William David Ross

First published Thu Aug 12, 2010; substantive revision Wed Mar 2, 2022

William David Ross (1877–1971) made contributions to ancient philosophy and to moral philosophy. The focus of this entry is his work in the latter area. Ross’s The Right and the Good is one of the most important contributions to moral philosophy published in the twentieth century. In it and other works, Ross develops a novel (pluralistic) deontological ethical theory rivalling Kantianism and utilitarianism. The most innovative element of this theory is the notion of a prima facie duty. Although Ross’s work in moral philosophy appeared to suffer at the hands of critics in the middle and late parts of the last century, recent work on normative and meta-ethical intuitionism has sparked a renewed interest in and enthusiasm for his ethical outlook.

1. Ross’s Life

William David Ross was born on 15 April 1877 in Thurso, Scotland. He spent the bulk of the first six years of his life in Travancore, India, where his father, John Ross, was the Principal of the Maharaja’s College. He received his formal education in Scotland, where he attended the Royal High School in Edinburgh and Edinburgh University. In 1895, Ross graduated from the latter with first-class honours in classics. He then entered Balliol College, Oxford, where he obtained first-class honours in classical honour moderations in 1898 and in literae humaniores in 1900. He was then appointed lecturer at Oriel College, Oxford and at the same time he was elected to a fellowship by examination at Merton College. In 1902, he dropped the latter when he was elected tutor in philosophy and fellow at Oriel College, a position which he held until 1929.

In 1915, Ross joined the army. When World War I ended he was Deputy Assistant Secretary in the Ministry of Munitions, with the rank of Major. He left the army with an OBE. Following the war, he remained for some time in public service on a part-time basis; for his efforts he was made a KBE in 1938. From 1923 to 1928 he was the Deputy White’s Professor of Moral Philosophy while John Alexander Stewart was ill. When the position became vacant in 1927, Ross refused to stand because (among other reasons) he thought his colleague H. A. Prichard a better moral philosopher (and better ‘philosopher generally’) and he preferred ‘working on metaphysics, ancient and the most modern’ (Clark 1971, 534). Two years later, in 1929, he became Provost of Oriel College, a position he held until he retired in 1947. In 1927, he was elected Fellow of the British Academy, and he served as its president from 1936 to 1940. During this time, he played a role in helping foreign scholars fleeing central Europe. In World War II he played an essential role in public service, serving on an Appeal Tribunal for Conscientious Objectors from 1940 to 1941 and on the National Arbitration Tribunal from 1941 to 1952. He served as Vice-Chancellor of Oxford from 1941 to 1944. Following the war, in 1947, he became President of the Union Académique Internationale, and, until 1949, the Chairman of the Royal Commission on the Press. In his retirement Ross continued his work in philosophy. He died in Oxford on 5 May 1971.

Ross’s contributions to university administration and to public service were of no small importance. But it is for his work in philosophy that he is best known. He made contributions to ancient philosophy and to moral philosophy. In his lifetime, Ross was considered a major figure in the study of Aristotle (Wiggins 2004). He was the General Editor of the Oxford Aristotle translation series, first with J. A. Smith and then alone; to this series he contributed translations of Aristotle’s Metaphysics and his Nicomachean Ethics. Ross edited a number of Aristotle’s works in Greek for the Oxford Classical Texts series, including Rhetoric, Physics, De Anima, and Politics, and he produced editions of the Metaphysics, Physics, Parva Naturalia, Analytics and De Anima with long introductions and detailed commentaries. In addition, he produced two monographs, Aristotle and Plato’s Theory of Ideas. In moral philosophy, Ross’s most important contributions are expressed in his books The Right and the Good and Foundations of Ethics. To these he added a handful of journal articles, a critical commentary on Immanuel Kant’s Groundwork, Kant’s Ethical Theory, and a chapter on Aristotle’s ethics in Aristotle.

In the introduction to the sixth edition of Ross’s Aristotle, J. L. Ackrill remarks Ross ‘made his mark in public life and as a university teacher and administrator, and he wrote influential books on ethics. But it is as the leading Aristotelian of the first half of the century that he will be most remembered’ (AT ix). There is certainly no denying Ross was one of the most influential Aristotelians of the twentieth century. Although some of Ross’s translations of Aristotle now have formidable competitors, they are still held in high regard. His editions of Aristotle’s texts with commentaries continue to be an important source for scholars working in ancient philosophy. This should not, however, lead to overlooking Ross’s impact on moral philosophy. Although Ross received rather short shrift from moral philosophers in the last century (e.g., Raphael 1981; Rawls 1971; Warnock 1960 ), his ethical outlook is now considered a serious contender and in recent years many of Ross’s moral and meta-ethical doctrines have received sustained attention and (in some cases) defence (see, e.g., Audi 1996, 2004; Dancy 2004; Gaut 2002; Hurka 2004, 2014; McNaughton 1988, 1996; Parfit 2011; Phillips 2019; Shaver 2007, 2014; Stratton-Lake 2002a, 2002b, 2011a, 2011b). It is reasonable, then, to say Ross will be remembered for his work in ancient philosophy and his work in moral philosophy.

2. The Data of Ethics

Ross attempts to develop an ethical framework that is faithful to and reflects the central ‘moral convictions of thoughtful and well-educated people’ (RG 41; FE 1–5). These convictions constitute, for Ross, “the data of ethics just as sense-perceptions are the data of a natural science” (RG 41). At least some of these moral convictions, Ross thinks, constitute knowledge the philosopher neither proves nor disproves (RG 20–21n1, 40). An ethical theory should not, Ross contends, repudiate these convictions – these facts – in an effort to simplify or systematize our moral thinking (RG 19, 40; FE 5, 83).

On the face of it, Ross is at odds with moral philosophers like Henry Sidgwick who take the systematization and correction of common-sense morality as one of the main roles of ethical theorizing (Sidgwick 1907: 77). Sidgwick, for example, holds that “the philosopher seeks unity of principle, and consistency of method” (even if this leads to revision of common-sense thinking) (Sidgwick 1907, 6) and that the role of the moral philosopher is to ‘enunciate, in full breadth and clearness, those primary intuitions of Reason, by the scientific application of which the common moral thought of mankind may be at once systematised and corrected’ (Sidgwick 1907, 373–74).

Ross does, of course, acknowledge errors exist in our moral thinking. Indeed, it is, he says, ‘a mistake to assume that all . . . [our] convictions are true, or even that they are all consistent; still more, to assume they are all clear’ (FE 1). Like some sense perceptions in science, he says, some of our moral convictions may have to be discarded as illusory (RG 41). They are not discarded at the behest of a theory. Instead, they are to be rejected, Ross says, ‘only when they are in conflict with other convictions which stand better the test of reflection’ (RG 41). The aim of moral philosophy is to compare our moral convictions with each other, ‘and to study them in themselves, with a view to seeing which best survive such examination, and which must be rejected either because in themselves they are ill-grounded, or because they contradict other convictions that are better grounded; and to clear up, so far as we can, ambiguities that lurk in them’ (FE 1; also FE 2–3, 190).

Ross suggests most errors in our moral thinking concern media axiomata – or middle principles or rules – rather than fundamental moral principles (FE 190; RG 20–21n1). However, he seems at times to consider reflective inquiry with the potential for revisions of a more radical nature. He suggests, for example, inquiry into the ‘historical origin of…[our moral] beliefs and practices’ may show ‘the most strongly felt repulsions towards certain types of conduct are relics of a bygone system of totems and fetishes, their connexion with which is little suspected by those who feel them’ (RG 13). An inquiry of this kind may lead to significant revision of even aspects of moral thinking thought to be fundamental (Singer 2005).

Moreover, Ross at times suggests he aims to reflect the views of the ‘thoughtful and well-educated’ (RG 41) or, what comes to the same thing, what ‘we’ think (RG 40; FE 102, 104, 134, 172). But at other times he says he aims to reflect the views of the ‘plain man’ (RG 17, 20–21n1, 28, 57; FE 186, 187, 188; KT 31). If the views of the thoughtful and well-educated and the plain man are distinct, and Ross inclines (with some justification) toward the former rather than the latter, his approach to moral theorising may be closer on the matter of reform (though not of system) to Sidgwick’s (which, to be clear, emphasises what we think on reflection and the consensus of experts (Sidgwick 1907, 338–343)). This may cause Ross trouble. He faults rival moral views for conflicting with what ‘plain men’ think about ethics. If he is open to substantially revising the plain person’s views, he may weaken his case against rivals.

In any case, the novelty of Ross’s moral outlook and its fit with what the plain person thinks will emerge only once its content is fully specified. About the data Ross seeks to clarify and honour, a number of questions emerge. What is its precise content? How is it known? What is its metaphysical status? Together with his fidelity to reflective moral attitudes, Ross’s answers to these questions constitute his unique contribution to moral philosophy.

3. Ross’s Rejection of Kant’s Deontology and Ideal Utilitarianism

Ross rejects Kantian deontology and ideal utilitarianism (his main opponent). Ross complains that each of his rivals ‘over-simplifies the moral life’ (FE 189). They fail to capture at least some of the moral attitudes constituting the knowledge the philosopher neither proves nor disproves (RG 20–21n1).

Kant over-simplifies the moral life in a number of ways. Ross thinks the clearest case of oversimplification is Kant’s commitment to exceptionless moral principles (RG 18–19; FE 313, 134, 173; KT 24, 95). Kant maintains lying is always wrong (Kant 1785, 1797). It cannot, he says, serve as a universal law that one may lie to avoid some difficulty or harm (either to oneself or to another). As soon as lying in such cases is such a law it is impossible to benefit by lying, for everyone will be wise to the fact people lie in such cases. Ross disagrees. In line with common sense, he thinks it is permissible to lie in some contexts (RG 28), e.g., when the (net) benefit of lying significantly outweighs the cost as would be true of a case in which one lies to prevent a friend from being killed by a would-be murderer inquiring about one’s friend’s whereabouts (KT 31–32; for Kant’s discussion of the case of the inquiring murderer, see Kant 1797). Ross holds the oversimplification results in part from Kant thinking ‘the rightness or wrongness of an individual act can be inferred with certainty from its falling or not falling under a rule capable of being universalised’ (FE 189; also KT 25). Kant’s abstract way of ethical reasoning involves neglecting factors relevant to figuring out what we should do (KT 33–34; FE 189).

Kant oversimplifies the moral life in another way. He says only the motive to do what is morally required because it is morally required possesses moral worth (Kant 1785). Ross contends other motives have moral worth, including ‘direct devotion to another person or other persons’ (KT 3). Returning favours to loved ones because you love them and not because you think you ought has moral value. It is closer to common sense to think moral life is not a ‘contest between one element which alone has worth [i.e., the motive to do what is right because it is right] and a multitude of others which have none; the truth rather is that it is a struggle between a multiplicity of desires having various degrees of worth’ (FE 206; also KT 3, 18, 93).

The ideal utilitarians Hastings Rashdall and G. E. Moore maintain an individual acts rightly in so far as their act produces at least as much surplus general good as any other act they could have performed in their situation (Moore 1903, 1912; Rashdall 1907, 1913; for detailed discussion of ideal utilitarianism, see Skelton 2011, 2013b). Ross holds ideal utilitarians guilty of distorting or oversimplifying moral life in a number of ways.

