Donald Cary Williams
The published work of Donald Williams (1899–1983) ranges across a broad spectrum in philosophy, but his importance as a philosopher rests in large measure on four major achievements. Firstly, in a period when the role of philosophy was being diminished and trivialized, he persisted with a traditional style of philosophizing. Although it remained unfashionable throughout most of his active years, he held to the classic program of Western philosophy: to explain and defend our capacity to attain knowledge (so far as that reaches), in the light of that to present a well-reasoned account of the most general and fundamental features of Reality, and on that basis to propose a wise scheme for the good life. His unswerving allegiance to this project, keeping it alive in dark days, has had its reward. At least in Anglophone circles, these classic metaphysical, epistemic and ethical issues are once more firmly on the agenda.
Williams’ own contributions belong to the epistemic and metaphysical aspects of the project rather than its ethical side (except for a brief defense of ethics as ultimately “pure postulate” (1933b)). So, secondly, as an account of our world he proposed an empirically informed materialistic naturalism. Among its distinctive features, he champions a 4-dimensional space-time which accords equal status to Past, Present, and Future.
Thirdly, this cosmology is embedded in an original and powerful theory of the nature of properties, the thesis that properties are themselves particulars rather than universals. This Trope theory, as it has come to be known, following Williams’ own usage, has become one of the standard alternatives in the Problem of Universals.
And in the fourth place, in the teeth of the prevailing skepticism on this topic, he developed an original and boldly positive justification of inductive inference.
- 1. Life
- 2. The Nature of Philosophy
- 3. Metaphysics—Cosmology
- 4. Metaphysics—Ontology
- 5. Objections to Williams’s Trope Ontology
- 6. The Ground of Induction
- 7. Objections to Williams’ proposed solution to the problem of induction
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Donald Williams was born on 28 May 1899 in Crows Landing, California, at that time a strongly rural district, and died in Fallbrook, also in his beloved California, and also at that time far from cities, on 16 January 1983. His father was Joseph Cary Williams, who seems to have been a jack of all countrymen’s trades; his mother Lula Crow, a local farmer’s daughter. Donald was the first in his family to pursue an academic education. After studies in English Literature at Occidental College (BA 1923), he went to Harvard for his Masters, this time in Philosophy (AM 1925). He then undertook further graduate study in philosophy, first at the University of California at Berkeley (1925–27), then at Harvard, where he took his PhD in 1928.
Also in 1928 he married Katherine Pressly Adams, from Lamar, Colorado, whom he had met at Berkeley, where she was something of a pioneer—a woman graduate student in psychology. In time, there were two sons to the marriage. The couple spent a year in Europe in 1928–29 (“immersing himself in Husserl’s Phenomenology to the point of immunization”, Firth, Nozick and Quine 1983, p 246). Then Donald began his life’s work as a Professor of Philosophy, first spending ten years at the University of California, Los Angeles, and then from 1939 until his retirement in 1967, at Harvard.
Throughout his long and distinguished career in philosophy he retained a down-to-earth realism and naturalism in metaphysics, and a conservative outlook on moral and political issues, characteristic of his origins. A stocky, genial, and cheerful man, he found neither the content nor the validation of ethics to be problematic. Although originally a student of literature, whose first publication was a book of poetry, he had not the slightest tincture of literary or academic bohemianism. He was among the very least alienated academics of his generation; which is not surprising, as his career was indeed one version of The American Dream.
The traditional ambition of philosophy, in epistemology and metaphysics, is to provide a systematic account of the extent and reliability of our knowledge, and on that basis, to provide a synoptic and well-based account of the main features of Reality. When Williams was in his prime, this ambition was largely repudiated as inappropriate or unattainable, and a much more modest role for philosophy was proposed. In setting forth his own position, in the preface to the collection of his selected essays (1966, p.viii), he lists some of these fashionable philosophies from the mid-twentieth century:
…logical positivism, logical behaviorism, operationalism, instrumentalism, the miscellaneous American linguisticisms, the English varieties of Wittgensteinism, the Existentialisms, and Zen Buddhism…
Each of these is, in its own way, a gospel of relaxation. They all propose that, in place of the struggle to uncover how things are, careful descriptions of how things appear will suffice. None is ambitious enough to set about constructing a positive and systematic epistemology and metaphysics.
Undeterred by this spirit of the age, Williams continued to insist that philosophical issues, including those of traditional metaphysics, are real questions with genuine answers (Fisher 2017). Conceptual analysis, concentration on phenomenological description, or exploration of the vagaries of language, may have their (subordinate) place, but to elevate them to a central position is an evasion of philosophy’s main task.
