Wilhelm Windelband

First published Mon May 18, 2020; substantive revision Thu Jun 13, 2024

Wilhelm Windelband (1848–1915) was a German neo-Kantian philosopher. He is considered the founding father of the Baden (or Southwest) school of Neo-Kantianism. The Baden school included his student and successor at Heidelberg, Heinrich Rickert (1863–1936), and Rickert’s student Emil Lask (1875–1915) as its core members. Alongside his contemporary Hermann Cohen (1842–1918)—the founder of the Marburg school of Neo-Kantianism—Windelband is a central proponent of the anti-psychologistic interpretation of Kant that became dominant in German academic philosophy from the 1880s onwards, and that constituted the backbone of “orthodox” neo-Kantianism in the late nineteenth century.

Windelband’s main philosophical contribution consists in reformulating Kant’s transcendental approach in terms of a “philosophy of values” that focuses philosophical analysis on questions of normativity. Although Windelband thinks of his project as an anti-metaphysical “scientific philosophy”, he is keen to secure for philosophy a role that is independent of the special sciences. He finds the grounds for philosophy’s independence in its formal-teleological method, and in its concern with a quaestio juris, rather than a quaestio facti. That is, philosophy deals with questions of justification, it does not determine matters of fact.

Windelband is well-known for having introduced a distinction between the “nomothetic method” of the natural sciences and the “idiographic method” of the historical disciplines. His argument that history is a science [Wissenschaft] that captures the unique, unrepeatable and individual character of reality has been highly relevant for subsequent debates on historical method.

He also made a name for himself in the history of philosophy by pioneering the method of structuring the historical presentation in terms of fundamental philosophical problems, rather than as a chronology of individual thinkers.

Windelband was a marvelous essayist. He developed his ideas not in the format of a larger systematic work, but in a series of addresses and individual papers, a selection of which was published in his famous Präludien [Preludes] in 1883. The genre of Windelband’s writings does not lend itself to the development of a philosophical system, and he often changes the emphasis, framing, and terminology of his claims and arguments from one essay to the next. Nevertheless, he was a rigorous thinker. This entry provides a rational reconstruction of the systematic insights that Windelband developed in his various addresses and essays, and groups them around the central themes that reoccur throughout his oeuvre. With respect to many of these themes—the anti-psychologistic interpretation of Kant, the fact-value distinction, the question of historical method, and the conception of the history of philosophy—Windelband was a highly influential contributor to the philosophical landscape of his time. Although he did not develop a detailed and encompassing philosophical system like his student Rickert, or the neo-Kantians of the Marburg school, most notably Ernst Cassirer (1874–1945), his ideas shaped subsequent debates on these issues more profoundly than is often acknowledged.

1. Biographical Sketch

Wilhelm Windelband was born in 1848 in Potsdam, Germany. His father, Johann Friedrich Windelband was a state secretary for the Province of Brandenburg. Windelband studied in Jena, Berlin, and Göttingen, attending lectures by Kuno Fischer (1824–1907) in Jena and studying with Hermann Lotze (1817–1881) in Göttingen. Fischer and Lotze would deeply influence Windelband’s philosophical thinking, as well as his work as a historian of philosophy.

In 1870, Windelband completed his dissertation on Die Lehren vom Zufall [Doctrines of chance] under Lotze’s supervision. The following year he served as a soldier in the German-French war. After his military service, he completed his habilitation in Leipzig and took up a position as “Privatdozent” there. His habilitation was published in 1873 under the title Ueber die Gewissheit der Erkenntniss: eine psychologisch-erkenntnisstheoretische Studie [On the certainty of knowledge: a psychological-epistemological study]. In 1874, Windelband married Martha Wichgraf with whom he would have four children.

Two years later, Windelband became professor (ordinarius) of “inductive philosophy” in Zürich. He lectured on psychology before taking up a position as professor of philosophy in Freiburg im Breisgau in 1877. In 1882 he accepted an offer from the University of Strasbourg. While his inaugural lectures in Zürich and Freiburg had centered on the relation between psychology and philosophy, his works from the Strasbourg period develop his core themes in the philosophy of values and the philosophy of history. Windelband served as “Rektor” of the University of Strasbourg in 1894/95 and 1897/98. He remained in Strasbourg until 1903, when he accepted a call from the University of Heidelberg. Between 1905 and 1908 he served as representative of the University of Heidelberg in the Baden “Landtag”. He was a member of the Berlin Academy of Sciences, and of the Academies of Sciences of Göttingen, Bayern and Heidelberg. He remained in Heidelberg and taught there until his death in 1915.

2. From Kant to the Philosophy of Values

Windelband’s views on normativity are strongly influenced by his teacher Lotze. In his Logic (1874), Lotze distinguishes between psychological laws which determine how thinking proceeds as a matter of fact, and logical laws, which are normative laws and prescribe how thinking ought to proceed (Lotze 1874: §x; §332, §337). This distinction also corresponds to a distinction between act and content. Lotze observes that “ideas” do occur in us as acts or events of the mind. But their content does not consist in such acts, is not reducible to mental activity, and does not exist in the way empirical processes and entities may be said to exist. It is not real, but “valid” (Lotze 1874: §§314–318).

The distinction between the factual and the normative would become the cornerstone of Windelband’s “philosophy of values”. In his early writings, however, Windelband does not yet embrace this distinction. In his habilitation thesis Über die Gewißheit der Erkenntnis (1873), he argues that logic is a normative discipline, but that it needs to be put on a psychological basis. This is because the justification of our knowledge claims is always dependent on and relative to specific epistemic purposes which, in turn, are given psychologically. Although he criticizes the identification of the conditions of knowledge with psychophysical processes, he does think of psychology and logic or epistemology as continuous with one another. His 1875 “Die Erkenntnislehre unter dem völkerpsychologischen Gesichtspunkte” [“The theory of knowledge from the perspective of folk-psychology”] which was published in Moritz Lazarus’ and Heyman Steinthal’s Zeitschrift für Völkerpsychologie und Sprachwissenschaft [Journal of folk psychology and linguistics], is more radical. It denies that logical norms are independent of the conscious mind and claims that the origins of logical norms are to be found in the social history of humankind: the principle of contradiction emerges in situations of social conflict together with the distinction between true and false beliefs; and the law of sufficient reason comes into being when conflicts between rival views are no longer settled by brute force. On this picture, logical principles exist only when humans cognize them. There is no boundary between psychological acts and objective logical laws, or between actual historical acceptance and normative validity.

