John Cook Wilson

First published Tue Dec 8, 2009; substantive revision Wed Jun 1, 2022

John Cook Wilson (1849–1915) was Wykeham Professor of Logic at New College, Oxford. His ideas are at the origin of ‘Oxford Realism’, a philosophical movement that flourished at Oxford during the first decades of the twentieth century. Although trained as a classicist and a mathematician, his most important contributions were to the theory of knowledge, where he argued that knowledge is factive in conjunction with the thesis that, as a state of mind, it is not definable in terms of belief—they share no ‘highest common factor’—and he thus rejected ‘hybrid’ and ‘externalist’ accounts of knowledge. He also argued for direct realism in perception, criticizing both empiricism and idealism, and argued for a view of universals as tropes. His influence swayed Oxford away from idealism and, through figures such as H. A. Prichard, Gilbert Ryle and J. L. Austin, his ideas were also to some extent at the origin of ‘moral intuitionism’ and ‘ordinary language philosophy’, which defined in turn much of Oxford philosophy until the second half of the twentieth century. Cook Wilson’s name was, however, all but forgotten by the end of the century, but the influence of his ideas is still felt today in the writings of philosophers as diverse as John McDowell, Charles Travis and Timothy Williamson.

1. Life and Work

Details about the life of John Cook Wilson, or ‘Cook Wilson’ as he is commonly called, may be found in a memoir published in 1926 by his pupil A. S. L. Farquharson, in his edition of Cook Wilson’s posthumous writings, Statement and Inference with other Philosophical Papers (SI, xii–lxiv). He was born in Nottingham on June 6, 1849, the son of a Methodist minister. Educated at Derby Grammar School, he went up to Balliol College in 1868, elected on an exhibition set up by Benjamin Jowett for students from less privileged schools. At Balliol, Cook Wilson read classics with Henry Chandler, from whom he certainly got his penchant for minutiae, and mathematics with Henry J. S. Smith. He also studied philosophy with Jowett and T. H. Green, who steered him towards Kant and idealism (SI, 880), along with other students from his generation, such as Bernard Bosanquet, F. H. Bradley, Richard Lewis Nettleship and William Wallace. He even went to Göttingen in 1873–74 to attend lectures by Hermann Lotze (SI, xxvii), whose portrait he kept in his study. Cook Wilson wrote late in his life that “from the first I would not commit myself even to the most attractive form of idealism, tho’ greatly attracted by it” (SI, 815). Farquharson also mentions Friedrich Ueberweg’s System of Logic and History of Logical Doctrines (Ueberweg 1871) as an early ‘realist’ influence (SI, 880). If we are to follow Prichard, however, Cook Wilson abandoned idealism “with extreme hesitation” (Prichard 1919, 309) and “it was only towards the close of his life that he really seemed to find himself” (Prichard 1919, 318). (See also on this point Farquharson’s reminiscence in (SI, xix).)

Cook Wilson was elected fellow of Oriel College in 1873 and he succeeded Thomas Fowler as Wykeham Professor of Logic, New College in 1889. Bernard Bosanquet, Thomas Case, and John Venn had been among his rivals. He finally moved to New College in 1901, where he remained until his death from pernicious anemia on 11 August 1915. His wife Charlotte, whom he had met in Germany, predeceased him; they had a son (Joseph 1916b, 557). Cook Wilson lived the uneventful life of an Oxford don. Among his awards, he became Fellow of the British Academy in 1907. A Liberal in his convictions (SI, xxix), he did not get involved in politics, nor did he take a prominent part in the affairs of his university. (He is, for example, seldom mentioned in (Engel 1983).) His most cherished extra-curricular activity appears to have been the development of tactics for military bicycle units.

Cook Wilson published little during his lifetime. Setting apart publications on military cycling and other incidental writings, the bulk of his publications were in his chosen fields of study, classics and mathematics. His work in Ancient philosophy, which form the bulk of his publications, is discussed in the next section.

In mathematics, he published a strange treatise that arose out of his failed attempt at proving the four-colour theorem, On the Traversing of Geometrical Figures (TGF). It had virtually no echo. Farquharson quoted the mathematician E. W. Hobson explaining that Cook Wilson “hardly gave sufficient time and thought to the subject to make himself really conversant with the modern aspects of the underlying problems” (SI, xxxviii). Cook Wilson also published two short papers on probability (IP, PBT) in which he gave new proofs of the discrete Bayes’ formula and of Jacob Bernouilli’s theorem (this last being known today as the weak law of large numbers). Edgeworth called the former an “elegant proof” (Edgeworth 1911, 378, n.10), but Cook Wilson was seemingly ignorant of an already better proof of the latter via the Bienaymé-Chebyshev inequality (Seneta 2012, 448 & 2013, 1104). His mathematical endeavours were otherwise largely wasted on trying to prove the inconsistency of non-Euclidean geometries. Cook Wilson claimed that he had ‘apprehended’ and thus ‘knows’ the truth of Euclid’s axiom of the parallels—he held it to be “absolutely self-evident” (SI, 561)—calling the idea of a non-Euclidean space a “chimera” (SI, 456) and non-Euclidean geometries “the mere illusion of specialists” (SI, xxxix). He thus tried in vain to find a contradiction to “convince the rank and file of mathematicians” so that “they would at least not suppose the philosophic criticism, by which I intended anyhow to attack, somehow wrong” (SI, xcvi). (See section 5 for further discussion of the point about knowledge.)

Cook Wilson published very little in philosophy: his inaugural lecture, On an Evolutionist Theory of the Axioms (ETA, see also SI, 616–634), a critique of Spencer opening with a very short encomium to Green and Lotze (ETA, 3–4), and a short piece in Mind (CLP) on the ‘Barber Shop Paradox’. In the former, he argued that Spencer’s claim that the criterion of truth p is the impossibility to think its contradictory and that this criterion is the product of evolution is based on a circular reasoning: to prove that the criterion results from evolution, one must apply it. The ‘Barber Shop Paradox’—not to be confused with the ‘Barber’s Paradox’—is attributed to Lewis Carroll (Carroll 1894), but it originated in a private debate about ‘hypotheticals’ with Cook Wilson, who attempted his own solution in CLP (Moktefi 2007a, chap. v, sect. 2), (Moktefi 2007b), (Moktefi 2008, sect. 5.2), while Russell had already satisfactorily resolved it in a footnote to The Principles of Mathematics (Russell 1903, 18). Cook Wilson was also involved on the same occasion in the genesis of Carroll’s better-known ‘paradox of inference’, in ‘What the Tortoise Said to Achilles’ (Carroll 1895), which will be discussed in section 8.

Cook Wilson’s reluctance to publish was partly caused by the fact that he constantly kept revising his views. As mentioned, he apparently reached a more or less stable viewpoint only late in his life. One of his better-known sayings is that

… the (printed) letter killeth, and it is extraordinary how it will prevent the acutest from exercising their wonted clearness of vision. (SI, 872) [See also Collingwood (2013, 19–20).]

His argument was that authors that have committed to print their views on a given issue would, should they prove to be erroneous, more often than not feel obliged to defend them and to engage in pointless rhetorical exchanges instead of seeing immediately the validity of arguments against them.

As a result, Cook Wilson resorted throughout his career to the printing for private circulation of pamphlets, known as Dictata, which he began revising for publication shortly before his death. Only 11 years later did the two volumes of Statement and Inference appear, in 1926, put together by Farquharson from his lecture notes and Dictata, along with some letters. These volumes are subdivided in five parts and 582 sections. Their arrangement, which is not Cook Wilson’s, betrays their origin in his lectures in logic and in the theory of knowledge; also interspersed are texts that originate from his study of and lectures on Plato and Aristotle. As the chronological table of the various sections shows (SI, 888–9), the texts thus assembled were written at different dates and, in light of Cook Wilson’s frequent change of mind (including his move away from idealism), they express views that are at times almost contradictory. This makes any study of his philosophy particularly difficult and, more often than not, accounts of his views are influenced by those, equally important, of his pupil H. A. Prichard.

2. Ancient Philosophy

Cook Wilson published over 50 papers in Ancient philosophy, in scholarly journals such as Classical Review, Classical Quarterly, Transactions of the Oxford Philological Society and Philologische Rundschau, and a few book-length studies on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics (AS) and on Plato’s Timaeus. His main philological claim concerning the structure of the seventh book of Nicomachean Ethics was that it contained traces of three versions probably written by some Peripatetic later than Eudemus. To this he added a year later a discussion (ASV) of interpolations in Categories, Posterior Analytics and Eudemian Ethics. In a postscript to the revised version of AS (1912), he claimed, however, that the variants were probably different drafts written by Aristotle himself. His pamphlet on the Timaeus (IPT) was mainly polemical, painstakingly detailing R. D. Archer-Hind’s ‘obligations’ in his 1888 edition of the Timaeus to earlier authors, J. G. Stallbaum more than any other.

Cook Wilson is mainly remembered today for two contributions to Plato studies, foremost for his paper ‘On the Platonist Doctrine of the ἀσύμβλητοι ἀριθμοί’ (OPD), which bears on the debate on ‘intermediates’ in Plato. This issue originates in Aristotle’s claim in Met. A 6 987b14–17 that Plato believed that the objects of mathematics occupy an “intermediate position” between sensible things and Ideas/Forms. Since there is no explicit commitment to this claim in Plato, scholars either rejected Aristotle’s testimony or looked for passages where Plato might be said to have implicitly endorsed it, such as the Line at the end of Book VI of the Republic. Cook Wilson argued against reading this passage as implicitly endorsing ‘intermediates’, claiming that objects of thought (διάνοια) are Ideas, because Plato stated in Rep. 511d2–3 that they are “intelligible given a principle” (καίτοι νοητῶν ὂντων μετ’ ἀρκῆς), and, as Cook Wilson saw the matter: “nothing but an ιδέα can be an object of νοῦς” (OPD, 259).

He also argued that universals being ‘one’ in contrast with the ‘many’ to which they correspond, there could be only one ‘Circularity’, one ‘number Two’, etc. This means that, for example, ‘the number Two’ or the universal ‘twoness’ being one, it cannot be a plurality composed of units and thus that ‘two and two make four’ is not an addition of universals such as ‘twoness and twoness make fourness’ or ‘the number Two added to the number Two makes the number Four’. These expressions have no sense according to Cook Wilson, for whom ‘two and two make four’ merely means that ‘any two things added to any other two things make four things’ (OPD, 249). This is why numbers qua universals are ‘unaddible’ or ‘uncombinable’ (ἀσύμβλητοι) as Aristotle put it in, e.g., Met. M 8 1083a34, a view that Cook Wilson takes to be “exactly the Platonic doctrine” (OPD, 250).

The need to posit ‘intermediates’ can be seen as arising from the fact that one cannot perform arithmetical operations on these ‘Idea numbers’, as Cook Wilson called them, while one would need entities that are ‘in between’ (τά μεταξύ) sensible things and Idea numbers to account for arithmetical truths as elementary as ‘two and two make four’. Cook Wilson nevertheless argued against commitment to ‘intermediates’ (OPD, §4), his view being that arithmetical operations are always on particulars and if the ‘monadic numbers’ of arithmetic are plurality of units, Idea numbers are properties of these numbers. That Plato had reached this view of Idea numbers as ἀσύμβλητοι ἀριθμοί at the time he wrote the Republic or later on would be yet another issue.

Cook Wilson also argued (OPD, §5) that Idea numbers form a series ordered by a relation of ‘before and after’ (πρότερον καὶ ὔστερον) and, following Aristotle’s testimony in Eth. Nic. I 6, 1096a17–19 and Met. B 3, 999a6–14, that there could be no genus of the species forming such ordered series (for a critique of this reading of Aristotle, see Lloyd (1962)). In other words, there can be no Form or universal of the Idea numbers. He would thus claim that in the proposition ‘The number Two is a universal’, the expression ‘a universal’ cannot denote in turn a particularization of ‘universalness’, because the latter is not a true universal as it lacks an “intrinsic character” (SI, 342 n.1 & 351), and this he took to be the point of Plato’s doctrine of “unaddible numbers” (SI, 352).

