopelessly naive, while other theologians, many Christian philosophers and apologists accept the common arguments (see section 2.2 above) as decisive. Again, the postmodern view that there are no better or worse interpretations of texts may play a role in quenching interest among academic theologians. Finally, it may simply be that trust in the mainstream tradition, or in various particular Christian traditions, currently runs high; many confess trinitarianism simply because their church officially does, or because it and/or the mainstream tradition tells them that the Bible teaches it. Distrust of councils and post-biblical religious authorities has largely evaporated, even among Protestants from historically anti-clerical and non-creedal groups. Ecumenical movements, and anti-sectarian sentiments probably also play a role in deflecting attention from the issues, in that to many it seems perverse to attack one of the few doctrines on which all the main, dominant Christian groups are in agreement.

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