This is precisely the type of thinking that Windelband will later reject as “psychologistic”, “historicist”, and “relativist” (1883: 116–117, 132). It is not clear what led Windelband to this change of view, but a deeper engagement with the Critique of Pure Reason and with the Kant scholarship of his time, in particular with works by Kuno Fischer (1860), Herman Cohen (1871), and Friedrich Paulsen (1875), seem to have factored in. The clear contours of Windelband’s anti-psychologistic interpretation of Kant emerge for the first time in his 1877 paper “Über die verschiedenen Phasen der Kantischen Lehre vom Ding-an-sich” [“On the different stages of the Kantian doctrine of the thing-in-itself”]. In this essay, Windelband argues against the idea, held by prominent figures of the “back-to-Kant” movement like Friedrich Albert Lange (1828–1875) and Hermann von Helmholtz (1821–1894), that knowledge emerges from an interaction between subject and object. According to their view, the object affects the subject’s mind, while the subject provides the a priori cognitive structures that organize representations. These a priori structures are innate as they consist in the psychophysical constitution of the human sensory apparatus and mind. Cohen’s critique of this (mis)interpretation focuses on the concept of the a priori and the question of objectivity (Cohen 1871). Windelband, in contrast, takes the problem of the thing-in-itself and the concept of truth as his starting points. His critique of the subject-object-interaction model leads him to an immanent conception of truth, according to which truth consists in the normative rules according to which our judgments ought to be formed. The immanent concept of truth thus shifts the focus of philosophical analysis on the universal and necessary “rules” that ground our judgments.

The 1877 essay gives a genetic account of the development of Kant’s views about the thing-in-itself from the Inaugural Dissertation (1770) to the second edition of the Critique of Pure Reason (1787). This genetic reconstruction is supposed to reveal the underlying philosophical problems and motivations that drove Kant’s thinking, as well as the inner tensions that, according to Windelband, permeate critical philosophy. In particular, Windelband identifies a “gulf” (1877: 225) between Kant’s critique of knowledge and the metaphysics of morals, as well as a tension between the psychological account of the faculties, and Kant’s mature anti-psychologism. He distinguishes between four phases in Kant’s thinking about the thing-in-itself, and argues that residues of the latter three stages are present in both editions of the Critique (1781; 1787) and in the Prolegomena (1783).

The first phase, Windelband argues, is that of the Inaugural Dissertation (1770). Kant adopts Leibniz’s distinction between noumena and phenomena while formulating a genuinely novel thought: he introduces the psychological distinction between receptive sensibility and the spontaneous intellect. This distinction allows him to maintain the claim that, unlike intuitions, concepts relate to things-in-themselves (1877: 240–241).

In the second phase, Kant concerns himself more deeply with the question how the concepts of the understanding can relate to objects. He is driven to the insight that

[w]e can only have a priori knowledge of that which we produce by the lawlike forms of our rational activities [Vernunfthandlungen]. (1877: 246)

Here, Windelband follows Fischer’s claim that the categories of the understanding are a priori valid for experience because they produce or “make” it (Fischer 1860). Because the understanding cannot “make” the thing-in-itself, the thing-in-itself cannot be known.

According to Windelband, Kant then proceeds to inquire why we are even assuming the existence of things-in-themselves if we cannot know them. Here he enters his third, most radical phase. Kant now thinks of the thing-in-itself as a fiction, an illegitimate hypostasis in which

the universal form of the synthetic act of the understanding is seen as something that exists independently of experience. (1877: 254)

Windelband argues that it is only by dismissing the existence of the thing-in-itself and by jettisoning the phenomena-noumena distinction that Kant can undertake his anti-psychologistic turn. With the rejection of the thing-in-itself, the characterization of sensibility as “receptive” also needs to be abandoned. And that makes a psychological construal of the faculties nonsensical. Kant is then also able to abandon the concept of truth as correspondence between representations and objects in favor of a strictly immanent conception. The immanent conception defines truth in terms of the universal and necessary rules that the relations between our representations need to accord to (1877: 259–260).

And yet, Kant could not rest with this radical view given his commitments in moral philosophy. Practical reason, and in particular the idea that the moral law does not depend on the qualities of humans as sensuous beings, but only on reason, demands a return to the assumption that the thing-in-itself exists (1877: 262). In the fourth phase, Kant thus reintroduces the thing-in-itself, while maintaining his anti-psychologism.

This genetic reconstruction allows Windelband to think of the conflict between the different views of the thing-in-itself that had emerged within the neo-Kantian tradition as reflective of inherent tensions in the Critique. He argues that Kant was especially unclear with respect to psychologism: the distinction between judgment (as a cognitive process) and justification (as logical and normative) is inadequately articulated in the first Critique. Hence Kant is at least partly responsible for the fact that in the first wave of neo-Kantianism represented by Lange and Helmholtz “the new concept of aprioricity was soon dragged down to the old idea of psychological priority” (1883: 101).

But Windelband’s approach to Kant is not merely historical. His sympathies clearly lie with the Kant of the third phase. For Windelband, the insight that natural psychological processes are “utterly irrelevant” for the truth value of our representations (1882b: 24), and the idea that the ultimate problem of philosophy is that of normativity and justification—not a quaestio facti, but a quaestio juris (1882b: 26)—need to be defended from Kant’s own unclarities on these matters. Windelband’s “philosophy of values” can thus be understood as an attempt to purify, explicate and develop the radical insights of the anti-psychologistic move in Kant’s “third phase”.

The cornerstone of this endeavor is the immanent conception of truth. Windelband repeatedly returns to discussing the correspondence theory of knowledge with its metaphor of a “mirror relation” between mind and object. He criticizes the misconception that our sensual perceptions are the things-in-themselves and that these things could be compared with our representations. Any comparison must occur between representations, since things and representations are “incommensurable” (1881: 130). According to Windelband, Kant’s central innovation consists in the insight that the truth of our judgments, and the relation of our representations to an object are not to be found in correspondence at all. Rather, it consists in the “rules” for combining representations (1881: 134). This leads Windelband to define truth as the “normality of thinking” (1881: 138)—with “normality” meaning that thinking proceeds in accordance with rules or norms. Windelband also conceptualizes the object of knowledge in terms of the rules of judgment. The object of knowledge is nothing other than

a rule according to which representational elements ought to organize themselves, in order for them to be recognized as universally valid in this organization. (1881: 135).

Windelband uses the terms “axioms” and “values” interchangeably to refer to the most fundamental rules, and he uses the term “norms” often, but not fully consistently to refer to values or axioms as they relate to psychological experience and the cultural-historical world. Focusing his interpretation on “values” and “norms”, Windelband captures the structural similarity of Kant’s three Critiques in terms of immanent truth: if truth is nothing other than accordance with a rule, then there is moral and aesthetic truth in just the same way as there is epistemic truth (1881: 140). In a later text, Windelband describes the unified project of the three Critiques in terms of the necessary and universal relation between thought and object. He writes that the postulates of practical reason relate to intelligible objects (ideas) just “as necessarily” as the intuitions and categories relate to the object of experience, and that teleological judgment constructs the purposive whole of nature just “as universally” as the principles of pure understanding apply the categories to experience (1904a: 151). While this formulation glosses over some of the nuances of the distinction between constitutive and regulative uses of reason, Windelband’s main intention is not that of giving a detailed and fully accurate reconstruction of Kant’s philosophy. In line with his famous dictum that “understanding Kant means to go beyond him” (1915: iv), he instead seeks to revive the critical project in a manner that allows it to answer the needs of his own time. And Windelband thinks that the critical philosophy required at the time of his writing is a “philosophy of values” which reveals the most fundamental values in epistemology, ethics, and aesthetics.

3. The Factual, the Normative, and the Method of Philosophy

As indicated above, Windelband bases his “philosophy of values” on Lotze’s distinction between the factual and the normative. Throughout his career, he seeks to explicate and clarify this distinction and to illuminate its consequences for philosophical method.