Cook Wilson not only believed that these views are the true interpretation of Plato, but also that they are true simpliciter and he criticized Dedekind’s definition of continuity in Stetigkeit und die irrationale Zahlen (Dedekind 1872) for “not realising the truth attained so long ago in Greek philosophy that [numbers] are Universals” and not magnitudes (OPD, 250, n.1 & SI, ciii) (Joseph 1948, 59–60). He never explained in any details how this critique is supposed to work against Dedekind, but provided instead lengthy and unconvincing arguments for also rejecting Russell’s logicist definition of natural numbers on similar ground (see section 8).

Despite the fact that he drew such preposterous consequences from it, Cook Wilson’s reading of Plato and Aristotle in OPD remained influential, albeit controversial, throughout the last century, through Ross’ edition of Aristotle’s Metaphysics (1924, liii–lvii, ad B 3, 999a6–10 & M 6, 1080a15–b4) and especially through its advocacy by Harold Cherniss in Aristotle’s Criticism of Plato and the Academy (Cherniss 1944, App. vi) and The Riddle of the Early Academy (Cherniss 1945, 34–37 & 76). Cherniss’ student Reginald Allen still claimed in the 1980s that Cook Wilson’s is the “true view of Plato’s arithmetic” (Allen 1983, 231–233). (For further endorsements of Cook Wilson’s reading see (Joseph 1948, 33 & chap. v), (Klein 1968, 62) or (Tarán 1981, 13–18) and for criticisms see (Hardie 1936, chap. vi), (Austin 1979, 302) or (Burnyeat 2012, 166–167).)

Cook Wilson’s other notable contribution is the provision, in ‘On the Geometrical Problem in Plato’s Meno, 86e sqq.’ (GPP), of a key addition to S. H. Butcher’s clarification (1888) of the notoriously obscure geometrical illustration of Meno 86e–87b, showing that Plato did not intend to offer an actual solution to the problem of the inscription of an area as a triangle within a circle, but simply to determine, while alluding to the method of analysis, the possibility of its solution. An analogous explanation of that passage was provided later on by T. L. Heath (1921, 298–303) and A. S. L. Farquharson (1923), while Knorr (1986, 71–74) and Menn (2002, 209–214) defended this interpretation without mention of Cook Wilson. (See also the critical discussion of the ‘Cook Wilson/Heath/Knorr interpretation’ in (Lloyd 1992), as well as (Scott 2006, 133–137) and (Wolfsdorf 2008, 164–169).)

Apart from these, Cook Wilson’s impact seems to have been limited to minute points of philology, such as the references to his critical comments on Apelt’s edition of De Melisso Xenophane Gorgia (APT) in (Kerferd 1955) or to his pamphlet on the Timaeus in A. E. Taylor’s and F. M. Cornford’s own commentaries of that dialogue, and the critical discussion of his views in Ross’ edition of Aristotle’s Prior and Posterior Analytics (Ross 1949, 496–497).

Given that Cook Wilson’s views on knowledge and belief (see section 5) are linked to Plato’s own distinction between ἐπιστήμη and δόξα, it is worth mentioning that they also had an impact on the study of Plato’s dialogues. For example, although A. D. Woozley held a different view of knowledge as “not something generically different from belief, but as the limited case of belief” (Woozley 1949, 193), Cook Wilson’s distinction between knowledge and belief is introduced as an interpretative tool in chapter 8 of R. C. Cross and A. D. Woozley, Plato’s Republic. A Philosophical Commentary (Cross & Woozley 1964), while the idea that knowledge involves ‘reflection’ (the ‘accretion’ described in section 5) and the concept of ‘being under the impression that’ are involved in Ryle’s discussion of knowledge in Plato’s Theaetetus (Ryle 1990, 23 & 27–28). (For a similar claim about Theaetetus, see Prichard (1950, 88), and for Ryle on Cook Wilson on Parmenides, see end of section 7.) The impact of Cook Wilson’s views was at any rate not limited to Plato studies: they form, for example, the basis for H. A. Prichard’s critique of Kant in his Kant’s Theory of Knowledge (Prichard 1909) or of his lectures on the Descartes, Locke, Berkeley and Hume on knowledge (Prichard 1950, chap. 5). (See in particular Prichard (1909, 245), quoted below or (1950, 86, 88 & 96) for statements of the distinction between knowledge and belief.)

3. On Method: Ordinary Language

If Cook Wilson’s reverence towards ordinary language derived from his training as a philologist, it was not limited to occasional references to instances of usage to buttress his arguments. He believed that in philosophy one must above all “uncompromisingly […] try to find out what a given activity of thought presupposes as implicit or explicit in our consciousness”, i.e., to “try to get at the facts of consciousness and not let them be overlaid as is so commonly done with preconceived theories” (SI, 328). He also spoke of the latter as originating in ‘reflective thought’ and argued it has two major defects. First, it is based on principles that, for all we know, might be false and, concomitantly, it is too abstract, because it is not based on the consideration of particular concrete examples. Indeed, in a passage where he criticized Bradley’s regress arguments against the reality of relations (Bradley 1897, chap. III), Cook Wilson begins by pointing out that “throughout this chapter there is not a single illustration, though it is of the last importance that there should be” (SI, 692). (On this critique of Bradley, see also Joseph (1916a, 37).) This is, however, slightly misleading, given that Bradley opens his discussion in his previous chapter, where a first regress is deployed, with the case of a lump of sugar (Bradley 1897, 16).) As H. H. Price put it later, for Cook Wilson and his epigones “to philosophize without instances would be merely a waste of time” (Price 1947, 336).

Secondly, Cook Wilson thought that philosophers are most likely to introduce distinctions of their own that do not correspond to the ‘facts of consciousness’ and thus distort our understanding of them. He therefore strove to uncover these ‘facts of consciousness’ through an analysis of concrete examples which would be free of philosophical jargon. This is strongly reminiscent of the ‘descriptive psychology’ of the Brentano School. As a matter of fact, Gilbert Ryle, who described himself as a “fidgetty Cook Wilsonian” in his youth (Ryle 1993, 106) and who was also probably the only Oxonian who knew something about phenomenology in the 1920s, believed Cook Wilson’s descriptive analyses to be as good as any from Husserl (Ryle 1971, vol. I, 176 & 203n.).

In what may be deemed a variant of the ‘linguistic turn’, Cook Wilson believed that an examination of the “verbal form of statement” was needed in order “to see what light the form of expression might throw upon problems about the mental state” (SI, 90), thus that ordinary language would be the guide to the ‘facts of consciousness’, because it embodies philosophically relevant distinctions:

It is not fair to condemn the ordinary view wholly, nor is it safe: for, if we do, we may lose sight of something important behind it. Distinctions in current language can never safely be neglected. (SI, 46)
The authority of language is too often forgotten in philosophy, with serious results. Distinctions made or applied in ordinary language are more likely to be right than wrong. Developed, as they have been, in what may be called the natural course of thinking, under the influence of experience and in the apprehension of particular truths, whether of everyday life or of science, they are not due to any preconceived theory. In this way the grammatical forms themselves have arisen; they are not the issue of any system, they are not invented by any one. They have been developed unconsciously in accordance with distinctions which we come to apprehend in our experience. (SI, 874)
Reflective thought tends to be too abstract, while experience which has developed the popular distinctions recorded in language is always in contact with the particular facts. (SI, 875)

For this reason, Cook Wilson considered it “repugnant to create a technical term out of all relation to ordinary language” (SI, 713) and SI is replete with appeals to ordinary language. For example, he argued in support of his views on universals that “ordinary language reflects faithfully a true metaphysics of universals” (SI (208), see section 7). But such appeals were not just meant to undermine ‘preconceived theories’, they were also constructive, e.g., when he distinguished between the activity of thinking and ‘what we think’, i.e., between ‘act’ and ‘content’ (SI, 63–64), arguing that this is “likely to be right” because “it is the natural and universal mode of expression in ordinary untechnical language, ancient and modern” (SI, 67) and “it comes from the very way of speaking which is natural and habitual with those who do not believe in any form of idealism” (SI, 64). As it turns out, Cook Wilson believed that the ‘content’, i.e., ‘what we think’ is not about the thing we think about, but the thing itself (so knowledge contains its object, see section 6).

These views were to prove particularly influential in the case of J. L. Austin, who began his studies at Oxford four years after the publication of SI. It is a common mistake to think of Wittgenstein as having had some formative influence on Austin, as he was arguably the least influenced by Wittgenstein of the Oxford philosophers (Hacker 1996, 172). (On this point see also Marion (2011), for the contrary claim, Harris & Unnsteinsson (2018).) At any rate, the evidence adduced here and elsewhere since Marion (2000) ought not to be ignored and, the philosophy of G. E. Moore notwithstanding, it is rather Cook Wilson and epigones such as Prichard that are the source of the peculiar brand of ‘analytical philosophy’ that was to take root in Oxford in the 1930s, known as ‘Oxford philosophy’ or ‘ordinary language philosophy’. One merely needs here to recall the following well-known passage from Austin’s ‘A Plea for Excuses’, which is almost a paraphrase of Cook Wilson:

Our common stock of words embodies all the distinctions men have found worth drawing, and the connections they have found worth marking, in the lifetimes of many generations: these surely are likely to be more numerous, more sound, since they have stood up to the long test of the survival of the fittest, and more subtle, at least in all ordinary and reasonably practical matters, than any that you or I are likely to think up in our arm-chairs of an afternoon—the most favoured alternative method. (Austin 1979, 182)

Neither Cook Wilson nor Austin believed, however, that ordinary language was not open to improvements. Cook Wilson was explicit about this when detailing his procedure:

Obviously we must start from the facts of the use of a name, and shall be guided at first certainly by the name: and so far we may appear to be examining the meaning of a name. Next we have to think about the individual instances, to see what they have in common, what it is that has actuated us. […] At this stage we must take first what seems to us common in certain cases before us: next test what we have got by considering other instances of our own application of the name, other instances in which has been working in us. Now when thus thinking of other instances, we may see that they do not come under the formula that we have generalized. […] There is a further stage when we have, or think we have, discovered the nature of the principle which has really actuated us. We may now correct some of our applications of the name because we see that some instances do not really possess the quality which corresponds to what we now understand the principle to be. This explains how it should be possible to criticize the facts out of which we have been drawing our data. (SI, 44–45)

Austin’s ‘linguistic phenomenology’ (Austin 1979, 182) was devised along similar lines (on this point, see Longworth 2018a), and he also thought that ordinary language could be improved upon:

Certainly ordinary language has no claim to be the last word, if there is such a thing. […] ordinary language is not the last word: in principle it can everywhere be supplemented and improved upon and superseded. Only remember, it is the first word. (Austin 1979, 185)

It is worth noting that Cook Wilson uses in the above passage the example of Socrates’ search for definitions as an illustration of his procedure. This strongly suggests that he derived it from consideration of the method of induction (ἐπαγωγή) in Ancient philosophy: collect first a number of applications of a given term and, focussing on salient features of these cases, formulate as an hypothesis a general claim covering them, then test it for counterexamples against novel applications. (Longworth (2018a) has also drawn some interesting parallels with ‘experimental mathematics’ (see Baker (2008) and the entry to this Encyclopedia).)

4. Apprehension & Judgement

Since Cook Wilson’s philosophy was largely defined in opposition to British Idealism, it is worth beginning with some points of explicit disagreement. Roughly put, under the idealist view knowledge is constituted by a coherent set of mutually supporting beliefs, none of which are basic, while others would be derivative. Surprisingly, when H. H. Joachim published The Nature of Truth (1906), perhaps the best statement of the coherence theory of truth usually attributed to the British Idealists, Cook Wilson criticized him for relying on a discredited ‘correspondence’ theory (SI, 809–810). Cook Wilson did not argue directly against the coherence theory, as Russell did (Russell 1910, 131–146), but simply took the opposite foundationalist stance. He reasoned that the chain of justification ought to come to an end and that this end point is some non-derivative knowledge, which he called ‘apprehension’ (SI, 816). As he put it: “it becomes evident that there must be apprehensions not got by inference or reasoning” (UL, § 18).