First, the view assumes, he says, there is a ‘general character which makes right acts right’, that of maximising a plurality of intrinsic goods (RG 16). By presupposing there is only one basic or underived obligation ideal utilitarianism distorts our understanding of moral deliberation. For example, when deciding whether to fulfil a promise we think much more of the fact that in the past we have made a promise than of the consequences its fulfilment promotes (RG 17; Ross 1931, 68). Our common-sense moral thinking includes the idea that what we ought to do depends in part on retrospective considerations, e.g., that we have made a promise in the past or previously incurred a debt.

Second, the view says the only morally salient relation ‘in which my neighbours stand to me is that of being possible beneficiaries by my action’ (RG 19; OJ 125). But we stand in relations of all kinds to other people, including that of creditor to debtor, child to parent and friend to friend, and they matter in themselves to what we are permitted or ought to do. You ought, for instance, to pay your debts before donating to charities even if giving priority to your debts fails to maximise surplus value.

Ross’s moral theory reinvigorated select doctrines defended by the eighteenth-century moralists Joseph Butler and (it seems) Richard Price. Ross revived the anti-utilitarian arguments in Butler’s A Dissertation of the Nature of Virtue (Butler 1736, 139–140) and in Price’s A Review of the Principal Questions in Morals (especially Price 1787, 79ff., 131–176). H. A. Prichard (Prichard 1912, 1932) and Moore (Moore 1903, 1912) were Ross’s most important contemporary influences. Ross found Prichard’s defense of a plurality of moral obligations and of the complexity of moral decision making alluring. Ross rejected Moore’s utilitarianism, but he sympathised with Moore’s methodology for soliciting intuitions about goodness and with some of his views about intrinsic value and moral semantics. Finally, Ross could not help being influenced by Aristotle. He was in particular impressed with Aristotle’s methodology and his appeal to the many and the wise.

4. Ross’s Distinctive Moral Framework: The Right and the Good

In a review of Foundations of Ethics, C. D. Broad writes The Right and the Good was ‘much the most important contribution to ethical theory made in England for a generation’ (Broad 1940, 228). The best explanation of Broad’s praise is the book clarifies and defends a novel form of deontology, according to which there are a plurality of moral requirements and non-instrumental goods. No one master principle explains why the particular things we believe are wrong/right are in fact wrong/right. Instead, there exist a number of basic, defeasible moral principles resisting reduction to some more fundamental principle. These principles are relied upon in making decisions about what we ought to do, though there is no sense in which we deduce what we ought to do from principles. No one non-instrumental good/evil explains why the particular things we think are good/evil are in fact good/evil. Instead, there exist a number of non-instrumental goods which cannot be reduced to some more fundamental non-instrumental good. These goods are appealed to in making decisions about the goodness or badness of a state of affairs all things considered, though there is no sense in which this is deduced from these claims. Ross’s clearheaded and forceful expression of this view makes his work of lasting philosophical significance.

4.1 The Right

Ross subscribes to five underivative or foundational duties (Hurka 2014; McNaughton 1996; Phillips 2019; Pickard-Cambridge 1932b; Stratton-Lake 2002a, 2011a; cf. Jack 1971):

  1. A duty of fidelity, that is, a duty to keep our promises (RG 21; FE 76–77; KT 21);
  2. A duty of reparation, that is, a duty to correct a previous wrong we have done (RG 21; FE 76; KT 21);
  3. A duty of gratitude, that is, a duty to return services to those from whom we have in the past accepted benefits (RG 21; FE 76; KT 21);
  4. A duty of beneficence, that is, a duty to maximise aggregate or general good (RG 25, 27, 30, 39; FE 67, 99, 130, 252, 257, 271, 313; KT 21); and finally
  5. A duty of non-maleficence, that is, a duty not to harm or injure others (RG 21–22, 26; FE 75, 130n1, 272).

Ross’s major innovation involves characterising these as prima facie duties rather than absolute or exceptionless duties. The notion of a prima facie duty may not be easy to grasp. Ross himself admits ‘prima facie’ is an unfortunate phrase to use to specify what he has in mind, for two reasons (RG 20; FE 84–85).

First, although he says there exist five basic prima facie duties, what he is referring to are not really duties (RG 20; FE 84–85). Prima facie duties do not state our actual obligation or duty proper – the thing we ultimately ought do – in a particular situation (RG 20). Instead, each duty rests on a separate and distinct ground and specifies a consideration counting in favour of or against an act or what to set ourselves to do, morally speaking.[1] As David Phillips puts it, ‘[t]he characteristic of being a prima facie duty is the characteristic of having a certain degree of obligatoriness or weight in virtue of being of a single morally significant kind’ (2019, 23). For example, that an act fails to fulfil a promise counts against it being right, and that an act produces the most surplus good counts in favour of it being morally right. Considerations of this sort have to be weighed and balanced against each other in deciding what we ought to do all things considered or simpliciter.

Second, using the phrase suggests the duties only appear to be duties that further reflection may reveal to be illusory. This is not Ross’s view: the considerations his duties point to are objective facts present in a situation (RG 20; FE 85). If you have wronged someone in the past, it is an objective fact of your situation that there is a consideration in favour of you compensating them for the harm.

There are numerous ways the idea of a prima facie duty might be further clarified. One way, suggested by Ross, is to think of a prima facie duty as constituting a tendency to be morally right or wrong (RG 28; FE 86). An act promoting general good has, for example, a tendency to be morally right and to contribute to determining our actual obligation (Hurka 2014, 72). A second way, also suggested by Ross, is to think of a prima facie duty as comprising a responsibility (FE 85). Repairing one’s past wrongs is something for which one has a responsibility, for instance, and this contributes to determining one’s actual obligation or responsibility. A third (controversial) way of explicating the idea is to think of a prima facie duty as constituting a moral reason for or against an act (Cowan 2017, 825; Olsen 2014, 64–65, 2015: 8; Shaver 2014, 314n24; Stratton-Lake 2002a, xxxiii–xxxviii, 2011a, 147–48, though cf. 2019). If my act will harm or injure another person, I have a moral reason not to do it given the duty of non-maleficence, and this reason contributes to determining my actual obligation. A fourth (more controversial still) way of clarifying the idea of a prima facie duty is to think of it as constituting a reason (sans phrase) in favour of or against an act (Phillips 2019, 26–37; Shaver 2011, 144). Ross himself used the language of reasons to explicate the idea of a prima facie duty. He says, for example, ‘the fact that a promise has been made itself constitutes a reason why it should be fulfilled’ (KT 21). These reasons contribute to determining my actual obligation or what I have actual reason to do.

The idea of a prima facie duty or obligation had not been fully clarified before Ross, either by defenders of deontological theories (though see Price 1787, 152, 167, 168 and Prichard 2002, 77–83) or their critics (including Moore 1903, 1912; Rashdall 1907, 1913; and Sidgwick 1907). Ross’s introduction of the notion of a prima facie obligation constitutes a major advance in the dispute between utilitarians and non-utilitarians. It paved the way for a moderate deontology. Ross’s innovation is crucial to avoiding cases thought problematic for absolute deontology in which obligations conflict and one is unable to avoid doing what is all things considered wrong (FE 83–86).

Ross’s five basic principles contribute to explaining other, non-basic moral considerations. The duty not to lie has two sources. Ross thinks you ought not lie because, in line with the duty of non-maleficence, to ‘tell lies is prima facie to do a positive injury to another person’ (RG 55) and because, in line with the duty of fidelity, when you enter into a conversation there is an implicit promise or understanding ‘language shall be used to convey the real opinions of . . . speakers’ (RG 54; also 21; FE 97). The obligation to obey the laws of one’s country is explained by the obligations of gratitude, fidelity and beneficence (RG 27). If one has benefitted from the laws of one’s country one ought to obey those out of gratitude for the benefit; if one has remained in a country in which one knows one is expected to obey the laws and one has relied on them for benefit, one has (at least implicitly) promised to obey them and should do so for that reason; if one’s country’s laws work to promote the general good, one ought to obey them as part of promoting general good (RG 27–28).

Ross does not think the five duties are of equal initial weight. The duty of non-maleficence is weightier than the duty to promote a maximum of aggregate good (RG 21, 22; FE 75, 130n1). He writes: ‘We think the principle ‘do evil to no one’ more pressing than the principle ‘do good to every one’, except when the evil is very substantially outweighed by the good’ (FE 75). It takes substantial (net) benefit to justify intentionally harming someone. It would be wrong to harm someone to promote only a marginal (net) benefit (contra utilitarianism).

Ross suggests in addition the duties of fidelity, reparation, and gratitude are in general weightier than the duty to promote general good (RG 19, 30, 41–42; FE 77, 76, 90, 187). It takes substantial (net) surplus value to justify begging off on one of these duties (RG 34–35). Unlike the duty to promote general good, the duties of fidelity, reparation and gratitude rest on personal relations with others, generating special rather than general duties (FE 76, 186). It is important to Ross that we can stand in the obligation-generating relations ‘of promisee to promiser, of creditor to debtor, of wife to husband, of child to parent, of friend to friend, of fellow countryman to fellow countryman, and the like’ (RG 19; also 22; FE 76; OJ 124, 126). The duties core to these relationships are in general weightier than the more general duty to promote the general good. Rival views, as noted, ignore these morally significant relations, or the ‘highly personal character of duty’, at their peril (RG 22). Finally, although he does not say it, his view would surely be the duty of non-maleficence is weightier than the duties of reparation, gratitude, and fidelity: it is (unless much is at stake) wrong to harm others in order to fulfil these duties.

Ross’s introduction of a prima facie duty makes for complicated moral decision making. One way to further clarify the structure of Ross’s view is to examine what he says about what he calls duty proper or our actual duty (RG 41). Suppose you’ve agreed to meet a friend for coffee. On the way to meet your friend, you witness an accident with several victims. You have taken first-aid courses and are able to provide the accident victims with life-saving treatment until the paramedics arrive. If you assist the accident victims, you will not be able to meet your friend; if you meet your friend, you will not be able to help the accident victims. So, you either break your promise or you benefit the accident victims. What is your actual obligation in this (simple) case?

Ross thinks right acts or our actual obligations have ‘the greatest balance of prima facie, rightness, in those respects in which they are prima facie right, over their prima facie wrongness, in those respects in which they are prima facie wrong’ (RG 41; FE 85). In order to figure out which, of the acts open to you, has the greatest balance of prima facie rightness over prima facie wrongness you have to look at all the acts open to you and determine all the ways in which they are prima facie right and all the ways in which they are prima facie wrong and then figure out in each case the balance of prima facie rightness over prima facie wrongness or vice versa (whichever the case may be). You then compare the acts open to you in terms of their balance of overall prima facie rightness. The act with the greatest balance of overall prima facie rightness is the one you ought all things considered to do and what you ought all things considered to do is your duty proper (for detailed discussion, see Hurka 2014, 69–78; Olsen 2014; Phillips 2019, 17–26).

In the simple case you look at the two acts open to you: meet your friend or aid the accident victims. Meeting your friend is prima facie right because it comprises keeping your promise, but prima facie wrong because it involves failing to maximise general good (in your circumstances). Helping the accident victims is wrong to the extent it involves breaking a promise, but right because it involves benefitting the victims. Ross says while there are no general rules ‘[f]or the estimation of the comparative stringency of . . . prima facie obligations’ (RG 41), his judgement is on reflection saving the accident victims is weightier than keeping your promise (RG 18), in which case, of the two acts, aiding the accident victims has on balance more prima facie rightness. Helping the accident victims is, then, all things considered, what you ought to do and therefore it is the right act – your actual duty – of those open to you.