In “Was ist Philosophie?” [“What is philosophy?”] (1882), Windelband approaches the factual-normative distinction by identifying two basic and irreducible types of cognitive operations: judgments and evaluations. While judgments relate representations in a synthesis, and thus expand our knowledge about an object, evaluations presuppose an object as given. They do not expand our knowledge. Rather, they express a relation between the “evaluating consciousness” and the represented object in a “feeling” of approval or disapproval (1882b: 29–30).

Despite characterizing evaluations in terms of the feelings and subjective attitudes of the evaluating consciousness, Windelband argues that some evaluations are “absolutely valid”. Even if they are not embraced by everyone as a matter fact, they entail a normative demand: they ought to be accepted universally according to an absolute value (1882b: 37). The basic idea seems to be that the normative force of any particular evaluation that is carried out by an empirical consciousness is derived from its relation to a non-empirical, absolute value. Windelband argues that even if there is disagreement about which evaluations ought to be embraced as universal and necessary, the demand for absolute validity itself can be recognized by everyone: we all believe in the distinction between that which is absolutely valid and that which is not (1882b: 43).

Accordingly, there must be a system of absolute values from which the validity of judgments in epistemology, aesthetics, and ethic derives. Critical philosophy, then, is nothing other than the “science of necessary and universal values” (1882b: 26) that explicates this system and thus reveals the grounds of normative appraisal and valid judgment. Note that for Windelband, normativity and validity are closely linked, if not identical. Absolute values endow our judgments with a normative demand. Our judgments are valid if and only if they raise a normative demand, that is if they ought to be accepted universally and necessarily.

Having distinguished the factual and the normative by reference to different cognitive operations, Windelband also seeks to identify the points of contact between the two realms. Ultimately, he wants to explain how empirical beings can recognize absolute values. His idea that there is a system of absolute values is thus accompanied by the conception of a “normal consciousness”. In normal consciousness the absolute system of values is, at least partially, represented in the form of norms that are known by “empirical consciousness” and that have an effect on it.

Starting from the immanent conception of truth as accordance with a rule, Windelband distinguishes from among the infinite possible combinations of representations that might or might not be formed by empirical consciousness a subset of combinations: the subset that accords with universal and necessary rules, and which hence ought to be formed (1881: 135–139: 1882a: 72–73). This subset is what he calls “normal consciousness” (1881: 139). Thought is related to and valid for an object if of the infinite possible combinations of our representations, our thinking forms exactly those judgments that “ought to be thought” (1881: 135). One might say that empirical consciousness contains (parts) of the system of absolute values as its “normal consciousness”. To the extent that philosophy seeks not only to reveal the absolute system of values, but also to inquire into how they can be norms for empirical—embodied, psychological and historically situated—human beings, critical philosophy is not only a “science of values”, but also a “science of normal consciousness” (1882b: 46).

Although Windelband refers to the “philosophy of values” as a science, he emphasizes that philosophy does not rely on the methods of the empirical sciences. Philosophy is a second-order science that reflects on the methods and results of the various empirical disciplines in order to reveal the values “by virtue of which we can evaluate the form and extent of their validity” (1907: 9). Crucially, this reflective endeavor cannot be carried out by means of empirical investigation. Here, the distinction between the factual and the normative assumes a methodological dimension.

In “Kritische oder genetische Methode?” [“Critical or genetic method?”] (1883) Windelband lays out in great detail the differences between the “explanatory” and “genetic” method of the empirical sciences, on the one hand, and the “teleological” or “critical” method of philosophy, on the other. And he warns of the devastating consequences that result if the two are conflated. He singles out two disciplines that might be thought to be relevant to philosophical questions about values: individual psychology and cultural history. He does not call into question the legitimacy of these disciplines or of the “genetic method” in general. He even thinks that the genetic method can be applied to values. That is, individual psychology and cultural history can yield valid genetic theories that explain the actual acceptance and development of values in an individual’s mental life and in cultural history. But actual acceptance is not the same as normative validity, and validity proper cannot be found by generalizing from the empirical. A firm boundary separates the genetic method and its approach toward actually accepted values from the critical method of philosophy which concerns values as normative.

Windelband’s argument against the application of the genetic method to philosophical questions has three components. First, he argues that the genetic method cannot solve philosophical questions about normativity and validity, because there is too much variety regarding the values that have been and are actually accepted. The empirical method will not uncover values that are universally embraced by all cultures (1883: 114–115).

Second, the genetic method can show and explain why some values have been accepted by this or that individual, or in this or that culture. But insofar as it is an empirical method, it cannot establish that the values in question are universal and necessary.

The universally valid can be found neither by inductive comparison of all individuals and peoples nor by deductive inference from … the ‘essence’ of man. (1883: 115)

Windelband points to the absurdity of trying to justify by empirical means that which is the presupposition of any empirical theory: the axioms upon which the validity of any theory is based (1883: 113).

Third, Windelband argues that the genetic method leads to relativism. The argument rests on the two claims just outlined, and can be reconstructed as follows. There is variation between individuals and cultures regarding which beliefs are actually prevalent, and the naturally necessary [naturnotwendig] laws of psychology lead to the formation of both true and false beliefs. As an empirical method with no access to the universal and necessary, the genetic method of cultural history and individual psychology has no criterion for distinguishing between valid and invalid beliefs. This means that it has to treat all beliefs as “equally justified [alle gleich berechtigt]” (1882b: 36).

For [the genetic explanation], there is thus no absolute measure; it must treat all beliefs as equally justified because they are all equally necessary by nature… [R]elativism is the necessary consequence of the purely empiricist treatment of philosophy’s cardinal question. (1883: 115–116)

Note that Windelband does not differentiate between the idea that all beliefs have only relative validity and the claim that they are all equally justified or equally valid. In his view, the genetic method does not merely render belief relative to individuals and cultures; it also forces us to conclude that all beliefs are equally valid. An empirical psychology or cultural history that oversteps its boundaries and tries to address philosophical questions about normativity and validity leads to “historicism”, “psychologism”, and “relativism” and destroys the basis of normative appraisal altogether.

Having rejected the genetic method in philosophy, Windelband explains that philosophical method is purely “formal”. The axioms, or values, on which the validity of our judgments is based upon cannot be proven. But it can be shown that the purposes of recognizing truth, beauty, and goodness can only be achieved if absolute values are presupposed. Hence the critical method of philosophy has a teleological structure:

[F]or the critical method these axioms, regardless of the extent to which they are actually accepted, are norms which ought to be valid if thinking wants to fulfil the purpose of being true, volition the purpose of being good, and feeling the purpose of capturing beauty, in a manner that warrants universal validation. (1883: 109)

And yet, while Windelband insists on the distinction between the empirical-genetic method of science and the critical-teleological method of philosophy, he takes his theory of “normal consciousness” to imply that empirical facts do play a role in philosophy. In particular, he wants to maintain that empirical facts about individual psychology and culture can provide the starting points for philosophical reflection. He therefore describes the philosophical method as a method of reflection [Selbstbesinnung], in which the empirical mind becomes aware of its own “normal consciousness”. Philosophy examines existing claims to validity in light of teleological considerations, and in this way reveals the “processual forms of psychic life that are necessary conditions for the realization of universal appraisal” (1883: 125). Put differently, teleological considerations allow the empirical consciousness to distinguish within itself between empirical and contingent contents, on the one hand, and the “contents and forms” that “have the value of normal consciousness”, on the other (1882b: 45–46; 1881: 139).

