Notes to Umar Khayyam

1. While the exact date of his birth is not known, Swami Govinda Tirtha mentions 439 AH, while Tabrizī in his Tarabkhānah mentions 455 AH as the likely date. Most scholars seem to accept the 439 AH as the probable date. See Tirtha (1941).

2. Some have suggested his death took place before 515 AH/1124 CE, but most contemporary scholars seem to think that 517 AH/1126 CE is a more likely date. For more information on his place of birth, see: Bayhaqī (1932/1351 AH), 116–7.

3. For more information on his teachers and students see Aminrazavi (2007), 21–23.

4. For Khayyām’s cosmological arguments see Risālah fi’l-wujūd (Jamshīd Nijād (ed.), 2000, 113) and Fi’l- kawn wa’l-taklīf (Hashemipour (ed.) 2000, 140–141). For Khayyām’s ontological argument see Fi’l-kawn wa’l-taklif, in Malik (ed.) 1998, 329.

5. Nājī Iṣfahānī (2002) identifies twenty-four principles which constitute the core of Khayyām’s philosophical views.

6. For more information see The Response to Three Problems: The Necessity of Contrariety in the World, Nājī Iṣfahānī (ed.), 2002, 167–68, and 177.

7. We have followed Alikhani and Ahvazi’s edition (2021, 216) on the preposition ka. The expression “like all existing accidents in re” (in our translation) is recorded as “for all existing accidents in re” by Jamshīd Nijād Awwal. He has dismissed a manuscript with “like” (ka) in favor of another with “for” (li) (On Existence, Jamshīd Nijād Awwal (ed.) 2000, 103, note 41). Malik’s edition (1998, 399) offers the same reading. However, Khayyam’s point here seems to be illustrating the notion of “simple.” If so, “like” is preferable to “for,” given that all existing accidents in re are simple, with no matter or form (again, this is a well-known Aristotelian theme). Furthermore, considerational attributes, such as existence and oneness, are attributable to primary substances as well. So, perhaps, accidents are used here to illustrate simple meanings.

8. FitzGerald’s translation goes like this:

For in the Market-place, one Dusk of Day,
I watch’d the Potter thumping his wet Clay:
And with its all obliterated Tongue
It murmur’d—“Gently, Brother, gently, pray!”
    (Rubā‘iyyāt, FitzGerald 2009, 34)

9. For information concerning a Sufi reading of Khayyām see: Naṣr (2001).

10. A possible, and partial, resolution is that Khayyam did not believe in “bodily” resurrection and hence this life is the only bodily/corporeal life one can have.

11. Translated to English in Amir-Móez (1963), and in Rashed and Vahabzadeh (2000); and into French in Rashed and Vahabzadeh (1999).

12. Translated into English in Kasir (1931); Winter and ‛Arafat (1950); and in Rashed and Vahabzadeh (2000). Translated into French in Woepcke (1851) and in Rashed and Vahabzadeh (1999). An account of Khayyām’s solution of one of the types of cubic equation may be found in Berggren (1986), pp. 118–124.

13. See Oaks (2011).

14. Translated into English in Amir-Móez (1959), Rashed and Vahabzadeh (2000), and Khalil (2008); and into French in Rashed and Vahabzadeh (1999). See also the analysis in Vahabzadeh (1997).

15. Interestingly, Youschkevitch and Rosenfeld (1973) point out that Khayyam’s principle (containing the two statements he attributes to Aristotle) cannot be found in any of Aristotle's known writings.

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Seyed N. Mousavian <>
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Mehdi Aminrazavi
Glen Van Brummelen

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