As Farquharson noted (SI, 78 n.), Cook Wilson did not define his key notion of ‘apprehension’. (This is related with Cook Wilson’s claim discussed in section 5 that knowledge is undefinable.) The notion appears to be at the same time close to Aristotle’s ‘noesis’ and to Russell’s ‘acquaintance’. Cook Wilson obviously took his lead from a tradition beginning with Posterior Analytics B 19 and his comments are reminiscent of Thomas Reid, who argues in his Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man (Bk. II, chap. v) that perception involves some conception of the object and the conviction of its existence, this conviction being immediate, non-inferential and not open to doubt. Cook Wilson was not exactly faithful to Aristotle and Reid, however, since he argued that apprehensions can be both perceptual and non-perceptual (SI, 79), and that some are obtained by inference while some are not, the latter being the material of inference (SI, 84–85). Furthermore, he argued that perceptual apprehensions should not be confused with sensations, as the mere having of a sensation is not yet to know what the sensation is, an idea that has echoes in Austin (Austin 1979, 91–94 & 122 n.2). For this, one needs an “originative act of consciousness” that goes beyond mere passivity and compares the sensation in order to apprehend its definite character. As Cook Wilson put it: “we are really comparing but we do not recognize that we are” (SI, 46).

Cook Wilson thought it misleading to base logic on ‘judgement’ instead of ‘proposition’ or ‘statement’ (SI, 94) and he questioned the traditional analysis of proposition under the form ‘S is P’, which he saw has having various meanings (Joseph (1916a, 6), see also section 9 for a related point). In his polemics against idealism, Cook Wilson’s main target was the traditional theory of judgement that one finds, e.g., in Bradley’s Principles of Logic (Bradley 1928), where the topic is simply divided into ‘judgement’ and ‘inference’. There would thus be a common form of thinking called the ‘judgement’ that ‘S is P’, which would include non-inferred knowledge, opinion, and belief, but would exclude inferred knowledge. One would be misled, he argued, by the common verbal form ‘S is P’ that knowledge, belief, and opinion are species of the same genre called ‘judgement’ (SI, 86–7). He claimed instead to follow ‘ordinary usage’ in adopting a ‘judicial’ account of ‘judgement’:

A judgement is a decision. To judge is to decide. It implies previous indecision; a previous thinking process, in which we were doubting. Those verbal statements, therefore, which result from a state of mind not preceded by such doubt, statements which are not decisions, are not judgements, though they may have the same verbal form as judgements. (SI, 92–3)

He further argued first that inferring is thus one of the forms of judgement: “if we take judging in its most natural sense, that is as decision on evidence after deliberation, then inferring is just one of those form of apprehending to which the words judging and judgement most properly apply” (SI, 86). Some inferences are, however, immediately apprehended, e.g., when one recognizes that it follows from ‘if p, then q’ and ‘p’, that ‘q’. Furthermore, the presence of a prior indecision or doubt, as opposed to confidence, is deemed an essential ingredient of judgement. It does not, however, fully put an end to doubt: as a judge may well be mistaken, our ordinary judgements “form fallible opinions only” (Joseph 1916a, 160).

Now, if indecision and doubt are involved prior to judgement, apprehension or knowledge (perceptual or not) could not be judgement, because, by definition, there is no room for doubt in these cases. When one is of the opinion that p, one has found the evidence being in favour of p, without being conclusive. But Cook Wilson thought statements of opinion as not involving the expression of a decision, so they not judgement either:

It is a peculiar thing—the result of estimate—and we call it by a peculiar name, opinion. For it, taken in its strict and proper sense, we can use no term that belongs to knowing. For the opinion that A is B is founded on evidence we know to be insufficient, whereas it is of the very nature of knowledge not to make its statements at all on grounds recognized to be insufficient, nor to come to any decision except that the grounds are insufficient; for it is here that in the knowing activity we stop. (SI, 99–100)

Moreover, there is no ‘common mental attitude’ involved in ‘knowing’ and ‘opining’:

One need hardly add that there is no verbal form corresponding to any such fiction as a mental activity manifested in a common mental attitude to the object about which we know or about which we have an opinion. Moreover it is vain to seek such a common quality in belief, on the ground that the man who knows that A is B and the man who has that opinion both believe that A is B. (SI, 100)

It is an important characteristic of ‘believing’, setting it apart from other ‘activities of consciousness’, that it is accompanied with a feeling of confidence, greater than in opining:

To a high degree of such confidence, where it naturally exists, is attached the word belief, and language here, as not infrequently, is true to distinctions which have value in our consciousness. It is not opinion, it is not knowledge, it is not properly even judgement. (SI, 102)

The upshot of these remarks is that ‘knowledge’, ‘belief’, and ‘opinion’ are not, as idealists would have it, species of the same genre, ‘judgement’ or ‘thinking’: these are all distinct and sui generis. This leads to the all-important distinction between ‘knowledge’ and ‘belief’, discussed in the next section: they do not merely differ in kind, they are not even two species of the same genus (Prichard 1950, 87). But Cook Wilson also held the view that knowing is more foundational, so to speak, as it is presupposed by other ‘activities of thinking’ such as judging and opining. For example, opinion involves knowledge, but goes beyond it:

There will be something else besides judgement to be recognized in the formation of opinion, that is to say knowledge, as manifested in such activities as occur in ordinary perception; activities, in other words, which are not properly speaking decisions. (SI, 96)

5. Knowing & Believing

Given that “our experience of knowing [is] the presupposition of any inquiry we can undertake”, Cook Wilson reasoned that “we cannot make knowing itself a subject of inquiry in the sense of asking what knowing is” (SI, 39). It follows immediately from this impossibility of inquiring about the nature of knowledge that a ‘theory of knowledge’ is itself impossible, a consequence he first expressed in a letter to Prichard in 1904:

We cannot construct knowing—the act of apprehending—out of any elements. I remember quite early in my philosophic reflection having an instinctive aversion to the very expression ‘theory of knowledge’. I felt the words themselves suggested a fallacy. (SL, 803)
Knowledge is sui generis and therefore a ‘theory’ of it is impossible. Knowledge is simply knowledge, and an attempt to state it in terms of something else must end in describing something which is not knowledge. (Prichard 1909, 245)

Thus, knowledge, as obtained in ‘apprehension’, could not be defined in terms of belief augmented by some other property or properties, as in the definition of knowledge as ‘justified true belief’. Cook Wilson is thus to be counted among early 20th-century opponents of this view (Dutant (2015), Le Morvan (2017) & Antognazza (2020)). This view is known since Timothy Williamson’s Knowledge and its Limits as ‘knowledge first’ (see Williamson (2000, v) and Adam Carter, Gordon & Jarvis (2017) for recent developments of this view).

At the turn of the last century, it was also held by the neo-Kantian philosopher Leonard Nelson (Nelson 1908 & 1949), to whom Cook Wilson alludes in SI (872), but it was also held unbeknownst to him by members of the Brentano school, such as Adolf Reinach, Max Scheler, and Edmund Husserl. (See Mulligan (2014) for a survey.) It was to become the central plank of ‘Oxford Realism’. For the Oxonians and the Brentanians one knows that p only if one ‘apprehends’ that p. As Kevin Mulligan put it: “one knows that p in the strict sense only if one has perceived that p and such perceiving is not itself any sort of belief or judging” (Mulligan 2014, 382). A version of this view is defended today by Timothy Williamson, according to whom knowledge is a mental state “being in which is necessary and sufficient for knowing p” (Williamson 2000, 21), and which “cannot be analysed into more basic concepts” (Williamson 2000, 33). The claim is, however, about ‘knowledge that p’ and not anymore about ‘apprehending that p’.

If knowledge is indeed distinct from belief, then the difference cannot be one of degree in the feeling of confidence or in the amount of evidential support:

In knowing, we can have nothing to do with the so-called ‘greater strength’ of the evidence on which the opinion is grounded; simply because we know that this ‘greater strength’ of evidence of A’s being B is compatible with A’s not being B after all. (SI, 100)
To know is not to have a belief of a special kind, differing from beliefs of other kinds; and no improvement in a belief and no increase in the feeling of conviction which it implies will convert it into knowledge. (Prichard 1950, 87)

Austin has a nice supporting example in Sense and Sensibilia, using the fact that ‘seeing that’ is factive: if no pig is in sight, I might accumulate evidence that one lives here: buckets of pig food, pig-like marks on the ground, the smell, etc. But if the pig suddenly appears:

… there is no longer any question of collecting evidence; its coming into view doesn’t provide me with more evidence that it’s a pig, I can now just see that it is, the question is settled. (Austin 1962, 115)

There is a parallel move by John McDowell in ‘Criteria, Defeasibility and Knowledge’ against the notion of ‘criteria’, deployed by some commentators of Wittgenstein as a sort of ‘highest common factor’ between evidence and proof (McDowell 1998, 369–394). Here, a ‘highest common factor’ would be a state of mind that would count as knowing, depending on one or more added factors, but would count in their absence as something else such as believing (McDowell 1998, 386). McDowell is now seen as having thus put forward a form of ‘disjunctivism’ about knowledge and belief (more on disjunctivism in section 6). Although McDowell does not mention these authors, Travis (2005) has shown that this move has roots in both Cook Wilson and Austin. The fact that there is no highest common factor to knowledge and belief entails for Cook Wilson a rejection of ‘hybrid’ and ‘externalist’ accounts of knowledge. Any ‘hybrid’ account would factor knowledge into an internal part, possibly a copy of the object known, and a relation of that copy to the object itself (see immediately below and section 6). Since there is no such highest common factor, this view, integral to ‘externalist’ accounts of knowledge, had to be rejected (Travis 2005, 287).

But Cook Wilson was led here to a further thesis. If one is prepared to say ‘I believe p’, when one is not sure that evidence already known is sufficient to claim that ‘I know that p’, then it looks as if one should always be in a position to know if one knows or if one merely believes. He argued, however, that ‘knowing that one knows’ should not mean that, once a particular piece of knowledge has been obtained, one should then decide if it counts as knowledge or not, because this decision would count again as a piece knowledge and “we should get into an unending series of knowings” (SI, 107). This is why he insisted that knowing that one knows “must be contained within the knowing process itself”:

Belief is not knowledge and the man who knows does not believe at all when he knows: he knows it. (SI, 101)

The consciousness that the knowing process is a knowing process must be contained within the knowing process itself. (SI, 107)

This claim was given further emphasis by Prichard, but his own formulation differ in an important respect, since he introduces the idea of a “reflection” in virtue of which when one knows that p, one is able to know that one knows that p and, when one believes that p, one is also able to know that one believes that p, so that it would be impossible to mistake knowledge for belief and vice-versa:

We must recognize that whenever we know something we either do, or at least can, by reflecting, directly know that we are knowing it, and that whenever we believe something, we similarly either do or can directly know that we are believing it and not knowing it. (Prichard 1950, 86 & 88)

One can see that this is not quite Cook Wilson’s position, given his regress argument. Prichard assumes that, whenever one does not know, one knows that one does not know:

When knowing, for example, that the noise we are hearing is loud, we do or can know that we are knowing this and so cannot be mistaken, and when believing that the noise is due to a car we know or can know that we are believing and not knowing this. (Prichard 1950, 89)