It is not entirely clear what Ross thinks of the relationship between prima face duties and duty proper. In RG, Ross suggests that the notion of our actual duty or duty proper is basic and that the notion of a prima facie duty could be defined in terms of it. So in the simple case discussed above Ross claimed that our actual duty was to help the accident victims and that prima facie duties could be defined in terms of contributing to or potentially explaining why it is our duty proper. In this case, the idea of a prima facie duty and our actual duty are not in the end distinct (Hurka 2014, 75).

He seemed to change his mind about this in FE, where following Broad, he took the idea of a prima facie duty to be basic and he understood it in terms of fittingness to some aspect of a situation (FE 79–82, 84; Broad 1930, 218–220). In the simple case above, keeping your promise to your friend is a prima facie duty as it is fitting to one aspect of the situation and benefitting the accident victims is another prima facie duty as it is fitting to another aspect of the situation. It is not entirely clear whether in FE Ross relied on to the concept of duty proper or instead whether he relied on the idea of duty all things considered (Hurka 2014, 74–75). In any case, Ross’s view in FE is that we can understand prima face duty independently of the notion duty all things considered and we can define or understand the latter in terms of the former.

Ross’s pluralism faces attack from two opposing camps, from those who think there are fewer than five basic responsibilities and from those who think there are more. Ross intimates his list is the best representation of the core commitments of common-sense morality (RG 20; FE 190). He is sanguine we have these responsibilities. He says, for example, ‘the existence of an obligation arising from the making of a promise is so axiomatic that no moral universe can be imagined in which it would not exist’ (FE 77; also KT 42). He is not entirely confident there exist only five basic responsibilities. His list is offered ‘without claiming completeness or finality for it’ (RG 20; also 23).

Ross is not hostile to the idea we might recognise a ‘new duty’ in light of new circumstances (FE 189). However, he does say ‘the general principles which it [i.e., intuitionism] regards as intuitively seen to be true are very few in number and very general in character’ (FE 190). He seems to think most disputes about his list would revolve around what should be added rather than what should be subtracted, since the responsibilities listed above are ‘authentic’ (RG 23), that is, responsibilities revealed upon sober reflection. But if new circumstances can lead to the recognition of new duties, why may they not lead to the recognition there are fewer basic duties than we might otherwise have supposed? This seems to be the nub of the issue between Ross and his ideal utilitarian foes.

Ideal utilitarians and others are keen to argue that Ross’s view is problematic because it is not systematic enough. In Some Problems in Ethics, H. W. B. Joseph suggested views like Ross’s go wrong, since ‘our obligations are not a heap of unrelated obligations’ (Joseph 1931 92; also 67–68). Forty years later, Rawls registered the same complaint: without some account of how the plurality of normative principles are to be weighed against one another using ‘reasonable ethical criteria, the means of rational discussion have come to an end. An intuitionist conception of justice [and by extension ethics] is, one might say, but half a conception’ (Rawls 1971, 41).

Ross is moved in part by this sort of worry. He initially lists what appear to be seven responsibilities, including a responsibility of justice (a responsibility to bring about ‘a distribution of happiness between other people in proportion to merit’ (RG 26, 21)) and a responsibility of self-improvement (a responsibility to improve oneself in respect of virtue and knowledge (RG 21)). He argues these can be subsumed by the responsibility ‘that we should produce as much good as possible’ (RG 27; also 30; FE 288–89). His version of beneficence involves the promotion of as much as possible of the four goods of pleasure, virtue, knowledge and justice (RG 27, 154).

But Ross does not think that further contraction is warranted: ‘[l]oyalty to the facts is worth more than a symmetrical architectonic or a hastily reached simplicity’ (RG 23; also FE 83; OJ 125). Indeed, his case against his ideal utilitarian foes Moore, Rashdall, and Joseph is strong since they adopt a form of value pluralism for similar reasons. In the context of defending his value pluralism, Moore says we cannot assume the ‘truth on any subject-matter will display such symmetry as we desire to see . . . [t]o search for ‘unity’ or ‘system’ at the expense of truth, is not, I take it, the proper business of philosophy’ (Moore 1903, 222).

Ross has a further argument against Rawls. Rawls’s theory contains two principles of justice, lexically ordered. His first principle outlining a set of basic rights takes priority over his second principle outlining the correct distribution of social benefits and burdens. Rawls does not think it is ever right to violate rights in order to produce just distributions. This gets him a theory as systematic as his classical average utilitarian rival and more systematic than Ross’s theory. But Ross can argue Rawls achieves system at the expense of endorsing absolutism, which many acknowledge to have counterintuitive results. Might gaining a massive benefit for the least well off not justify a trivial rights violation?

Ross hopes to show his view comprises the best representation of common-sense morality or, as noted above, what ‘we’ think. We might wonder whether this is the case. It is relatively clear most hedonistic utilitarians are reformers of common-sense morality (e.g., Bentham 1789; Mill 1863, 1843; Sidgwick 1907). These philosophers may not be moved (at the level of moral foundations) by claims their view conflicts with common-sense morality. For their aim in part is to revise it and make moral deliberation more systematic. Ross gives hedonism short shrift because he thinks it obvious pleasure is not the only intrinsic value (RG 17, 99; FE 65). He often argues ideal utilitarianism, like hedonistic utilitarianism, can be dismissed because it is at odds with common-sense morality (RG 17–19, 38; FE 67ff.). Yet, it is far from clear ideal utilitarianism is reformist like hedonistic or classical utilitarianism. The better way to represent the dispute between ideal utilitarians and Ross is over which view best represents common-sense moral thinking. It is certainly true that the main proponents of ideal utilitarianism took themselves to be aiming to provide the best representation of common-sense morality (e.g., Rashdall 1907; Pickard-Cambridge 1932b, 152; Johnson 1953).

As Ross conducts it, the main dispute between the two revolves around the issue of whether ideal utilitarians can make sense of the obligation to keep one’s promises. Ross’s view is ‘[t]o make a promise is not merely to adapt an ingenious device for promoting the general well-being; it is to put oneself in a new relation to one person in particular, a relation which creates a specifically new prima facie duty to him, not reducible to the duty of promoting the general well-being of society’ (RG 38). (To clarify that Ross’s target is ideal utilitarianism here we have to substitute good for well-being as Ross does elsewhere (RG 34–36). Ideal utilitarians can agree with Ross’s point as stated. It might be true that promises are not a device for promoting well-being but false they are not a device for promoting the good, which is the point ideal utilitarians wish to make.)

Ross employs the following example to illustrate his initial case (RG 34–35). Suppose by fulfilling a promise to Edward you produce 100 units of (surplus) good for him, but by breaking the promise and doing something else you have not promised to do you produce 101 units of (surplus) good for James. The ideal utilitarian view entails it is wrong to fulfil the promise: we must benefit James. But this is not the verdict of common-sense morality. Ross says it takes a much greater disparity in value between the two to justify breaking the promise (RG 35; FE 77, 90).

In reply, the ideal utilitarian may try to capture the common-sense verdict by noting breaking promises erodes mutual confidence and keeping promises enhances mutual confidence (RG 38; FE 187). These goods and evils tip the balance in favour of keeping the promise. Ross frowns on this response. There will no doubt be cases, he says, where all the benefits of breaking the promise will outweigh (though only very slightly) all the costs associated with breaking it, and in this case the ideal utilitarian will have to admit it is obligatory to break the promise (RG 38). Ross thinks this is not the verdict of common-sense morality.

Classical utilitarians might think in this case we should revise common-sense morality. If after all is said and done, it is better to break a promise, we should break it. They might insist that on sober reflection common sense is mistaken and promises just are devices for promoting well-being. Ideal utilitarians seem to opt for a different strategy.

In an engaging set of essays, W. A. Pickard-Cambridge presses Ross on the issue of whether ideal utilitarianism is actually as at odds with common-sense morality as Ross suggests (Pickard-Cambridge 1932a, 1932b, 1932c). Pickard-Cambridge first argues there are strong direct and indirect reasons for taking promises very seriously (Pickard-Cambridge 1932b, 153–157). He argues further ideal utilitarianism accounts better for our common-sense attitudes about cases of the following kind:

  1. Chuck has promised Peter he will replace a string on his violin by 4:00 pm tomorrow. Just before Chuck intends to fulfil the promise Peter contracts an illness making it impossible for him ever to use his violin. It appears Chuck is not bound to fulfil the promise. This is the verdict of the plain man and the verdict of the ideal utilitarian, but it is not the verdict entailed by Ross’s view (Pickard-Cambridge 1932b, 158).
  2. A rich miser pretends to be a pauper in order to get Richard to agree to pay him $100. Richard takes pity on him, and he agrees to pay him the money in six months. Richard discovers a few months later through newspapers reports the miser is a fraud. Richard has no reason to fulfil the promise. Again, this is the verdict of the plain man and the verdict of the ideal utilitarian, but it is not the verdict that seems entailed by Ross’s view (Pickard-Cambridge 1932b, 165–166).
  3. A poor man contacts Anne via the Internet asking her to please pay him $100.00 in six months. Anne agrees to give him the money. Three months later, before Anne has paid the money, the poor man wins the lottery and is rich. The ideal utilitarian says she is not bound to fulfil the promise and the plain man agrees, but this is not Ross’s verdict (Pickard-Cambridge 1932b, 166).

In response to (1), Ross argues we must insist on ‘some common sense in the interpretation of the promise’ (FE 94; also 95, 96). Both Peter and Chuck assume if by 3:00 Peter is rendered unable ever to use his violin, the promise is null and void. But the ideal utilitarian may say she can provide an interpretation of the promise and that her interpretation and its explanation fit more easily with common-sense morality. Peter and Chuck assume what they do because no good would otherwise come from insisting on the promise being fulfilled.

In reply to (2), Ross says the promise ‘arose out of conversation with the miser, which was conducted under the implied contract to tell each other the truth’ (FE 97). The miser lied. Therefore, the promise is null and void. The difficulty with this reply is for it to work Ross has to assume the implied contract stipulates we are to tell each other the whole or all the truth. But he may not be entitled to this assumption. It is not obvious that when I sell you something I am required to tell you all the truths about the item for sale. The ideal utilitarian is in a better position to explain why in the case of the miser the implied contract to tell the truth requires one not lie about being a beggar. The contract is specified this way because it is beneficial for it to be so specified: it is not in general beneficial to honour fraudulent promises.

In reply to (3), Ross contends, initially, if Anne has ‘a very delicate sense of honour’, she ought to consider paying the poor man on account of her carelessness in agreeing unconditionally in the first place (FE 97). This is not plausible. There is no reason to enrich an already rich person merely because of carelessness (of this sort). Ross further argues what is promised is not that Anne pay $100.00; rather, what is promised is she pay a poor man $100.00, and since the man in question is no longer poor, there is therefore no need to fulfil the promise (FE 97–98). But what drives this interpretation of the promise? The ideal utilitarian may say the reason we interpret the promise this way is doing so is on balance beneficial. Furthermore, the ideal utilitarian can argue that even without thinking of this interpretation of the promise we still believe we have no or only very weak reasons to pay, and that they can offer the best explanation of this fact. They can also explain why this is (as Ross notes) a somewhat difficult issue to decide: there are utilitarian reasons on either side.

Pickard-Cambridge further argues ideal utilitarianism provides the best explanation of the strength of a promise (1932b, 159–163). Ross agrees some promises are more binding than others. A promise to visit a sick friend is stronger than the promise to attend the theatre with friends (FE 100). He suggests the former is stronger because of the value of what is being promised (FE 100). An explicit promise is more binding than a casual promise and more recent promise is more binding than an older promise. Ross says this is because the manner in which and the time at which a promise has been made ‘intensify the promiser’s awareness of its existence and the promisee’s expectation of its fulfilment’ (FE 101). These responses seem to play right into the hands of the ideal utilitarian: the promise is more binding when more value is at stake and when the promisee’s expectations (and possible disappointment) are greater, all of which are goods the ideal utilitarian claims we need to balance in deciding what we ought all things considered to do.