4. The Problem of Freedom

The distinction between the normative and the factual and the question how the two realms are related also structure Windelband’s reflections on human freedom. Throughout his intellectual career, Windelband returns to this problem, presenting different strategies for reconciling causal determinism and human freedom. His dissertation, completed under Lotze in 1870, deals with the concepts of chance, causal necessity, and freedom. At that time, Windelband still embraces the Kantian concept of transcendental freedom, according to which the noumenal self is the uncaused cause of all intentional action (1870: 16–19). But after the 1877 essay, which had uncovered the anti-metaphysical rejection of the thing-in-itself in Kant’s “third phase” as the radical starting point for the “philosophy of values”, Kant’s metaphysical solution to the problem of freedom ceased to convince him.

Windelband’s most fully developed effort to arrive at an alternative solution to the problem of freedom can be found in his 1882 essay “Normen und Naturgesetze” [“Norms and natural laws”] and in his 1904 lectures Über Willenfreiheit [On freedom of the will]. In these texts, Windelband articulates the following core claims. First, the Kantian dualism between phenomena and noumena needs to be overcome, and we need to think of moral responsibility in a way that does not presuppose a noumenal realm. Second, causal explanation and normative evaluation are two irreducible, but ultimately compatible, ways of viewing, or constructing, the world of appearances. Third, the object of moral evaluation is neither a particular moral action, nor a transcendentally free will, but a “personality”—understood as a set of relatively stable motivations and psychological dispositions—that is the natural cause of our actions. Although articulating these same core thoughts, the two texts differ in how they motivate these ideas, and in the consequences that they draw from them.

“Normen und Naturgesetze” begins by postulating a conflict between natural law and moral law: if the moral law demands an action that would also result from natural causes alone, it is superfluous. But if it demands an action that does not accord with natural causes, it is useless, because natural necessity cannot be violated (1882a: 59).

Windelband holds that causal determinism extends to mental life and that for this reason the conception of freedom as a fundamental capacity that violates “the naturally necessary functions of psychic life” (1882a: 60) is implausible from the get-go. However, he grants that there are two different and irreducible ways of viewing the same objects: on the one hand, there is psychological science which explains what the facts of mental life are. On the other hand, there are ideal norms, which do not explain what the facts are, but express how they ought to be (1882a: 66–67). The solution to the antagonism between natural law and moral law is to be found in the relation between these two points of view.

Here, Windelband introduces the claim that although ideal norms differ from causal laws, they are not incommensurable with them and, in fact, act on us causally. His argument builds on his conception of “normal consciousness” as the representation of the system of absolute values within empirical consciousness. Windelband argues that a mind that becomes aware of its own “normal consciousness” is capable of acting on the basis of and in agreement with the norms that it has discovered within itself:

[E]ach norm carries with it a sense that the real process of thinking or willing ought to form itself in accordance with it. With immediate evidence a form of psychological coercion attaches itself to the awareness of the norm. (1882a: 85)

The norm becomes a determining factor in and for empirical consciousness. It acts as “part of the causal law” and determines psychological life with natural necessity (1882a: 87; see also 1883: 122).

The result is what Windelband calls a “deterministic concept of freedom” (1882a: 88), according to which freedom consists in nothing other than the becoming-aware of the norms that command how we ought to act: our becoming-aware of them determines our actions with natural necessity. Freedom is the “determination of empirical consciousness by normal consciousness” (1882a: 88).

But Windelband still needs to explain how it is possible that we can be aware of a moral norm and not act on it. Long passages in the 1904 lectures are devoted to developing the thought that what determines our moral decisions and actions, and hence decisions if and when we act in accordance with the moral law is our “personality”. Windelband approaches this as a theoretical, not as a normative, question and concludes that we may well call those decisions and actions “free” that are predominantly determined by our constant personality, as opposed to being determined by external circumstances or contingent affects. Freedom is “the unhindered causality of a pre-existing willing” (1904b: 106).

However, Windelband concedes that this analysis does not exhaust our concept of freedom since there is not merely a theoretical, but also a normative use of the concept. In this context, Windelband acknowledges the attraction of the Kantian argument that moral responsibility is possible only if we have transcendental free will and with it the capacity for genuine alternatives: we could act differently given the same circumstances. But Windelband rejects the project of grounding human freedom in a noumenal world. He thinks that Kant’s distinction between an intelligible noumenal self that is the uncaused cause of our actions, and a deterministic empirical world as constructed by our understanding reproduces the same problems that earlier metaphysical accounts of freedom had encountered. He discusses two problems in particular.

First, on the one hand, the personality that a particular individual has developed is part of the empirical world and therefore, on the metaphysical picture, does not feature into the free decisions of the individual. But, on the other hand, the noumenal self is empty. It is an abstract, general self, uniform in all of us; and thus it cannot account for the differences in the moral life of individuals (1904b: 161–163).

Second, transcendental freedom is fundamentally incompatible with the “all- encompassing reality and causality of the deity” (1904b: 187). God is the ultimate uncaused cause, and the only way to understand this thought is by assuming a “timeless causality” between God and the intelligible characters (noumenal selves)—a view which ends up undermining the freedom of the latter (1904b: 186–9)

Having concluded that Kantian dualism fails to avoid the pitfalls of earlier metaphysical approaches to freedom, Windelband abandons the concept of transcendental freedom altogether. But while in 1882 his alternative had been the “deterministic concept of freedom”, in 1904 Windelband proceeds to articulate the view that the concept of free will is a mere placeholder in our normative discourse. We are not free in the metaphysical sense, but we are perfectly entitled to pass moral judgment. And we use the language of freedom to express the fact that when passing moral judgment we disregard questions of causal determination.

To spell out this idea, Windelband takes up the 1882 distinction between the “points of view” of explanatory science and ideal norms. He now argues that there are two ways of constructing the world of appearances: we construct the world of appearances according to causal laws, and we construct it according to our normative evaluations. Evaluation

reflects within the manifoldness of the given on those moments only which can be put in relation to the norm… [O]ne could call the manner in which the objects of experience, the given manifoldness of the factual, appear uniformly in light of such an evaluation another form of “appearance”…. (1904b: 195–6)

Freedom then means not that the will is an uncaused cause. When speaking of freedom, we appeal to the uncaused merely in the sense that we evaluate matters independently of causal deterministic processes (1904b: 197–198).