Charles Travis called the claim that in knowing that p one can always distinguish one’s condition from all states in which not-p the ‘accretion’ (Travis (2005, 290) & Kalderon & Travis (2013, 501)) and he argued that it damages the core of Cook Wilson’s and Prichard’s positions (Travis 2005, 289–294). To use the above example of the pig suddenly coming into view, the claim is that, although one can know by reflection that one knows that one is seeing a pig, one cannot by mere reflection exclude the possibility that one is in fact seeing some cleverly engineered ‘ringer’. The upshot of this argument is not immediately clear: if it is the case that one knows p only if p and one knows that one knows that p, how could one be unable to exclude the case that not-p, hence that one does not know p? At all events, Travis sees this as reinstalling the argument from illusion (Travis 2005, 291), that had already been subjected to numerous critiques from an early paper by Prichard to Austin’s Sense and Sensibilia:

That statements about appearances imply that we at least know enough of reality to say that real things have certain possible predicates, e.g., bent or convergent. To deny this is to be wholly unable to state how things look. […] It is only because we know that our distance from an object affects its apparent size that we can draw a distinction between the size it looks and the size it is. If we forget this we can draw no distinction at all. (Prichard 1906, 225–226)

… it is important to remember that all talk of deception only makes sense against a background of general non-deception. (You can’t fool all the people all of the time.) It must be possible to recognize a case of deception by checking the odd case against more normal ones. (Austin 1962, 11)

Guy Longworth (2019) has detailed how much Austin owed to Cook Wilson on knowledge (see Urmson (1988) for a discussion in relation to Prichard): Austin held the ‘knowledge first’ view and, concomitantly, rejected the possibility of a theory of knowledge (Austin 1962, 124), he viewed knowledge as akin to proof, thus as being different in kind from belief on accumulation of evidence (see Austin (1962, 115) & (1979, 99)). But Austin dropped the ‘accretion’ in ‘Other Minds’ as he shifted the analysis of the claim that ‘If I know, I can’t be wrong’ (SI (69) & Prichard (1950, 88)) to that of ‘I know that p’ as providing a form of warrant, one’s authority for saying that p (Austin 1979, 99–100). Krista Lawlor (2013) recently suggested that Austin introduced here the speech act of ‘assurance’. (Although it has been claimed that the idea of ‘performatives’ originates in an exchange of letters on promises with Prichard (Warnock 1963, 347), that dimension remained unexplored in Oxford Realism before Austin, who was consciously moving away here from strict focus on ‘statements’.)

The ‘accretion’ raises indeed an issue concerning ‘other minds’, given that it is one’s reflective view that, supposedly, authoritatively determines that one knows: could there be other ways to determine whether someone else knows? (See Longworth (2019).) This is how Austin, who also viewed knowledge as a state of mind, was arguably led to explore the ramifications the challenge ‘How do you know?’ to the person claiming ‘I know’. Although he warned against the ‘descriptive fallacy’ (Austin 1979, 103), Austin’s claim appears to be, rather, that ‘I know’ has functions “over and above describing the subjective mental state of knowing” (Longworth (2019, 195), see Austin (1979, 78–79)).

To come back to Cook Wilson, he grappled here with related problems. It is implied by the above that knowledge requires a sort of warrant very much akin to a proof and, consequently, “we are forced to allow that we are certain of very much less than we should have said otherwise” (Prichard 1950, 97). Mathematical knowledge appears paradigmatic. As Prichard put it: “In mathematics we have, without real possibility of question, an instance of knowledge; we are certain, we know” (Prichard 1919, 302). (Joseph used this view to argue against Mill’s empiricist account of mathematics, using ‘intuition’ where Cook Wilson would use ‘apprehension’ (Joseph 1916a, 543–553).) Alas, Cook Wilson put forth the axiom of parallels in Euclidean geometry as an example of knowledge, and dismissed non-Euclidean geometries as inconsistent (see section 1). If for any p such as the axiom of parallels, someone fails to ‘apprehend’ it, then all he could do is, somehow lamely, ask them to try and “remove […] whatever confusions or prejudices […] prevent them from apprehending the truth of the disputed proposition” (Furlong 1941, 128).

This reply raises a prima facie problem for Cook Wilson, because he could not have known, in the sense of ‘knowing p only if p’, that ‘non-Euclidean geometries are inconsistent’, since it has been proved that they are not. He thus unwittingly provided an illustration of the need to account, from his own internalist standpoint, for the sort of error (or ‘false judgement’) committed when one claims to know that p, while it is the case that not-p. For someone to know or to be in error while thinking that one knows would just be two undistinguishable states, since which of the two happens to be the case would depend on some external factors:

… the two states of mind in which the man conducts his arguments, the correct and the erroneous one, are quite undistinguishable to the man himself. But if this is so, as the man does not know in the erroneous state of mind, neither can he know in the other state. (SI, 107)

Cook Wilson saw this a threat to the very possibility of demonstrative knowledge, since one would never be sure that any demonstration is true (SI, 107–108). Answering the threat, he would need here is thus to make room for errors—when one thinks that one knows but one does not—but without excluding by the same token the possibility that knowing entails being in a position that one knows that one knows.

Cook Wilson was thus led to distinguish, in some of his most intriguing descriptive analyses, a further ‘form of consciousness’, different from both knowledge and belief (or opinion), which he called ‘being under the impression that’ (SI, 109–113). A typical example being when one sees the back of Smith on the street and, ‘being under the impression that’ it is a friend, say Jones, one slaps him on the back, only to realize one’s mistake when he turns his head. The “essential feature” of this state of mind is, according to Cook Wilson, “the absence of any sense of uncertainty or doubt, the action being one which would not be done if we felt the slightest uncertainty” (SI, 110). Thus, one did not falsely judge that the man on the street was Jones, because there was no judgement at all: one was merely ‘under the impression that’ it was him. Maybe one had some evidence that it was Jones, but the point is that one acted on it without questioning the evidence: it was not used as evidence, there was no assessment out of which one may be said to prefer this possibility that other possibility, because no other possibility was entertained. In this state of mind, the possibility of error is somehow excluded, given that it does not occur to one that ‘This man is Jones’ might be false. It is thus not the case that one thought that one knew but really did not, because it is not true that to begin with one thought one knew, since one had not reflected on one’s evidence. The absence of doubt or uncertainty opens the door to the possibility of being mistaken while taking oneself as being certain.

The notion of ‘being under the impression that’ played a significant role in the writings of the Oxford Realists, not just those of Prichard, who also spoke of the ‘an unquestioning frame of mind’, ‘thinking without question’ or ‘taking for granted’ (Prichard 1950, 79 & 96–98), but also those of William Kneale, H. H. Price and J. L. Austin—see, e.g., Kneale (1949, 5 & 18), Price (1935), and Austin (1962, 122). Perhaps most strikingly, Prichard was to drop the ‘accretion’ and argue in a late essay, ‘Perception’, that perception is not a kind of knowing: we merely see colour extensions, which we systematically mistake for objects or ‘take for granted’ to be objects (Prichard 1950, 52–68). Still, the notion of ‘being under the impression that’ had its critics at Oxford, such as H. P. Grice, who was aware of the difficulties raised by the ‘accretion’:

This difficulty led Cook Wilson and his followers to the admission of a state of “taking for granted”, which supposedly is subjectively indistinguishable from knowledge but unlike knowledge carried no guarantee of truth. But the modification amounts to surrender; for what enables us to deny that all of our so-called knowledge is really only “taking for granted”? (Grice 1989, 383–384)

One may also justifiably feel that Cook Wilson has not fully explained away cases of error such as his own in being certain that ‘non-Euclidean geometries are inconsistent’, because his conviction was not the result of merely ‘being under the impression that’.

Nevertheless, the influence of Cook Wilson’s conceptions was felt in a variety of ways in the second half of the last century. H. H. Price offered in Belief an important commentary on Cook Wilson’s notion of ‘being under the impression that’ (Price (1969, 204–220), reprising some of the content of Price (1935)). He deemed it an important addition to the traditional ‘occurrence’ analysis of belief, as opposed to the ‘dispositional’ analysis. Price usefully contrasted ‘being under the impression that’ with ‘assent’ (Price 1969, 211–212), which is usually said to involve preference and confidence: in prefering p one would decide in favour of p having alternatives q and r in mind, but this is precisely not the case when ‘being under the impression that’, since in this state one does not entertain alternatives. As Cook Wilson points out, “there is a certain passivity and helplessness” involved (SI, 113). There is no confidence either, since in this state of mind doubt is not an option, hence no degree of certainty is involved. Price also explored (1969, 212–216) connections between this unquestioning state of mind and the notion of ‘primitive credulity’ (Bain 1888, 511), i.e., the idea harking back to Spinoza (Ethics IIp49s) that one naturally believes in the reality of anything that is presented to one’s mind, unless some contradicting evidence is also occurring.

In contrast to Price, Jonathan Cohen argued that beliefs are dispositions (Cohen (1989, 368) & (1992, 5)). He also rejected the Cook Wilson’s claim that belief involves confidence (see section 4), but, without crediting him (except privately), Cohen made use of ‘being under the impression that’ to define belief as a disposition to ‘normally to feel that p’ or ‘to feel it true that p’ (Cohen (1989, 368) & (1992, 7)). So defined, belief would thus differ from ‘acceptance’, which results from a conscious and voluntary choice and involves, like Price’s ‘assent’, preference and confidence. Cohen further added to these differences that acceptance is also subjectively closed under deductibility, while this is not the case with belief:

… you may well feel it true that p and that if p then q, without feeling it true that q. You will just be failing to put two and two together, as it were. And detective-story writers, for example, show us how often and easily we can fail to do this with our beliefs. (Cohen 1992, 31–32)

So acceptance of p involves ‘premissing’, i.e., the decision to use p as a premise or rule of inference in further reasonings, and Cohen thought that he was carving nature at its joint here: “Belief is a disposition to feel, acceptance a policy for reasoning” (Cohen 1992, 5). This is in many ways not faithful to Cook Wilson’s original ideas, but one can sense their presence within the idea of being unreflectively disposed to feel that p being conceptually distinct from accepting p.

On another note, John McDowell described knowledge in ‘Knowledge and the Internal’ as a “standing in the space of reasons” and argued against an “interiorization of the space of reasons” that would occur if one were to think of knowledge as achieving flawless standings in the space of reason, “without needing the world to do us any favours” (McDowell 1998 395–396). If appearances were to be misleading, it would be argued that this not be the result of faulty moves within the space of reason but simply an “unkindness of the world”. This conception, McDowell sees as opening the door to an ‘hybrid’ account of knowledge, with flawless standings in the space of reasons as an internal part, which would provide necessary conditions for knowledge, and favours from the world—when thing are as they appear to be—as an extra condition (McDowell 1998, 400). But, McDowell concludes, “the very idea of reason as having a sphere of operation within which it is capable of ensuring, without being beholden to the world that one’s postures are all right […] has the look of a fantasy” (McDowell 1998, 405). This is so precisely because the resources from the space of reasons could not provide factiveness on their own, so knowledge could not be completely constituted by standings within it. To rid oneself of the fantasy, one needs simply to recognize that on occasions when the world is what it appears to be, this favour is “not extra to the person’s standing in the space of reasons” (McDowell 1998, 405) and that “we are vulnerable to the world’s playing us false; and when the world does not play us false we are indebted to it” (McDowell 1998, 407). Here too, although the terminology is taken from Wilfrid Sellars, there is a recognizable source in Cook Wilson.

Finally, another significant development related to the ‘accretion’ is its connection with the ‘knowing that one knows’ principle in epistemic logic, first introduced in Jaakko Hintikka’s ground-breaking Knowledge and Belief (Hintikka 1962). Hintikka argued for the equivalence between ‘I know that p’ and ‘I know that I know that p’ or, more generally, that ‘i knows that p’ (Kip) implies ‘i knows that i knows that p’ (KiKip) (Hintikka 1962, chap. 5). In connection with this, he noticed that Prichard’s introduction the idea of “reflection” (see Prichard (1950, 88) quoted above) turns the argument into an argument from introspection that does not sustain the more general claim that ‘i believes that p’ (Bip) implies ‘i knows that i believes that p’ (KiBip) (Hintikka 1962, 109–110). Still, Hintikka thought that Cook Wilson and Prichard would be right, if their remarks were to be understood as restricted to the case where i is the first-person pronoun ‘I’ (Hintikka 1962, 110).