Still worse was the suggestion that philosophical questions are mere surface expressions of a philosopher’s underlying psycho-pathology. The claim of Morris Lazerowitz to that effect, suggesting that Bradley’s Absolute Idealism was no more than an intellectual’s poorly expressed death wish, or that McTaggart’s argument against the reality of time a panic fear of change, he met with a stern rebuke (1959, pp 133–56).
He set forth a Realist philosophy on traditional empiricist principles: “He thought that practically everything was right out there where it belonged” (Firth, Nozick and Quine 1983, p 246). He maintained that while all knowledge of fact rests on perceptual experience, it is not limited to the perceptually given, but can be extended beyond that by legitimate inference (1934a). In this way his Realism can develop the breadth and depth required to do justice to all the scientific techniques which so far surpass mere perception.
Williams’s empiricism extended to philosophy itself. He challenged the prevailing orthodoxy that philosophy is a purely a priori discipline. He emphasized the provisional character of much philosophizing, and the striking absence of knock-down arguments in philosophic controversy (“Having Ideas In The Head” 1966, 189–211).
Following his own prescription for an affirmative and constructive philosophy, Williams worked steadily towards the development of his own distinctive position in metaphysics. He introduced the useful division of the subject into Speculative Cosmology, which deals with the basic elements making up the world we live in, such as matter, mind, and force, together with the relations between them, and Analytic Ontology, which explores the fundamental categories, such as Substance and Property, and how they relate to one another. Speculative Cosmology, in particular, needs to be open to developments in the fundamental sciences, and so needs to be seen as always provisional and a posteriori. Analytic Ontology, the exploration of the categories of being, is a more purely reflective and a priori discipline aiming to elucidate the range of different elements in any universe.
To begin with Speculative Cosmology, Williams’s position has three main features.
It is Naturalistic. The natural world of space, time, and matter, with all its constituents, is a Reality in its own right. Contrary to all Idealist metaphysics, this world, except for the finite minds that are to found within it, is independent of any knowing mind. Moreover, it is the only world. There are no divinities or supernatural powers beyond the realm of Nature (“Naturalism and the Nature of Things” 1966, pp 212–238). Even mathematical realities belong in the natural world: numbers—at least natural ones—as abstractions from clusters, and geometrical objects as abstractions from space. The philosophy of mathematics was an aspect of his position that was never fully worked through.
Second, his position is not only Naturalist but also Materialist. This Materialism is not of the rather crude kind that supposes that every reality is composed of a solid, crunchy substance, the stuff that makes up the atoms of Greek speculation. Any spatio-temporal reality, whether an ‘insubstantial’ property, such as a color, or something as abstract as a relation, such as farther-away-than, or faster-than, so long as it takes its place as a spatio-temporal element at home in the world of physics, is accepted as part of this one great spatio-temporal world. Williams’s Materialism is thus one which can accept whatever physical theory posits as the most plausible foundation for the natural sciences, provided that it specifies a world which develops according to natural law, without any teleological (final) causes.
The Mental is accommodated in the same way. Although Mind is unquestionably real, mental facts are as spatio-temporally located as any others (“The Existence of Consciousness”, “Mind as a Matter of Fact” 1966, pp 23–40, 239–261). The Mental is not an independent realm parallel to and equal to the Material, but rather a tiny, rather insignificant fragment of Being, dependent upon, even if not reducible to, the physical or biological nature of living beings. Williams has a capacious conception of the Material—his position could perhaps be better described as Spatio-Temporal Naturalism.
Thirdly, Williams’s metaphysics is 4-dimensional. Or, more precisely, given the development of multi-dimensional string theories since his time, it takes Time to be a dimension in the same way that Space has dimensions. The first step is to insist, against Aristotle and his followers, that statements about the future, no less than those concerning the present and the past, are timelessly true or false. They need not await the event they refer to, in order to gain a truth value (“The Sea Fight Tomorrow” 1966, pp 262–288.) This encourages the further view that the facts that underpin truths about the future are (timelessly) Real. All points in time are (timelessly) Real, as are all points on any dimension of our familiar Space. Whatever account is to be given of Change, it does not consist in items gaining or losing Reality. This stance receives powerful support from physical theory. Williams embraced and argued for the conception of Time as a fourth dimension introduced by Minkowski’s ‘Block Universe’ interpretation of Einstein’s Theory of Special Relativity. A consequence of this is that the experience of the flow or passage of Time must be some sort of illusion. Williams embraced that consequence, and argued for it in a celebrated paper (‘The Myth of Passage’, 1951).
