Notes to The Medieval Problem of Universals

1. In a somewhat free translation: “I like Plato, but I like the truth even more.” Cf. Aristotle, The Nicomachean Ethics, 1096a15, in The Complete Works of Aristotle.

2. These are the opposing, yet complementary attitudes (universals come “from above”, for Plato, and “from below”, for Aristotle) that are famously immortalized in the gestures of the two philosophers in the center of Raphael’s picture “The School of Athens”.

3. To be sure, there were medieval authors who were skeptical about the reconcilability of Plato and Aristotle on the issue of universals. Cf. the following remark by John of Salisbury (ca. 1120-1180): “Bernard of Chartres and his students worked hard to reconcile Aristotle and Plato. But in my judgment they arrived late, so they strove in vain to reconcile two dead men, who could have reconciled as long as they were alive, but disagreed.” John of Salisbury, Metalogicon, bk. 2, c. 17, 875d22-25.

4. Cf.: “In the second place it is clear what those professors mean who say that there are three sorts of universals, namely, before the individual thing, as an idea, in the thing, as a form communicated to many things, and after the thing, as the species or sign of the former.” John Wyclif, Tractatus de Universalibus, c. 2, p. 69. Cf. also: “To these two kinds of universals [Plato’s and Aristotle’s], a third is added, namely, the species in the understanding abstracted from the things is called universal, because it is related to many things, not because it is predicated of many, but because it is similar to many. … And perhaps this is whence the distinction originated that there are three kinds of universals: before the thing, in the thing, and after the thing. For a universal in the first way is before the thing, because it causes things. In the second way it is in the thing, because it is the same essence as the things. In the third way it is after the thing, because it is a species abstracted from the things and caused by them.” Giles of Rome, In Primum Librum Sententiarum, 1SN, d. 19, pars 2, q. 1. Utrum in divinis sit totum universale?. Concerning alleged “ontological extremities” in mediaeval philosophy see J. A. Trentman’s Introduction to his edition of Vincent Ferrer’s Tractatus de Suppositionibus, esp. pp. 20-30.

5. Notable exceptions would be Ockham, and his followers, such as Peter of Ailly, John Gerson, and Gabriel Biel. See Ockham, Ordinatio I, d. 35, q. 5, and Biel, Collectorium I, d. 35, q. 5. These authors argue that only singular creatures have ideas in the divine mind (which they identify with the singular creatures themselves as they are eternally pre-cognized by God), but neither their species, nor their genera do. To be sure, since created intellects do form universal concepts of singulars, and God does have cognition of those concepts in each singular created mind from eternity, in a roundabout way these authors still concede that there are universals in the divine mind. However, Ockham also claims that in the divine mind these universals do not function as universal exemplars, as they do in the minds of created agents. The basis of the claim is that for Ockham, the intuitive, singular cognition of singulars is superior to the abstractive, universal cognition of the same. But regardless of such details, the point is that even such hardheaded nominalists would not directly go against the authority of St. Augustine on this issue, for which see the section on divine ideas below.

6. In fact, by the 12th century the irresistible challenge posed by Porphyry’s questions yielded a proliferation of answers that John of Salisbury found pedagogically completely unjustifiable, complaining in his Metalogicon that his contemporaries’ endless discussions of universals in connection with what was supposed to be an introductory logic text placed “unbearable burden on the tender shoulders of their students” (onera importabilia teneris auditorum humeris imponunt). op. cit., bk. 2, c. 19, 877a.

7. As Paul Spade has pointed out in his careful analysis of Boethius’ argument, this characterization of what a universal is derives from Porphyry’s commentary on Aristotle’s Categories. See, Spade 1996b.

8. Although Boethius does not explicitly formulate his argument in terms of the distinctness and identity of the acts of being of the entities in question, in the conclusion of his argument, he quite explicitly alludes to the Aristotelian principle of the convertibility of unity and being. See Spade 1996b, p. 22 (12). In any case, this reformulation of Boethius’ argument is just my attempt at clarifying what Boethius may have meant by the requirement of metaphysical “constitutiveness” that accounts for the key motive in the argument which Paul Spade very aptly called the “contagiousness” of the plurality of the particulars.