Although Williamson has picked up the Oxonian banner of ‘knowledge first’, this is one point where he did not follow Cook Wilson and Prichard, since he argued against the ‘knowing that one knows’ principle with help of the notion of ‘luminosity’. A condition C is said to be ‘luminous’ if and only if for every case a, if C obtains in a then in a one is in a position to know that C obtains (Williamson 2000, 95). Williamson (2000, chap. 4) provided arguments against ‘luminosity’, thus that one can know without being able to know that one knows.

6. Perception

Cook Wilson also argued against idealism that in apprehension it is neither the case that the object exists only within the apprehending consciousness, nor that it is constituted by it: the object is independent of the apprehending consciousness. As he wrote: “the apprehension of an object is only possible through a being of the object other than its being apprehended, and it is this being, no part itself of the apprehending thought, which is what is apprehended” (SI, 74). This independence, he considered to be presupposed by the very idea of knowledge expounded above. But he further rejected the distinction between act, content and object of perception, first by negating the act-object distinction:

In our ordinary experience and in the sciences, the thinker or observer loses himself in a manner in the particular object he is perceiving or the truth he is proving. That is what he is thinking about, and not about himself; and, though knowledge and perception imply both the distinction of the thinker from the object and the active working of that distinction, we must not confuse this with the statement that the thinking subject, in actualizing this distinction, thinks explicitly about himself, and his own activity, as distinct from the object. (SI, 79)

And, secondly, by rejecting the notion of ‘content’: “For the only thing that can be found as ‘content’ of the apprehending thought is the nature of the object apprehended” (SI, 75). Austin echoed this last point saying that “our senses are dumb” (Austin 1962, 11). (There is an extensive literature on this claim, see, e.g., (Travis 2004) or (Massin 2011).) The point is not that perception does not aim at an object, but merely to deny that it does so through a ‘content’ acting as intermediary:

what I think of the red object is its own redness, not some mental copy of redness in my mind. I regard it as having real redness and not as having my copy of redness. […] If we ask in any instance what it is we think of a given object of knowledge, we find it always conceived as the nature or part of the nature of the thing known. (SI, 64)

What one apprehends must be the real object itself, not “some mental copy” of it, so Cook Wilson is claiming here that, as a state of mind, knowledge contains its object: “what we apprehend […] is included in the apprehension as a part of the activity or reality of apprehending” (SI, 70). A long letter to G. F. Stout (SI, 764–800) is of particular importance here, where Cook Wilson criticized Stout on ‘Primary and Secondary Qualities’ (Stout 1904), with this key diagnosis, of the ‘objectification of the appearing as appearance’:

This is sometimes spoken from the side of the object as the appearance of the object to us. This ‘appearance’ then gets distinguished from the object […] But next the appearance, though properly the appearing of the object, gets itself to be looked on as itself an object and the immediate object of our consciousness, and being already, as we have seen, distinguished from the object and related to our subjectivity, becomes, so to say, a merely subjective ‘object’—‘appearance’ in that sense. and so, as appearance of the object, it has now to be represented not as the object but as some phenomenon caused in our consciousness by the object. Thus for the true appearance (= appearing) to us of the object is substituted, through the ‘objectification’ of the appearing as appearance, the appearing to us of an appearance, the appearing of a phenomenon caused in us by the object. (SI, 796)

Cook Wilson’s rejection of ‘hybrid’ accounts of knowledge (see the previous section) is linked to his rejection of epistemological ‘intermediaries’, so that knowledge could not be of some such ‘objectified’ appearance. He considered all such intermediaries (‘images’, ‘copies’, ‘representative’, tertium quid, etc.) as “not only useless in philosophy but misleading as tending to obscure the solution of a difficult problem” (SI, 772). In this he stood in the tradition of Thomas Reid, his arguments were as a matter of fact first developed against the empiricism of Locke, Berkeley and Hume (for example in UL (§ 10)). In his letter to Stout, Cook Wilson put it thus:

You begin an important section of your argument by assuming the idea of sensations being representative.

They {represent—express—stand for} something other than themselves.

Now, I venture to think that the idea of such representation in philosophy, or psychology rather, is very loose and treacherous and, if used at all, should be preceded by a ‘critique’ of such representative character, and an explanation of the exact sense in which the word representative is used. (SI, 769)

Against views of this kind, Cook Wilson developed three arguments in his letter. First, he pointed out that it is impossible to know anything about the relation between the representative and the object, since one can never truly compare the former to the latter. Secondly, he claimed that representationalist theories are always in danger of leading towards idealism, since one must then somehow ‘prove’ the existence of the object which is, so to speak, ‘behind’ its representatives—there might be none. Thirdly, he claimed that all such theories beg the question, since the representative has to be apprehended in turn by the mind, and not only this further ‘apprehension’ remains unexplained, it would require that the mind be equipped with the very apparatus that the representationalist theories were, to begin with, devised to explain:

We want to explain knowing an object and we explain it solely in terms of the object known, and that by giving the mind not the object but some idea of it which is said to be like it—an image (however the fact may be disguised). The chief fallacy of this is not so much the impossibility of knowing such image is like the object, or that there is any object at all, but that it assumes the very thing it is intended to explain. The image itself has to be apprehended and the difficulty is only repeated. (SI, 803)

Cook Wilson also inveighed against Stout’s notion of ‘sensible extension’ pointing out inter alia that it makes no sense to claim that these are extended without being in space (SI, 783) and he tried to explain how a given object may appear to have different shapes from different perspectives, without making an appeal to any representative (SI, 790f.).

Stout answered these criticisms in print (for a discussion see Nasim 2008, 30–40 & 94–98). He argued that he had not been holding a view akin to Locke’s representationalism, claiming that the ‘representative function’ of his ‘presentations’ is of a different nature, more like a memory-image would represent what is remembered (Stout 1911, 14f.), but it is at first blush unclear what he meant by this. Against Cook Wilson’s first argument, he claimed that in his conception presentations and presented objects form an “inseparable unity” (Stout 1911, 22), this being, once more, unclear. At all events, both Stout and Russell, in his theory of ‘sense-data’ as ‘objects of perception’ (Russell 1912), insisted that the physical object and the representative are ‘real’. But one might say that this ‘objectification of the appearing as appearance’, does not annul Cook Wilson’s diagnosis of the difficulties inherent in that position. At least Russell was clearer about its implications, requiring a ‘logical construction’ of physical objects as functions of ‘sense-data’. One way to counter Cook Wilson on the absurdity of the locution ‘sensible extensions’ is to distinguish between ‘private’ and ‘public’ space, as Russell was to do in ‘The Relation of Sense-Data to Physics’ (Russell 1917, 139–171); as it is well-known, this postulation generates its own set of difficulties, e.g., the claim that space must have 6 dimensions (Russell 1917, 154). Russell on ‘sense-data’ was to become a favourite target for Prichard’s acerbic wit (Prichard 1915 & 1928).

Cook Wilson also wove his joint critique of the ‘objectification of the appearing as appearance’ and of representationalism into a broad historical narrative according to which “empiricism ends in the Subjective Idealism it was intended to avoid” (UL, § 10, see also SI, 60–63); he spoke of an “insidious and scarcely ‘conscious’ dialectic” that “has done much mischief in modern metaphysics and theories of perception” (SI, 797). Wilfrid Sellars, who attended Prichard’s classes as a Rhodes Scholar at Oxford in the mid-1930s, found the idea of such a ‘dialectic’ appealing:

I soon came under the influence of H. A. Prichard and, through him, of Cook Wilson. I found here, or at least seemed to find, a clearly articulated approach to philosophical issues which undercut the dialectic, rooted in Descartes, which led to both Hume and 19th Century Idealism. At the same time, I discovered Thomas Reid and found him appealing for much the same reasons. (Sellars 1975, 284)

Although Cook Wilson’s philosophy may be construed as a continuation of sorts of the Scottish School of Hutcheson and Reid (see also section 10), it is striking that there are hardly any references to these authors in his writings, even more so given that they contain critiques of Locke, Berkeley and Hume from a similar standpoint. (See Alsaleh (2003), focussing on attacks on Hume and their impact on Price (1932) and Austin (1962), and Marion (2009) for an overview of the 19th-century stages of this ‘dialectic’).

There was, however, no doctrinal unity on perception among Cook Wilson’s epigones. Prichard was probably the first to put Cook Wilson’s views into print in ‘Appearances and Reality’ (Prichard 1906) but, as already pointed out, he ended up arguing that in perception we systematically mistake colour expanses for objects. H. H. Price, who was at first close to Cook Wilson (Price 1924), incorporated a sense-data theory while rejecting phenomenalism in Perception (Price 1932). He became for that reason one of Austin’s targets in Sense and Sensibilia (Austin 1962), which remains, for all its novelty, faithful to Cook Wilson’s orthodoxy on knowledge. At all events, a form of direct realism in the theory of perception is one of the characteristic features of Oxford Realism. It is an ancestor to contemporary variants such as the position argued for by John McDowell in Mind and World (McDowell 1994) and, after a long eclipse, Cook Wilson’s views are once more playing a role in current debates about perception. (See for example references to them in Kalderon (2011, 241; 2018, xv, 49, 88 & 184), Siegel (2018, 2), Stoneham (2008, 319–320).)

One topic of particular interest in this respect is ‘disjunctivism’ (see Soteriou (2016) for an overview). This is the view that in perception one is faced either with cases of genuine perception or with cases of illusion or hallucination, as in ‘I see a flash of light or I am having the perfect illusion of doing so’ (Hinton 1973, 39). Such disjunctions were first analysed in detail by Michael Hinton (see Hinton (1973) and Snowdon (2008)), but there have been suggestions that disjunctivism harks back to Austin or even Cook Wilson and Prichard (Kalderon & Travis (213, 498–499), for Austin’s case, see also Longworth (2019)). Adjudicating such claims depends on one’s understanding of disjunctivism itself, but a few points can be adduced. Disjunctivism should not be confused with any ‘naïve’ or ‘direct realism’, but one may appeal to it to defend such views, therefore one should expect Cook Wilson and Oxford Realists to have taken some steps towards it. The sharp distinction between knowledge and belief (section 5), with the rejection of any ‘highest common factor’ between the two, should count as a first step. (The above-mentioned critiques of the argument from illusion reinforce this point.) A further step towards a form of disjunctivism is also taken when, having distinguished knowledge from belief, Cook Wilson also claimed that belief presupposes knowledge: it is only when assessing what I may know about some thing that I might realize that it is not sufficient to claim that ‘I know that p’, so that I remain circumspect and merely claim that ‘I believe that p’ (see sections 4 & 5).

7. Universals

In metaphysics too, Cook Wilson had first to cope with idealism, thus with the looming threat of Bradley’s regress about relations (Bradley 1897, chaps. II–III). Given a relation R between a and b, a regress arises when one asks what relates the relation to its relata, e.g., what relates a to R (and R to b), and one assumes as an answer that a further relation, say, R*, is needed to tie a and R, a bit like a string that ties two objects together that needs a further string to both of its ends to tie it to the objects. Since a need to explain the tie between a and R* arises by the same token, one needs to introduce yet another relation R**, and so forth. In a brief chapter (SI, 692–695), Cook Wilson argued that the first move here—supposing that R* is needed to tie a to R—is simply ‘unreal’, because there could not be a new relation that relates a relation to one of its terms. Thus, the regress would not be generated. One problem with Cook Wilson’s objections is that they admittedly aim at the regress concerning ‘external relations’ (SI, 692), but they are not fully developed against ‘internal relations’ that Bradley also entertains (Bradley 1897, 17–18). Cook Wilson may not have a full and appropriate answer to Bradley, but he thought he was thus free to entertain the relation of a subject to its attributes.