Ross has one final reply to Pickard-Cambridge, using the following example. A is dying. He entrusts his property to B, on the strength of B’s promise to give it to C. C does not know of A’s intentions or B’s promise. B’s activities will not disappoint A or C, nor will his activities negatively impact the general mutual confidence. Suppose D could make better use of the property than C. It follows on ideal utilitarianism B ought to give the property to D. Ross thinks this breach of trust ‘outrageous’ (FE 105).

The version of ideal utilitarianism to which Pickard-Cambridge subscribes seems to entail B has no reason to fulfil the promise to A. This is a problem for the view. However, Ross’s own view may imply revision in this case, too. He says ‘[w]hen we consider ourselves bound…to fulfil a promise, we think of the fulfilment of the promise as the bringing into existence of some source of pleasure or satisfaction for the person to whom we have made the promise’ (RG 162). This suggests the rightness of the promise depends on it producing some pleasure or satisfaction for A. But since A is dead when B fulfils the promise no pleasure or satisfaction can be brought into existence for A, implying that B has no obligation by Ross’s lights to fulfil the promise.

Of course, Ross might drop the requirement that the fulfilment of a promise must produce pleasure for the promisee and suggest instead only the fulfilment of a promise be ‘bonific’ for someone (e.g., C) (RG 36; Ross 1928–29: 267–68). This seems to put him at odds with the plain man in other cases, however. Consider a deathbed promise with a different content, that A be buried with C, his wife. Suppose this promise is not bonific. Ross will have to say there is no reason to fulfil it (though perhaps he could claim that fulfilling the promise is bonific since it satisfies A’s desire (Skelton 2013a)). Hence, he may have to advocate revision to common-sense morality. Perhaps he can argue his revision is more conservative than the revisions required by ideal utilitarianism. But this is a very thin difference; it may not be enough to give Ross the edge. Given these worries and the fact that ideal utilitarianism seems quite close to the plain man or common-sense morality in many of the other important cases, its entailing it is right to break the promise in the initial case above can hardly be considered a death blow.

The ideal utilitarian may not be satisfied with this outcome. Perhaps the more appropriate route is not to opt for revision to common-sense morality. For this may in the end give Ross a philosophical advantage, especially if there is hope he can find satisfactory replies to Pickard-Cambridge’s objections. Instead, perhaps the better strategy is to capture the importance of promise keeping to common-sense morality by holding that keeping promises is non-instrumentally good or at least that breaking a promise is non-instrumentally bad (Brennan 1989; Ewing 1957, 1959; Johnson 1953, 1959; Shaver 2011). The general strategy is to subsume all of Ross’s non-utilitarian duties in this way. This is a compelling response. To assess it, it is important to examine his theory of value.

Before discussing Ross’s theory of value, it is important to note two other reactions to his list of duties.

Ross’s foes are not alone in recommending fewer duties than he allows. Some of Ross’s fans advocate for reducing his initial list of duties, too. Phillips, for example, agrees Ross holds, at least initially, there are five foundational duties (Phillips 2019, 58–59). However, Phillips thinks the best account of Ross’s view involves jettisoning the duty of non-maleficence (the responsibility not to harm or injure others) (Phillips 2019, 86–90).

Ross pays little attention to the duty of non-maleficence. His main focus is his four other duties – fidelity, reparation, gratitude, and beneficence – which have a similar structure. Each involves promoting some good or goods (RG 162; 1928–9: 267–68). Phillips thinks at the core of Ross’s view is the notion of an agent-relative intensifier. We have a general reason to promote various goods on grounds of beneficence, and the duties of fidelity, reparation, and gratitude function to intensify reasons to provide certain goods to certain people (Phillips 2019, 67ff). So, for example, if I can benefit a benefactor or a total stranger to the same degree, I have more reason – the reason is more intense – to benefit my benefactor because I have a responsibility of gratitude to them. The duty of non-maleficence is not like this: it does not involve promoting a good (Hurka 2014, 182–83; Phillips 2019, 86–87).

Phillips thinks there are good reasons to jettison the duty of non-maleficence. Ross suggests the duty of non-maleficence in some way constrains what we are permitted to do to promote general good. It is not permissible, for example, to kill one person to prevent two other people from being killed. Phillips thinks this leaves Ross susceptible to the paradox of deontology, which says it is paradoxical to hold someone’s being harmed provides a consideration against, say, torturing, but not a consideration favouring acting to prevent people from being harmed, say, by being tortured by someone else. The concern is: How can it be wrong to harm one person when by harming one person one can prevent two other people from being harmed?

Phillips does not abandon non-maleficence entirely. Instead, he attempts to capture our intuitions about the distinctive badness of harming or injuring by treating harming or injuring as a higher-level evil, involving an unfitting attitude (willing or wanting) toward a base-level evil (harming or injuring) (Phillips 2019, 89). It is vicious to want to harm or injure someone, because harming or injuring another person is bad. If we think of harming or injuring as a higher-level evil we can, Phillips thinks, explain why harming is worse than failing to benefit, since ‘[n]onbeneficence does not necessarily involve any similar unfitting attitude’ (Phillips 2019, 89), though Phillip’s suggestion will not capture the idea it is wrong to harm one person in order to prevent two from being harmed.

Phillips’s amendment may not recommend itself to Ross. Jettisoning a requirement not to harm others involves giving up a salient part of common-sense morality, involving the idea, as Ross puts it, of a duty based on people possessing ‘definite rights, or at least claims, not to be made means to the giving of pleasure to others; and claims that ought to be respected unless the net pleasure, or good, to be gained for the community by other action is very considerable’ (FE 75). Phillip’s suggestion may force us to reconsider whether interpreting the duties of promise keeping, reparation and gratitude as agent-relative intensifiers is right for Ross.

In addition, it is far from clear Phillips has established harming is a distinctive evil as compared with nonbeneficence. Phillips says whereas harming or injuring involves the unfitting attitude of wanting or aiming at a base bad (harm or injury), failure to benefit involves no bad attitude and so is not as bad as harming (Phillips 2019, 89). This may not be obvious. When I fail to benefit I am indifferent to something good. This seems a wrong attitude to have to a base good (benefits), making nonbeneficence no worse than harming. Of course, it is possible this indifference is not necessarily involved in nonbeneficence, in which case it would not be as bad harming or injuring. But it is far from clear that when I harm someone I necessarily will or desire injuring or harming them, in which case harming would not be worse than nonbeneficence. I might merely be aiming or willing benefits that my harming produces (for these criticisms, see Shaver 2020, 508).

A different reaction to Ross’s lists of duties is to argue it includes too few responsibilities. Sidgwick famously claimed egoism and utilitarianism represent coordinate but conflicting requirements of rationality. On his view, we ought to maximise our own happiness and maximise general happiness (Sidgwick 1907, 496–509). Sidgwick thought it could not be proved to the egoist that their happiness was not for them all important and so the egoist could not be rationally converted to utilitarianism (Sidgwick 1907, 420). (Sidgwick did think he could convert adherents of something like Ross’s view to utilitarianism (Sidgwick 1907, 337–361.)) In defending egoism, Sidgwick endorsed the existence of non-derivative agent-relative reasons. My good provides me with a special reason to promote my happiness, a reason individuals other than me lack. These reasons compete and (sometimes) conflict with the agent neutral reasons provided by utilitarianism.

Channeling Sidgwick, Phillips argues Ross should admit agent-relative reasons or intensifiers relating to one’s own happiness. Phillips thinks ‘[t]he fact that a pain will befall me rather than someone else gives me a special extra reason to be concerned with the pain – special extra reason that other people don’t have. Facts about personal identity, that is, are agent-relative intensifiers of hedonic reasons’ (Phillips 2019, 75). Many philosophers agree (e.g., Butler 1736, 137, Price 1787, 148–151, Parfit 2011, 131).

Ross does not think we have agent-relative moral reasons of this sort because he does not think there is a moral duty to promote one’s own happiness. He says ‘the act of seeking pleasure for oneself is not merely not obligatory, but has not even the specific kind of rightness or fitness which is moral fitness. It seems morally entirely colourless’ (FE 277; also 272, 282, 288; RG 151). We might agree it is it odd to say one has a moral duty to promote one’s own happiness (though see Shaver 2014, 213–18 for discussion).

The difficulty is Ross seems to be of the view we have no reason whatsoever to promote our own happiness (Parfit 2011, 372). He thinks the only duties in existence are moral duties. This is hard to accept. It does seem for many one’s own happiness or one’s own unhappiness provides one with reasons or obligations, though not necessarily moral reasons or obligations. (Phillips can easily accommodate this thought since he holds the best way to understand prima facie duties is in terms of reasons rather than moral reasons or duties.)

Ross seems also to think we have no reason to avoid our own pain. This comes out clearly in his characterisations of the duty of non-maleficence. It comprises a duty not to injure ‘others’ (RG 21); the duty rests on the fact that ‘if there are things that are bad in themselves we ought, prima facie, not to bring them upon others’ (RG 26). He seems, then, to think while I have a prima facie duty not to harm others, I have no such duty not to harm myself. It seems to follow, then, it would not be morally wrong for me to impose a very large pain on myself to avoid only a trivial pain for another. It would not be wrong, then, for me to make myself a mere ‘means to the giving of pleasure to others’ (FE 75). This is hard to accept even if we accept Ross’s view there exist only moral duties. It seems morally wrong to use oneself in this way. And even if we are convinced we lack a moral duty to prevent our own pain we are very unlikely to be convinced we lack strong non-moral reason to prevent it. Ross may have to modify his duty of non-maleficence to accommodate this.

These are not the only additions to Ross’s list one might advocate. Curiously missing from Ross’s list is a prima facie duty of veracity. We might agree with him (pace Kant) when the (net) benefits of lying are considerable we have an obligation to lie, but disagree with his claim veracity is not a foundational prima facie duty like fidelity and gratitude. Ross does not give an argument for why there is no foundational prima facie duty of veracity.

Ross’s thought seems to be the duty can be accounted for in terms of his five, foundational duties. As noted, Ross says the duty not to lie rests in part on the duty of non-maleficence. It is wrong to lie because it involves inflicting a positive injury on another person (RG 55). This might be true in part. But one might imagine someone replying with a claim similar to the one Ross makes in reply to utilitarian attempts to show the duty of fidelity to promises is not foundational, namely, that, like promise keeping, veracity is not just a device for preventing bad outcomes. Even in cases where lying is beneficial it still might be prima facie wrong, for while it does not harm or injure anyone in Ross’s sense, it does bypass another’s will in an objectionable way.

Ross also suggests lying is wrong because it involves breaking an implicit promise ‘not to tell ties which seems to be implied in the act of entering into conversation’ (RG 21; FE 97). Again, this might capture some of what we think wrong with lying, but it may not provide the full account of what makes it wrong. Ross says when ‘we consider ourselves bound . . . to fulfil a promise, we think of the fulfilment of the promise as the bringing into existence of some source of pleasure or satisfaction for the person to whom we have made the promise’ (RG 162). When we consider ourselves bound to tell the truth we are not clearly of the view doing so will promote pleasure for the individual to whom we owe the obligation. Think here of being asked to provide an honest assessment of a student’s work. We think we ought to tell the truth, but this is not obviously accompanied by the thought doing so will bring into existence pleasure for the student.