Apart from his Materialistic or Spatio-Temporal Naturalism, Williams’s major contributions to metaphysics lie in the realm of ontology, and concern the fundamental constituents of Being. His key proposal is that properties are indeed real—in fact Reality consists in nothing but properties—but that these properties are not Universals, as commonly supposed, but particulars with unique spatio-temporal locations. The structure of Reality comprises a single fundamental category, Abstract Particulars, or “tropes”. Tropes are particular cases of general characteristics. A general characteristic, or Universal, such as redness or roundness, can occur in any one of indefinitely many instances. Williams’ focus was on the particular case of red which occurs as the color, for example, of a particular rose at a specific location in space and time, or the particular case of circularity presented by some particular coin in my hand on a single, particular occasion. These tropes are as particular, and as grounded in place and time, as the more familiar objects, the rose and the coin, to which they belong.
These tropes are the building blocks of the world. In his analogy, they provide ‘the Alphabet of Being’ from which the entities belonging to more complex categories—objects, properties, relations, events—can be constructed, just as words and sentences can be built using the letters of the alphabet. Familiar objects such as shoes and ships and lumps of sealing wax, and their parts as revealed by empirical scientific investigation, such as crystals, molecules and atoms, are concrete particulars or things. In Williams’s scheme, each of these consists in a compresent cluster of tropes—the particular thing’s particular shape, size, temperature, and consistency, its translucency, or acidity, or positive charge, and so on. All the multitude of different tropes that comprise some single complex particular do so by virtue of their sharing one and the same place, or sequence of places, in Space-Time. That is what ‘compresent’ means. There is no inner substratum or individuator to hold all the tropes together. The tropes are individuals in their own right, and do not inhere in any thing-like particular. So Williams’s view is a No-Substance theory, or, otherwise described, a theory in which each trope is itself a simple Humean substance, capable of independent existence.
Universal properties and quantities such as acidity and velocity, which are common to many objects, are not beings in their own right, but resemblance classes of individual tropes. If two objects match in color, both being red, for example, the tropes of color belonging to each are separate tropes, both being members of the class of similar color tropes which constitutes Redness.
Relations are treated along the same lines. If London is Larger-than Edinburgh, and Dublin Larger-than Belfast, we have two instances of the Larger-than relation, two relational tropes. And they, along with countless other cases, all belong to the resemblance class whose members are all and only the cases of Larger-than. This account denies that, literally speaking, there is any single entity which is simultaneously fully present in two different cases of the same color, or temperature, or whatever. So it is a No-Universals view, and often described as a version of Nominalism. This is understandable, but it is better to confine the term ‘Nominalism’ to the denial of the reality of properties at all. So far from denying properties, on Williams’s theory the entire world consists in nothing but tropes, which are properties construed as particulars. So his position is better described not as Nominalist but as Particularist.
Tropes provide an elegant and economical base for an ontology. Unlike almost all competing ontologies, that of Williams rests on just one basic category, which can be used in the construction not just of things and their properties and relations, but of further categories, such as events and processes. Events are replacements of the tropes that are to be found in a given location. Processes are sequences of such changes. Trope theory is well placed to furnish an attractive analysis of causality, as involving power tropes that govern and drive the transformations to be found in events and processes.
It can also be of use in other areas of philosophy, for example in valuation theory, where the existence of many tropes, rather than one single unitary reality, can explain our sometimes divided attitudes toward what, on a Substance ontology, we would regard as the same thing. Something can be good in some respects (tropes), but not in others. To view the manifest world as comprising, for the most part, clusters of compresent tropes makes explicit the complexity of the realities with which we are ordinarily in contact.
Many philosophers have admitted tropes into their scheme of things: Aristotle, Locke, Spinoza and Leibniz, for example. What is distinctive in Williams is not that tropes are admitted as a category, but as the only fundamental category, a trope-based form of what Schaffer calls “property primitivism.” (Schaffer 2003, 125). All else is constructed out of tropes, including concrete particulars and general properties, whereas tropes themselves are not constructed out of anything else, for example, out of a substance, a universal and the relation of exemplification. Not surprisingly, various aspects of Williams’ trope primitivism have been subjected to serious philosophical challenges either directly or indirectly.
Some philosophers reject all forms of property primitivism, including that of Williams, on the grounds that properties cannot serve as the only independent elements of being. Properties must be had by objects and a property cannot be instantiated in isolation from wholly distinct properties so they lack the requisite independence, the capacity of existing in any combination with “wholly distinct existences.” (Some philosophers go so far as to claim that if a property P is a trope, then P is dependent on the specific thing that has it and so could not have existed without that thing existing; see Mulligan, Simons, & Smith 1984, Heil 2003.) There are two ways for this objection to go. (1) Armstrong takes the ostensive fact that properties must be had by objects to establish the dependence of properties on non-property particulars, substrata, and, thus, the falsity of property primitivism (Armstrong 1989, 115). (2) Alternately, one can take the apparent fact that there can be no properties that are not clustered with other properties to show that properties cannot play this role.