Although this is rarely noted, Cook Wilson is one of the forerunners of what we now call ‘trope theories’. What Edmund Husserl called ‘moments’ and later on G. F. Stout called ‘characters’ and D. C. Williams ‘tropes’, Cook Wilson called instead ‘particularization of the universal’ (SI, 336) or ‘particularized qualities’ (SI (713), Mulligan et al. (1984, 293 n.13)). Among his contemporaries, Cook Wilson’s ideas stand indeed closest to both Stout’s and Husserl’s. He seems not to have known about the latter, but one noticeable common feature concerns ‘dependence’ (Mulligan et al. 1984, 294). Cook Wilson suggested towards the end of his life that ‘things’ taken in themselves should be called ‘existences’ (SI, 713) and, keeping close to the language of Aristotle (τόδε τι, ‘a this’), he defined an ‘existence’ as ‘a this such and such’ (SI, 713). Starting with the subject-attribute distinction, in the case of an existence where the subject is said to be a ‘substance’, he argued that the “ordinary conception” of its ‘attribute-element’ is that it is “always a dependent reality” (SI, 157), with these “dependent existences” having in turn further existences dependent on them (SI, 153).

Under his conception ‘existences’ are, one might say, ‘bundles’ of particularized qualities. But he did not consider ‘substance’ as a sort of substrate in which universals are particularized, as many defenders of tropes do: the ‘thing’ is according to him a mere ‘unity’ of elements, “not something over and above them. which has them, but their unified existence” (SI, 155). He also expressed this by saying that the universal “covers the whole nature of the substance” (SI, 349), as “the particular does not have the universal in it and something also besides the universal to make it particular” (SI, 336, see also Joseph (1916a, 23)). It contains nothing besides the particularization of the universal: “the particular is not something that has the quality, it is the particularized quality. This animal is particularized animality” (SI, 713). Likewise, “the differentia cannot be separated from the genus as something added on to it” (SI, 359), the species are just the forms that the universal, as genus, takes (SI, 335). Stout, citing Cook Wilson with approval, put it thus: “square shape is not squareness plus shape; squareness itself is a special way of being a shape” (Stout 1930, 398). (The view harks back to Aristotle, Met. I 8 1058a21–26, see also on this point Joseph (1916a, 85–86), Wisdom (1934, 29), Prior (1949, 5–6) and Butcharov (1966, 147–153)).

Trope theories usually explain the fact that two things ‘share’, say, a particular shade of yellow with help of a resemblance class. Here, Cook Wilson parts company, claiming that the universal is “something identical in the particulars, which identity cannot be done away by substituting the term similar for same” (SI, 344 & 347). Although the universal is, according to Cook Wilson, nothing outside its particularizations, it is claimed to be a “unity and identity in particulars” or a “real unity in objects” (SI, 344). It is meant to possess an ‘intrinsic character’ (SI, 342n. & 351), for which Cook Wilson reluctantly introduced a technical term: “the characteristic being of the universal” (SI, 342). But he introduced no equivalent to Stout’s fundamentum relationis or ‘distributive unity of a class’ (Stout 1930, 388), because he did not define the universal in terms of membership of a class. Although he recognized that universals have an extension, i.e., the “total being of the universal” composed of the “whole of the particulars as the particularization of this unity”, he did not identify the universal with it (SI, 338).

For this reason and in virtue of the realist epistemology which he tied to this conception (immediately below), Cook Wilson is often read as having held a form of ‘immanent realism’, as opposed to the moderate forms of nominalism more typical of trope theories (Armstrong (1978, 85) or Moreland (2001, 165 n. 16)). One objection against this stance is that there is not much point having both universals and tropes. As David Armstrong put it, one of the two is bound to be redundant: “Either get rid of universals, embrace a trope version of Resemblance Nominalism or else cut out the middlemen, namely, the tropes” (Armstrong 1989, 17 & 132). This reading cannot be the last word, though, since Cook Wilson also appears only to have admitted one sort of entities, the tropes or ‘particularizations of the universal’. Thus, there seems to be a tension, at best unresolved, in Cook Wilson’s stance, which could explain why it has found few supporters, one exception being J. R. Jones (1949, 1950 & 1951).

Cook Wilson’s ‘particularizations of the universal’ are thus “strictly objective” and “not a mere thought of ours” (SI, 335–336); they thus cannot be phenomenal entities. His thinking here is of apiece with his anti-idealist views on ‘apprehension’. He had argued against T. H. Green’s neo-Kantian stance, that apprehension has no ‘synthetic’ character: any synthesis apprehended is attributed to the object and not the result of an activity of the ‘apprehending mind’. As he put it, “in the judgement of knowledge and the act of knowledge in general we do not combine our apprehensions, but apprehend a combination” (SI, 279), and it is “the nature of the elements themselves” which “determines which unity they have or can have”; the ‘apprehending mind’ has “no power whatever to make a complex idea out of simple ones” (SI, 524). This view implies that universals and connections between them, as particularized, are in rebus and to be apprehended as such (Price 1947, 336). The view is, therefore, that there is no possible apprehension of the universal except as particularized:

Just as the universal cannot be, except as particularized, so we cannot apprehend it except in the apprehension of a particular. (SI, 336)

Cook Wilson further reasoned that, when one states that ‘a is a triangle’, one is predicating of a the universal ‘triangularity’ and that, analogously, in stating that ‘triangularity is a universal’ one would then put the universal ‘triangularity’ in the subject position—the ‘nominative case to the verb’ as he quaintly puts it (SI, 349)—and treat it as if it were a particular, while putting ‘universal’ in the predicate position. But to talk about the universal in this way would require per impossibile that one apprehends the universal in abstraction from any of its particularizations. Cook Wilson held his conception as being, if not popular among philosophers, at least in accordance with ordinary language and common sense (SI, 344–345).

It is thus the particularization of a given ‘characteristic being’ which we are said to apprehend, but “neither as universal nor as particularized” (SI, 343). There is no suggestion in Cook Wilson’s writings of something akin to Husserl’s act of ‘categorial intuition’ or ‘ideational abstraction’, in virtue of which the universal would be “brought to consciousness and […] actual givenness” (Husserl 2001, 292). He believed instead that the ‘intrinsic character’ of any universal is inexplicable, because the relation between particular and universal, although fundamental and thus presupposed by any explanation (SI, 335 & 345), is sui generis, therefore not explainable in terms of something else:

I seem to have discovered that the true source of our metaphysical difficulties lies in the attempt, a mistaken attempt too frequent in philosophy, to explain the nature of the universal in terms of something other than itself. In fact the relation of the universal to the particular is something sui generis, presupposed in any explanation of anything. The nature of the universal therefore necessarily and perpetually eludes any attempt to explain itself. The recognition of this enable one to elucidate the whole puzzle of the Parmenides of Plato. (SI, 348, see also SI, 361)

Cook Wilson thus believed to have found an answer to the notorious set of regress arguments known as the ‘third man’ in Parm. 132a-143e. (Ryle argued later on that Cook Wilson’s answer would not do, developing his own regress argument against the notion of ‘being an instance of’, that Ryle read Cook Wilson as presupposing, while merely claiming that it is sui generis (Ryle 1971, vol. I, 9–10).)

8. Philosophy of Logic

Cook Wilson did not contribute to logic. His inclination was at any rate conservative. For example, there was for him no room even to try and make a case for an alternative logic, since he held the Aristotelian principles (the principle of syllogism, the law of excluded middle and the principle of contradiction) to be “those simple laws or forms of thoughts to which thought must conform to be thought at all. Thought therefore cannot throw any doubt on them without committing suicide” (ETA, 17 & SI, 626). Cook Wilson also rejected new developments in symbolic logic from Boole to Russell. He was not as such adverse to the “symbolization of forms of statements”: when criticizing Boole’s he alluded to “an improved calculus of [his] own” (SI, 638), which he called “fractional method” (SI, 662). But he did not publish it and all we have is the beginnings of an outline (SI, 192–210). His main objection to Boole—a common one at the time—was to the algebraist’s use of equations, perceived as an intrusion of mathematics in logic (SI, 635–636). (See the whole chapter (SI, 635–662).) And the little he knew of mathematical logic, Cook Wilson ferociously opposed. He did think of syllogistic as “a science in the same sense as pure mathematics” (SI, 437), but he was opposed to the very idea of logical foundations for mathematics because he believed that logical inferences are exhausted by syllogistic and, “mathematical inference as such is not syllogistic” (SI, xcvi). This is a misunderstanding, common at the time, of the expressive power of quantification theory as developed among others by Gottlob Frege and C. S. Peirce, of which he was clearly insufficiently cognizant, if not plainly ignorant.

Cook Wilson used his interpretation of Plato’s doctrine of Idea numbers as ἀσύμβλητοι ἀριθμοί as a basis for an attack on Russell and the logicist definition of numbers, Plato’s doctrine being understood (see section 2) as entailing that there cannot be a universal of the members of the ordered series of universals: 1-ness, 2-ness, 3-ness, etc. because they do not share an ‘intrinsic character’. Confusing this series with that of the natural numbers, he concluded that the logicist definition in terms of classes of classes, e.g., of the number 5 as the class of all classes equinumerous with a given quintuplet, is “a mere fantastic chimera” (SI, 352). In line with the argument about putting the universal ‘triangularity’ in the subject position (previous section), Cook Wilson reasoned for the case of natural numbers that there would be an alleged ‘universal of numberness’ and that this would lead straight to a contradiction: since all particulars of a universal are said to possess its quality, a group of 5 as a particular of ‘5-ness’ would thus possess the ‘universal of numberness’, thus contradicting his claim that a particular cannot be a universal (SI, 353).

By the same token, Cook Wilson thought that this line of reasoning shows that Russell’s paradox of the class of all classes that do not contain themselves (Russell 1903, chap. X) is a “mere fallacy of language” (SI, cx). He thus argued at length (SI, §§ 422–32), including in his correspondence with Bosanquet (SI, §§ 477–518) that there can no more be a ‘class of classes’ than ‘universalness’ could be a ‘universal of universals’ and that a class can no more be a member of itself than ‘universalness’ could be a particular of itself: the implied ‘universal of universals’ or ‘universalness’, of which universals would be the particulars, would be a particular of itself, which is, Cook Wilson claims, “obviously absurd” (SI, 350). For bad reasons such as these, Cook Wilson was contemptuous of what he called “the puerilities of certain paradoxical authors” (SI, 348). He even wrote to Bosanquet:

I am afraid I am obliged to think that a man is conceited as well as silly to think such puerilities are worthy to be put in print: and it’s simply exasperating to think that he finds a publisher (where was the publisher’s reader?), and that in this way such contemptible stuff can even find its way into examinations. (SI, 739)

The problem with Cook Wilson’s arguments is that they are based on an elementary confusion between membership of a class and inclusion of classes (see for example SI, cx & 733–734). Peter Geach called Cook Wilson “an execrably bad logician” (Geach 1978, 123) for committing blunders such as this. (Cook Wilson’s claim in a letter to Lewis Carroll that it is not possible to know that ‘Some S is P’ without knowing which S it is which is P is another such elementary blunder (Carroll 1977, 376).)