Windelband believes that his view preserves moral responsibility. As described above, his theoretical investigation had yielded the result that that which determines the extent to which we act in agreement with a moral norm is our personality or character. Personality is the constant cause of voluntary action, it determines our actions necessarily according to general psychological laws. From a practical standpoint, personality then is also the ultimate object of moral appraisal. We hold personality responsible, and we are justified in doing so, even if the formation of personality is itself a causal process over which the individual has no control. Ultimately, the upshot of Windelband’s discussion is that moral responsibility does not presuppose a noumenal world and transcendental freedom, because it does not presuppose that we could act otherwise. It merely presupposes that another person in the same circumstances could act otherwise. The idea that one could have acted differently refers

not to the concrete human being in these concrete circumstances, but to the generic concept of the human being. (1904b: 212)

5. The Natural and the Historical Sciences

In Windelband’s view, a reconsideration of the Kantian project is not only necessary because of its inherent tensions; broader developments in nineteenth-century culture and science also necessitate an adaptation of the critical method to changed historical circumstances. One important factor is the professionalization of the historical disciplines that had been underway since the early nineteenth century (1907: 12). One of Windelband’s central and best known philosophical contributions concerns the question what distinguishes the “historical sciences”, that is, those disciplines that study the human-historical and cultural world, from the natural sciences. Windelband’s answer to this question is in line with his formal-teleological conception of philosophy: by explicating the autonomous presuppositions of historical method, critical philosophy safeguards the historical sciences against methodological holism, namely the view that there is only one scientific method, and that this is the method of physics and natural science.

Windelband shares the goal of securing the autonomy of the historical disciplines with his contemporary Wilhelm Dilthey. In his 1883 Einleitung in die Geisteswissenschaften [Introduction to the human sciences] Dilthey had founded the distinction between the natural sciences and the human sciences or “sciences of spirit” on a distinction between outer and inner experience. While outer experience forms the basis of hypothetical knowledge in natural science, inner experience discloses “from within” how the individual is an intersection of social and cultural relations (Dilthey 1883: 30–32, 60–61, 88–89). Inner experience is at the same time psychological and socio-historical, and a descriptive psychology capable of grasping the integrated nexus of inner experience can provide the “sciences of spirit” with a solid foundation (Dilthey 1894).

Windelband profoundly disagrees with Dilthey’s strategy for demarcating the historical disciplines. In his Strasbourg rector’s address “Geschichte und Naturwissenschaft” [“History and natural science”] from 1894, he takes issue with the suggestion that the facts of the “sciences of spirit” derive from a particular type of experience. He takes Dilthey to endorse an introspective view of psychological method. To this he objects that the facts of the historical disciplines do not derive from inner experience alone, and that inner perception is a dubious method in the first place. He also classifies psychology with the natural sciences, rejecting Dilthey’s idea that the human-historical disciplines could be founded on a non-explanatory and non-hypothetical descriptive psychology. Perhaps most fundamentally, Windelband rejects the term “sciences of spirit” on the ground that it suggests that the distinction between different sciences rests on a material distinction between different objects: spirit and nature (Windelband 1894: 141–143).

Windelband seeks an alternative method for science-classification that is purely formal. His reflections take scientific justification in its most abstract form as their starting point: justification in science is either inductive or deductive, Windelband argues, and the basic relation on which all knowledge is based is between the general and the particular (1883: 102–103).

The distinction between different empirical sciences is then also to be sought at this level. In particular, Windelband argues that science might pursue one of two different “knowledge goals” (1894: 143): it “either seeks the general in the form of natural law or the particular in the historically determined form” (1894: 145). The former approach is that of the “nomothetic sciences” which seek to arrive at universal apodictic judgments, treating the particular and unique as a mere exemplar or special case of the type or of the generic concept. The “idiographic sciences”, in contrast, aim to arrive at singular assertoric judgments that represent a unique object in its individual formation (1894: 150).

Windelband emphasizes that the distinction between nomothetic and idiographic sciences is a purely formal and teleological one. One and the same object can be approached from both points of view, and which method is appropriate depends entirely on the goal or purpose of the investigation. Moreover, most sciences will involve both general and particular knowledge. The idiographic sciences in particular depend on general and causal knowledge which has been derived from the nomothetic sciences (1894: 156–157).

Note, however, that Windelband is not consistently restricting his analysis to the formal level. He tends to use the terms “nomothetic” and “natural” sciences, and the terms “idiographic” and “historical” sciences interchangeably, which at least suggests a correspondence between scientific goals, methods, and objects.

Although Windelband does not spell this out in great detail, he also suggests that values are of integral importance to the idiographic method. First, he argues that the selection of relevant historical facts depends on an assessment of what is valuable to us (1894: 153–154). Second, he suggests that the integration of particular facts into larger wholes is only possible if meaningful, value-laden relations can be established such that “the particular feature is a meaningful part of a living intuition of the whole [Gesamtanschauung]” (1894: 154). And third, he claims that we value the particular, unique, and individual in a way in which we do not value the general and recurrent, and that the experience of the individual is indeed at the root of our “feelings of value” (1894: 155–156).

It is Windelband’s student Heinrich Rickert who takes up these suggestions and develops them into a systematic account of the “individuating” and “value-relating” “concept-formation” of the “historical sciences of culture” (Rickert 1902). Rickert argues that “scientific concept formation”, by which science overcomes the “extensive and intensive manifold” of reality, depends on a principle of selection. The principle of selection at work in the natural sciences is that of “generalization”. For this reason, the natural sciences cannot account for the unique and unrepeatable character of reality. The historical sciences, in contrast, form their concepts in a manner that allows them to capture individual realities (Rickert 1902: 225, 236, 250–251). They do so on the basis of values: values guide the selection of which particular historical facts belong to and can be integrated into a specific historical “individuality” (examples being “the Renaissance”, “the Reformation” or “the German nation state”). According to Rickert, one can clearly distinguish the theoretical value-relation that is the basis of historical science and practical evaluation. The historian relies on values but does not evaluate his material (Rickert 1902: 364–365). Building on Windelband’s core ideas about historical method, Rickert arrives at a more refined and systematized account of how historical science forms its concepts, that ultimately leads to an account of what culture as an object of scientific study amounts to.

In some of his later writings, Windelband will pick up the more developed thoughts of his student Rickert. For example, he claims that each science creates its objects according to the manner in which it forms its concepts (1907: 18), and that the historical sciences rely on a system of universal values when making selections about what enters into their concepts (1907: 20).

6. The History of Philosophical Problems

A large part of Windelband’s oeuvre consists of writings in the history of philosophy. Windelband primarily covers modern philosophy from the Renaissance to his own time, but he also published on ancient philosophy. As a historian, Windelband is heavily indebted to Fischer. And yet, he goes significantly beyond his teacher, developing a new method and mode of historical presentation. Windelband conceives of the history of philosophy as a “history of problems”. Rather than presenting a chronological sequence of great minds, he organizes the presentation of philosophical ideas according to the fundamental problems around which the philosophical debates and arguments of an age were structured. Windelband also takes a reflective attitude towards his own historiographical practice and seeks to clarify the goals and systematic relevance of the history of philosophy.

In these reflections, Windelband seeks to integrate two main thoughts: First, the idea that philosophy is a reflection of its time and age and, second, the conviction that the history of philosophy has systematic significance. Windelband finds both thoughts in Hegel’s approach to the history of philosophy. Mirroring Hegel’s famous dictum that “philosophy is its own time apprehended in thought”, he speaks of philosophy the “self-consciousness of developing cultural life” (1909: 4). He also applauds Hegel’s “deep insight” that the history of philosophy realizes reason and thus has intrinsic relevance for systematic philosophy (1883: 133). Windelband thinks of history as the “organon of philosophy” (1905: 184), as a guide to the absolute values that the critical method seeks to reveal.