It is possible, of course, that we might think telling the truth is accompanied by the thought doing so will produce some other good (e.g., knowledge or insight) in which case Ross might be right the duty to tell the truth rests on the duty to fulfil a promise. But someone keen on a prima facie duty of veracity might insist even when no good is at stake it might still be prima facie right to tell the truth. It is hard to know what Ross can say to someone who insists on a self-standing prima facie duty of veracity (like Price 1787, 153).

Ross mentions one good to be promoted under the duty of beneficence is the good of justice which for him involves ‘the bringing about of a distribution of happiness between other people in proportion to merit’ or virtue (RG 26; also 21, 27, 28, 138, 153–154; FE 286). This is but one element of justice, as Ross allows. He says many existing injustices in his sense are due to ‘social and economic systems which we have … taken part in and assented to’ (RG 28) (including, we should imagine as Ross did not, the colonialism from which Ross’s own college – Oriel College – benefitted (Clarke 1971, 327)). He says this fact reinforces our obligations of justice.

Ross may be right. But our obligations to disrupt these systems is not merely a matter of restoring justice in Ross’s sense. It might be the case that we have a prima facie obligation to facilitate fair or equitable outcomes in the distribution of wealth and income that are unrelated to restoring or preventing injustice in Ross’s case. Indeed, we might argue it is more important to achieve some fairness in the distribution of income and wealth and it would be right to achieve it even at the expense of justice in Ross’s sense.

There are other issues of justice Ross does not touch on. For example, Ross says very little about equality in the distribution of scare resources. Some think in distributing scarce medical resources (e.g., ICU beds) we ought to give priority to the least well off. Ross might think considerations of this sort are captured by the duty of beneficence. But many might think we should give priority to the least well off even if this fails to promote the best outcomes. Ross may need to include a prima facie duty of equity in his list to accommodate the full inventory of issues relating to justice.

4.2 The Good

In RG, Ross argues four things are intrinsically good (RG 27, 102, 134–141):

  1. Virtue (or, ‘virtuous disposition and action, i.e. action, or disposition to act, from any one of certain motives [desires], of which at all events the most notable are the desire to do one’s duty, the desire to bring into being something that is good, and the desire to give pleasure or save pain to others’ (RG 134; also 160);
  2. Knowledge (or apprehension of fact) and (to a lesser extent) right opinion (or correct belief about the ways things are);
  3. Justice (or happiness apportioned to merit or virtue); and
  4. Pleasure[2].

Virtue, knowledge and pleasure are states of mind, while justice is a relation between states of mind (virtue and pleasure) (RG 140).[3]

Ross does not think these values are of the same importance. He ranks them. Virtue is ranked highest. It is ‘superior’ to all the other goods (RG 153). It is, he says, ‘infinitely’ better than knowledge (understood as a ‘bare condition of the intellect’ (RG 151)), pleasure, and (it seems) justice (RG 150, 152–154). As noted, there are three virtuous desires. These, too, are ranked. The desire to do one’s duty is more valuable than the desire to promote what is good (e.g., virtue and knowledge) which is more valuable than the desire to promote others’ pleasure (RG 164–166).

Knowledge is the next best, followed by right opinion.[4] Knowledge and right opinion are, for Ross, distinct states: ‘Knowledge is apprehension of fact, and right opinion is not that, but is simply a state of mind in which things are believed (not apprehended) to be related as they are in fact related’ (RG 146). Knowledge is better than right opinion, for two reasons.

First, knowledge involves direct apprehension of facts or the inferential apprehension of one fact ‘as necessitated by other facts’, but right opinion is always partly grounded on ‘the product of other psychical events such as wishes, hopes, fears, or the mere association of ideas’ (RG 146). Second, knowledge involves certainty which right opinion lacks (RG 30, 138–139, 147). In addition, ‘knowledge of general principles is intellectually more valuable than knowledge of isolated matters of fact’ and the more general the knowledge – the more it explains or has the potential to explain other facts – the better it is (RG 147; for discussion, see Hurka 2014, 206–208).

The least valuable is pleasure (RG 152). It is unclear where exactly to place justice in Ross’s hierarchy; he says only that it is less valuable than virtue (RG 153–154). It is not implausible to think it should be placed between (virtuous) knowledge and pleasure, and therefore the values are ranked as follows: virtue, (virtuous) knowledge, justice and pleasure.

In FE, Ross defends a slightly different view. He appears to maintain there are four non-instrumental values (FE 19, 73, 180, 262, 278, 288–289):

  1. virtue;
  2. intellectual and aesthetic activities;
  3. justice; and
  4. (others’) pleasure.

In RG, Ross maintains all non-instrumental values are valuable in the same way: their goodness is intrinsic to them (RG 115, 118, 132; also OJ 119; he returns to this position at KT 11–12;). In FE, he adopts a different stance. The value of virtue and intellectual activities is a ‘quality intrinsic to them’ (FE 278). These items are ‘fit objects of admiration’ or objects ‘worthy of admiration’ (FE 282–283). By contrast, the value of justice and pleasure is not intrinsic to them; rather, their value is based on a relation involving us rightly taking an interest or rightly finding (some kind of) satisfaction in them (FE 278). The pleasure of others and justice are ‘worthy objects of satisfaction’ or things in which it is right to take satisfaction or an interest (FE 275, 278, 282, 283, 288–89). The difference in the source of value of the things in the two categories appears to follow from the fact ‘while it is self-evident that the only ground on which a thing is worthy of admiration is that it is good in itself, it is not self-evident that the only ground on which a thing is worthy of our interest or liking is that it is good in itself’ (FE 279).[5]

This distinction between types of non-instrumental value permits Ross to explain two things he thinks true of pleasure:

  1. Only innocent pleasure is good, that is, pleasure not undeserved or taken in the misfortune of others or in lust or in cruelty (RG 136–137, 151; FE 271–272).
  2. Only the innocent pleasure of others is good and hence why we think we have a duty to promote it and not our own (even innocent) pleasure (FE 74–75, 272, 276, 279, 283, 322).[6]

The reason only innocent pleasure is valuable is only it is an object worthy of satisfaction. For Ross, it is not right to take satisfaction in, for instance, undeserved pleasure or pleasure in cruelty or lust. The reason only the pleasure of others is valuable is, again, only in it is it right for one to take satisfaction. It is not right, thinks Ross, for one to take satisfaction in one’s own pleasure.

In section 4.1 we discussed Ross’s view we have no duty or obligation to promote our own pleasure or prevent our own pain. Here we see one reason for this: one’s own pain is not from one’s own point of view bad and one’s own pleasure is not from one’s own point of view good. These are not fit objects of (dis)satisfaction. Hence, we have no duty to prevent our own pain or promote our own pleasure.[7]

In RG, Ross wrestled with whether we have a duty to promote our own pleasure, noting ‘while we clearly recognize a duty to produce pleasure for others, it is by no means so clear that we recognize a duty to produce pleasure for ourselves’ (RG 24; also 25–26, 151). Despite his lack of confidence, he affirmed in RG an obligation to promote our own happiness under the obligation of beneficence (RG 25–26). However, as we have seen, there are traces of the view we have no duty to promote our own pleasure / prevent our own pain even in RG, including (as noted) in how he construes the duty of non-maleficence (e.g., at RG 21, 22, 28) and in his view it is not virtuous to desire to give yourself pleasure or save yourself pain (RG 134, 168; cf. Ross 1928–29, 268–69).

Ross is often unclear about the value and status of justice. He frequently states there are only three intrinsic goods (FE 19, 180, 262, 278; KT 11–12; OJ 119, 120, 121). In early writings, he claims justice is a duty not a value (OJ 123). In RG, he is unclear, sometimes claiming justice is a good (RG 27) and sometimes that it is a prima facie duty (RG 35). However, in FE he is relatively clear justice is good in the same sense the pleasure of others is good, so it seems reasonable to conclude he thinks justice is a non-instrumental good (FE 288–289). He also suggests at one point promise keeping is good in the same way justice and pleasure are good (FE 289). But he more often rejects the claim that promise keeping is good (FE 141, 142), suggesting not all objects worthy of satisfaction are valuable.[8]

There are variety of ways in which to attack Ross’s theory of value. As in the case of Ross’s list of duties we can ask whether his list should be expanded or contracted. But before we discuss this it is worth to examine a some of the unique and striking features of Ross’s value theory.

Ross says a number of highly interesting things about knowledge, including about the value of knowledge (RG 148). One thing he says, for example, is knowledge is always more valuable than right opinion. He seems to think knowledge better in part because right opinion always rests on ‘psychological causes (largely irrational)’, e.g., wishes, hopes, and fears (RG 146). Against Ross, one might suggest not all right opinion – e.g., opinion carefully formed on the basis of the best evidence – necessarily rests on such causes (Phillips 2019, 144). Suppose having used the best, most sophisticated polling data I believe with a credence level of 84% that a certain politician will win a by-election and she does. My being able to have only probable opinion in this case need not result from some intellectual vice or shortcoming.

Ross might say in reply in the case of right opinion you cannot rule out that such causes are operating on your opinion, whereas in the case of knowledge you can, because, on his conception of knowledge, when you know, you know you know. You have complete conviction (RG 147). This might make knowledge more valuable. And, he might continue, even if you can rule out such causes in the case of right opinion right opinion is less valuable than knowledge because it is in some way always based on conjecture and merely contingent connections between ideas and so held with some degree of diffidence.

Ross also says, as we noted, some virtuous motives are better than others. We might question whether we really can affirm, for example, the desire to do one’s duty is always better than the desire to produce something good (RG 164–65). The desire to do your duty because it is your duty seems no more valuable than the desire to promote good because it is good (Hurka 2003, 213–14). Both involve similar kinds of attitudes (loving the good and loving the right) and overcoming similar kinds of obstacles. It is not clear it is better to follow warranted public health measures because you desire to do what you ought rather than because you desire to promote general good.

Ross’s value theory also includes two very striking claims. Perhaps the most striking claim is about the value of virtue. He says ‘no amount of pleasure is equal to any amount of virtue’ (RG 150; italics in original). This means a world with some, very small amount of virtue but great amounts of (surplus) pain is better than a world with slightly less virtue (one more venial sin has been committed) but great quantities of (surplus) pleasure. This is hard to believe. Surely, the second world is better (Price 1931, 354; also Hurka 2014, 226; Phillips 2019, 120).

Ross also says in FE that one’s own (innocent) pleasure lacks non-instrumental value from one’s own point of view. He holds this because, as we noted, only the (innocent) pleasure of others is something in which it is right to take satisfaction. Ross says little about (innocent) pain. But his view seems to be my own (innocent) pain is not something in which it is right to take dissatisfaction.

However, it does not seem like it is wrong to take dissatisfaction in one’s own pain. It seems right to take dissatisfaction in one’s wretched childhood (if one has had one) and to take dissatisfaction in the fact one’s future is likely to be painful (after, say, a terminal cancer diagnosis). It is not clear, contra Ross, we could not follow these judgements with ‘moral safety’ (FE 288). It might be harder to think it right to take satisfaction in one’s own pleasure. But, still, it does not seem wrong to take satisfaction in a joyous childhood (if one has had one) and to take satisfaction in the fact that one’s future appears likely to be enjoyable (see also Shaver 2014, 312).

Furthermore, Broad rightly says we ‘certainly condemn morally a person who acts highly imprudently, i.e. one who unreasonably discounts his own probably future pleasures and unpleasures in comparison with those which are immediately within his reach’ (Broad 1971, 274–75; also Butler 1736, 137–138; Price 1787, 153). One plausible explanation of this is that one’s own pleasure (pain) is non-instrumentally good (bad).

