Hans Vaihinger

First published Thu Jan 23, 2020

Hans Vaihinger (1852–1933) was a Neo-Kantian philosopher, who made important contributions to epistemology, philosophy of science and mathematics, and to the historiography of philosophy. As a historian, Vaihinger produced groundbreaking work on Kant’s theoretical philosophy, especially on the Transcendental Aesthetic and Transcendental Deduction of the Categories, as well as one of the first serious philosophical commentaries on Nietzsche. As a systematic philosopher, Vaihinger is best remembered as the father of the philosophical theory of fictionalism, which he sets out in his magnum opus Die Philosophie des Als Ob (PAO), which translates to The Philosophy of As-If. Heavily influenced by the nineteenth-century Neo-Kantian Friedrich Albert Lange, as well as by Arthur Schopenhauer, the PAO develops a position that Vaihinger calls “idealistic positivism.” The view seeks to wed elements of Kant’s transcendental idealism with the Darwinian theory of natural selection, and places central emphasis on the epistemic import of idealization and fiction. Vaihinger’s fictionalism anticipated many of the anti-realist and anti-metaphysical strains of later logical positivism, and represented an important alternative to the Neo-Kantianism of the Marburg, Southwest, and Göttingen Schools.

1. Brief Biography

Hans (born Johannes) Vaihinger’s early life was in many ways that of a typical intellectual in nineteenth-century Germany. Born on 25 September 1852 near Tübingen, the son of the pastor Johann Georg Vaihinger, Hans was intended for the clergy. He began his studies in theology at the University of Tübingen in 1870, but, never especially devout, he soon turned his attentions to other subjects, primarily philosophy and natural science. Throughout the next four years, Vaihinger’s course of study emphasized the classics of German philosophy—Kant, Fichte, Schelling, Hegel, and Schleiermacher—but he also devoted himself intensely to the independent study of Schopenhauer and Darwin. In 1874, Vaihinger completed his dissertation under the supervision of the logician Christoph von Sigwart with a prize-winning essay, entitled Recent Theories of Consciousness according to their Metaphysical Foundation and their Significance for Psychology.

Later in the same year, he reported to Leipzig for compulsory military service, but was excused due to his poor eyesight. Free of his military duties, Vaihinger had the opportunity to attend lectures at the University from, among others, the founder of empirical psychology Wilhelm Wundt. It was during this time that Vaihinger first encountered the work of a figure who, next to Kant, would be his most important and lasting philosophical influence, the Neo-Kantian Friedrich Lange. Vaihinger describes the impact Lange’s History of Materialism made on him as follows: “Now at last I had found the man whom I had sought in vain during those four years [at Tübingen]. I found a master, a guide, an ideal teacher… . All that I had striven for and aimed at stood before my eyes as a finished masterpiece. From this time onwards I called myself a disciple of F.A. Lange” (PAO, xxi–xxii).

After a brief tenure in Leipzig, Vaihinger moved to Berlin, where he continued his studies with Hermann von Helmholtz and the Neo-Kantian Eduard Zeller. In 1876, Vaihinger published his first work, an exposition and defense of Lange’s brand of Neo-Kantianism, entitled Hartmann, Dühring, and Lange: Towards a History of German Philosophy in the Nineteenth Century. It was here that the views which would form the basis of the PAO first began to take shape. In autumn of the same year, Vaihinger again relocated—this time to the University of Strassburg—and by early 1877 he had habilitated with a work entitled Logical Studies on Fictions. Part I: The Theory of Scientific Fictions. Though the PAO would not be published for more than 30 years, the Logical Studies is already, according to Vaihinger, “exactly the same” as Part I of the former work (PAO xxiii–xxiv).

The extremely long gestation period of the PAO seems to have been the product of a variety of factors. First and foremost, monetary considerations compelled Vaihinger to find permanent academic employment. To further his candidacy, Vaihinger decided to bring out a Commentary on Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason in honor of the centenary of the first Critique’s publication. The first volume of the Commentary was released in 1881, and helped Vaihinger secure a permanent position at the University of Halle. The second volume followed in 1892. A sense of the scholarly depth of Vaihinger’s work is given by the fact that the two-volume Commentary, which deals only with the KrV’s Prefaces, Introductions, and Transcendental Aesthetic, reaches nearly 1,100 pages. Moreover, a number of personal and professional engagements occupied Vaihinger in the last decade of the century. In 1889 he married Elisabeth Schweigger, the daughter of a Berlin bookseller. In 1892 they had a son, Richard, and in 1895 a daughter, Erna. In 1896, he founded the journal Kant-Studien, and in 1901 the Kant Gesellschaft.

Finally, in 1911, Vaihinger published the first edition of PAO. The work made him something like a philosophical celebrity virtually overnight. It proved so popular that it had gone through no fewer than 10 editions by the time of his death in 1933, attracting the attention of luminaries from a wide variety of academic fields (including Einstein, Ostwald, and Freud). Halle even became informally known as the “Vaihinger-Stadt” (Vaihinger city). The PAO’s success enabled Vaihinger to found, in 1918, yet another journal, Annalen der Philosophie und philosophischen Kritik, which dealt specifically with the themes broached in the PAO, and included contributions from figures such as the mathematician Moritz Pasch, the embryologist Wilhelm Roux, and the positivist philosophers Rudolf Carnap and Hans Reichenbach. In 1930, Carnap and Reichenbach took over editorship of the Annalen and renamed it Erkenntnis.

Though this period of Vaihinger’s life was marked by tremendous professional success, it was also a period of personal struggle. In 1906, suffering badly from cataracts, Vaihinger was forced to discontinue his lecturing. Eventually, he was completely blinded. In 1913, there occurred a rather bizarre incident: an anti-Semitic publication, the Semi-Kürschner, “accused” Vaihinger of being a Jew. With anti-Semitism already on the rise in Germany, Vaihinger felt compelled to defend his reputation in court, and sued the publication for defamation. Though the Semi-Kürschner ultimately removed his name, the incident perhaps explains in part why his reputation would continue to suffer under the Nazis. Additionally, Vaihinger had invested significant portions of his assets in Russia; the October Revolution, together with the economic crisis after the First World War left him in dire financial straits, and he was forced to sell the bookstore he had inherited from Elisabeth’s parents. Struggle turned to tragedy when, in 1918, Vaihinger’s daughter Erna committed suicide. His son Richard also began suffering from neuropathy brought on by the war, and by 1929 he was completely incapacitated.

Vaihinger died in 1933, on the eve of the rise of the Third Reich. A long-time liberal and pacifist, Vaihinger and his work were treated with hostile silence throughout the Nazi period. A final, posthumous tragedy would thus befall him during these years: once among Germany’s most celebrated and influential philosophers, Vaihinger became a virtual nobody, and his works were quickly forgotten. Though contemporary philosophical literature reveals a renewed interest in his ideas, it is fair to say that his reputation has never fully recovered. For a more detailed treatment of Vaihinger’s biography, see (Simon 2014). Vaihinger himself discusses his intellectual development at length in his autobiographical (1921b) (also included as the introduction to C.K. Ogden’s 1925 English translation of PAO).