Fortunately, Cook Wilson made a more interesting contribution to philosophy of logic in his discussion of Lewis Carroll’s paradox of inference (Carroll 1895), of which he gave the following formulation:

… let the argument be A1 = B1, B1 = C1, therefore A1 = C1. The rule which has to be put as the major premiss is, things being equal to the same thing are equal to one another. Under this we subsume A1 and C1 are things equal to the same thing, and so draw the conclusion that they are equal to one another. This is syllogism I. Now syllogism I, which is of the form MP, SM, SP, in turn exemplifies another rule of inference which is the so-called dictum de omni et nullo. This must now appear as a major premiss. The resulting syllogism may be put variously; the following short form will serve. Every inference which obey the dictum is correct; the inference of syllogism I obeys the dictum; therefore it is correct. This is a new syllogism (II) which again has for rule of inference the same dictum; hence a new syllogism (III) and so on in saecula saeculorum. (SI, 444)

Leaving aside the incorrect identification of the inference rule as the dictum de omni, this is recognizably the infinite regress in Carroll’s paradox and, while Carroll did not provide one, Cook Wilson offered the following diagnosis:

… it is clearly a fallacy to represent the rule according to which the inference is to be drawn from premisses as one of the premisses themselves. We should anticipate that this must somehow produce an infinite regress. (SI, 443)

These passages cannot be precisely dated and his correspondence with Carroll for the relevant period is lost, so one cannot tell who framed the paradox first (Moktefi 2007, chap. V, sect. 3.1). They were both anticipated, however, by Bernard Bolzano, who already stated the paradox in his Wissenschaftslehre (1837) and provided a similar diagnosis (Bolzano 1972, § 199). (For a discussion, see Marion (2016).) Interestingly, Cook Wilson’s diagnosis is linked to his own views on the apprehension of universals via their particularizations (see the previous section):

A direct refutation may, however, be given as follows. In the above procedure the rule of inference is made a premiss and a particular inference is represented as deduced from it. But, as we have seen, that its an inversion of the true order of thought. The validity of the general rule of inference can only be apprehended in a particular inference. If we could not see the truth directly in the particular inference, we should never get the general rule at all. Thus it is impossible to deduce the particular inference from the general rule. (SI, 445)

In Lewis Carroll’s presentation of the paradox, the Tortoise refuses to infer the conclusion when faced with an instance of the rule of Modus Ponens and Achilles suggests that one should then add the rule as a further premise, but the Tortoise still refuses to infer, so that Achilles then suggest to add the whole formula resulting from adding the rule as a premise as yet a further premise to no avail, and so forth. It is often claimed that the Tortoise’s repeated refusals indicates that rules of inference are in themselves normatively inert, so that a further ingredient is needed for one to infer, e.g., a ‘‘rational insight’’ (Bonjour 1998, 106–107). Cook Wilson’s claim that one can only ‘apprehend’ the validity of the rule in a particular inference, thus ‘seeing the truth directly’ or possessing a ‘direct intuition’ (SI, 441), is an analogous move.

The idea that a rule of inference cannot be introduced as a premise in an inference in accordance with it, on pains of an infinite regress, was also reprised by Ryle (Ryle 1971, vol. II, 216 & 238). But he used it to argue for his celebrated distinction between ‘knowing how’ and ‘knowing that’: ‘‘Knowing a rule of inference is not possessing a bit of extra information. Knowing a rule is knowing how. It is realised in performances which conform to the rule, not in theoretical citations of it.’’ (Ryle 1971, vol. II, 217). However, if ‘knowing how’ is no longer a state of mind (even dispositionally), then the view is no longer Cook Wilson’s.

Cook Wilson believed that all statements are ‘categorical’, arguing away ‘hypothetical judgements’ with the claim that “in the hypothetical attitude”, we apprehend “a relation between two problems” (SI, 542–543 & Joseph (1916a, 185)). In other words, conditionals do not express judgements but connections between questions. This view was elaborated by Ryle into his controversial stance on indicative conditionals as ‘inference-tickets’ in ‘‘If’, ‘So’, and ‘Because’’ (Ryle 1971, vol. II, 234–249). Ryle compared conditionals of the form ‘If p, then q’, to “bills for statements that statements could fill” (Ryle 1971, vol. II, 240) and he rejected the form ‘If p then q, but p, therefore q’, claiming that in some way the p in the major premise cannot for that reason be the same as p asserted by itself. This, of course, runs afoul of Geach’s ‘Frege Point’ (Geach 1972).

9. Philosophy of Language

Cook Wilson also questioned superficial uniformity of the form ‘S is P’, calling the subject of attributes ‘metaphysical’ (SI, 158) in order to distinguish it from the subject of predication. He thus distinguished the ontological distinction between substance and attribute from the logical subject-predicate distinction. Using the traditional definition of the subject as ‘what supports the predicate’ and the predicate as ‘what is said concerning the subject’ (quoting Boethius, SI, 114–115), he noted that a ‘statement’ such as ‘That building is the Bodleian’ has different analyses, depending on the occasion in which it is used. If in answer to ‘What building is that?’, with the ‘stress accent’ on ‘the Bodleian’ as in ‘That building is the Bodleian’, the subject is ‘that building’ and the predicate as ‘what is said concerning the subject’ is ‘that that building is the Bodleian’ (SI, 117 & 158). But, if in answer to the question ‘Which building is the Bodleian?’ with the ‘stress accent’ now on ‘that’ as in ‘That building is the Bodleian’, then the Bodleian is the subject and the predicate is ‘that building pointed out was it’ (SI, 119). The same goes for ‘glass is elastic’, where elasticity is predicated of glass and ‘glass is elastic’, when it is stated in answer to someone looking for substances that are elastic. This shows that the relation of subject to predicate is somehow symmetric, but it is not the case, however, with the subject/attribute distinction because ‘‘The subject cannot be an attribute of one of its own attributes’’ (SI, 158). Cook Wilson also noted that ‘‘the stress accent is upon the part of the sentence which conveys the new information’’ (SI, 118), and he would thus say that the subject-predicate relation depends on the subjective order in which we apprehend them (SI, 139), while the relation between ‘subject’ and ‘attribute’ is objective in the sense that it is holding between a particular thing and a ‘particularized quality’, it is a ‘‘relation between realities without reference to our apprehension of them’’ (Robinson 1931, 103).

In ‘How to Talk’ (Austin 1979, 134–153), Austin further developed distinctions akin to Cook Wilson’s differentiation between the logical subject/predicate and metaphysical subject/attribute distinctions, and this differentiation was shared by P. F. Strawson (Strawson 1959, 144), who also believed in ‘particularized qualities’ (Strawson (1959, 168) & (1974, 131)). In a bid to avoid Bradley’s regress (Strawson 1959, 167), he introduced the idea of ‘non-relational ties’ between subject and attribute, leaving ‘relations’ for the link between logical subject and predicate. Some non-relational ties are thus said to hold between particulars and particulars: to the relation between Socrates and the universal ‘dying’ corresponds an ‘attributive tie’ between the particulars that are both Socrates and the event of his death. That such ‘ties’ are less obscure than ‘relations’ and that this maneuver actually succeeds in stopping the regress are further issues, but it is interesting to note that Strawson chose the name ‘attributive tie’ in honour of Cook Wilson (Strawson (1959, 168), see SI, 193).

Strawson also noted that Cook Wilson’s argument for differentiating between the logical subject/predicate and metaphysical subject/attribute distinctions involves an appeal to ‘‘pragmatic considerations’’ (Strawson 1957, 476). Cook Wilson’s claim that a sentence such as ‘glass is elastic’ may state something different depending on the occasion in which it is used also had an important continuation in J. L. Austin’s more general point that, although the meaning of words plays a role in determining truth-conditions, it is not an exhaustive one: it “does not fix for them a truth-condition” because that depends on how truth is to be decided on the occasion of their use (see Travis (1996, 451) and Kalderon & Travis (2013, 492 & 496)):

… the question of truth and falsehood does not turn only on what a sentence is, nor yet on what it means, but on, speaking very broadly, the circumstances in which it is uttered. (Austin 1962, 111)

This line of thought has been pursued further by Charles Travis under the name of ‘occasion-sensitivity’, i.e., ‘‘the fact that the same state of the world may require different answers on different occasions to the question of whether what was said in a given statement counts as true’’ (Travis (1981, 147), see also (1989, 255)), this being a recurring theme, see the papers collected in Part 1 of (Travis 2008)). Thus, Cook Wilson’s above examples, ‘That building is the Bodleian’ or ‘glass is elastic’, are genealogically related to what are commonly known as ‘Travis cases’, i.e., sentences used to make a true statement about an item in one occasion and a false one about the same item in another. (For examples of these, see Travis (1989, 18–19), (1997, 89), (2008, 26 & 111–112).)

R. G. Collingwood also took Cook Wilson as putting forth a slightly different thesis, namely that the meaning of a statement is determined by the question to which it is an answer (Collingwood 1938, 265 n.). He used this idea as the basis for his ‘logic of questions and answers’ (Collingwood 2013, chap. 5) and for his theory of presuppositions (Collingwood 1998, chaps. 3–4), this last being further developed by the French linguist Oswald Ducrot (1980, 42f.). Collingwood was reluctant, however, to recognize Cook Wilson as an inspiration, since he thought ill of the idea of ‘apprehensions’ as a non-derivative basis for knowledge and he believed instead that knowledge comes from asking questions first (Collingwood 2013, 25), and thus that knowledge depends on a ‘complex of questions and answers’ (Collingwood 2013, 37).

10. Moral Philosophy

Cook Wilson hardly wrote on topics outside the theory of knowledge and logic, but two remarks ought to be made concerning moral philosophy. First, the last piece included in Statement and Inference is composed of notes for an address to a discussion society in 1897, that was announced as ‘The Ontological Proof for God’s Existence’. In this text, which opens with a discussion of Hutcheson and Butler, Cook Wilson argued that in the case of “emotions as are proper to the moral consciousness”, such as the feeling of gratitude:

We cannot separate the judgement from the act as something in itself speculative and in itself without the emotion. We cannot judge here except emotionally. This is true also of all moral and aesthetic judgements. Reason in them can only manifest itself emotionally. (SI, 860)

He argued further, in what amounts to a form of moral realism, that there must be a real experience, i.e., in the case of gratitude, “Goodwill of a person, then, must here be a real experience” (SI, 861), and that the feeling of “reverence with its solemnity and awe” is in itself “not fear, love, admiration, respect, but something quite sui generis” (SI, 861). It is a feeling that, Cook Wilson argued, “seems directed to one spirit and one alone, and only possible for spirit conceived as God” (SI, 864). In other words, the existence of the feeling of reverence presupposes that God exists. Cook Wilson thus sketched within the span of a few pages a theory of emotions, which is echoed today in the moral realism that has been developed, possibly without knowledge of it, in the wake of David Wiggins’ ‘Truth, Invention and the Meaning of Life’ (Wiggins 1976) and a series of influential papers by John McDowell—now collected in McDowell (2001).

Cook Wilson’s ideas had a limited impact on Oxford theology. Acknowledging his debt, the theologian and philosopher C. C. J. Webb described religious experience as one that “cannot be adequately accounted for except as apprehension of a real object” (Webb 1945, 38), but he nevertheless chose to describe his standpoint as a form of ‘Platonic idealism’ (Webb 1945, 35). Cook Wilson’s realism also formed part of the philosophical background to C. S. Lewis’ “new look” in the 1920s, via E. F. Carritt’s teaching. In Surprised by Joy, Lewis also described awe as “a commerce with something which […] proclaims itself sheerly objective” (Lewis 1955, 221), but he quickly moved away from this position (see Lewis (1955, chaps. XIII–XIV) and McGrath (2014, chap. 2)).

Secondly, Prichard is also responsible for an extension of Cook Wilson’s conception of knowledge to moral philosophy, with his paper ‘Does Moral Philosophy Rest on a Mistake?’ (Prichard 1912), whose main argument is analogous to Cook Wilson’s argument for the impossibility of defining knowledge. In a nutshell, duty is sui generis and not definable in terms of anything else. The parallel is explicit in Prichard (1912, 21 & 35–36). That we ought to do certain things, we are told, arises “in our unreflective consciousness, being an activity of moral thinking occasioned by the various situations in which we find ourselves”, and the demand that it is proved that we ought to do these things is “illegitimate” (Prichard 1912, 36). In order to find out our duty, “the only remedy lies in actually getting into a situation which occasions the obligation” and “then letting our moral capacities of thinking do their work” (Prichard 1912, 37). This paper became so influential that Prichard was elected in 1928 to the White’s Chair of Moral Philosophy at Corpus Christi, although his primary domain of competence had been the theory of knowledge. His papers in moral philosophy were edited after his death as Prichard (1949, now 2002). Prichard stands at the origin of the school of ‘moral’ or ‘Oxford intuitionism’, of which another pupil of Cook Wilson, the Aristotle scholar W. D. Ross (Ross 1930, 1939) remains the foremost representative, along with H. W. B. Joseph, E. F. Carritt, and J. Laird. Some of the views they expressed have recently gained new currency within ‘moral particularism’, e.g., in the writings of Jonathan Dancy (Dancy 1993, 2004).