In response to (1), one can challenge the assumption that if properties must be had by objects, then they are not capable of independent existence. Ross Cameron, for example, suggests that properties might both be capable of independent existence—including existing without substrata—and not be capable of existing without being the property of something. (2006, 104). The dependence of properties on objects is compatible with property primitivism if one adopts a bundle theory of concrete particulars. In that case, properties are always had by objects since they are always found in bundles, even if only a bundle of one, but exist without substrata.
As for (2), some philosophers reject the requirement that if properties are the only ultimate constituents of reality, then they must be capable of existing in isolation from all other wholly distinct properties (Simons 1994; Denkel 1997). Properties can be both the only ultimate constituents of reality and inter-dependent. This response requires the rejection of the Humean principle that the basic independent units of being can exist in any combination, including unaccompanied (Schaffer 2003, 126). A very different response to (2) rejects the necessity of trope clustering altogether (Williams 1966, 97; Campbell 1981, 479; Schaffer 2003).
Plausible though it be, however, that a color or a shape cannot exist by itself, I think we have to reject the notion of a standard of concreteness. … (Williams 1966, 97)
At best, it is a contingent matter that there are no tropes that are not compresent with any other tropes—for example, a mass trope on its own. (Campbell goes so far as to suggest that there is reason to think that there are actual cases of free-floating tropes (1981, 479)).
Even if the trope primitivist can get around these quite general objections, there remains the most serious objection to Williams’ brand of trope primitivism, an objection that is specific to Williams’ conception of tropes, depending on more than the assumption that tropes are properties. The charge is that a Williamsonian trope is not genuinely simple, but complex embracing, at least, an element that furnishes the nature or content of the trope, and an element providing its particularity (Hochberg 1988; Armstrong 2005; Moreland 1985; Ehring 2011). In short, Williamsonian tropes are constructed out of something else, making them incompatible with trope primitivism.
This objection is based on two assumptions. First, under Williams’ conception, the nature of a trope is a non-reducible, intrinsic matter that is not determined by relations to anything else, including resemblance relations to other tropes or memberships in various natural classes of tropes. And, second, anything that stands in more than one arbitrarily different relation, each of which is grounded intrinsically in that entity, must be complex since that entity will have intrinsic “aspects” that are not identical to each other. The two relevant relations are numerical difference from other tropes and resemblance to other tropes, each of which is grounded intrinsically in the trope relata under the Williams conception. Hence, there are “intrinsic aspects” of each trope that are not identical to each other, a particularity-generating component and a nature-generating component.
In response to this “complexity” objection, Campbell claims that the distinction between a trope’s nature and its particularity is merely a “formal” distinction, a product of different levels of abstraction, and not a real distinction between different components of a trope. One should no more distinguish a particularity-component from a nature-component of a trope than distinguish components of warmth and orangeness in an orange trope:
To recognize the case of orange as warm is not to find a new feature in it, but to treat it more abstractly, less specifically, than in recognising it as a case of orange. (Campbell 1990, 56–7; further in Maurin 2005; Fisher 2020)
Alternately, Ehring suggests that we grant this objection, but preserve trope simplicity by switching to a non-Williamsonian conception of tropes, according to which a trope’s nature is determined by its memberships in various natural classes of tropes rather than intrinsically, thereby sidestepping one of the assumptions operative in the objection (2011; discussion in Hakkarainen and Keinänen 2017).
Coming under criticism as well is Williams’ resemblance-based account of general characteristics and property agreement. According to Williams, a fully determinate general color characteristic—say, the shade of red that characterizes this shirt and this chair—-is just the set of all tropes that exactly resemble the red trope of this shirt. Different objects of that “same” shade of red each possess a different trope from this set of exactly similar red tropes. But this analysis seems to generate an infinite regress. If trope t1 is related to trope t2 by resemblance trope r1, t2 is related to trope t3 by resemblance trope r2, and t3 is related to t1 by resemblance trope r3, then these resemblance tropes will also resemble each other, giving rise to further resemblance tropes, and so on. To stop this vicious regress, the objection continues, resemblance must be taken to be a universal (Daly 1997, 150).