2. Early Views and Intellectual Context

With the hegemony of absolute idealism broken, Germany was awash with competing philosophical systems by the time Vaihinger habilitated in 1877. Three important movements are worth emphasizing (for detailed studies of the late nineteenth-century context, see Beiser [2013; 2014; 2015; 2017]). First, under the influence of Lange and others, Neo-Kantianism had become a major force on the intellectual scene. Second, due partly to Schopenhauer’s rising star, and partly to the continued influence of Hegel and Schelling, grand metaphysical theorizing after the idealist model was experiencing a resurgence in the work of Adolf Trendelenburg, Hermann Lotze, and Eduard von Hartmann. Finally, traditional materialism and empiricism, though very much on the defensive, had nevertheless gained back considerable ground since their nadir in early decades of the century.

Vaihinger’s first intervention in these foundational debates came in the form of his short tract Hartmann, Dühring, and Lange. Its title notwithstanding, the book is less a work of historical exegesis, and more a polemical defense of Lange’s Kantian standpoint against the dual assault of naïve realism (represented by the positivism of Eugen Dühring) and unchecked metaphysical speculation (exemplified by Hartmann’s Neo-Schopenhauerian view, according to which fundamental reality is a monistic vital substance). Vaihinger’s chief charge against Hartmann and Dühring is that they are dogmatists, that they systematically overstep the critical strictures Kant had placed on cognition, claiming knowledge of things in themselves (1876, 10, 17). Both commit “the original sin of post-Kantian philosophy”—Hegel’s “fantastic petitio principii” of “the unity of thought and being” (1876, 67). Lange’s Neo-Kantianism, by contrast, represents something like the best of both worlds, and so promises a middle path in a seemingly intractable dispute. With Dühring, Lange emphasizes the importance of grounding philosophy in the results of the empirical sciences. But with Hartmann, he avoids naïvely eliding the empirical objects studied by the sciences with things in themselves.

It is not, however, only Lange’s in-principle restriction of knowledge to appearances that Vaihinger wishes to champion. More importantly, he holds that Lange has demonstrated that the empirical sciences themselves conclusively support the transcendental idealist’s position. In Chapter IV, Part 3 of the second volume of his magnum opus The History of Materialism and Critique of its Contemporary Significance, Lange draws on the work of Johannes Müller and Helmholtz to argue that “the physiology of the sense organs is the developed, or corrected Kantianism, and Kant’s system can, as it were, be viewed as a program for the more recent discoveries in this field” (1873–75, 2:409). The basic idea was that such research had shown that our perceptual apparatus plays an active role in structuring our experience, and that the output of such a process does not qualitatively resemble the initial external stimulus, for which it is a mere “sign.” Since what we perceive is always the product of such unconscious physiological processes, it supposedly follows that we have no knowledge of the objects that ultimately cause our perceptions (for more on these sorts of arguments, see [Hatfield 1990, 165–71, 195–208, and esp. 208–218; Beiser 2014, 199–205, 381–86], and the entries on Hermann von Helmholtz, and Friedrich Lange). Thus, if Dühring rejects transcendental idealism, he simply has not consistently followed his own prescription that philosophy should base itself on the empirical sciences. And if Hartmann claims to know the nature of things in themselves, he can do so only by flagrantly ignoring the results of those sciences.

Though perhaps rhetorically effective, this argument leads to a basic tension in Vaihinger’s early view. Vaihinger sums up Lange’s conclusion as follows: “the result of the physiology of the senses is that we do not … perceive external objects, but rather ourselves first produce the appearance of such things, specifically as a consequence of the affection by transcendent objects” (1876, 56). These appearances are the result of our “physiological organization” operating on sensory stimuli. But he goes on to concede that this “‘organization’ signifies only the unknown … Y whose collaboration with the ‘thing in itself’, X, produces the world of inner and outer experience” (1876, 57), that “even our own body … is only a product of our optical apparatus” (1876, 57), and that “not merely the external world, but also the organs with which we grasp it are mere images of what truly exists, which itself remains unknown to us” (1876, 58).

So, according to the Lange-Vaihinger view, the objects of our experience are the joint product of affection by things in themselves and the operations of our physiological organization. This is supposed to have the conclusion that things in themselves are entirely unknowable, a fortiori not knowable through the methods of the empirical sciences. The problem becomes clear, then, when we ask what sort of thing ‘physiological organization’ is supposed to signify. If it refers to a thing in itself (the cognitive apparatus in itself), then the empirical sciences could establish nothing about it. In this case, the Langean argument is entirely impotent. If it refers to an appearance, then there is evidently a circle in the argument: the existence of appearances is supposed to be explained by the causal collaboration of things in themselves and the perceptual apparatus, but the perceptual apparatus is itself an appearance. Finally, if the physiological organization is both an appearance and a thing in itself, then the empirical sciences can in fact yield knowledge of at least some things in themselves. This, of course, is precisely what the argument is meant to forestall.

Vaihinger does little to assuage these problems in (1876). Sometimes he suggests that they are rooted in the fact that the very notion of a thing in itself involves a contradiction, albeit one which is “grounded in the contradictory constitution of our cognitive faculty itself” (1876, 34). In other words, Vaihinger seeks to view the issue of things in themselves along the lines of a Kantian antinomy—a conflict which arises necessarily from the nature of our reason, but which can at least be recognized as such. This, however, is of little help. For one, it is questionable whether the basic epistemological standpoint of (1876) can even be coherently stated without commitment to things in themselves. For another, a crucial feature of Kant’s antinomies is that they are resolved by his transcendental idealism, thus lending that doctrine an indirect proof (KrV, A 506/B 534). If the critical philosophy itself were to generate insoluble contradictions, that would be reason to reject, not accept, it. Vaihinger would continue to struggle with these issues in the PAO, which still aims to advance the broadly Langean project of naturalizing Kantianism. As we shall see in §6, however, Vaihinger’s conception of Kantianism undergoes a considerable shift, now taking the form of what he calls “idealistic positivism”, “positivist idealism”, or even (in what is evidently the first use of the phrase) “logical positivism.” For more on Vaihinger’s debt to Lange, see (Ceynowa 1993, 133–72; Heidelberger 2014).