Ross’s worry seems to be that it is odd to say it would be morally right to take satisfaction in one’s own pleasure and morally right to take dissatisfaction in one’s own pain (FE 322; also 324, 282, 288; RG 151). Perhaps the right reply, then, is to say that there is reason to take satisfaction in one’s own pleasure and reason to take dissatisfaction in one’s own pain.

In general, Ross’s value theory is too rigid. One of the attractive features of his theory of prima facie duties is its flexibility and its lack of a rigid hierarchy amongst the duties. It is always possible for any one duty to outweigh any other. Ross would do well to inject some of this flexibility into his value theory, thinking it is always possible for one value to outweigh any other in some context. This seems a better fit with what ‘we’ think on reflection.

In the last section we explored some attempts by ideal utilitarians to show there are fewer duties than Ross allows. Some ideal utilitarians take the opposite position with respect to his list of values. They think it should be expanded or (at any rate) modified. They think a plausible list would incorporate the values of keeping promises, expressing gratitude and compensating for past wrongs. The idea is that acts of this sort have value. They think this will help capture our intuitions about the ethical importance of promise keeping, gratitude and reparation while retaining the idea it is never right to do less than the (impartial) best. Grappling with this puts us in a position us to assess the second ideal utilitarian reply to Ross’s objections mentioned in the last section.

Recall again one of Ross’s examples to suggest ideal utilitarianism cannot make sense of the obligation to keep one’s promises:

A is dying. He entrusts his property to B, on the strength of B’s promise to give it to C. C does not know of A’s intentions or B’s promise. B’s activities will not disappoint A or C, nor will his activities negatively impact the general mutual confidence. Suppose D could make better use of the property than C. It follows on ideal utilitarianism B ought to give the property to D.

Ross thinks this breach of trust ‘outrageous’ (FE 105).

In reply, some ideal utilitarians contend they can agree in this case the promise ought to be kept by adding a value to Ross’s list and say (the act of) promise keeping is non-instrumentally valuable (or at least that promise breaking is evil). The most plausible form of this argument states Ross must accept promise keeping is valuable because he accepts knowledge and justice are valuable and there is no real difference between these values and the value of keeping promises or the disvalue of breaking promises (Shaver 2011, 130ff.).

The characterisation of Ross’s value theory in this section provides him with a potential defence. He seems to insist on many occasions only states of mind or relations between states of mind have non-instrumental value. Promise keeping, reparation, and gratitude are not merely states of mind or relations between states of mind. Therefore, they are not non-instrumentally good.

One worry with this reply is knowledge is not merely a state of mind. It involves relations to what grounds it. In RG, Ross insists knowledge has intrinsic value. He sometimes suggests this in FE. However, his considered seems to be that it is not knowledge but intellectual and aesthetic activities that have value (FE 19, 27, 73, 180, 262, 266, 267, 270, 278, 282–283, 284, 290, 296; also OJ 119, 120, 121; KT 11–12). And these, we might think, are states of mind.

This reply might cause Ross problems. If he says knowledge is not intrinsically valuable but intellectual activities are, he cannot say an activity of the mind is better when it issues in knowledge (FE 270; Shaver 2011, 134n34). Perhaps Ross will have to say intellectual activities leading to knowledge are better, not because knowledge is itself good, but because of its instrumental properties, e.g., knowledge might lead us to being most effective at promoting justice or virtue or pleasure. A fortiori the claim it is intellectual activities that are intrinsically good explains why some instances of knowledge are more important than others. Ross says ‘different instances of this [intellectual] activity are good in proportion as they are conducted according to these principles’ (FE 270; also RG 151–152), i.e., principles discovered by logic. Because, say, more philosophical or more general knowledge requires greater and more sophisticated use of ‘the principles discovered by logic’ (FE 270), it is better than knowledge of the sex lives of movie stars. The value of the intellectual activities explains the value of the knowledge.

But what about the fact that justice is an intrinsic value? It is not a state of consciousness; it is a relation between states of consciousness (RG 140). If Ross is willing to accept justice as a good, why not accept (the act of) promise keeping, and so on, are good? Ross might insist justice is different from promise keeping, reparation, and gratitude because it is compounded from states of consciousness and that is why it and not these other things are good. However, perhaps the better reply is to stop treating justice as a value. He repeatedly contends it is only states of mind that have value (OJ 118; RG 122, 106–107, 140; FE 259, 270; KT 21), and justice is not a state of mind. He can insist only states of mind have value and block the ideal utilitarian response. Ross is open to characterising justice as a requirement of duty rather than a value (FE 319), and he losses little by not listing it as a value. Further, it might be more acceptable and capture more of what we think about justice to construe justice (in his sense and others) as a duty.[9] Many think justice constrains what we are permitted to do to promote general good and Ross sometimes agrees (FE 71).

It is, of course, open to a critic to argue there is little reason to think that only states of mind have value. Ross does little to defend the view. Indeed, he might be forced to reconsider whether only states of consciousness possess value once he is confronted with the idea that achievement is among the things we seem to value, where this involves ‘having a goal for how the world should be and then realizing it’ (Hurka 2014, 209). Achievement involves interacting with and affecting the world, including doing things like writing a book, raising a child to adulthood and building a muscular physique.

Ross relies quite heavily on the Moorean isolation method to defend his value theory (Moore 1903, 93, 95–96, 187–88). You figure out whether something is non-instrumentally valuable by considering it by itself or in isolation (KT 10, 11). His value theory came under much less scrutiny than did his theory of right, and therefore he did not see fit to consider monistic responses to it. This may in part be because there is agreement amongst his main rivals—Moore, Rashdall, Pickard-Cambridge, Ewing, and Johnson—that value pluralism is true. This may also be because he considered the main monistic rival—that is, hedonism—a dead end (RG 98; FE 65). But hedonism lives on (Bradley 2009; Crisp 2006; de Lazari-Radek and Singer 2014; Feldman 2004; Hewitt 2010; Mendola 2006). Therefore, Ross’s value theory may be in for a challenge neither he nor his ideal utilitarian critics anticipated.

To get a taste of what this challenge may look like consider the following hedonistic reply to Ross’s argument for the idea virtue is intrinsically valuable. Hedonists hold pace Ross that while it is obvious virtue is instrumentally good and vice is instrumentally bad, it is far from clear the former is intrinsically good and the latter is intrinsically bad (Sidgwick 1907: 400ff.). In response, Ross asks us to imagine two worlds, W1 and W2. W1 and W2 include the same quantity of pleasure. However, W1 contains agents that are virtuous, who act from or who are disposed to act from the right motives, while W2 contains agents who are vicious, who act from or who are disposed to act from the wrong motives. Is not W1 preferable to W2? Ross thinks it is, and he says what explains this is virtue is intrinsically good (RG 134).

But the hedonist has a reply. The situation envisaged is implausible, for surely W1 would have more pleasure than W2 because typically virtuous people produce more pleasure than vicious people. Indeed, would not a world with virtuous people be more likely to continue to be filled with pleasure and lack the possibility of descending into chaos than a world with vicious people? Is not this ultimately the reason why we desire or prefer it?

In response, Ross reminds us not all pleasure springs from the actions of virtuous people and not all pain springs from actions of vicious (RG 134). Some results from ‘the operation of natural laws’ (RG 134). Suppose, then, there are two worlds, W1 and W2. W1 contains virtuous people and W2 contains vicious people, and the two worlds contain equal amounts of pleasure, because although W1-type worlds usually contain more pleasure than W2-type worlds, W1’s extra virtue-generated pleasure is offset by ‘a much greater incidence of disease’, making the worlds equal in pleasure. Ross contends it is still the case the virtuous world, W1, is better than W2.

This is a good response. The hedonist may have a rejoinder. Would not W1 be on the whole better (hedonistically speaking) in the long run because of the virtuous people? Would not W1 be a place where it is more likely to be the case a cure is found or where it is more likely pain is treated effectively and sympathetically or where it is more likely to remain stable enough to handle the disease and illness? Ross may rely on strategies similar to the ones he adopts against the ideal utilitarian’s attempt to show she can explain the importance of promise keeping (RG 38). But it is clear proponents of Ross’s view of value may well have to contend with arguments of this variety given the recent resurgence of hedonism. They may have to contend more specifically with hedonistic replies questioning the reliability of the intuitions to which Ross appeal in his attempt to argue for value pluralism.

5. Ross’s Moral Epistemology

How do we acquire moral and axiological knowledge? Ross holds ‘both in mathematics and in ethics we have certain crystal-clear intuitions from which we build up all that we can know about the nature of numbers and the nature of duty’ (FE 144). Our knowledge of the basic moral and axiological propositions which are the object of moral intuitions is non-inferential (OJ 121, 123; RG 29, 146; FE 144, 172, 262, 320). They are non-inferentially knowable because they are self-evident or knowable on the basis of an understanding of the self-evident proposition alone (RG 20n1, 29; FE 320). For example, that we have a responsibility to keep our promises is self-evident (RG 29). It is by a process of reflection on this proposition that we come to apprehend we have this responsibility. Ross thinks we can trust our moral apprehensions, and since apprehension is a matter of knowledge, and knowledge implies certainty, he is certain we have the above responsibilities and that certain things are intrinsically valuable (RG 146, 29, 30; KT 42; Skelton 2007; cf. Audi 2004).

That our responsibilities are self-evident does not entail they are obvious to everyone who reflects on them. Ross says a responsibility is self-evident ‘not in the sense that it is evident from the beginning of our lives, or as soon as we attend to the proposition for the first time, but in the sense that when we have reached sufficient mental maturity and have given sufficient attention to the proposition it is evident without any need of proof, or of evidence beyond itself. It is self-evident just as a mathematical axiom, or the validity of a form of inference, is evident’ (RG 29; also 12, 32; KT 42).

The analogy with mathematics is instructive, for we acquire our moral knowledge in the same way we acquire knowledge of mathematical axioms. We apprehend that 2+2 = 4 by apprehending 2+2 matches makes 4 matches and 2+2 balls makes 4 balls, and so on. We apprehend the algorithm in the particular cases after exposure to particular instances of its application, by a process of intuitive induction (FE 170). We apprehend it is prima facie right to keep promises by apprehending it is prima facie right to fulfill this or that particular promise. ‘What comes first in time is the apprehension of the self-evident prima facie rightness of an individual act of a particular type. From this we come by reflection to apprehend the self-evident general principle of prima facie duty’ (RG 33; also FE 170).

How do we decide or form epistemic attitudes about our actual obligation in a particular circumstance? What one ought to do in a particular case, as we noted above, is that act ‘of all those possible for the agent in the circumstances, [that has]…the greatest balance of prima facie rightness, in those respects in which they are prima facie right, over their prima facie wrongness, in those respects in which they are prima facie wrong’ (RG 41; also RG 46). To figure out which, of the acts open to you, has the greatest balance of prima facie rightness over prima facie wrongness you look at all the acts open to you and determine all the ways in which they are prima facie right and all the ways in which they are prima facie wrong and then figure out in each case the balance of prima facie rightness over prima facie wrongness. You then compare the acts open to you in terms of their balance of prima facie rightness over prima facie wrongness. The act with the greatest balance of overall prima facie rightness is the one you ought all things considered to do and what you ought all things considered to do is what you ought or it is right to do.