But despite the Hegelian gloss of these two claims, Windelband is critical of Hegelianism. This is primarily because he has a different understanding of the idea that philosophy is “its own time apprehended in thought”. For Windelband, this means that philosophical thinking is shaped by historically contingent factors.

Accordingly, Windelband formulates two criticisms of the Hegelian conception of the history of philosophy. First, he finds fault with the idea that the order in which successive philosophical ideas emerge is necessary and that—in virtue of being necessary—it has systematic significance:

[I]n its essentially empirical determination which is accidental with respect to the “idea” the historical process of development cannot have this systematic significance. (1883: 133, see also 1905: 176–177)

The history of philosophy is not only shaped by the necessary self-expression of reason, but also by the causal necessity of cultural history. The cultural determinants of philosophical thinking lead to “problem-convolutions” (1891: 11), in which various, conceptually unrelated philosophical questions merge with one another. Windelband also emphasizes that the “individual factor” of the philosopher’s character and personality is relevant for how philosophical problems and concepts are articulated in a given historical moment (1891: 12)

Second, although Windelband agrees that the historical development of philosophical ideas is partly driven by critique and self-improvement, he does not think of this process in terms of progress. Windelband probes the often unacknowledged presuppositions of our talk about progress. In “Pessimismus und Wissenschaft” (1876) Windelband argues that science cannot decide between historical optimism and historical pessimism (1876: 243). In “Kritische und genetische Methode” (1883) he gives a more detailed analysis of why this is the case. Historical change itself is not progress, he observes. In order to determine whether a given historical development is progressive, we need to be in possession of “a standard, the idea of a purpose, which determines the value of the change” (1883: 119). Windelband is wary of triumphalist narratives that identify the historical development of present-day values with progress. History is determined by contingent cultural factors and could have produced “delusions and follies … which we only take to be truths now because we are inescapably trapped in them” (1883: 121). Of progress we can only speak legitimately, if we are in possession of an absolute value that allows us to assess the historical development. At minimum, this means that the appeal to a progressive history of philosophy is of no help when it comes to the systematic task of uncovering the system of absolute values: progress cannot aid in revealing absolute values as it presupposes them.

But while the fact that philosophy is at least partly determined by contingent cultural factors undercuts necessity and progress, it also opens the door for a reconceptualization of the “essence” of philosophy. In his Einleitung in die Philosophie [Introduction to philosophy] (1914) Windelband reflects on the fact that everyday life, culture, and science do already contain general concepts of the world. These concepts form the initial content of philosophical reflection (1914: 6). But the business of philosophy only takes off when these initial concepts, and the assumptions that are baked into them, become unstable and collapse. An experience of shock and unsettling prompts philosophy to question, rethink, and critically assess the concepts and ideas of everyday life and science. In this process of critical assessment, philosophy strives to purify these concepts and ideas, and to connect them into a coherent, unified system. According to Windelband, in this process of conceptual reorganization, a rational necessity exerts itself. The “vigorous and uncompromising rethinking of the preconditions of our spiritual life” creates certain philosophical problems “with objective necessity” (1914: 8).

Windelband provides neither a very detailed account of what “philosophical problems” exactly are, nor of how precisely they spring from the unsettling of everyday concepts. But he makes three claims that, taken together, establish that philosophy, even when reflecting its particular age, is not solely determined by contingent cultural factors. First, philosophical puzzles stem from the “inadequacy and contradictory imbalance” of the contents that philosophy receives from life and science (1891: 10). That is, true philosophical problems emerge whenever the systematizing drive of philosophy is confronted with the deep incoherence of life. Second, philosophical problems are necessary because the conceptual “material” found in life already contains “the objective presuppositions and logical coercions for all rational deliberation about it” (1891: 10). The necessity of philosophical problems is logical necessity. Third, despite historical change

[c]ertain differences of world- and life-attitudes reoccur over and over again, combat each other and destroy each other in mutual dialectics. (1914: 10)

Because philosophical problems emerge “necessarily” and “objectively”, they also reoccur throughout history. Philosophical problems are thus timeless and eternal (1891: 9–10; 1914: 11)).

Windelband also believes that the history of philosophy, pursued empirically and scientifically, can disentangle from one another the “temporal causes and timeless reasons” (1905: 189) that together give rise to the emergence of philosophical problems.

Only through knowledge of the empirical trajectory that is free of constructions can come to light …. what is the share of … the needs of the age on the one hand…but on the other hand that of the objective necessities of conceptual progress. (1905: 189)

At this point, Windelband reaches a clear verdict on the goal and systematic significance of the history of philosophy: it lies in disentangling that which is contingently actually accepted from that which is “valid in itself” (1905: 199). History is the “organon of critical philosophy” precisely to the extent that it allows us to distinguish the actually accepted norms of cultural life from that which is absolutely valid (1883: 132).

7. Critical Philosophy and World-Views

Windelband’s “philosophy of values” is also an intervention into debates that had preoccupied the neo-Kantian movement and German academic philosophy more broadly since the materialism controversy [Materialismusstreit]: what the relation between science and world-views is, and whether philosophy is capable of providing a “world-view”.

Given that he takes the core of the critical project to consist in a quaestio juris—a concern with normativity—it seems surprising that throughout the 1880s Windelband insists that critical philosophy does not provide a “world-view”: the project of revealing the highest values of human life has nothing to do with “world-views”, he argues, because it does not provide a metaphysical account of the world and our place in it (1881: 140–141, 145). Questions about optimism or pessimism cannot be answered by means of “scientific” philosophy, since they depend on the idea that the world as a whole has a purpose. And claims about the ultimate purpose of the world arise only from an unscientific, subjective, and arbitrary projection of particular purposes onto the universe as such (1876: 231). Philosophy is a science, albeit a second-order formal science, and is thus barred from formulating a world-view that would be metaphysical in character.

After 1900, however, Windelband’s position on the question of world-views changes. He now claims that it is the aim of philosophy to provide a “world-view” with scientific justification (1907: 1). Given that Windelband holds that philosophy in general and the Kantian project in particular need to be adapted to the developing circumstances of time and culture, this change of position is not inconsequential: the cultural landscape of the early 1900s demands a revision of the neo-Kantian project that highlights not only its “negative” and critical aspects, but also develops its positive implications for cultural life (1907, 8). The shift to a more positive attitude towards philosophy as a world-view corresponds to a re-evaluation of Kant’s oeuvre, in which Windelband at least partly suspends the anti-metaphysical rigor of the “third phase” of the genesis of the Critique of Pure Reason, and attributes more relevance to the Critique of the Power of Judgment. This view is taken up by Rickert, who later argues in more detail that the third Critique forms the core of critical philosophy, and that Kant’s metaphysical project can provide the basis for an encompassing theory of world-views (Rickert 1924: 153–168).

In his 1904 “Nach hundert Jahren” [“After one hundred years”] Windelband provides yet another take on the relation between the natural and the normative. Declaring the question how the realm of natural laws is related to the realm of values to be the “highest” philosophical endeavor (1904a: 162), he now sees in the Critique of the Power of Judgment the possibility of solving this problem: here one finds the idea that the purposive system of nature gives rise to the value-determined process of human history. The central concept that allows for connecting nature and history in this way is that of “realization” (1904a: 162–3).