One response to this objection tries to stop the regress before it starts by denying that there are any resemblance trope-relations holding between tropes. In particular, the trope theorist might follow Oliver’s advise
to avoid saying that when two tropes are exactly similar …, there exists a relation-trope of exact similarity … holding between the two tropes. (1996, 37)
There are no resemblance-tropes corresponding to these resemblance predicates. Another response denies that resemblance relations mark an addition to our ontology and, hence, there can be no regress of resemblance relations. Campbell, for example, argues that the successive resemblance relations in the regress are nothing over and above the non-relational tropes that ultimately ground these relations. Since resemblance is an internal relation, it supervenes on these ground-level non-resemblance tropes, but supervenient “additions” are not real additions to one’s ontology (Campbell 1990, 37).
There is also a whole host of objections in the literature to Williams’ trope bundle theory. According to Williams, concrete particulars are not substrata instantiating various properties. They are wholly constructed out of tropes, forming bundles of tropes, the trope constituents of which are pairwise tied together by a compresence relation. Compresence, in turn, is collocation for Williams, “the unique congress in the same volume.” (In order to allow for non-spatial objects, Williams grants the possibility of “locations” in systems analogous to space (1966, 79).) One immediate worry, raised by Campbell, is the possibility that there may be cases of overlapping objects demonstrating that collocation is not sufficient for compresence (1990, footnote 5, 175). In response, the trope bundle theorist can opt for the view that compresence is non-reducible. However, even with this revision there remain significant objections concerning the possibility of accidental properties, the possibility of change, and an apparent vicious regress of compresence relations.
Bundle theory has been charged with ruling out the possibility of accidental properties in concrete particulars. Bundles of properties have all of their constituent properties essentially. Objects generally do not. This chair could have been blue instead of red, but the bundle of properties that characterize the chair could not have failed to include that red property. One way around this objection is proposed by O’Leary-Hawthorne and Cover: combine bundle theory (although for them properties are universals) with a specific account of modality, a counterpart semantics for statements about ordinary particulars (1998). What makes it true that a particular object o could have had different properties is that a non-identical counterpart to o, n, in another possible world has different properties than does o. As long as there is a possible world in which there is a object-bundle, n, that is non-identical counterpart to o and differs from o with respect to its properties, then o could have differed in just that way.
Simons suggests a very different approach. He proposes to replace unstructured bundles with “nucleus theory.” An object consists of an inner core of essential tropes and an outer band of accidental tropes, but no non-property substratum (1994).
In like manner, bundle theory has been charged with ruling out the possibility of change in objects. The same bundle complex cannot be composed of one set of property at one time, but a different set at a different time. Concrete objects, on the other hand, can and do change. In response, it has been suggested that this objection loses its force if bundle theory is combined with a four-dimensionalist account of object persistence (Casullo 1988; see also Ehring 2011). For example, if ordinary objects are spacetime worms made up of appropriately related instantaneous temporal parts that are themselves complete bundles of compresent tropes, then change can be read as a matter of having different temporal parts that differ in their constitutive properties. Another response to the change-is-impossible objection is to adopt Simons’ “nucleus theory” in place of traditional bundle theory. Nucleus theory seems to allow for change in the outer band of accidental properties (Simons 1994).
Trope bundle theory has also been accused of giving rise to Bradley-style vicious regress. According to trope bundle theory, for an object o to exist, its tropes must be mutually compresent. However, it would seem, for trope t1 to be compresent with trope t2, they must be linked by a compresence trope, say, c1. But, the existence of t1, t2, and c1 is insufficient to make it the case that t1 and t2 are compresent since these tropes could each be parts of different, non-overlapping bundles. So for t1 and t2 to be linked by compresence trope c1, c1 must be compresent with t1 by way of a further compresence relation, say c2 (and with t2 by, say, c3) and so on, giving rise to either a vicious, or at least, uneconomical regress (Maurin 2010, 315). In response, one can try to break the link between the relevant predicates and tropes. Oliver suggests that the trope theorist should reject the assumption that there are any relation-tropes corresponding to the predicate “….is compresent with…” even though that predicate has some true applications (1996, 37). This response might be indirectly supported by reference to Lewis’s claim that it is an impossible task to give an analysis of all predications since any analysis will bring into play a new predication, itself requiring analysis (Lewis 1983, 353).
A second, quite different response is modeled on Armstrong’s view that “instantiation” is a “tie,” not a relation (since “the thisness and nature are incapable of existing apart”), and, hence, it is not subject to a relation regress. (1978, 109). The idea is that the union of compresent tropes is too intimate to speak of a relation between them since the tropes of the same object could not have existed apart from each other. This response, however, requires more than generic dependencies—for example, that this specific mass trope requires the existence of some solidity trope or other—since generic dependencies would not guarantee that the specific mass and solidity tropes, say, in this particular bundle could not have existed without being compresent.