What is the relationship between the prima facie responsibilities we have and the ‘actual or absolute duty to do one particular act in particular circumstances’ (RG 28)? Our self-evident prima facie responsibilities are not ‘principles by the immediate application of which our duty in particular circumstances can be deduced’ (FE 84; also 169, 171; OJ 122, 127). Instead, one determines one’s actual duty or one’s duty proper, by reference to ‘all the morally significant kinds it [the act] is an instance of’ (RG 20; italics in original; also FE 84, 186; OJ 126–127). One’s actual responsibility or duty ‘belongs to an act in virtue of its whole nature and of nothing less than this’ (RG 28; also 33, 132).

Ross is not exactly right here, for one has to engage in a fair amount of comparison of rival acts open to one in terms of their balance of prima facie rightness over prima facie wrongness. The idea is our prima facie principles provide moral considerations or factors of direct relevance to the morality of each of the acts open to us. We have to judge with respect to each act open to us to what extent prima facie rightness outweighs prima facie wrongness and then compare acts with each other in terms of their balance of prima facie rightness over prima facie wrongness and then determine which act has on balance the greatest amount of prima facie rightness over prima facie wrongness. The act with the greatest balance of prima facie rightness over prima facie wrongness is what you ought all things considered to do and is therefore your actual obligation. The act which is one’s actual duty is the one for which one is most responsible or to which the weightier of one’s responsibilities attach of those acts open to one (FE 85; RG 41–42).

Unsurprisingly, Ross says ‘[t]his sense of our particular duty in particular circumstances, preceded and informed by the fullest reflection we can bestow on the act in all its bearings, is highly fallible, but it is the only guide we have to our [actual] duty’ (RG 42). We never know, then, what we actually ought to do in a certain situation. Instead, we have a ‘considered opinion’ or ‘probable opinion’ regarding what we ought to do in a particular situation (RG 19, 30, 31, 33; FE 189, 190, 191; OJ 122, 123, 127). In the end, the decision regarding what to do simpliciter, to use Aristotle’s phrase, ‘rests with perception’ (RG 42; OJ 127; Aristotle1109b23, 1126b4). It is important to note all of the responsibilities have a valence, positive or negative, and this valence persists even when a responsibility is outweighed by weightier responsibilities. So if one’s break a promise one owes compensation to the person to whom one has made the promise (RG 28).

One point of clarification. Ross says the act which is our actual duty or obligation in our situation is the one, out of the range of acts open to us, with the greatest balance of prima facie rightness over prima facie wrongness. It is possible, of course, all acts open to us will have on balance a greater amount of prima facie wrongness over prima facie rightness. In this case, one presumes, Ross will say our actual obligation is the act, of those open to us, with the least amount of prima facie wrongness over prima facie rightness on balance.

In addition, Ross seems not to have considered fully the possibility that two acts open to us might be tied in terms of the amount of prima facie rightness over prime facie wrongness they possess. If two or more acts are tied in this respect, there is no act of those open to us having the greatest balance of prima facie rightness over prima facie wrongness. In such a case there will appear to be a conflict of actual obligations. To avoid saying this, Ross will have to modify his view to say our actual obligation in our situation is the act, of those open to us, with at least as much prima facie rightness over prima facie wrongness as any other act open to us.

Ross’s epistemology may be attacked in a variety of different ways.

One issue arises with respect to Ross’s contrast between our knowledge of prima facie duties or responsibilities and our knowledge of our actual obligation in a situation. Ross thinks we have certainty with respect to prima facie responsibilities (RG 30), but only probable opinion of our actual duty. Our lack of knowledge of our actual duty is due in part to the difficulty of determining the precise weight of a prima facie duty or its degree of obligatoriness (FE 188).

One may dissent from both the claim we have knowledge of or are certain we have the prima facie responsibilities Ross says we have and from the claim that we cannot know (in some perhaps lesser sense) our actual duty.

It is hard to believe we could ever be certain we have Ross’s prima facie duties. Ross himself gives reasons for doubt. As noted, in RG he says in his original discussion of prima facie duties we have a prima facie duty of justice (pleasure apportioned to virtue) (RG 21). A duty of this sort would in some way constrain our duty of beneficence. A few pages later he revises his view and says justice is not a duty, but a good that ought to be promoted as a part of our obligation of beneficence in which case it would not constrain our duty of beneficence (RG 27). But Ross is less than clear about exactly what he thinks. After it seems he has settled on the idea justice is a good he seems to suggest he is not fully convinced saying again justice is a duty (RG 35; for the same view, see FE 71–72). This suggests uncertainty about a prima facie duty justice. And we may have similar uncertainties about the status of other duties, including the prima facie duty of fidelity to promises. We may be uncertain whether or not the duty to keep one’s promises constrains the duty of beneficence (for discussion, see Phillips 2019, 186–87).

In addition, it seems in some cases we can have quite a firm view of our actual duty. Consider a situation in which you have to acts open to you. You are walking to work to chat with a student you have promised to meet. On the way there you see a child drowning in a pond and only you can save her. If you save her, you will not be able to meet your student; if you carry on to meet your student, the child will drown. So, either you break a relatively trivial promise to meet a student in your office hours or you save a drowning child. It seems clear to many that your actual obligation in this scenario is that you break the promise. True, it is likely that you cannot be certain of this but you can be as certain of this as you can be of any prima facie duty (for discussion, see Hurka, 2014, 124–125; Phillips 2019, 187–88; Price 1931, 344; Ross sometimes agrees; FE 191).

Another worry is there is very little agreement in intuitions or claims to self-evidence. This suggests for some there is no fact of the matter as to what has value or what one is responsible for. Ross concedes there is a lot of disagreement. His response begins by noting a lot of moral diversity rests not on ‘disagreement about fundamental moral principles, but partly on differences in the circumstances of different societies, and partly on different views which people hold, not on moral questions but on questions of fact’ (FE 18). He thinks most of the differences concern media axiomata, i.e., attempts to apply general principles to particular circumstances, which rest on different circumstances or different factual beliefs (FE 18–19). About middle principles, he says intuitionists must have an open mind (FE 190).

Many differences cannot be explained away in this fashion, however (FE 19). There are differences as to the ‘comparative worth of different goods’ (FE 19) and as to the stringency of the responsibilities Ross endorses (FE 186–188). These disagreements should not, he thinks, undermine our confidence that there is objective moral truth. But it is very hard to see a resolution to these problems. He says despite changes in scientific theories there is a sense science progresses toward the truth. The same is true in ethics. There is no reason to ‘doubt that man progresses fairly steadily towards moral truth as he does towards scientific’ (FE 20). The difficulty with this response is whereas in scientific matters there is an independent way of establishing progress, there is no such independent or seemingly independent way of establishing this in ethics. Recent research in the social sciences on moral judgement should not leave us confident (Greene 2008; Singer 2005).

The problems with Ross’s moral epistemology are compounded by the fact he thinks the principles of his framework best reflect the main elements of common-sense moral thinking, and that this is necessary to an acceptable moral theory. This threatens to make his position appear parochial (Hare 1971). He is aware of this worry. He replies by saying the number of principles intuitionism endorses is small in number and general in content and this leaves room to reject much of what is commonly taken to be right (FE 190). He also insists on the idea the list of duties (goods) he fixes on are a result of sober reflection on what we really think where this involves appeal to thought experiments and judgements about particular cases (for discussion, see Stratton-Lake 2002b, 114–118). This seems like the right kind of move to make to avoid dogmatism.

However, it puts him in a rather awkward position. If it really is true the number of principles is small and it is possible therefore to reject much of what is commonly recognized to be morally required, the position has a more reformist edge, and to the extent it is reformist it is more rather than less like the other views Ross rejects. In this case, it makes it much more difficult for him to fault his rivals for not capturing common-sense morality or what the plain many thinks. If he attempts to move more toward the plain man’s view, then although he can more easily raise objections to ideal utilitarianism and other views, he is much more likely to lose his critical element and therefore less likely fend off the charge of parochialism.

6. Ross’s Moral Metaphysics

Like many in his time, Ross took pains to undermine various definitions of moral terms. He draws a distinction between naturalistic and non-naturalistic definitions. The former are ‘definitions which claim to define an ethical term without using any other ethical term’ (FE 6). The latter are definitions which attempt ‘to define one ethical term by the aid of another’ (FE 6; cf. 42).

Ross rejects all naturalistic definitions of moral terms, including ‘right’ and (intrinsic) ‘good’. In RG, he argues (following Moore 1912 and Sidgwick 1907) that the moral terms ‘right’ and ‘ought’ are incapable of definition: ‘right’ is an ‘irreducible notion’ (RG 12). In FE, he suggests again ‘right’ is indefinable (FE 42), though he is sympathetic to the idea that ‘right’ is definable in terms of ‘suitable’ (FE 52–55). On this view, ‘this act is right’ means ‘this act has “the greatest amount of suitability possible in the circumstances”’ (FE 53; also 55). This is not a naturalist definition, since ‘suitability’ is itself a ‘unique and indefinable’ ethical notion (FE 146; also 159).

In RG, Ross appears to reject all naturalistic attempts to define ‘good’ (RG 78ff.). He is in particular keen to impugn views providing relational accounts of ‘good’; that is, views defining it in terms of some relation to a mental state, e.g., desire. His view appears to be that ‘goodness is a quality which can no more be defined in terms of anything other than itself, than can the quality of the sensation which we describe as being one of “seeing yellow”’ (RG 86). In FE, he seems to affirm the view that ‘good’ is indefinable (FE 262), though again he seems sympathetic to a non-naturalistic definition, according to which ‘good’ is definable in terms of ‘admirable’ or ‘commendable’ (FE 271, 283). He says this sense of ‘good’ applies only to things that are intrinsically good in the sense of being objects worthy of admiration, and (as noted above) only virtue and intellectual activity are worthy of admiration (FE 283). The notion of ‘good’ as applied to the goods of pleasure and justice can be defined relationally. These goods are not objects worthy of admiration but rather fit objects of satisfaction. Both notions of good are in a sense definable, but the definitions are non-natural: in both cases ‘good’ is defined in terms of ‘worthiness’ or ‘rightness’ (FE 279, 282).

Ross suggests a number of arguments against various (naturalistic and non-naturalistic) definitions of moral terms. He relies in part on the following kind of argument, which is directed at Moore (RG 8). If ‘right’ and ‘being productive of the greatest good in the circumstances’ mean the same thing, it is not the case it is intelligible the proposition ‘the “right act” just is “the act productive of the greatest good in the circumstances”’ should have been denied and maintained ‘with so much fervour; for we do not fight for or against analytic propositions’ (RG 8). It is intelligible that these propositions should have been denied and maintained with so much fervour. Therefore, it is not the case that ‘right’ and ‘productive of the greatest good in the circumstances’ mean the same thing. This argument can be generalised to reject the usual suspects, e.g., ‘right’ means ‘approved of by me’ or ‘right’ means ‘approved of by the majority of society’, and so on. But it is not the best argument, since we may well fight over analytic propositions, especially when they are opaque or unobvious.

Ross seems to acknowledge this sort of worry. He writes ‘the fact that we accept some definition as correct shows that the term did somehow stand for a complex of elements; yet the fact that we are for some time in doubt about whether the term is analysable, and if so, what the correct analysis is, shows that this complex of elements was not distinctly present to our mind before, or during, the search for a definition’ (RG 92–93). In reply, he says the only way to rebut the claim ‘right’ and ‘good’ are definable (naturalistically) is to examine ‘all the definitions that possess any initial plausibility’ (RG 93). To these we should apply two tests (FE 259; RG 93). First, we should determine whether ‘the definition applies to all things to which the term applies, and to no others’ (FE 259; also RG 93). Second, we should ask whether the proposed definition expresses ‘explicitly what we had implicitly in mind when we used the term’ (FE 259; also RG 93). Using these tools, Ross rejects (among others) the position that ‘this act is right’ means ‘all or most men…react to the act with a feeling of approval’ (FE 24). We often judge an act is right even when we know we are alone in holding this view (FE 25).