The turn to the concept of “realization” also leads to a shift in how Windelband approaches the problem of science classification. In 1894, Windelband had thought of the nomothetic and idiographic sciences as two fundamental yet disjointed and even incommensurable approaches to seeking knowledge of the world: “Law and event persist next to each other as the last, incommensurable factors of our representation of the world” (1894: 160). But in 1904, he claims that the concept of realization provides a common, unified basis for the natural and the historical sciences (1904a: 163).

Windelband’s language assumes a Hegelian tone. Critical philosophy equipped with the concept of realization is able to grasp and express the “spiritual value content” of reality (1904a: 165). History is capable of revealing the universal value content in the contingent maze of human interests and desires, and in so doing captures “the progressive realization of rational values” (1907: 20–21). The human as a rational being is not determined psychologically or naturally, but humanity is a historical task: “only as a historical being, as the developing species, do we have a share in world-reason” (1910a: 283: see also 1905: 185). Windelband even suggests that history itself has a goal, namely the realization of a common humanity (1908: 257).

These remarks remain cursory however, and there is room for debate over how much of Hegel’s ontology of history Windelband takes on board, as well as whether his talk about the progressive realization of reason in history is incompatible with the formal-teleological method that he had endorsed in the 1880s and 1890s. His “Kulturphilosophie und transzendentaler Idealismus” [“Philosophy of culture and transcendental idealism”] of 1910 presents us with a puzzling fusion of Kantian and Hegelian language. The goal of critical philosophy is that of revealing the unity of culture, Windelband now claims, and this unity can only be found

by grasping the essence of the function … which is common for all the particular …cultural activities: and this can be nothing else than the self-consciousness of reason which produces its objects and in them the realm of validity itself. (1910b: 293).


Präludien refers to a collection of works by Windelband. Page numbers refer to the 1915 edition. NKR refers to The Neo-Kantian Reader (2015) edited by Sebastian Luft.

Selected Works by Windelband

  • 1870, Die Lehren vom Zufall, Berlin: Schade.
  • 1873, Über die Gewißheit der Erkenntnis: Eine psychologisch-erkenntnistheoretische Studie, Berlin: Herschel. [Windelband 1873 available online]
  • 1875, “Die Erkenntnislehre unter dem völkerpsychologischen Gesichtspunkte“, Zeitschrift für Völkerpsychologie und Sprachwissenschaft 8: 166—178.
  • 1876, “Pessimismus und Wissenschaft”, reprinted in his Präludien, 2: 218–243.
  • 1877, “Über die verschiedenen Phasen der Kantischen Lehre vom Ding-an-sich”, Zeitschrift für wissenschaftliche Philosophie 1, pp. 224–266.
  • 1881, “Immanuel Kant”, reprinted in his Präludien, 1: 112–146.
  • 1882a, “Normen und Naturgesetze”, reprinted in his Präludien, 2: 59–98.
  • 1882b, “Was ist Philosophie?” reprinted in his Präludien, 1: 1–54.
  • 1883, “Kritische oder genetische Methode?” reprinted in his Präludien, 2: 99–135. Translated as “Critical or Genetic Method?” by Alan Duncan, in NKR: 271–286.
  • 1891, Lehrbuch der Geschichte der Philosophie, Tübingen: Mohr.
  • 1894, “Geschichte und Naturwissenschaft”, reprinted in his Präludien, vol. 2, pp. 136–160. Translated as “History and Natural Science”, by Guy Oakes, in NKR: 287–298. [Windelband 1894 available online]
  • 1904a, “Nach hundert Jahren. Zu Kants hundertjährigem Todestage”, reprinted in his Präludien, vol. 1, pp. 147–167.
  • 1904b, Über Willenfreiheit: Zwölf Vorlesungen, Tübingen: Mohr.
  • 1905, “Geschichte der Philosophie”, in Die Philosophie zu Beginn des zwanzigsten Jahrhunderts: Festschrift für Kuno Fischer, Wilhelm Windelband (ed.), 2nd ed, Heidelberg: Winter pp. 529–554.
  • 1907, “Über die gegenwärtige Lage und Aufgabe der Philosophie”, reprinted in his Präludien, 2: 1–23.
  • 1908, “Über Wesen und Wert der Tradition im Kulturleben”, reprinted in his Präludien, 2: 244–269.
  • 1909, Die Philosophie im deutschen Geistesleben des 19. Jahrhunderts: Fünf Vorlesungen, Tübingen: Mohr. [Windelband 1909 available online]
  • 1910a, “Die Erneuerung des Hegelianismus”, reprinted in his Präludien, 1: 273–289.
  • 1910b, “Kulturphilosophie und transzendentaler Idealismus”, reprinted in his Präludien, 2: 279–294. Translated as “Philosophy of Culture and Transcendental Idealism”, by Alan Duncan, in NKR: 317–324.
  • 1914, Einleitung in die Philosophie, Tübingen: Mohr.
  • [Präludien] 1915, Präludien. Aufsätze und Reden zur Philosophie und ihrer Geschichte, 2 volumes, 5th expanded edition, Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck. 1st ed.: 1883. 2nd ed.: 1902; 3rd ed.: 1907; 4th ed.: 1911. [Windelband 1915 volume 1 and Windelband 1915 volume 2 available online]

Other Literature Cited

  • Cohen, Hermann, 1871, Kants Theorie der Erfahrung, Berlin: Dümmler. 2nd ed.: 1885. Partially translated as Kant’s Theory of Experience by D. Hyder, in NKR: 107–116.
  • Dilthey, Wilhelm, 1883, Einleitung in die Geisteswissenschaften, Leipzig: Duncker & Humblot. Translated as Introduction to the Human Sciences, by R.A. Makkreel and F. Rodi, in Wilhelm Dilthey: Selected Works, vol. I, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1989, pp. 47–242.
  • –––, 1894, “Ideen über eine beschreibende und zergliedernde Psychologie”, in Gesammelte Schriften, vol.5, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1924, pp. 139–240. Translated as “Ideas for a Descriptive and Analytic Psychology”, by R.A. Makkreel and F. Rodi in Wilhelm Dilthey: Selected Works, vol. II, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2010, pp. 115–210.
  • Fischer, Kuno, 1860, Kants Leben und die Grundlagen seiner Lehre, Mannheim.
  • Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich, 1821, Grundlinien der Philosophie des Rechts oder Naturrecht und Staatswissenschaft im Grundrisse. Werke Bd 7, edited by Eva Moldenhauer, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp, 1986. Translated as Elements of the Philosophy of Right, by H.B. Nisbet, edited by Allen W. Wood, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • Lotze, Hermann, 1874, Logik. Drei Bücher vom Denken, vom Untersuchen und vom Erkennen, 2nd ed.: 1880, Leipzig: S. Hirze. Translated as Logic, Bosanquet Bernard (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon, 1888.
  • [NKR] Luft, Sebastian (ed.), 2015, The Neo-Kantian Reader, New York: Routledge.
  • Paulsen, Friedrich, 1875, Versuch einer Entwicklungsgeschichte der Kantischen Erkenntnisstheorie, Leipzig: Fuess.
  • Rickert, Heinrich, 1902, Die Grenzen der naturwissenschaftlichen Begriffsbildung. Eine logische Einleitung in die historischen Wissenschaften, Tübingen: Mohr. Translation (abridged) of the 6th edition of 1929, The Limits of Concept Formation in Natural Science, by Guy Oakes, Cambridge University Press, 1986.
  • –––, 1924, Kant als Philosoph der modernen Kultur. Ein geschichtsphilosophischer Versuch, Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck.