3. Interpretation of Kant

Before returning to Vaihinger’s own positive philosophy, it is worth examining the task that occupied him intensely between the publication of (1876) and the PAO: the interpretation of Kant. The rise of Neo-Kantianism in the second half of the nineteenth century brought with it a renewed interest in the historical study of the critical philosophy. The majority of the works written during this period tended to approach Kant’s texts polemically, either with the aim of defending and “updating” them, or with the intention of refuting them. In terms of its scholarly sobriety, depth of textual analysis, and sensitivity to Kant’s immediate intellectual context, Vaihinger’s Commentary was unique. He notes that his approach will be that of those who analyze ancient texts “with philological sobriety and strict rigor … in order to determine their genuine meaning from an historical standpoint” (1881–92, 1:iii). The extent to which Vaihinger resists allowing his own philosophical commitments to influence his interpretation is indeed impressive. In fact, the very idea that understanding Kant’s texts might require a distinctively historical kind of approach seems to have been something of a novelty and is among Vaihinger’s lasting contributions to Kant scholarship.

There are other important, and more substantive, respects in which the Commentary was at the vanguard of Kant scholarship. The dominant trend in the interpretation of Kant’s theoretical philosophy throughout most of the nineteenth century had been the physio-psychological reading advanced by such figures as Schopenhauer, Jakob Fries, Friedrich Beneke, Jürgen Bona Meyer, Helmholtz, and of course Lange (Beiser 2018, 64–72, 81–84; 2014, 209–11, 460–63). According to this tradition, Kant’s main goal in the Critique was the discovery of the causal mechanisms underlying perception. Kant’s conception of the a priori was accordingly understood as referring to innate or ingrained properties of the psychological subject that played an active role in the construction of perception and acquisition of empirical knowledge. The first to break decisively with this tradition was probably Hermann Cohen. Cohen (1871) highlighted the epistemological side of Kant’s project—his interest in justifying various claims to knowledge. Accordingly, Cohen interpreted the a priori as referring to the logical, rather than psychological, conditions of knowledge (1871, 208). In this respect, Cohen’s influence on the Commentary was decisive. Vaihinger insists at the outset that Kant’s “philosophy is, in the first instance, epistemology [Erkenntnistheorie]” (1881–92, 1:8).

Vaihinger certainly does not, however, accept Cohen’s interpretation tout court. Though Cohen too had emphasized the need for historical sensitivity in interpreting Kant, his aims were ultimately still polemical: he believed more careful attention to Kant’s texts could exonerate his system from some of the perennial charges of inconsistency. For example, Kant’s doctrine that things in themselves exist independently of us and causally affect our minds to produce our representations had long been thought to violate his doctrine that the categories have validity only for objects of possible experience. Another charge, very much alive at the time, was that Kant’s key arguments for the non-spatiotemporality of things in themselves failed on the grounds that they showed, at best, only the subjectivity of space and time, not their mere subjectivity. According to this criticism, Kant overlooked the possibility that space and time might be both subjective forms of intuition and objective properties of things in themselves (the classic statement of this criticism is [Trendelenburg 1867]). Cohen’s response to both charges was to argue that interpreters were wrong to read Kant’s doctrine of things in themselves as positing a class of entities ontologically distinct from appearances. Instead, he maintained, the Kantian thing in itself is a mere “limiting concept” (Grenzbegriff), to whose actual existence Kant was never committed (1871, 252, 268).

Vaihinger, by contrast, does not hesitate to admit that the above objections are genuine problems for Kant. Indeed, he believes they pinpoint serious inconsistencies in Kant’s position. For example, against Cohen’s deflationary treatment of the thing in itself, Vaihinger notes, “Kant speaks thousands of times of affecting things in themselves; the impossibility of the existence and causal efficacy of things in themselves is, by contrast, merely a consequence that Kant’s readers must certainly draw from his theory of the categories, but which Kant himself hints at only seldom, and even then only timidly” (1881–92, 2:47) (the actual target of this remark is Fichte, but the point applies to Cohen’s reading too). Vaihinger’s goal in the Commentary is not to exonerate Kant from such inconsistencies, but to explain why he fell into them. In particular, Vaihinger argues that careful attention to both Kant’s pre-critical writings and his unpublished notes reveals that the Critique is really a “patchwork” of inconsistent views and arguments from various periods of Kant’s intellectual development. It consists of “geological strata which differ in both time of composition and content” (1902, 27). In the case of the Deduction, Vaihinger even claims to have been able to trace precisely each portion of the text to a particular series of notes from the decade between the Dissertation and the KrV (1902). In this respect, then, Kant’s great book resembles more the texts of Homer than the work of a single author, writing at a single time, with a single set of views.

More specifically, Vaihinger believes the development of Kant’s thought proceeds through six stages. From 1750–1760 Kant is a dogmatic rationalist after the Leibnizian-Wolffian model. Then, under the influence of Locke and Hume, he endorses empiricism from 1760–1764. With the publication of Dreams of a Spirit Seer, he begins to adopt the standpoint of the critical philosophy, but by the time of the 1770 Inaugural Dissertation, the influence of Leibniz (particularly of the Nouveaux Essais) reasserts itself. This reversion to dogmatism lasts until 1772 when he becomes a skeptic, again under the influence of Hume. Finally, he arrives at the mature critical standpoint with the publication of the Critique of Pure Reason in 1781 (1881–92, 1:47–49). Unfortunately, on Vaihinger’s reading, doctrines from the first five periods continue to figure in Kant’s arguments for and even the core tenets of the critical philosophy. It is this which explains the numerous inconsistencies besetting Kant’s system.

A clear example of Vaihinger’s basic approach is his treatment of Kant’s famous argument for the subjectivity of space from incongruent counterparts. In the Prolegomena, Kant argues thus:

There are no inner differences here [in the case of incongruent counterparts] that any understanding could merely think; and yet the differences are inner as far as the senses teach … one hand’s glove cannot be used on the other… . These objects are surely not representations of things as they are in themselves, and as the pure understanding would cognize them, rather, they are sensory intuitions, i.e., appearances. (4:286)

Roughly, Vaihinger reconstructs the argument as follows: (1) Some differences in the spatial properties of objects cannot be known through the pure understanding; (2) All differences between things in themselves can be known through the pure understanding; (C) Space is not a thing in itself. Premise (2), however, violates Kant’s noumenal ignorance doctrine, according to which things in themselves cannot be known through the understanding’s categories. Thus, Vaihinger concludes, “this assumption [that things in themselves are knowable through the pure understanding] is obviously anathema to Kantian criticism, and an archaic reversion to dogmatism” (1881–92, 2:528). More specifically, his claim is that the premise is residue from Kant’s view in the 1770 Dissertation, according to which things in themselves are objects as the pure understanding knows them (1881–92, 2:354, 453, 522).