9. To be sure, Boethius does not explicitly talk about a collection here, but this suggestion is certainly very similar to those later collection-theories which Abelard vehemently (and quite effectively) criticized. See Five Texts (Spade 1994), pp. 35-37. In any case, in Boethius’ argument nothing depends on whether the several items demanding a genus are grouped together into a collection, a quasi-entity with its own less-than-numerical quasi-unity. The point is that according to the assumption of this part of the argument, the term ‘genus’ has to stand for a number of distinct entities, no matter whether they are taken to form a collection or not.

10. This summary provides the overall structure of Boethius’ argument. In the reconstruction above I did not follow the order of Boethius’ actual presentation; I merely summarized what I take to be the gist of Boethius’ reasoning. For an intriguing and thoroughgoing discussion of the interpretational possibilities as to the actual “fine-structure” of Boethius’ argumentation, see again Spade 1996b.

11. The same solution recurs, in ever more refined forms, e.g., in Abelard Five Texts (Spade 1994, p. 48), John of Salisbury (Metalogicon, bk. 2, c. 20, 877c7-878a9), and Aquinas (ST1, q. 85, a. 1, ad 1-um.).

12. To be sure, I may still be mistaken about what a man is. But that, again, would be a case of forming a judgment, as opposed to simply conceiving of man without any judgment whatsoever. The point is that by an act of simple apprehension I either do conceive of a certain (kind of) thing, or I don’t. If I do, then in this act there cannot be falsity unless I make a judgment about the thing conceived; if I don’t, then I literally have no idea of the thing, so I will certainly not make a judgment about it, let alone a false one.

13. Note that Berkeley’s famous criticism of the Lockean conception of abstraction does not apply here, for abstraction in this sense, as selective intellectual attention, was admitted even by George Berkeley in a significant insertion in the second edition of the Introduction to his Principles. See George Berkeley: A Treatise Concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge, p. 16.

14. The tradition goes back to Philo of Alexandria, and the Alexandrian school of Ammonius Saccas. See Spade 1985, p. 67. An excellent, detailed discussion of Greek and Arab Neo-Platonism is provided in Libera 1996. Interestingly, Aquinas, following Averroes, attributes this theory to Aristotle. Cf. 1SN, d. 36, q. 2, a. 1, ad 1-um. Domingo Soto, besides referring to the locus classicus from Augustine quoted below, indicates that he also found the same doctrine in the “through and through Platonic” (ubique Platonicus) Seneca. Cf. Soto, D., In Porphyrii Isagogen, Aristotelis Categorias, librosque de Demonstratione, Commentaria, p. 30 I. For Seneca, see, e.g., Ad Lucilium Epistulae Morales, lxx.7; lxv. 4-7. Seneca is also quoted by Ockham and Biel in the places referred to in n. 5 above.

15. On Eighty-Three Different Questions, q. 46, 2, translated by P. V. Spade in Spade 1985 (Other Internet Resources), p. 383, from Augustine, De diversis quaestionibus octoginta tribus.

16. Quite significantly, Aquinas quotes Augustine as his authority for this position: “Augustine says (De Trin. iv, 6,7): ‘God is truly and absolutely simple.’” ST1, q. 3, a. 7, sc. (See the whole question for Aquinas’ detailed arguments for God’s simplicity.)

17. Cf.: Henry of Ghent, Summa Quaestionum Ordinariarum (henceforth HQO), 2, a. 65, q. 5; John Duns Scotus, Op. Oxon. lb. 1, d. 35, q. unica. Thomas of Sutton, Quodlibeta, IV, q. 5. For Aquinas’ detailed discussion of the issue one should check 1SN, d. 36, q. 2, aa. 1-3.

18. On the Free Choice of the Will, II, 8; cf. Phaedo, 73c-75c, in Plato, Collected Dialogues.

19. Note that this premise merely assumes the abstraction of the concept of some sort of unity, found, for example, in the experience of single bodies (which really is common experience), and not the formation of the concept of absolute unity, which would require (at least) the further steps indicated below. Of course, the premise also presumes the Aristotelian conception that the intellective soul has an active intellect, the active faculty enabling it to perform abstraction.