Maurin provides an alternative response that grants the existence of compresence relation-tropes, but denies the regress on the grounds that relation-tropes, including compresence relations, necessitate the existence of that which they relate. There is no need for further compresence relations holding between a compresence-relation and its terms (2002, 164). A fourth response, from Ehring, suggests that this regress can be stopped once it is recognized that compresence is a self-relating relation, a relation that can take itself as a relatum. The supposed infinite regress for the bundle theorist involves an unending series of compresence tropes, c1, c2, …, and cn, but the series, c1, c2, …, and cn is taken to be infinite because it is assumed that each “additional” compresence trope is not identical to the immediate preceding compresence trope in the series. However, if compresence is a “self-relating” relation, this assumption may be false (2011).
Finally, there is an objection to the very notion of a trope and, hence, to the foundations of trope primitivism (and, perhaps, to any ontology that includes tropes). The idea is that if properties are tropes, then exactly similar properties can be swapped across objects, but there is no such possibility.
If the redness of this rose is exactly similar to but numerically distinct from the redness of that rose, then the redness of this rose could have been the redness of that rose and vice versa. But this is not really a possibility and, thus, properties are not tropes. (Armstrong 1989, 131–132)
A similar argument is based on the possibility of tropes swapping positions in space (Campbell 1990, 71). “Property swapping,” it is claimed, is an unreal possibility since property swapping would make no difference to the world. (Note that the cross-object version of this objection cannot get off the ground if tropes are not transferable between objects, a view that is found in (Martin 1980), although Martin rejects trope primitivism since he posits substrata in addition to tropes).
One response to the no-swapping objection, given by Campbell and Labossiere, rejects the assumption that trope swaps would make no difference to the world. For example, although the effects of “swapped” situations would be exactly similar in nature, those effects would differ in their causes (Campbell 1990, 72; Labossiere 1993, 262). Schaffer, on the other hand, denies that the trope theory is automatically committed to the possibility of trope swapping (2001). If tropes are individuated by times/locations and a counterpart theory of modality is right, then trope swapping is ruled out:
The redness which would be here has exactly the same inter- and intraworld resemblance relations as the redness which actually is here, and the same distance relations, and hence it is a better counterpart than the redness which would be there. (Schaffer 2001, 253).
What is clear is that Williams’ trope ontology remains at the center of a vibrant and ongoing debate, counting as a serious option among a small field of contenders. His brand of trope primitivism is certainly of more than merely historical interest.
Williams has also left a wider, if less plainly manifest legacy as a metaphysician. For a discussion of his influence on David Lewis, and through him on later thinkers, see Fisher 2015.
The Problem of Induction is the problem of vindicating as rational our unavoidable need to generalize beyond our current evidence to comparable cases that we have not yet observed, or that never will be observed. Without inductive inferences of this kind, not only all science but all meaningful conduct of everyday life is paralyzed. Indeed, Williams prefaced his philosophical treatment with a declaration of the evils of inductive skepticism in eroding rational standards in general, even in politics:
In the political sphere, the haphazard echoes of inductive skepticism which reach the liberal’s ear deprive him of any rational right to champion liberalism, and account already as much as anything for the flabbiness of liberal resistance to dogmatic encroachments from the left or the right. (Williams 1947, pp 15–20)
David Hume, in the eighteenth century, had shown that all such inferences must involve risk: no matter how certain our premises, no inductively reached conclusion can have the same degree of certainty. Hume went further, and held that inductive reasoning provides no rational support whatever for its conclusions. This is Hume’s famous inductive scepticism.
Williams was almost alone in his time in holding not only that the problem does admit of a solution, but in presenting a novel solution of his own. To do this, he needed to argue against Hume, and Hume’s twentieth century successors Bertrand Russell and Karl Popper, who had declared the problem insoluble, and also against contemporaries such as P. F. Strawson and Paul Edwards, who had claimed that there was no real problem at all (Russell 1912, Chapter 6; Popper 1959; Edwards 1949, pp 141–163; Strawson 1952, pp 248–263). Williams tackled the problem head-on. In The Ground of Induction (1947) he makes original use of results already established in probability theory, whose significance for the problem of induction he was the first to appreciate. He treats inductive inference as a special case of the problem of validating sampling techniques. Among any population, that is, any class of similar items, there will be a definite proportion having any possible characteristic. For example, among the population of penguins, 100% will be birds, about 50% will be female, some 10%, perhaps, will be Emperor penguins, some 35%, perhaps, will be more than seven years old, and so on. This is the complexion of the population, with regard to femaleness, or whatever.