These are not the only arguments on which Ross relies. Against the view ‘right’ means ‘awakes in me the emotion of approval’ (FE 22), he argues it is unable to explain ‘the possibility of difference of opinion on the rightness of acts’ (FE 24). On this view, if I say ‘incest is impermissible’ and you say ‘incest is permissible’ we are not disagreeing, since all I am saying is ‘incest awakes in me the emotion of disapproval’ and all you are saying is ‘incest awakes in me the emotion of approval’, two statements that appear to be ‘perfectly compatible’ with each other (FE 24). But we want to say the two statements are not compatible. Ross gives the same argument against the claim ‘X is good’ means ‘I have a certain feeling toward X’. If I say ‘X is good’ and you say ‘X is bad’, you are saying you have a certain (negative) feeling toward X and I am saying I have a certain (positive) feeling toward X, two statements that seem to be compatible with each other. Yet, he urges, ‘if anything is clear, it is that we do suppose ourselves to be making incompatible statements about the object’ (RG 83).

Ross also appears to reject various analyses of moral terms in order to preserve a certain way of conducting moral philosophy (Shaver 2007, 286, 295). He notes ‘there is a system of moral truth, as objective as all truth must be, which, and whose implications, we are interested in discovering’ (RG 15; also 20, 29; KT 60). The discovery of these truths is not a matter of scientific (empirical) investigation. Ethical truths are not discovered by ‘mere observation’ (FE 7; also 168).

Instead, they are ‘grasped by an intuitive act of human reason’ (FE 3). ‘The use of the senses, and the physical sciences, give us no propositions in which ‘right’ or ‘obligatory’ occurs as a term’ (KT 87). There are ‘two types of predicate—those that can be discovered by experience to belong to their subjects, and those that can be discovered by insight, and let us grant that rightness belongs to the second class’ (KT 81). In science, ‘sense-experience…furnishes…real data’ (RG 40). In ethics, ‘no such appeal is possible. We have no more direct way of access to the facts about rightness and goodness and about what things are right or good, than by thinking about them’ (RG 40; emphasis added; also 82).

To entrench this idea he draws analogies between mathematic and logical knowledge and ethical knowledge (RG 29, 30, 32; KT 42, 85; FE 320). He is fan of synthetic a priori truths in ethics (and elsewhere) (FE 35–36; also 320). Since it might be possible to arrive at ethical knowledge by means of (mere) experience if moral terms were reducible to natural terms, this provides Ross with an incentive to show no such reduction is possible. He wants in short to protect a moral methodology prizing appeal to what ‘we’ think, the thoughts of the ‘best and most enlightened’ (FE 172), consensus amongst experts (OJ 119–120; FE 191) and various kinds of thought experiments. Indeed, it has been suggested that through the use of these tools it is possible to demonstrate that though ‘right’ is not synonymous with a natural property it nonetheless refers to some natural property, e.g., what has the greatest balance of justice, beneficence, fidelity, and so on, over injustice, non-maleficence and infidelity, and so on (Shaver 2007, 289). (This may be controversial if such notions as ‘justice’ are incapable of complete naturalization. If complete naturalization is not an option, then Ross may be forced to endorse a less palatable metaphysics.)

Ross holds the basic claims of morality express ‘facts which are self-evidently necessary’ (FE 320; also 262). Are these objective facts of a special kind? The standard suggestion is for Ross moral facts are non-natural facts or non-natural properties (Stratton-Lake 2002a, xxi; Frankena 1963, 86–87; 1973, 103). It is not clear he actually holds this view. He says very little about the nature of moral facts except (perhaps unhelpfully) to compare them to mathematical and logical facts. He does not appear to infer from the failure of naturalistic definitions of moral terms that the terms refer to distinct properties. His focus is almost entirely on definitions of ‘right’ and (intrinsic) ‘good’. His concern is with what ‘we have in mind’ not with properties (FE 13, 42), though, problematically, he often refers to ‘good’ as a ‘quality’ or ‘characteristic’ or ‘property’ (RG 82, 87, 88, 110, 122; FE 278, 279). He writes that ‘the difference between goodness or value and such attributes as yellowness is there whereas the latter are differentiae…of their possessors, the former is a property (i.e. a consequential attribute) of them’ (RG 121; italics in original).

It is not clear Ross intends this view to be an inference from his arguments against naturalistic or other analyses. That he offers no explicit argument to this effect suggests he likely did not intend the inference (cf. Stratton-Lake 2002a), and he nowhere rules out that moral properties are natural properties. At any rate, he does not need to make this inference to achieve the aims he has in rebutting the various definitions he discusses. The arguments he uses are sufficient to preserve (in his view) plausible moral semantics, moral disagreement, and his moral methodology. This should please the adherents of this view, though it still leaves Ross with the task of making sense of the nature of moral truth if it is not to be understood as correspondence to the moral facts.

Ross’s appeal to self-evidence and his defence of the synthetic a priori may seem problematic to many, though recent defences of these views suggest their fortunes are improving (Audi 1996, 2004; Crisp 2002; Parfit 2011; Stratton-Lake 2002a, 2002b). To defend himself, Ross might simply eschew appeal to self-evidence and certainty with respect to intuitions about general principles and replace them with appeal to moral beliefs of high reliability or to considered convictions about moral claims (Griffin 1996; Hooker 2000; Rawls 1971). This seems to give him what he needs methodologically (for discussion, see Irwin 2009, 686–90). The appeal to considered convictions allows him the ability to say, for example, we know directly pain is bad and it is prima facie wrong to break your promises; in addition, he can avoid the defects of coherence theories of justification by holding there are at least some propositions not justified exclusively by coherence (FE 141; Ross 1931, 61–62).

This (importantly) puts him on the same level as almost all moral theorists working today. It is less clear Ross is able to divest himself of synthetic a priori truths. But if his endorsement of synthetic a priori truths is one way of securing the standard way of doing moral philosophy, which involves appeal to thought-experiments, intuition, what we think, and so on, it is more difficult to reject. It is more difficult to reject still if we accept such claims in areas outside ethics and if we are not keen on (radical forms of) empiricism.

7. Ross’s Contemporary Importance

Ross’s contemporary importance to moral philosophy rests on his clarification and defence of a form of pluralistic deontology attempting to avoid the alleged deficiencies of utilitarianism without embracing the alleged excesses of Kantianism. The most distinctive feature of this view is the notion of a prima facie duty or of a consideration counting in favour of or against an act, morally speaking. Ross’s view serves as an important source of inspiration for those dissatisfied with Kantianism and utilitarianism. Ross said little about issues in what we now call practical or applied ethics. He belonged to a group of moral philosophers, including Moore, Prichard and others, for whom it was not important to work out views on contemporary issues or to use moral philosophy to change the world (though see Ross 1929; RG 56–64, for his reflections on punishment; for illuminating discussion of Ross’s view, see Moriarty 2006; Zimmerman 2011). Nevertheless, Ross’s view has seen a resurgence in ethics and applied ethics (Audi 2004; Beauchamp and Childress 2008; Phillips 2019; Stratton-Lake 2011b).

Ross also outlines a moral epistemology distinct from the coherentist reflective equilibrium that has held sway over moral philosophy for the last fifty years. He relies on the idea that at the core of ethics there are certain self-evident truths which can be discovered by reflection on what we think about moral and axiological questions. Those dissatisfied with the standard model for doing moral philosophy but who at the same time find themselves attracted to the idea ethical theories should capture the main elements of common-sense morality do well to consult Ross’s unique contribution to moral epistemology.


Primary Sources

[OJ] “The Basis of Objective Judgements in Ethics,” International Journal of Ethics, 37(2) (1927): 113–127.
[RG] The Right and the Good, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1930.
[FE] Foundations of Ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1939.
[KT] Kant’s Ethical Theory: A Commentary on the Grundlegung zur Metaphysik der Sitten, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1954.
[AT] Aristotle, sixth edition, London: Routledge, 1995.

Other Papers (in ethics) by Ross

  • Ross, W. D., 1928, “Is There a Moral End?,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society: Supplementary Volumes, 8: 91–98.
  • Ross, W. D., 1928–29, “The Nature of Morally Good Action,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 29: 251–274.
  • Ross, W. D., 1929, “The Ethics of Punishment,” Journal of Philosophical Studies, 4(14): 205–211.
  • Ross, W. D., 1931, “The Coherence Theory of Goodness,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society: Supplementary Volumes, 10: 61–70.

Secondary Sources

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  • –––, 2004, The Good in the Right: A Theory of Intuition and Intrinsic Value, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
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  • –––, “Self and Others,” in David Cheney (ed.), Broad’s Critical Essays in Moral Philosophy, New York: Routledge, pp. 262–282.
  • Butler, Joseph, 1736, A Dissertation of the Nature of Virtue, in David McNaughton (ed.), Joseph Butler: Fifteen Sermons and Other Writings on Ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2017.
  • Clark, G. N., 1971, “Sir David Ross: 1877–1971,” Proceedings of the British Academy, 57: 525–543.
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  • –––, 2006, Reasons and the Good, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
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  • –––, 2003, Virtue, Vice, and Value, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
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  • –––, 1797, “On a Supposed Right to Lie from Philanthropy” in Mary Gregor (ed.), The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant: Practical Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
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  • Mendola, Joseph, 2006, Goodness and Justice: A Consequentialist Moral Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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  • –––, 1863, Utilitarianism, in Roger Crisp (ed.), Mill’s Utilitarianism, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998.
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  • –––, 1912, Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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  • –––, 1932b, “Two Problems About Duty (II),” Mind, 41(162): 145–172.
  • –––, 1932c, “Two Problems About Duty (III),” Mind, 41(163): 311–340.
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  • –––, 1932, “Duty and the Ignorance of Fact,” Annual Philosophical Lecture, Henrietta Hertz Trust, London: Humphrey Milford; reprinted in MacAdam (ed.) 2002, pp. 84–110.
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  • –––, 1913, Ethics, London: T. C. & E. C. Jack.
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  • –––, 2011a, “Eliminativism about Derivative Prima Facie Duties,” in Thomas Hurka (ed.), Underivative Duty: British Moral Philosophers from Sidgwick to Ewing, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 146–165.
  • –––, 2011b, “Recalcitrant Pluralism,” Ratio, 24(4): 364–383.
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  • Stroud, Sarah, 2017, “Lying as Infidelity: A Quasi-Rossian Account,” in Mark Timmons (ed.), Oxford Studies in Normative Ethics (Volume 7), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 73–97.
  • Warnock, Mary, 1960, Ethics Since 1900, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wiggins, David, 2004, “Ross, Sir (William) David (1877–1971),” Oxford Dictionary of National Biography, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wiland, Eric, 2014, “Rossian Deontology and the Possibility of Moral Expertise,” in Mark Timmons (ed.), Oxford Studies in Normative Ethics, Volume 4, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 159–178.
  • Zimmerman, Michael J., 2011, “Ross on Retributivism,” in Thomas Hurka (ed.), Underivative Duty: British Moral Philosophers from Sidgwick to Ewing, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 166–182.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


The author wishes to thank John Cooper, Thomas Hurka, David Phillips, and Robert Shaver for helpful written comments on previous drafts of this entry.

Copyright © 2022 by
Anthony Skelton <askelto4@uwo.ca>

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