Vaihinger’s reading of the KrV, and especially of the Deduction, has become known as the “patchwork thesis.” The patchwork reading has been influential in Anglophone scholarship, due largely to its adoption by Norman Kemp Smith (1918), but it remains controversial. Since the reading apparently requires us to assume that Kant failed to understand that combining views he knew were inconsistent with one another would produce a view that is itself inconsistent, it may be objected that, “if such a conclusion is true, we must say that Immanuel Kant was either abnormally stupid, or else that he took his thinking in a frivolous spirit” (Paton 1930, 157). However, the thesis that the Deduction, regardless of its precise method of composition, at least contains multiple inconsistent lines of argument, rather than a single unified argument, has found able defenders since Vaihinger (see e.g., Wolff 1963; Guyer 1987). For a recent challenge to this revised patchwork reading see (Allison 2015).

Vaihinger’s interpretive work during the 1880’s and 90’s did not extend to the other major part of the KrV, the Transcendental Dialectic. The PAO, however, includes a supplementary appendix in which Vaihinger lays out a novel interpretation of this chapter (PAO 201–35). The Dialectic was the part of the KrV that clearly had the most significant impact on Vaihinger’s own thought, and his interpretation of it is radical and interesting. It will therefore be worth briefly examining before turning to the main argument of the PAO.

In the Dialectic, Kant claims that certain concepts (e.g., those of an immaterial soul, freedom of the will, and God) have their root in pure reason. He argues that such concepts are mere “Ideas” (Ideen), in the sense that they are not constitutive principles of experience, and thus yield no “cognition” (Erkenntnis) of objects. Nevertheless, he suggests they are “not arbitrarily thought up” (A 327/B 384), but have a number of important “regulative” uses. In his works on moral philosophy, Kant goes on to argue that we can even have a certain kind of “practical cognition” of or “rational faith” in the Ideas. A natural interpretation of Kant’s position regarding the Ideas holds that we lack theoretical justification for believing that they refer to objects, and this lack of justification is such that we cannot claim knowledge of the existence or non-existence of such objects. Practical reason, however, may provide justification for the belief in (say) the existence of God, even if not of a sort sufficient to yield knowledge of him. Vaihinger disputes this reading. Instead, he interprets the Ideas as self-conscious fictions, which are nevertheless licensed by their theoretical and practical utility. This utility justifies us in “making use” of such concepts—looking, e.g., at nature as though it were the product of an intelligent designer—but never in believing they refer to objects. The interpretation relies crucially on two factors: first, a suggestive passage in which Kant calls Ideas “heuristic fictions” (A 771/B 799), and contrasts them with hypotheses; and second, Kant’s frequent use of ‘als ob’ and related locutions when describing the regulative employment of the Ideas. Both the distinction between fictions and hypotheses, and the idea of treating reality as if certain concepts appropriately applied to it are major themes that find extensive development in the PAO.

Vaihinger’s interpretation of the Ideas as fictions is highly controversial, and was already subjected to withering criticism in his own day by Erich Adickes (1927). Adickes accuses Vaihinger of ignoring countless passages that flatly contradict his fictionalist reading, and of misleadingly paraphrasing or eliding passages he does cite. In one way, at least, this criticism is unfair. Vaihinger explicitly concedes: “in Kant we also find in the same contexts many passages which permit or even demand a contrary interpretation… . Two tendencies are revealed, a critical and a dogmatic, a revolutionary and a conservative” (PAO 212). Vaihinger’s interpretation is not, unlike his work in the Commentary, intended to be strictly historical; he is rather presenting one strand in Kant’s thought that he finds especially promising. Adickes nevertheless makes a compelling case that even those passages on which Vaihinger does rely do not speak decisively in favor of his interpretation. Most contemporary Kant scholars follow Adickes in rejecting the fictionalist interpretation of the Ideas, though it continues to find some supporters (see e.g., Shaper 1966; Korsgaard 1996, 162–76; and esp. Rauscher 2015).

4. The Epistemology of the PAO

I turn now to Vaihinger’s chief systematic work, the PAO. That this work represents his attempt to continue Lange’s project of naturalizing Kantian epistemology (Heidelberger 2014, 51–55) may appear surprising given Vaihinger’s interpretation of Kant. Confusion here may be forestalled by attending to something Vaihinger himself says about the aim of the work:

There were two possible ways of working out the Neo-Kantianism of F.A. Lange. Either the Kantian standpoint could be developed, on the basis of a closer and more accurate study of Kant’s teaching, and this is what Cohen has done, or one could bring Lange’s Neo-Kantianism into relation with empiricism and positivism. This has been done in my philosophy of “As if,” which also leads to a more thorough study of Kant’s “As if” theory. (PAO xxii)

So Vaihinger distinguishes between the views maintained by the historical Kant, and Lange’s brand of Kantianism, which his own systematic work defends and develops.

But, the PAO also builds on Lange’s position in non-trivial ways. Vaihinger’s autobiographical essay “The Origin of the Philosophy of ‘As If’” points to two further significant influences, Arthur Schopenhauer and Charles Darwin. Vaihinger’s interest in Schopenhauer was sparked by the doctrine that the intellect is “a mere tool in the service of the will” (Schopenhauer 1958, 2:205). This view is based in part on Schopenhauer’s metaphysics, according to which the ultimate nature of reality is nothing other than a suprapersonal, aimless, quasi-volitional striving or “will.” Schopenhauer holds that this “will” expresses itself empirically in the striving of organic beings to preserve their individual existence, and the intellect has accordingly developed as a mere tool to aid more complex organisms in this task. Vaihinger believed that Darwin’s theory of natural selection had provided an empirical grounding for Schopenhauer’s hypothesis (PAO xviii). This was crucial, since Vaihinger’s own Kantianism prevented him from endorsing Schopenhauer’s speculative vitalist metaphysics (PAO xvii). At the same time, Vaihinger comes to view Kant’s doctrine of the essential limits of our cognition through this Schopenhauerian-Darwinian lens: the “limitations of human knowledge,” he says, are “a necessary and natural result of the fact that thought and knowledge are originally only a means, to attain the Life-purpose, so that their actual independence signifies a breaking-away from their original purpose; indeed, by the fact of this breaking-loose, thought is confronted by impossible problems” (PAO xviii). Vaihinger will use this idea to motivate his own fictionalism, and to provide a radical reinterpretation of Kantianism.

These various influences are drawn together in the introductory chapters of PAO. Here, Vaihinger presents a view of the “psyche” as a purely natural faculty, akin to a bodily organ, and bound by the same laws as the rest of the organic world. All psychic activities, including “scientific thought,” are “to be considered from the point of view of an organic function” (PAO 1). Like bodily organs, the psyche is designed (or rather, selected) to perform a particular role within the total economy of the organism. Its purpose is “to change and elaborate the perceptual material into those ideas, associations of ideas, and conceptual constructs,” which produce “a world [in which] objective happenings can be calculated and our behavior successfully carried out in relation to phenomena”(PAO 2). Its purpose is therefore not “to be a copy [Abbild] of reality,” but rather “an instrument for finding our way about more easily in this world” (PAO 22, translation altered). Though broadly in the spirit of Schopenhauer and Darwin, this instrumentalist conception of the mind is, as Ceynowa has argued (1993, 35–132), also more specifically indebted to the nineteenth century psychologist Adolf Horwicz.