20. ST1, q. 84, a. 5. In his commentary on Aquinas’s relevant remarks, Robert Pasnau objected to this characterization in the following way: “… I would contrast a naturalistic interpretation with a supernatural one (see Loquendo naturaliter, p. 202), and insist that Aquinas sees something supernatural at work in the operation of the agent intellect, something that cannot be explained, except by a raw appeal to our participating in the divine light. At this point there is no further philosophical account to be had, and so I find it misleading to refer to Aquinas’s interpretation as ‘naturalistic’” (Pasnau, 2002, p. 450). However, on my reading of Aquinas, here he merely gives a tip of the hat to Augustine’s doctrine, while at the same time he respectfully rejects it. Concept acquisition and understanding in possession of concepts are the natural operations of the human mind (comprising both the agent and the possible intellect), without any direct infusion of supernatural “light”: for Aquinas, our intelligible species are genuinely acquired from experience through the natural operation of the agent intellect (namely, abstraction), they are not infused “from above”, and once acquired, they are naturally utilized by the possible intellect in its three operations distinguished by Aristotle (simple apprehension, judgment formation, and reasoning). To be sure, the way these natural operations work also provides proofs for Aquinas that the human intellect is immaterial, and so in that sense it is elevated above any corporeal, material nature. And in this sense (but in this sense alone) it more intimately participates in the immaterial divine nature than any corporeal nature possibly can. In any case, just to make my point clear, when I claim that Aquinas provides a ‘naturalistic interpretation’ of illumination, I merely want to stress (apparently in genuine contrast to Pasnau’s reading of Aquinas) that the natural operation of the agent intellect, namely, abstraction, would for Aquinas account for the possibility of universal concept formation without any reliance on some direct, immediate divine action on the human mind (planting some information in the human mind that it could not acquire from experience), in contrast to Augustine’s account that would require precisely this sort of direct divine influence (as is also clear from Matthew of Aquasparta’s and Henry of Ghent’s articulation of the Augustinian position discussed below). But perhaps our disagreement with Pasnau is still only verbal, merely depending on how much we want to read into the adjective “naturalistic”.

21. An excellent collection of relevant texts can be found in Bonaventure, et al., De Humanae Cognitionis Ratione: anecdota quaedam Seraphici Doctoris Sancti Bonaventurae et nunnulorum eius discipulorum (henceforth: DHCR).

22. Cf. Aristotle, Posterior Analytics, ii, 19, 100a15-b17, Nicomachean Ethics, vi, 6, 1140b31-1141a8.

23. The allusion to Descartes (with the phrase “clear and distinct”) is intended. For Descartes’ “Augustinian roots” see Menn, S.: Descartes and Augustine, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998). It is worth noting here that Henry’s distinction between these two sorts of concepts provides an interesting solution to what in modern philosophy is usually referred to as “the paradox of analysis”. The paradox consists in the puzzling phenomenon that correct conceptual analyses can be informative. For example, ‘circle’ is correctly analyzed as ‘locus of points equidistant from a given point’. Still, a person may have the concept of ‘circle’, and the concept of ‘circle’ is nothing but the concept of ‘locus of points equidistant from a given point’, yet the person may genuinely learn something when first instructed about this analysis. Henry would say that although the simple concept of ‘circle’ and its analysis do express the same concept, the simple concept without its analysis is just an initial, vague impression of visible circles on the mind, which does not enable one to recognize the pure truth of what a circle is, whereas with the analysis the same concept will enable the mind to deliver sound judgment on the pure truth of the thing, in the form of a priori geometrical principles and conclusions.

24. This is also what is happening in the Platonic dialogues, where the interlocutors first start out with all confidence in having some definite conception of the subject matter of the discussion, but when it comes to the point of having to provide an essential definition of the subject, they all end up in confusion and embarrassment, apparently lacking the definite concept they thought they had, after which they start seeking “illumination” or “recollection” throughout the discussion, to reach the understanding they realized they lacked.