Selected Secondary Literature

  • Anderson, R. Lanier, 2005, “Neo-Kantianism and the Roots of Anti-Psychologism”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 13(2): 287–323. doi:10.1080/09608780500069319
  • Beiser, Frederick C., 2011, The German Historicist Tradition, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199691555.001.0001
  • –––, 2013, Late German Idealism: Trendelenburg and Lotze, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199682959.001.0001
  • –––, 2014, The Genesis of Neo-Kantianism, 1796–1880, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198722205.001.0001
  • Bonifaci, Jacinto Páez, 2020, “Wilhelm Windelband como pensador sistemático e historiador de la filosofia”, Anales del Seminario de Historia de la Filosofía, 37(2): 269–280. doi:10.5209/ashf.67624
  • –––, 2023, “Epistemología y psychología en el Neokantismo temprano de Wilhelm Windelband”, Kriterion, 64(154): 49–73. doi:10.1590/0100-512x2023n15403jpb
  • Centi, Beatrice, 2015, “The Validity of Norms in Neo-Kantian Ethics”, in De Warren and Staiti 2015: 127–146. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139506717.007
  • Dewalque, Arnaud, 2012, “Rationalité de la forme et irrationalité du contenu dans l’école de Bade”, in Olivier Feron (ed.), Figuras da racionalidade. Neokantismo e Fenomenologia, Lisbon: Centro de Filosofia da Universidade de Lisboa, 179–202.
  • De Warren, Nicolas and Andrea Staiti (eds.), 2015, New Approaches To Neo-Kantianism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139506717
  • Ferrari, Massimo, 1998, “Neokantismo come filosofia della cultura: Wilhelm Windelband e Heinrich Rickert”, Revue de Métaphysique et de Morale, 3: 367–388
  • Gabriel, Gottfried, 2007, “Windelband und die Diskussion um die Kantischen Urteilsformen”, in Heinz and Krijnen 2007: 91–108.
  • Griffjoen, Sander, 1998, “Rickert, Windelband, Hegel und das Weltanschauungsbedurfnis”, in Krijnen and Orth 1998: 57–73.
  • Grundlach, Horst, 2017, Wilhelm Windelband und die Psychologie Das Fach Philosophie und die Wissenschaft Psychologie im Deutschen Kaiserreich. Heidelberg: Heidelberg University Publishing. doi:10.17885/heiup.203.276
  • Hartung, Gerald, 2015, “Philosophical Historiography in the 19th century: A Provisional Typology” in Hartung and Pluder 2015: 9–24.
  • Hartung, Gerald and Valentin Pluder (eds.), 2015, From Hegel to Windelband: Historiography of Philosophy in the 19th Century, Berlin, New York: De Gruyter.
  • Heinz, Marion, 2002, “Fichte und die philosophische Methode bei Windelband”, in Pätzold, and Krijnen 2002: 135–146.
  • –––, 2007, “Normalbewusstsein und Wert. Kritische Diskussion von Windelbands Grundlegung der Philosophie”, in Heinz and Krijnen 2007: 75–90.
  • Heinz, Marion and Christian Krijnen (eds.), 2007, Kant im Neukantianismus: Fortschritt oder Rückschritt?, Würzburg: Königshausen und Neumann.
  • Kim, Alan, 2015, “Neo-Kantian Ideas of History”, in De Warren and Staiti 2015: 39–58. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139506717.003
  • Kinzel, Katherina, 2017, “Wilhelm Windelband and the Problem of Relativism”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 25(1): 84–107. doi:10.1080/09608788.2016.1228602
  • –––, 2019, “The History of Philosophy and the Puzzles of Life: Windelband and Dilthey on the Ahistorical Core of Philosophical Thinking”, in The Emergence of Relativism: German Thought from the Enlightenment to National Socialism, Martin Kusch, Katherina Kinzel, Niels Wildschut, Johannes Steizinger (eds.), London: Routledge, pp. 26–42.
  • Krijnen, Christian and Ernst-Wolfgang Orth (eds.), 1998, Sinn, Geltung, Wert. Neukantianische Motive in der modernen Kulturphilosophie, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.
  • Krijnen, Christian and Andrzej Noras (eds.), 2012, Marburg versus Südwestdeutschland: philosophische Differenzen zwischen den beiden Hauptschulen des Neukantianismus, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.
  • Krijnen, Christian 2015, “Philosophy as Philosophy of Culture?” in De Warren and Staiti 2015: 111–126. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139506717.006
  • Kreiter, Erik, 2002, “Philosophy and the Problem of History. Hegel and Windelband”, in Pätzold and Krijnen 2002: 147–60.
  • Köhnke, Klaus Christian, 1991, The Rise of Neo-Kantianism: German Academic Philosophy between Idealism and Positivism, translated by R.J. Hollingdale, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kühn, Manfred, 2010, “Interpreting Kant Correctly: On the Kant of the Neo-Kantians”, in Luft and Makkreel 2010: 113–131.
  • Luft, Sebastian and Rudolf Makkreel (eds.), 2010, Neo-Kantianism in Contemporary Philosophy, Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
  • Makkreel, Rudolf, 2010, “Wilhelm Dilthey and the Neo-Kantians: On the Conceptual Distinction Between Geisteswissenschaften and Kulturwissenschaften”, in Luft and Makkreel 2010: 253–271.
  • Makkreel, Rudolf and Sebastian Luft, 2010, “Dilthey and the Neo-Kantians: the Dispute over the Status of the Human and Cultural Sciences”, in Routledge Companion to Nineteenth Century Philosophy, Dean Moyar (ed.), New York: Routledge, pp. 554–597.
  • Morrone, Giovanni, 2017, “Cultura e storia. La Geschichtsphilosophie di Wilhelm Windelband”, Laboratorio dell’ ISPF, XIV(18): 1–29. doi:10.12862/Lab17MRG
  • Noras, Andrzej J., 2012, “Philosophiegeschichte als Problem der Marburger und Südwestdeutschen Neukantianer”, in Krijnen and Noras 2012: 115–140.
  • Orth, Ernst Wolfgang, 2002, “Hegelsche Motive in Windelbands und Cassirers Kulturphilosophie”, in Pätzold and Krijnen 2002: 123–134.
  • Patton, Lydia, 2015, “Methodology of the Sciences”, in Oxford Handbook of German Philosophy in the Nineteenth Century, Michael Forster and Kristin Gjesdal (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 594–606.
  • Pätzold, Detlev and Christian Krijnen (eds.), 2002, Der Neukantianismus und das Erbe des deutschen Idealismus: Die philosophische Methode, Würzburg: Koenigshausen & Neumann.
  • Pollok, Konstantin, 2010, “The ‘Transcendental Method’: On the Reception of the Critique of Pure Reason in Neo-Kantianism”, in Cambridge Companion to Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason, Paul Guyer (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 346–379. doi:10.1017/CCOL9780521883863.016
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