Whatever its exact provenance, Vaihinger’s basic thought is that what is selected for in the evolution of our cognitive capacities is the ability to aid us in carrying out activities that are useful for the purposes of survival. Specifically, Vaihinger seems to reason that any course of action—say, procuring food for oneself—involves at least some minimal degree of planning, and that in turn requires some basic ability to predict what the future will be like, and to know how it will be different if we choose to φ rather than to ψ. Thus, he suggests that the purpose of thought is “to calculate those events that occur without our intervention and to realize our impulses appropriately” (PAO 3). For the bare purposes of carrying out those actions necessary for survival, Vaihinger is claiming, the intellect would not have to be a reliable guide to the way the world really is. On the contrary, fictions may have an indispensable role to play here.

What are we to make of this sort of argument? One might suggest that the fact that our cognitive apparatus is a product of natural selection supports, rather than undermines, the idea that it is a reliable guide to the way the world is. For, being mistaken about how things stand in one’s environment is surely an impediment, not an aid, to survival. Vaihinger would likely respond that this only shows that we have to get the right things about the world right. It does not mean that our total image of the world is, or even could be, a copy of reality, accurate in all its details. Vaihinger’s view is that the picture of the world that is easiest to work with will depart from reality in certain crucial respects.

One may now wonder, however, what is to be made of Vaihinger’s near exclusive emphasis in PAO on fictions in the natural sciences and mathematics. After all, the theorizing in fundamental physics is a rather different matter than determining how to find a meal, and even if such theories turn out to be useful down the line, it seems that life would (and does) manage just fine without them. Here, Vaihinger relies on another Darwinian idea, which he calls the “Law of Preponderance of the Means over the End,” according to which “means which serve a purpose often undergo a more complete development than is necessary for the attainment of their purpose” (PAO xxix). In the language of contemporary evolutionary biology, scientific thought is like a “spandrel.” At the same time, Vaihinger is keen to emphasize the connection between scientific theorizing and more humdrum cognitive processes. He adopts the broadly Kantian view that what is given to us in experience is merely a “chaos of sensations” (PAO 117), which needs to be ordered and refined by the logical functions of thought, or categories. For example, the repeated co-occurrence of sensations of a branching shape and sensations of green leads the psyche to postulate a relation of substantial inherence between a thing or substance (the tree) and its attribute (green) (PAO 122–23). However, he argues in a manner evocative of Berkeley, the notion of a substance is incoherent since it implies the existence of a bare substrate with no properties whatsoever (PAO 125–26). The fiction is nevertheless justified, he suggests, because it facilitates the recognition of regularities in the occurrences of our sensations, and the communication of these regularities to others (PAO 130). Given that our most immediate relation to the world is thus mediated by the categories (which also include the relations of part-whole, cause-effect, inter alia), it is natural to suppose that these fictions will resurface in our more sophisticated theories, e.g., in the form of the atom (a simple material substance). Vaihinger is not suggesting that genuine knowledge that serves no particular practical aim is impossible; but he is suggesting that our total theoretic image of the world is ultimately limited by those fictions that have been preserved as most adaptive for our basic practical aims (PAO 130).

Vaihinger’s emphasis on the deep connection between cognition and action have led many interpreters to liken his views to those of the American pragmatists (e.g., Appiah 2017, 4; Koridze 2014; Fine 1993, 4; and esp. Ceynowa 1993). Others have disputed this connection (Bouriau 2016). Vaihinger himself tells us that fictionalism and pragmatism share important similarities, but nevertheless are distinguished by the fact that pragmatism accepts, whereas fictionalism rejects, the principle that “an idea which is found to be useful in practice proves thereby that it is also true in theory” (PAO viii). So, if one defines a pragmatist narrowly as someone who endorses this Jamesian definition of truth, Vaihinger is no pragmatist; his core contention is that “we may not argue from the utility of a psychical and logical construct that it is right” (PAO 51). Nevertheless, given Vaihinger’s emphasis on the inseparability of practical and theoretical thought, his view that the use of a concept can be justified on purely practical grounds, and so forth, it does not seem unfair to liken him to the pragmatist tradition in a wider sense.

5. The Nature of Vaihinger’s Fictionalism

Central to Vaihinger’s project in the PAO is a distinction between two sorts of fictions: (1) what he (somewhat inaptly) terms ‘semi-fictions,’ which are “methods and concepts based upon a simple deviation from reality” (PAO 59); and (2) ‘real’ or ‘genuine fictions’ which are self-contradictory concepts (ibid.). In other words, semi-fictions are statements or propositions that happen not to correspond to the world; genuine fictions are those that claim something impossible about the world.

An important example the first kind is what Vaihinger calls the “abstractive” or “neglective” fiction (PAO, 14–17, 140–41). Such fictions are roughly what we have in mind today when we speak of ‘idealized models’ (contemporary philosophers of science sometimes distinguish further between “Aristotelian” and “Galilean” methods of idealization. See the article on Models in Science. Vaihinger does not clearly distinguish these). A standard example is the model of the planetary system given in classical mechanics:

In physics we find such a fiction in the fact that masses of undeniable extension, e.g., the sun and the earth, in connection with the derivation of certain basic concepts of mechanics and the calculation of their reciprocal attraction are reduced to points or concentrated into points (gravitational points) in order, by means of this fiction, to facilitate the presentation of the more composite phenomena. Such a neglect of elements is especially resorted to where a very small factor is assumed to be zero. (PAO 16)

The idea is familiar. If what we are interested in is determining the trajectory and velocity of the planets around the Sun, then it is useful to ignore or iron-out a wide variety of features of the system, e.g., the size of the planets, the presence of friction, the gravitational pull that the planets and their moons exert on one another. Here, then, we evidently have a clear-cut case in which “pretending” that certain things are true of the solar system can greatly aid our aim of prediction. As Vaihinger notes, we get the “right” results here because the properties of the system we are ignoring have only a negligible influence on the phenomena we are interested in studying. The solar system behaves nearly just as it would if the planets were mass points, etc. This suggests a counterfactual understanding of fictions: by reasoning from assumptions that are false—sometimes radically false—at the actual world, we may still arrive at conclusions that are true, or quite nearly true, at the actual world. If those results are arrived at more efficiently by entertaining the fiction, then the fiction is justified.