11. Legacy

The historical importance of Cook Wilson’s influence ought not to be underestimated. In his obituary, H. W. B. Joseph described him as being “by far the most influential philosophical teacher in Oxford”, adding that no one had held a place so important since T. H. Green (Joseph 1916b, 555). This should be compared with the claim that in the 1950s Wittgenstein was “the most powerful and pervasive influence” (Warnock 1958, 62). The ‘realist’ reaction against British Idealism at the turn of the 20th century was at any rate not confined to the well-known rebellion of G. E. Moore and Bertrand Russell at Cambridge. There were also ‘realisms’ sprouting in Manchester (with Robert Adamson and Samuel Alexander), and in Oxford too, where Thomas Case had already argued for realism in Physical Realism (Case 1888) (Marion 2002b), although it is clearly Cook Wilson’s influence that swayed Oxford away from idealism. Since he published so little, it is therefore mainly through teaching and personal contact that he made a significant impact on Oxford philosophy, not only through the peculiar tutorial style to which generations of ‘Greats’ students were subjected—as described in Walsh (2000) or Ackrill (1997, 2–5)—but also through meetings that he initiated, which were to become the ‘Philosophers’ Teas’ under Prichard’s tutelage, the ‘Wee Teas’ under Ryle’s and ‘Saturday Mornings’ under Austin’s.

His legacy can thus be plotted through successive generations of Oxford philosophers. E. F. Carritt, R. G. Collingwood (who reverted to a form of idealism later on), G. Dawes Hicks, H. W. B. Joseph, H. A. Prichard, W. D. Ross and C. C. J. Webb are among his better-known pupils at the turn of the century. After his death, his influence extended through the teaching of Carritt, Joseph and Prichard, and the posthumous volumes of Statement and Inference to the post-World War I generation of the 1920s, including Frank Hardie, W. C. Kneale, J. D. Mabbott, H. H. Price, R. Robinson and G. Ryle, and the early analytic philosophers of the 1930s, J. L. Austin, I. Berlin, J. O. Urmson, and H. L. A. Hart, in particular. For example, Isaiah Berlin’s described Hart as “an excellent solid Cook Wilsonian” in a letter to Price (Berlin 2004, 509), and admitted himself to have been at first an Oxford Realist (Jahanbegloo 1992, 153). (See Marion (2000, 490–508) for further details.) Thus, Oxford Realism first dislodged British Idealism from its position of prominence at Oxford and then transformed itself into ordinary language philosophy and, as pointed out in the previous section, moral intuitionism. In the post-World War II years, Cook Wilson’s name gradually faded away, however, while ‘ordinary language philosophy’, which owed a lot to his constant reliance on ordinary language against philosophical jargon, blossomed. It became one of the strands that go under the name of ‘analytic philosophy’, so Cook Wilson should perhaps be seen as one of its many ancestors.

The only Oxford philosopher of note who opposed the ‘realists’ before World War II was R. G. Collingwood, who died too soon in 1943. He felt increasingly alienated and ended up reduced to invective, describing their theory of knowledge as “based upon the grandest foundation a philosophy can have, namely human stupidity” (Collingwood 1998, 34) and their attitude towards moral philosophy as a “mental kind of decaudation” (Collingwood 2013, 50). Collingwood objected to Cook Wilson’s anti-idealist claim that ‘knowing makes no difference to the object known’, that in order to vindicate it one would need to compare the object as it is being known with the object independently of its being known, which is the same as knowing something unknown, a contradiction (Collingwood 2013, 44). But Collingwood’s argument did not rule out the possibility of coming to know an object, while knowing that it was not altered in the process. (For critical appraisals, see Donagan (1985, 285–289) Jacquette (2006) and Beaney (2013).) In another telling complaint, he criticized the Oxford Realists for being interested in assessing the truth or falsity of specific philosophical theses without paying attention to the fact that the meaning of the concepts involved may have evolved through history, and so there is simply no ‘eternal problem’ (Collingwood 2013, chap. 7). This points to a lack of historical sensitivity, which is indeed another feature of analytic philosophy that arguably originates in Cook Wilson.

There was another deleterious side to Cook Wilson’s influence in Oxford: his contempt for mathematical logic. It explains why one had to wait until the appointment of Hao Wang in the 1950s for modern formal logic first to be taught at Oxford. In the 1930s, H. H. Price was still teaching deductive logic from H. W. B. Joseph’s An Introduction to Logic (Joseph 1916a) and inductive logic from J. S. Mill’s System of Logic. This reactionary attitude towards modern logic and later objections to ‘ordinary language philosophy’ go a long way to explain why Cook Wilson’s reputation dropped significantly in the second half of last century. In the 1950s, Wilfrid Sellars was virtually alone in his praise:

I can say in all seriousness that twenty years ago I regarded Wilson’s Statement and Inference as the philosophical book of the century, and Prichard’s lectures on perception and on moral philosophy, which I attended with excitement, as veritable models of exposition and analysis. I may add that while my philosophical ideas have undergone considerable changes since 1935, I still think that some of the best philosophical thinking of the past hundred years was done by these two men. (Sellars 1957, 458).

As the tide of ‘ordinary language philosophy’ ebbed, Cook Wilson’s views on knowledge showed more resilience. In the 1960s, Phillips Griffiths’ anthology on Knowledge and Belief included excerpts from Cook Wilson (Phillips Griffiths 1967, 16–27) and John Passmore was able to write that “Cook Wilson’s logic may have had few imitators; but his soul goes marching on in Oxford theories of knowledge” (Passmore 1968, 257).

As shown in sections 5 and 6, Cook Wilson’s views on knowledge and perception are now once more involved in contemporary debates. They had remained influential all along, although his name was often not mentioned. His peculiar combination of the claims that knowledge is a factive state of mind and that it is undefinable, argued for anew by J. L. Austin, has been taken up and further developed by John McDowell (McDowell 1994, 1998), Charles Travis (Travis 1989, 2008), and Timothy Williamson (Williamson 2000, 2007), who is currently Wykeham Professor of Logic, New College. One has, therefore, what Charles Travis once described as “an Oxford tradition despite itself” (Travis (1989, xii), on this last point, see also Williamson (2007, 269–270n)).

During the twentieth century, secondary literature on Cook Wilson’s philosophy was not considerable, with a few papers of unequal value by Foster (1931), Furlong (1941), Lloyd Beck (1931) and Robinson (1928a, 1928b), along with a few studies on universals in the post-war years (see section 7), and only one valuable commentary, Richard Robinson’s The Province of Logic (Robinson 1931). Interest in the study of his philosophy was only revived at the beginning of this century, with Marion (2000) giving a first overview of Oxford Realism. In a short book, Kohne (2010) charts the views of Cook Wilson, Prichard and Austin on knowledge as a mental state. An important contribution, Kalderon & Travis (2013) secured Oxford Realism’s place in the history of analytic philosophy, comparing it with other forms of realism in Frege, Russell and Moore, while drawing links with later developments in the writings of J. L. Austin, J. M. Hinton and John McDowell. As a result of this revival of interest, the philosophies of J. L. Austin (Longworth 2018a, 2018b & 2019, and the entry to this Encyclopedia) and of Wilfrid Sellars (Brandhoff 2020) are now being re-interpreted in light of Cook Wilson’s legacy.


Primary Sources

Writings by Cook Wilson

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  • [ASV] ‘Aristotelian Studies I. On the Structure of the Seventh Book of the Nicomachean Ethics, ch. i–x, vom Verfasser’, Göttingische gelehrte Anzeige, April 14, 1880, pp. 449–474.
  • [IPT] On the Interpretation of Plato’s Timaeus. Critical Studies with Reference to a Recent Edition, Oxford, Clarendon Press, 1889.
  • [ETA] On an Evolutionist Theory of the Axioms, An Inaugural Lecture, Oxford, Clarendon Press, 1889.
  • [APT] ‘Apelt’s Pseudo-Aristotelian Treatises’, The Classical Review 6 (1892): pp. 16–19, 100–107, 156–162, 209–214, 441–446 & 7 (1893): 33–39.
  • [IP] ‘Inverse or “a posteriori” Probability’, Nature, December 13, 1900, pp. 154–6. Reproduced partly as (SI, §§ 325–327).
  • [PBT] ‘Probability—James Bernoulli’s Theorem’, Nature, March 14, 1901, pp. 465–6.
  • [GPP] ‘On the Geometrical Problem in Plato’s Meno, 86e sqq.: With a Note on a Passage in the Treatise De Lineis Insecabilibus’, The Journal of Philology, January 1, 1903, pp. 222–240
  • [OPD] ‘On the Platonist Doctrine of the ἀσύμβλητοι ἀριθμοί’, The Classical Review, 18 (1904): 247–60.
  • [TGF] On the Traversing of Geometrical Figures, Oxford, Clarendon Press, 1905.
  • [CLP] ‘Lewis Carroll’s Logical Paradox’, Mind, 14 (1905): 292–293. With correction, Mind, 14 (1905): 439.
  • [SI] Statement and Inference with other Philosophical Papers, 2 vols., Oxford, Clarendon Press, 1926; reprint: Bristol 2002.
  • [UL] Unpublished Lectures from 1913–1914 (Charlottesville VA, Intelex, 2005). Electronic edition in the Past Masters series available online.

For a complete list of Cook Wilson’s publications during his lifetime, see (SI, lxv–lxxii). Cook Wilson’s papers were deposited at the Bodleian Library, University of Oxford in 1970, ref. GB 161 MSS. Top. Oxon. c. 580–4, and a carbon copy of his lecture notes on Plato’s The Republic, that had been in possession of A. D. Woozley, was donated to the Houghton Library, Harvard University in 2008. Another such typescript was deposited among the papers of Percy William Dodd at Jesus College, Oxford (JC:F12/MS5/I).

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  • ––– (1932) Perception, London: Methuen, 2nd edition, 1950.
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  • ––– (1909), Kant’s Theory of Knowledge, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • ––– (1912), ‘Does Moral Philosophy Rest on a Mistake?’, Mind, 21: 21–37.
  • ––– (1915), ‘Mr. Bertrand Russell on Our Knowledge of the External World’, Mind, 24: 145–185.
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  • ––– (1928), ‘Mr. Bertrand Russell’s Outline of Philosophy’, Mind, 37: 265–282.
  • ––– (1949) Moral Obligation, W. D. Ross (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
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  • ––– (2002), Moral Writings, J. MacAdam (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
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  • ––– (1930), The Right and the Good, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
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  • ––– (1949), Aristotle’s Prior and Posterior Analytics. With Introduction and Commentary, 2 volumes, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Ryle, G., (1971) Collected Papers, 2 vols., London: Hutchinson. Reprint: Bristol, Thoemmes Press, 1990.
  • ––– (1990), ‘The Logical Atomism in Plato’s Theaetetus’, Phronesis, 35(1): 21–46.
  • ––– (1993) ‘Paper Read at the Oxford Philosophical Society 500th Meeting, 1968’, in Aspects of Mind, Oxford: Blackwell.
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  • ––– (1959), Individuals. An Essay in Descriptive Metaphysics, London: Methuen.
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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


Thanks to Guy Longworth, whose comments greatly improved this entry, along with Benoît Castelnérac, Maxime Deschênes, Cora Diamond, Pascal Engel, Mark Kalderon, Vincent Lizotte, Alessandro Moscarítolo, Colin Tyler and two anonymous referees.

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