Now in the pure mathematics of the relations between samples and populations, Jacob Bernoulli had in the 18th century established the remarkable fact that, for populations of any large size whatever (say above 2500), the vast majority of samples of 2500 or more closely match in complexion the population from which they are drawn. In the case of our penguins, for example, if the population contains 35% aged 7 years or more, well over nine tenths of samples of 2500 penguins will contain between 33% and 37% aged 7 years or more. This is a necessary, purely mathematical, fact. In the language of statistics, the vast majority of reasonably sized samples are representative of their population, that is, closely resemble it in complexion.
Bernoulli’s result enables us to infer from the complexion of a population to the complexion of most reasonably-sized samples taken from it, since the complexion of most samples closely resembles the complexion of the population. Williams’s originality was this: he noticed that resemblance is symmetrical. If we can prove, as Bernoulli did, that most samples resemble the population from which they are drawn, then conversely the population’s complexion resembles the complexion of most of the samples.
This brings us to the problem of induction. What our observations of the natural world provide us with can be regarded as samples from larger populations. For example the penguins we have observed up to this point provide us with a sample of the wider population of all penguins, at all times, whether observed or not. What can we infer about this wider population from the sample we have? That, in all probability, the population’s complexion is close to that of the sample. We may of course, have an atypical sample before us. But with samples of more than 2500, well over 90% represent the population fairly closely, so the odds are against it.
Thus Williams assimilates the problem of induction to an application of the statistical syllogism (also called direct inference or the proportional syllogism). A standard syllogism concerns complexions of 100%, and has a determinate conclusion: if all S are P, and this present item is an S, then it must be P. A statistical syllogism deals with complexions of less than 100%, and its conclusion is not definite but only probable: for example, if 95% of S are P, this present S is probably P. Some logicians claim that the probability in question is exactly 0.95, but Williams does not need to rely on that additional claim. It is enough that the probability be high. Applying the statistical syllogism to Williams’ reversal of the Bernoulli result, we have: 95% of reasonably-sized samples are closely representative of their population, so the sample we have, provided there are no grounds to think otherwise, is probably one of them. On that basis, we are rationally entitled to infer that the population probably closely matches the sample, whose complexion is known to us. The inference is only probable. Induction cannot deliver certainty. In any given case, it is abstractly possible that our sample may be a misleading, unrepresentative one. But to expect an inference from the observed to the unobserved to yield certainty is to expect the impossible.
Williams’ treatment of induction created quite a stir when it appeared, but attracted criticisms of varying power from commentators wedded to more defeatist attitudes, and was eclipsed by the Popperian strategy of replacing an epistemology of confirmation with one that focused on refutation. It thus exercised less influence than it deserves. It is a closely reasoned, deductively argued defense of the rationality of inductive inference, well meriting continued attention.
Its reliance on a priori reasoning (as opposed to any contingent principles such as the “uniformity of nature” or the action of laws of nature) means that it should hold in all possible worlds. Williams’ argument would thus be easily defeated by the exhibition of a possible world in which inductive reasoning did not work (in the sense of mostly yielding false conclusions). However, critics of Williams have not offered such a possible non-inductive world. Chaotic worlds are not non-inductive (as the induction from chaos to more chaos is correct in them), while a world with an anti-inductive demon, who falsifies, say, most of the inductive inferences I make, is not clearly non-inductive either (since although most of my inductions have false conclusions, it does not follow that most inductions in general have false conclusions).
Marc Lange (2011) does however propose a counterexample, arising from the “purely formal” nature of Williams’ argument. Should it not apply equally to “grue” as to “green”? Objects are grue if they are green up to some future point in time, and blue thereafter. The problem is to show that our sample, to date, of green things is not a sample of things actually grue. (Williams’s own views on the grue problem are given in his “How Reality is Reasonable” in (2018)).
Stove (1986, 131–144) argued that his more specific version of Williams’s argument (see below) was not subject to the objection, and that the failure of induction in the case of ‘grue’ showed that inductive logic was not purely formal—but then neither was deductive logic.
Other criticisms arise from the suggestion that the proportional syllogism in general is not a justified form of inference without some assumption of randomness. Any proportional syllogism (with exact numbers) is of the form
- The proportion of Fs that are G is r.
- a is F.
- So, the probability that a is G is r.
(Or, if we let B be the proposition that the proportion of Fs that are G is r, and we let p(h | e) be the conditional probability of hypothesis h on evidence e, then we can express the above proportional syllogism in the language of probability as follows: p(Ga | Fa & B) = r.)
Do we not need to assume that a is chosen “randomly”, in the sense that all Fs have an equal chance of being chosen? Otherwise, how do we know that a is not chosen with some bias, which would make its probability of being G different from r?