If this is Vaihinger’s view, however, it would appear to face a serious difficulty. For, his main interest is in the so-called “real fictions,” which, as noted above, are not merely false, but contradictory. Since everything follows from a contradiction, any counterfactual whose antecedent is a real fiction will be trivially true, and this is to say they cannot possibly do the work Vaihinger envisions (Appiah 2017, 11; Cohen 1923, 485). One way to respond, here, is to note that the logic with which Vaihinger operates is still essentially the version of Aristotelian logic found in Kant and throughout much of the nineteenth century. Such pre-twentieth-century logics often implicitly reject the principle ex contradictione quodlibet. See, e.g., the discussion of conditionals in the influential Port-Royal Logic (Arnauld and Nicole 1996, 100).

Relatedly, but from a more contemporary perspective, one might read Vaihinger as anticipating some recent views on counterpossible reasoning (Pollard 2010). Consider the following counterfactual conditionals:

  • (1) If Fermat’s last theorem were false, then no argument for it would be sound.
  • (2) If Fermat’s last theorem were false, then Andrew Wiles would deserve eternal fame.
  • (3) If intuitionistic logic were correct, then the Law of Excluded Middle would fail.
  • (4) If intuitionistic logic were correct, then the Law of Excluded Middle would hold.

Intuitively, (1) and (3) are true while (2) and (4) are false. Moreover, someone who rejects intuitionism might well wish to argue against intuitionism by relying on something like (3), even though what the antecedent states is, by her lights, impossible. These facts have led some to suppose that (1) and (3) are not merely true, but non-trivially true (for more on these sorts of arguments, see the entry for Impossible Worlds). Vaihinger’s fictionalism might thus be read as adding a heap of substantive examples to the list of alleged non-trivial counterpossible conditionals.

This sort of reading seems supported by examples that Vaihinger himself gives, and the theory of “fictive judgments” he bases on them. One of Vaihinger’s favorite examples is:

  • (5) If the circle were a polygon, then it would be subject to the laws of rectilinear figures. (PAO, 193)

Though (5)’s antecedent and consequent both state something impossible, Vaihinger contends it forms the basis of Archimedes’s proof of the area of a circle using the method of exhaustion (PAO 177). Here, then, is a case in which a proof no one would wish to call trivial allegedly proceeds from a contradictory assumption. Generalizing, Vaihinger claims, “in a hypothetical connection [sc. conditional proposition], not only real and possible but also unreal and impossible things can be introduced, because it is merely the connection between the two presuppositions and not their actual reality that is being expressed” (PAO 193–94).

Anthony Appiah rejects this kind of interpretation, on the grounds that such counterpossibles are unintelligible (2017, 11–17; cf. Wilholt 2014, 112). Instead, he suggests Vaihinger’s talk of useful contradictions is more fruitfully understood as referring to the use of multiple mutually incompatible models. In particular, the point is that we may find it useful to regard certain phenomena in one way for some purposes, but in another, incompatible way for other purposes. Even when it turns out to be useful to combine incompatible models for understanding one and the same phenomenon (or range of phenomena), Appiah suggests, Vaihinger need not be committed to a paraconsistent logic. Rather, drawing on (Cartwright 1999), he suggests that using a model does not involve drawing out each of its logical implications, but instead a kind of skill of “knowing which lines of inference one should and which one should not follow” (2017, 13). Moreover, because our main aim in using models is not ultimately to obtain the truth about the physical world, but to get around in it, there is no reason to avoid such inconsistency (2017, 14–17).

Appiah’s interpretation allows those who are wary of paraconsistent logics to salvage something philosophically promising from Vaihinger’s talk of contradictions. It also perhaps has the advantage of doing greater justice to the multifarious character of Vaihinger’s theory of fictions. For, while Vaihinger claims that the fictive judgment has a “hypothetical element,” he does not simply reduce fictive judgments to conditionals (PAO 194). On the other hand, the interpretation stumbles against texts in which Vaihinger suggests that the contradictions of real fictions exist within theories or models, not between them. For example, the concept of a (classical) atom is supposed to be a real fiction because it is absurd to suppose something which occupies space, but nevertheless has no extension. This is to say that the atomistic fiction is itself contradictory, not merely that it conflicts with other ways of modeling matter. Another way of putting the worry is to note that the interpretation blurs the apparently sharp distinction between semi-fictions and real fictions: any model will be a real fiction as long as we use it together with another model incompatible with it.

For yet another approach, which denies that Vaihinger has or needs a general account of how contradictory fictions can be fruitful, see (Fine 1993, 9–11). On this reading, Vaihinger is interested only in surveying actual scientific practice, and revealing that, as a matter of fact, it does make fruitful use of real fictions; the question of how this is possible is beside the point. There is something to this characterization of Vaihinger’s procedure, which trades more in examples than in general pronouncements. However, it will also be difficult for proponents of this reading to explain passages like these: “This purpose [of thought] can only be that of facilitating conceptual activity, of effecting a safe and rapid connection of sensations. What we have to show, therefore, is how fictional methods and constructs render this possible” (PAO 52, emphasis added); “the philosophy of as if shows that and why these false and contradictory representations are still useful” (1921a, 532, emphasis added). Here, Vaihinger seems to indicate that his purpose is not just to enumerate instances of useful fictions, but to explain how and why they are useful.

In addition to Vaihinger’s specific analysis of fictions, one might wonder about his precise brand of fictionalism. Contemporary philosophers distinguish between “hermeneutic fictionalism” and “revolutionary fictionalism” (see the entry on Fictionalism). Hermeneutic fictionalism holds that certain domains of discourse are fictional, in the sense that their participants are not aiming at literal truth, but only seeming to do so. Some textual evidence speaks in favor of reading Vaihinger as a hermeneutic fictionalist. For example, he writes: “the axiom and the hypothesis … endeavor to be expressions of reality. The fiction, on the other hand, is not such an expression nor does it claim to be one” (PAO 60). And Vaihinger’s theory of the fictive judgment maintains that many judgements of the syntactic form ‘A is B’ are properly analyzed as, or merely elliptical for, ‘A is to be regarded as if it were B’—“the ‘is’ is a very short abbreviation for an exceedingly complicated train of thought” (PAO 195). On the other hand, in many places Vaihinger clearly indicates that he thinks we often treat what would be better regarded as fictional discourse as aiming at truth. Many disputes, he suggests, can be resolved by reinterpreting such discourse fictionally. Thus, for example, proponents of classical atomism have been wrong to think that their theory is true, but their opponents have also been wrong to believe that the theory should therefore be given up (PAO 53). He makes an analogous point about the dispute between substantivalists and relationalists over the nature of space (PAO 170–71). So, Vaihinger appears to be a revolutionary fictionalist at least about some discourses in which he is interested.