25. For more on this issue see Pasnau 1999b.

26. For an excellent, monographic discussion, see Marrone, 2001.

27. As John of Salisbury writes: “…everybody follows Aristotle” (…omnes Aristotelem profitentur). Metalogicon, bk. 2, c. 19, 877a18.

28. Cf. Spade 1985, c. 40, where P. V. Spade carefully identifies Abelard’s opponents on the basis of John of Salisbury’s encyclopedic account of the current views on universals of his time.

29. No wonder that in modern philosophies of language, mostly inspired by the “collection-theorist” view of quantification theory, we have the persistent problem of providing a principled distinction between essential and non-essential predicates.

30. The term status (the plural form of which is also status, pronounced with a long u) designates just a state of a thing, the way the thing is. It is this simple, intuitive idea that gains some further, technical significance in the context of Abelard’s theory.

31. Cf. Aristotle, Physics, 2, c. 3, 195 a13-14. Note that the Physics was not yet available in Abelard’s time. Abelard’s own examples include being flogged for not appearing in court, being hanged for stealing, dying because of not eating, and being damned for not acting rightly. In any case, Abelard’s point clearly is that he takes the causal relation to hold between the significata of whole propositions, regardless of the particular content of these propositions, or the particular kind of causality involved.

32. This will immediately raise the problem whether the status of created things are there before their creation, and if not (since nothing other than God can be coeternal with God), then whether God’s providence of created things before their creation was empty. Abelard explicitly raises and answers this problem. Cf. Five Texts (Spade 1994), pp. 49-50 (135)-(140).

33. Five Texts (Spade 1994), p. 47 (123). Indeed, according to the immediately following paragraph (124), the status has a “greater force” in determining the community of universal names; so it may even be primarily signified by a common term.

34. In fact, this may be an early anticipation of the distinction that appears in Aquinas, who distinguishes between that from which a name is imposed, and that on which the name is imposed, what is intended to be signified. For more on this distinction, see Klima 1996a.

35. For a more detailed discussion of the philosophical issues raised by Abelard’s theory, see Tweedale 1982, and Spade 1985, c. 40.

36. Avicenna: Metaphysica V, 1, at II, p. 228 lines 31-36; 1508 ed., fol. 86va; tr. in Spade 1985, c. 21, p. 461.

37. De ente et essentia, c. 2 (in Opera Omnia)

38. In this connection the analogy perfectly applies to what Aristotle and Aquinas had to say about monstrous births, and what we know about genetic errors.

39. The addition of this paragraph was prompted by a post by “the maverick philosopher”, William F. Vallicella: Gyula Klima on common natures. That post also refers to another one, questioning the force of Aquinas’ argument concerning neither unity nor multiplicity belonging to a nature according to its absolute consideration: Frege meets Aquinas: A passage from De Ente etEssentia. Interestingly, something similar to the Fregean distinction invoked by Vallicella between a mark (Merkmal) of a concept and a property (Eigenschaft) of a concept is quite explicitly made, although obviously not in the same terms, by Cajetan in his discussion of the argument in his commentary on Aquinas’ text (pp. 134-143, nn. 55-56.). A “good Thomistic answer” to Vallicella’s objection, the possibility of which he hints at in the latter post, can be found in Cajetan’s q. VI of his commentary (pp. 143-155, nn. 57-62), which this paragraph was meant to reconstruct. For an excellent, detailed discussion of Cajetan’s solution, see Wood, 2011.

40. In Aquinas, De ente et essentia, c. 3 (in Opera Omnia), we find:

Human nature has in the intellect existence abstracted from all individuals, and thus it is related uniformly to all individuals that exist outside the soul, as it is equally similar to all of them, and it leads to knowledge of all insofar as they are men. Since the nature in the intellect has this relation to each individual, the intellect invents the notion of species and attributes it to itself. Hence, the Commentator, in De Anima I, com. 8, says, ‘The intellect is what makes universality in things,’ and Avicenna says the same in his Metaphysicae V, cap. 2. Although this nature understood in the intellect has the notion of a universal in relation to things outside the soul (because it is one likeness of them all), as the nature has existence in this intellect or in that one, it is a certain particular understood species.