Defenders of the proportional syllogism (McGrew 2003; Campbell and Franklin 2004) argue that no assumption of randomness is needed. Any information about bias would indeed change the probability, but that is a trivial fact about any argument. An argument infers from given premises to a given conclusion; a different argument, with a different force, moves from some other (additional) premises to that conclusion. Given just that the vast majority of airline flights land safely, I can have rational confidence that my flight will land safely, even though there are any number of other possible premises (such as that I have just seen the wheels fall off) that would change the probability if I added them to the argument. The fact that the probability of the conclusion on other evidence would be different is no reason to change the probability assessment on the given evidence.
Similar reasoning applies to any other property that a may have (or, in the case of the Williams argument, that the sample may have), such as having been observed or being in the past. If there is some positive reason to think that property relevant to the conclusion (that a is G), that reason needs to be explained; if not, there is no reason to believe it affects the argument and the original probability given by the proportional syllogism stands.
Serious criticisms specific to Williams’s argument have been based on claims that the proportional syllogism, though correct in general, has been misapplied by Williams. Any proportional syllogism,
- The proportion of Fs that are G is r.
- a is F.
- So, the probability that a is G is r,
is subject to the objection that, in the case at hand, there is actually further information about the Fs that is relevant to the conclusion Ga. For example, in
- The proportion of candidates who will be appointed to the board of Albert Smith Corp is 10%.
- Albert Smith Jr is a candidate.
- So, the probability that Albert Smith Jr will be appointed is 10%,
it is arguable that information is hidden in the proper names that is favorably relevant to the younger Smith’s chance of success. The question then is whether the same could happen with the proportional syllogism in Williams’ argument for induction. Maher (1996) argues that there is such a problem. In this version of Williams’ argument:
- The proportion of large samples whose complexion approximately matches the population is over 95%.
- S is a large sample.
- So, the probability that the complexion of S matches the population is over 95%,
is there, typically, any further information about the sample S that is relevant to whether it matches the population? The potentially relevant information one has is the proportion in S of the attribute to be predicted (blue, or whatever it might be). Can that be relevant to matching?
It certainly can be relevant. For example, if the proportion of blue items in the sample is 100%, it suggests that the population proportion is close to 100%; that is positively relevant to matching since samples of near-homogeneous populations are more likely to match. (For example, if the population proportion is 100%, all samples match the population.) Conversely, fewer samples match the population when the population proportion is near one half.
David Stove (1986), in defending Williams’ argument, proposed to avoid this problem by taking a more particular case of the argument which would not be subject to the objection. Stove proposed:
If F is the class of ravens, G the class of black things, S a sample of 3020 ravens, r = 0.95, and ‘match’ means having proportion within 3% of the population proportion, then it is evident that ‘The proportion of Fs that are Gs is x’ is not substantially unfavorable to matching (for all x).
For even in the worst case, when the proportion of black things is one half, it is still true that the vast majority of samples match the population (Stove 1986, 66–75).
Stove’s reply emphasizes how strong the mathematical truth about matching of samples is: it is not merely that, for any population size and proportion, one can find a sample size and degree of match such that samples of that size mostly match; it is the much stronger result that one can fix the sample size and degree of match beforehand, without needing knowledge of the population size and proportion. For example, the vast majority of 3020-size samples match to within 3%—irrespective of the population size (provided of course that it is larger than 3020) and the proportion of objects with the characteristic under investigation..
Maher also objects that the attribute itself, such as “blue”, might be a priori relevant to its proportion in the sample and hence to matching. For example, if “blue” is one of a large range of possible colors, then a priori it is unlikely that an individual is blue and unlikely that a sample will have many blue items. As with any Bayesian reasoning, a prior probability close to zero (or one) requires a lot of evidence to overcome; in this case, we would conclude that a sample with a high proportion of blue items was most likely a coincidence, and the posterior probability of the sample matching the population would still not be high.
Scott Campbell (2001), in reply to Maher, argues that priors do not dominate observations in the way Maher suggests. By analogy, suppose that, while blindfolded, I throw a dart at a dartboard. I am told that 99 of the 100 spots on the board are the same color, and that there are 145 choices of color for the spots. After throwing, I observe just the spot I have hit and find it is blue. Then (in the absence of further information), the chance is very high that almost all the other spots are blue. The prior improbability of blue does not prevent that. In the same way, the fact that the vast majority of samples match the population gives good reason to suppose that the observed sample does too, irrespective of any prior information of the kind Maher advances.
Williams’ defense of induction thus has resources to supply answers to the criticisms that have been made of it. It remains the most objectivist and ambitious justification of induction.
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