6. The As-If Philosophy and Kantianism

The most obvious aim of the PAO is to establish the centrality of fictions to our cognitive life. But there is also a broader, and in some ways more ambitious, aim to the book—to provide the kind of “corrected Kantianism” Lange had tried to establish in the History of Materialism. As we saw above, Vaihinger views Kant’s system as riddled with inconsistencies, which arise from the alleged fact that Kant retains certain elements of his pre-critical dogmatism even after adopting the critical standpoint. The As-If philosophy can be seen as an attempt to retain what Vaihinger takes to be Kant’s core philosophical insights, while removing the inconsistencies that beset the surrounding system in which those insights were originally couched.

As was noted above, a major problem for Vaihinger’s early view, as for many of the Neo-Kantians of his day, was the status of the thing in itself. Vaihinger now consistently rejects this notion, predictably labelling it a fiction. Given that things in themselves are supposed to be transcendent substances that causally affect us, this rejection follows immediately from his view that the concepts of substance and cause are themselves fictions (PAO 55–56). True to form, however, Vaihinger still holds that the concept of things in themselves has some utility: as Cohen had argued, it serves as a “limiting concept” (PAO 55), ensuring that we restrict our inquiries to what is empirically given to us. As we have seen, Vaihinger puts an instrumentalist spin on this Kantian idea; all knowledge is empirical in the sense that our guiding cognitive aim is the prediction and control of empirical phenomena, not correspondence to objective reality (though, once again, it bears emphasizing that Vaihinger does not seem to be claiming that such correspondence is impossible, only that it is incidental to our main epistemic aim).

Vaihinger’s rejection of the thing in itself is implicit in the general label he gives to his own philosophical view, “idealistic positivism.” The ‘positivism’ here is in part an epistemological, and in part a metaphysical thesis. The epistemological thesis is that “what is given consists only of sensations” (PAO 124; cf. xxviii). The metaphysical thesis is that “what we usually term reality consists of our sensational contents [Empfindungsinhalte]” (PAO xxx, emphasis added); “Nothing exists except sensations” (PAO 44, emphasis added; cf. 1921a, 532–33). This extreme view (for which Vaihinger does not argue) has the immediate conclusion that all knowledge is of appearances, since nothing exists except appearances.

In addition to this radical kind of empiricism, the PAO continues to uphold the broadly Kantian view that cognition is necessarily limited, or, as Vaihinger sometimes puts it, that there is no “identity between thought and being.” However, it is no longer limited in the sense of being cut off from some transcendent realm of things in themselves, but in being essentially incomplete. The point is best appreciated by attending to another distinction central to the PAO—that between fictions and hypotheses. Hypotheses (not to be confused with so-called “hypothetical judgments”) are judgments that are “problematic” in form, i.e., which have the form ‘it is possible that A is B’ (where the relevant sense of possibility is epistemic). Thus, if the judgment ‘matter is composed of atoms’ is a hypothesis, the person making it is maintaining that it may be true, and holds out hope that it may be confirmed or falsified in the future. By contrast, and as we have seen already, the fictive judgment has the form ‘A is to be regarded as if it were B (when in fact A is not B).’ Since Vaihinger holds that such judgments can be licensed by their practical utility, and because it is our practical aims that ultimately guide and constrain theoretical inquiry, Vaihinger infers that every theory will necessarily involve some fictions; not even the best theory will consist entirely of hypotheses, much less true hypotheses.

The distinction between hypotheses and fictions is important for understanding Vaihinger’s revised brand of Kantianism in another way as well. In the Dialectic, Kant had argued that dogmatic metaphysics necessarily leads reason into a series of conflicts, or “antinomies,” with itself. It can produce, that is, equally valid arguments putatively establishing both that freedom exists and that freedom does not exist, that matter is composed of simples and that matter is not composed of simples, and so on. Kant claims that these conflicts are “natural” to reason, since reason has an innate drive to know the “unconditioned.” He argues, however, that these conflicts can be avoided if (and only if) one recognizes the non-spatiotemporality of things in themselves. Transcendental idealism allows us to maintain that in some of the antinomial conflicts it is possible for both the thesis and antithesis to be false without contradiction, and that in others it is possible for both to be true without contradiction. The critical philosophy thus has the distinct advantage of being able to explain how certain apparently insoluble metaphysical debates arise, and of providing the only possible resolution of those debates. Vaihinger similarly posits a natural human tendency to confuse, not appearances and things in themselves, but fictions and hypotheses. Many statements that are introduced into our discourse as fictions end up being taken for hypotheses. And vice versa, many propositions that are originally intended as hypotheses are retained with mere fictional significance. Vaihinger calls this the “law of ideational shifts” (Gesetz der Ideenverschiebung) (PAO 92–99). Seemingly intractable debates in the sciences can be resolved, he maintains, by systematically recognizing this distinction. Thus, for instance, certain arguments against atomism are cogent if intended to establish that atomism is false (since it is contradictory); but they are erroneous if intended to imply that atomism should be rejected. Likewise, arguments for atomism are sure to fail if they are meant to establish the existence of atoms; but they are perfectly acceptable if they only aim to show that atomistic discourse is useful and indeed essential for scientific practice. For, the atomist’s discourse is best understood as a conscious fiction. As Vaihinger suggests, the confusion arises from ignoring the essential practical dimension of thought (PAO xviii).

How successful is Vaihinger in resolving the alleged tensions in Kant’s critical philosophy? On one level, straightforwardly rejecting things in themselves and endorsing an ontology only of sensations clearly avoids the supposed problem of attributing causal efficacy to transcendent objects. On another, however, it would appear that Vaihinger cannot so easily reject things in themselves without causing problems for his basic epistemological view. For one, an obvious question arises as to what it is that has the sensational contents that serve as Vaihinger’s ontological basics. For another, we have seen that Vaihinger’s arguments in the Introduction hold that the mind or “psyche” operates on sensory stimuli, and that it has certain ends to which fictions are expedient means. If nothing exists except sensations, then it seems we must read Vaihinger’s talk of ‘mind’ loosely, perhaps as referring to some particular kind of collection of or relation between sensations. But, one is tempted to say, it is simply incoherent to suggest that sensations themselves are the bearers of sensations, that they have aims, that they operate on and systematize other sensations, etc. At the very least, “operation” would seem to be a causal notion, so that Vaihinger’s causal fictionalism threatens to undermine the arguments at the foundation of his system. Vaihinger sometimes attempts to respond to these sorts of worries. He suggests, for example, “From our point of view the sequence of sensations constitutes ultimate reality, and two poles are mentally added, subject and object” (PAO 56); “nothing exists except sensations which we analyze into two poles, subject and object … . In other words, the ego and the ‘thing in itself’ are fictions” (PAO 44). The question of course is who the we is here that is doing the mental adding. Perhaps Vaihinger intends such talk to itself be fictional. But he cannot hold that without undermining the very motivation for his fictionalism. Nor does Vaihinger ever make clear and precise exactly what “poles” of sensations are supposed to be.

