Supplement to Truthlikeness

Why truthlikeness is not probability or vagueness

Truthlikeness (or verisimilitude) is often confused with other notions, like vagueness or epistemic probability. It is then instructive to see how truthlikeness differs from these other notions, and what are the most common sources of the confusion.

One common mistake is to conflate truthlikeness with vagueness. Suppose vagueness is not an epistemic phenomenon, and that it can be explained by treating truth and falsehood as extreme points on a scale of distinct truth values. Even if there are vagueness-related “degrees of truth”, ranging from clearly true through to clearly false, they should not be confused with degrees of closeness to the truth. To see this, suppose Alan is exactly 179 cm tall. Then the proposition that Alan is exactly 178 cm tall should turn out to be clearly false on any good theory of vagueness. Nevertheless it is pretty close to the truth. That Alan is tall, on the other hand, is a vague claim, one that in the circumstances is neither clearly true nor clearly false. However, since it closer to the clearly true end of the spectrum, it has a high (vagueness-related) degree of truth, if there is such a thing. Still, Alan is tall is not as close to the truth as the quite precise, but nevertheless clearly false proposition that Alan is exactly 178 cm tall. So closeness to the truth and vagueness-related degrees of truth (if there are such) can also pull in different directions.

Neither does truthlikeness – likeness to the whole truth of some matter – have much to do with high probability. The probability that the number of planets is greater than or equal to 0 is maximal but that trivially true proposition is not terribly close to the whole truth. Suppose some non-tautological true propositions can be known for certain – call their conjunction the evidence. Then any truth that goes beyond the evidence will be less probable than the evidence. However truths that go beyond the evidence might well be closer to the whole truth than the evidence is. The true proposition which goes most beyond the evidence is the strongest possible truth – it is the truth, the whole truth and nothing but the truth. And that true proposition is clearly the one that is closest to the whole truth. So the truth with the least probability on the evidence is the proposition that is clearly closest to the whole truth.

What, then, is the source of the widespread conflation of truthlikeness with epistemic probability? Probability – at least of the epistemic variety – measures the degree of seeming to be true, while truthlikeness measures the degree of being similar to the truth. Seeming and being similar might at first strike one as closely related, but of course they are very different. Seeming concerns the appearances whereas being similar concerns the objective facts, facts about similarity or likeness. Even more important, there is a difference between being true and being the truth. The truth, of course, has the property of being true, but not every proposition that is true is the truth in the sense of the aim of inquiry. The truth of a matter at which an inquiry aims is ideally the complete, true answer to its central query. Thus there are two dimensions along which probability (seeming to be true) and truthlikeness (being similar to the truth) differ radically. (There is a related and interesting problem, discussed at length in §3 – concerning probabilitistic credal states, and the relations between the truthlikeness of propositions and the closeness of probabilistic credal states to a target state.)

Copyright © 2022 by
Graham Oddie <>
Gustavo Cevolani <>

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