Cf. Suarez, F., Disputaciones Metafisicas, pp. 360-361. For a somewhat different interpretation of the same distinction, however, cf. also Cajetan, Commentary on Being and Essence, pp. 67-71, 121-124.

41. For a more detailed, systematic discussion of the issue of different “degrees of being” and different “degrees of unity” this conception entails see Klima 1996a and 2000b.

42. See more on Olivi in Pasnau 1999a. For more discussion of the issue of intermediaries in cognition in medieval philosophy, especially in Aquinas, its relation to skepticism, and whether it should be construed in terms of the modern “direct realist” vs. “representationalist” distinction, see Klima 1996b. (See also Appendix A of Pasnau 1997).

43. For an excellent, brief “textbook-treatment” of, and relevant excerpts from, the 1277 condemnations see “The Condemnation of 1277”, in A. Hyman and J. J. Walsh, (eds.), Philosophy of the Middle Ages, which also provides further scholarly references. For a thoroughgoing discussion, see Hissette 1977.

44. For Henry’s view, as opposed and criticized by the Thomist theologian Thomas of Sutton, see Klima 2000a. For the same, as criticized by Duns Scotus, see Five Texts (Spade 1994), pp. 69-71. For a detailed account of Scotus, see Cross, 2014. For in-depth contemporary discussions of the problem of individuation in the Middle Ages, see Gracia 1994. For a comprehensive account of the early history of the problem, see Gracia 1984.

45. Cf. F. Suarez, On the Various Kinds of Distinctions.

46. W. Ockham, Summa Logicae, part 1, c. 51, p. 169.

47. Ibid., p. 171, where Ockham explicitly claims that this is the root (radix) of the errors of the moderns.

48. This claim is developed in Klima 1999.

49. For a recent summary of the development of Ockham’s views on this matter see Pasnau 1997, pp. 277-289, esp. p. 278, n. 47, where the author provides further references to the existing secondary literature. A particularly illuminating account of Ockham’s early fictum theory is provided by Read 1977.

50. To be sure, this conception of indifference of representation based on essential similarity of the represented things raises a number of further questions which seriously challenge the success of Ockham’s semantic program on the level of how the fundamental semantic relation between concepts and things is established. A detailed discussion of this issue can be found in Klima 1997. Cf. also, Adams 1987, I, c.3, pp. 121-133. A detailed analysis and powerful defense of Ockham’s conception is provided by Claude Panaccio [Panaccio 2004]. For more recent discussions of fourteenth-century developments, see Amerini and Cesalli (eds.), 2017.

51. In medieval logic (regardless of many disagreements over the details between individual authors), personal supposition (when a term is used to refer in a proposition to something of which it can truly be predicated with the mediation of the copula of the proposition in question) was commonly distinguished from simple supposition (when the term is used to refer to its immediate significate), and material supposition (when the term is used to refer to itself or other tokens of its type). For a brief summary account of the medieval theories of the properties of terms, see Spade 1982. For much more, see Spade 1996a. See also Read 2015.

52. Again, this need not necessarily be regarded as a flaw of this theory. After all, in our age of satellite uplinks and computer networks we should not find the idea of the same information content (which is nothing but the objective concept in the scholastic jargon) being realized in several, physically radically different media. (Indeed, Napster would not be in trouble, if the recording companies did not think that the music downloaded is the same that they had recorded.)

53. For detailed, systematic comparisons of the different semantic principles of the two viae, see Klima 1993b and 1999.

54. Cf. Aristotle, Physics, III, 3, 202a15-202b29; Metaphysics, XI, 9, 1066a17-34.

55. An excellent survey of the medieval theories of relations is provided by Henninger 1989.

56. D. Soto, In Porphyrii Isagogen, Aristotelis Categorias, librosque de Demonstratione, Commentaria, p. 28H.

57. D. Soto, In Porphyrii Isagogen, Aristotelis Categorias, librosque de Demonstratione, Commentaria, p. 28H.

58. For an excellent historical survey of these developments see Ashworth 1974.

59. Documents of the typical humanistic reaction are provided with Rita Guerlac’s excellent introduction in Vives, J. L., Against the Pseudodialecticians.

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