One may also worry that, throughout the PAO, Vaihinger has reverted to a crudely psychologistic version of Kantianism that both he and Cohen had earlier rejected. On this score, Vaihinger is more easily defended. Though his fictionalism draws on certain biological and psychological theories, his main concern is still epistemological: “Apart from the general warning not to confuse fictions with reality, we may also call attention to the fact that every fiction must be able to justify itself, i.e., must justify itself by what it accomplishes for the progress of science” (PAO 79). There would arguably be a confusion if Vaihinger held that the fact that certain concepts (or dispositions to form them) are psychologically innate justifies us in believing that there exist objects exemplifying them. But that is precisely the view he wishes to reject. The appeal to the theory of natural selection is intended to suggest a pragmatic, rather than evidential, justification for the use of those concepts. In this sense, Vaihinger sees himself as drawing on Kant’s method of justifying the concepts of God, freedom, and immortality on practical grounds, but extending it beyond the domain of moral philosophy.


Primary Literature

Works by Vaihinger

  • 1876, Hartmann, Dühring, und Lange: zur Geschichte der deutschen Philosophie im XIX. Jahrhundert. Ein kritischer Essay, Iserlohn: Baedeker.
  • 1881–92, Commentar zu Kants Kritik der reinen Vernunft, Stuttgart: Spemann.
  • 1902, Die transcendentale Deduktion der Kategorien, Halle: Niemeyer.
  • 1905, Nietzsche als Philosoph, Berlin: Reuter & Reichard.
  • 1921a, “Ist die Philosophie des Als Ob Skeptizismus?” Annalen der Philosophie, 2: 532–37.
  • 1921b, “Wie die Philosophie des Als-Ob entstand,” in Schmidt (ed.), 1921, Die deutsche Philosophie der Gegenwart in Selbstdarstellungen, Leipzig: Meiner.
  • 1922, Die Philosophie des Als Ob: System der theoretischen, praktischen und religiösen Fiktionen der Menschheit auf Grund eines idealistischen Positivismus. Mit einem Anhang über Kant und Nietzsche, siebente und achte Auflage, Leipzig: Meiner.
  • 1925, The Philosophy of “As If”: A System of the Theoretical, Practical and Religious Fictions of Mankind, translation of Die Philosophie des Als Ob by C.K. Ogden, New York: Harcourt, Brace & Co.; reprinted, Petoskey, MI: Random Shack, 2015.

Other Primary Literature

  • Cohen, H., 1871, Kants Theorie der Erfahrung, Berlin: Dümmler.
  • Kant, I., 1900–, Kants gesammelte Schriften, 29 volumes, edited by Königlich-Preussische Akademie der Wissenschaften, Berlin: de Gruyter.
  • –––, 1998, Critique of Pure Reason, tr. Paul Guyer and Allen Wood, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2002, Prolegomena to any Future Metaphysics that will be able to Come Forward as a Science, tr. Gary Hatfield, in Allison and Heath (eds.), 2002, Theoretical Philosophy after 1781, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lange, F.A., 1873–75, Geschichte des Materialismus und Kritik seiner Bedeutung in der Gegenwart, 2 volumes, Iserlohn: Baedecker.
  • Trendelenburg, A., 1867, “Ueber eine Lücke in Kants Beweis von der ausschliessende Subjektivität des Raums und der Zeit,” Historische Beitrage zur Philosophie (Volume 3), Berlin: Bethge.

Secondary Literature

  • Adickes, Erich, 1927, Kant und die Als-Ob-Philosophie, Stuttgart: F. Frommann.
  • Appiah, K.A., 2017, As If: Idealization and Ideals, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Arnauld, A. and P. Nicole, 1996, Logic, or, the Art of Thinking, tr. Jill Buroker, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Beiser, F.C., 2013, Late German Idealism: Trendelenburg and Lotze, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2014, The Genesis of Neo-Kantianism, 1796–1880, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2015, After Hegel: German Philosophy from 1840 to 1900, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 2017, Weltschmerz: Pessimism in German Philosophy, 1860–1900, Oxford: Oxford University Press
  • –––, 2018, Hermann Cohen: An Intellectual Biography, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bouriau, C., 2016, “Hans Vaihingers Die Philosophie des Als-Ob: Pragmatismus oder Fiktionalismus?”, Philosophia Scientiae, 20: 77–93.
  • Cartwright, N., 1999, The Dappled World, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Ceynowa, K., 1993, Zwischen Pragmatismus und Fiktionalismus: Hans Vaihingers Philosophie des ‘Als Ob,’, Würzburg: Köngishausen & Neumann.
  • Cohen, M.R., 1923, “On the Logic of Fiction,” The Journal of Philosophy, 18: 477–88.
  • Fine, A., “Fictionalism,” Midwest Studies in Philosophy, 18: 1–18.
  • Guyer, P., 1987, Kant and the Claims of Knowledge, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hatfield, G., 1990, The Natural and the Normative: Theories of Spatial Perception from Kant to Helmholtz, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Heidelberger, M., 2014, “Hans Vaihinger und Friedrich Albert Lange. Mit einem Ausblick auf Ludwig Wittgenstein,” in Neuber (ed.), 2014, Fiktion und Fiktionalismus: Beiträge zu Hans Vaihingers Philosophie des Als Ob, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.
  • Kemp Smith, N., 1918, A Commentary to Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason, London: Macmillan and Co.
  • Koridze, G.B., 2014, “Vaihinger, James und die alten Athener,” in Neuber (ed.), 2014, Fiktion und Fiktionalismus: Beiträge zu Hans Vaihingers Philosophie des Als Ob, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.
  • Korsgaard, C.M., 1996, Creating the Kingdom of Ends, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Paton, H.J., 1930, “Is the Transcendental Deduction a Patchwork?”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 30: 143–78.
  • Pollard, S., 2010, “’As-If’ Reasoning in Vaihinger and Pasch,” Erkenntnis, 73: 83–95.
  • Rauscher, F., 2015, Naturalism and Realism in Kant’s Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Schopenhauer, A., 1958, The World as Will and Representation (Volume 2), tr. E.F.J. Payne, New York: Dover.
  • Shaper, E., 1966, “The Kantian Thing-in-Itself as a Philosophical Fiction,” The Philosophical Quarterly, 16: 233–43.
  • Simon, G., 2014, “Leben und Wirken Hans Vaihingers,” in Neuber (ed.), 2014, Fiktion und Fiktionalismus: Beiträge zu Hans Vaihingers Philosophie des Als Ob, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.
  • Wilholt, T., 2014, “Fiktionalismus als Philosophie der Mathematik,” in Neuber (ed.), 2014, Fiktion und Fiktionalismus: Beiträge zu Hans Vaihingers Philosophie des Als Ob, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.
  • Wolff, R.P., 1963, Kant’s Theory of Mental Activity, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

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