Supplement to Actualism

Problems with the Actualist Accounts

Problems for New Actualism

New actualism is a powerful and elegant solution to the problem of possibilism. It appears to have all the theoretical power of possibilism without possibilism's commitment to mere possibilia; everything there is is actual. However, one might argue that it is no surprise that new actualism retains the theoretical power of possibilism, because new actualism is nothing more than thinly veiled possibilism: the new actualist's “actuality” is just the possibilist's being, and contingent nonconcreteness is nothing but the possibilist's mere possibility; nothing but terminology distinguishes a mere possibile from a possibly (but not actually) concrete individual.

Even if this is all there were to new actualism, it would not be insignificant. For, in that case, new actualism shows that the standard definition of actualism has not gotten to the heart of the matter — that actualism is not best characterized as the thesis that everything there is, in any sense, is actual. For new actualism demonstrates, at least, that there is a way of systematically reclothing possibilist statements in actualist guise.

This might prompt the “classical” actualist to try to get at the essence of her view in a slightly different way. The real target of the claim that everything is actual is the possibilist's division of being into two modes: actuality and mere possibility (i.e., contingent nonactuality). The new actualist certainly denies that division; there are indeed no mere possibilia for the new actualist, no objects that are, but which fail to be actual. However, the classical actualist would argue that the new actualist still violates the spirit of actualism. The new actualist does indeed maintain a single sense of being; but in place of the possibilist's division of being into two modes — actuality and contingent nonactuality — the new actualist substitutes a division of actuality into two modes: concreteness and contingent nonconcreteness. It is difficult not to see this as a mere relabeling of the possibilist's distinction. Most classical actualists will, therefore, regard new actualism as having the form of actualism without having the content necessary to serve as a genuine solution to the possibilist challenge.

For further debate on new actualism see Tomberlin [1996], the reply by Linsky and Zalta [1996], and Bennett 2006 and the reply by Nelson and Zalta [2009].

Problems for Individual Essences

Plantinga's account is not without its problems. We will raise three that have appeared in the literature. Plantinga has reasonable responses to the first two. The third seems to be the most problematic.

An Extravagant Ontology

The first, a perhaps least pressing, problem of Plantinga's account is its commitment to a rich universe of fine-grained properties, relations, states of affairs, etc. However, the epistemological problems of platonism in general notwithstanding, abstract entities are largely recognized as, if perhaps not indispensable, extremely useful theoretical constructs, and are ubiquitous in contemporary philosophy of language, logic, mathematics, and linguistics, and in artificial intelligence. Hence, Plantinga's project is in no deeper water in this regard than many other well-regarded projects. For all but the most stringent nominalists, then, the only objection can be that the ontology is too rich, too fine-grained. However, once abstract entities are admitted at all, such a charge will stick only if the entities in question are not doing any reasonable philosophical work, and that is not the case in Plantinga's account; for all its richness, the elements of its ontology and their nature seem quite carefully chosen to play their respective roles. Hence, the objection here seems to boil down simply to a difference of philosophical taste. And that is not a serious objection.

Uninterpretability of the Semantics

Plantinga and Jager purport to be providing a genuine semantics for quantified modal languages, an account of the meaning of modal assertions. There are two related, and more serious, objections to their project, however. (These objections are based in part upon Linsky and Zalta [1994].)

First, Plantinga's modal semantics does not square with our basic semantic intuitions. In particular, on Plantinga's semantics, names denote, and quantifiers range over, individual essences. Intuitively, however (and also according to the current dominant theories of reference), names do no such thing; names denote individuals: ‘Quine’ denotes Quine, not his individual essence. Indeed, in order to denote haecceities, we resort to grammatically more complex constructions like gerunds that contain names referring to individuals, e.g., ‘being Quine’. The term ‘Quine’ here must be taken to refer to Quine, not an individual essence, lest the term denote, not an individual essence of Quine, but an individual essence of an individual essence of Quine.

This last point illustrates the second and more difficult objection, namely, that Plantinga's semantics provides no way of interpreting the basic definitions and principles of the semantics itself. According to the semantics, quantifiers range over individual essences and atomic formulas express coexemplification. Yet the metalinguistic quantifiers in the definitions of ‘individual essence’ and ‘coexemplification’ must, on pain of circularity, be taken to range over individuals. Again, the crucial principle P4 of Plantinga's semantics says that, necessarily, every object has an individual essence. But clearly, the universal quantifier here cannot itself be interpreted as a quantifier over individual essences, lest P4 express only the trivial proposition that, in every world w, every individual essence that is exemplified in w is coexemplified with the property having an individual essence. So, while P4 is intended to guarantee that there are enough individual essences, intepreted according to Plantinga's own semantics P4 turns out to be true even if there are no individual essences at all.

There are moves that one can imagine Plantinga and Jager making in response to these difficulties. For instance, perhaps they could add a domain of actual individuals to the semantics to serve as the referents for names. Again, perhaps Plantinga intends the semantics not to capture the denotation relation but rather only the relation of expressing that he has argued holds between names and individual essences (cf. Plantinga [1974]). The point, however, is that, if the account of Plantinga and Jager is to be understood as a genuine semantic theory as they seem to purport, numerous difficulties must be addressed before the account can be considered viable. If their semantics is to be understood in some other way, its nature and purpose need significant clarification and, where appropriate, modification.

Conceptual Difficulties with Haecceitism

More pernicious difficulties surround the notion of an individual essence itself, and in particular the notion of a haecceity. To get at the chief problem, first, define a property or relation to be logically simple (simple, for short) if it is not itself a negation, conjunction, disjunction, quantification, modalization, etc. of any other properties or relations. (The idea here, of course, is that logically simple properties correspond to basic predicates in a language, and logically complex properties are analogous to complex sentences. It is a bit difficult in fact to find any uncontroversial examples of logically simple properties. Perhaps certain fundamental mental states like happiness or physical states like being a quark or having mass qualify. For purposes here, however, we needn’t delve deeper.) Next, say that a property P is general if it is possible both that (i) something x exemplify P and that (ii) possibly, something y distinct from x exemplify P. Intuitively, then, a property is general if it can be exemplified by more than one thing, albeit perhaps only at different times or in different possible worlds. The notion of generality can be extended to relations in an obvious way.

Now, haecceities are either simple or they are not. Both options are problematic. Plantinga refers to haecceities by means of two types of gerunds: grammatically simple gerunds like ‘being Quine’, and grammatically more complex gerunds like ‘being identical with Quine’. Those of the former sort suggest that haecceities are logically simple, the latter that they are logically complex. We consider them in turn.

If haecceities are logically complex, the central question is: In what does this logical complexity consist? An appealing and quite popular answer dating back to Russell is that logical complexity, at least in part, involves a certain type of metaphysical complexity: a logically complex property, proposition, or relation is literally constituted by less complex metaphysical parts. (See Frege [1980], p. 169.) So, for example, the property being human and over 6 feet tall is constituted by the properties being human and being over 6 feet tall. And, most relevantly, singular properties and relations like being a student of Quine that involve expressions for a relation and an individual are constituted by those very entities, in this case, in this case, the relation being a student of and Quine himself.

If this account is correct, then Quine is a literal metaphysical component of the haecceity being identical with Quine. If so, however, then it seems that haecceities are ontologically dependent on their instances; no haecceity exists uninstantiated. For Quine is the very component that distinguishes being identical with Quine from every other haecceity, and hence he appears to be essential to its identity. But if that is correct, then haecceities cannot play the role of possibilia, for possibilia are, in a certain sense, necessary beings. Though perhaps not actual in every world, nontheless, for the possibilist, necessarily, for every possibile x and every world w, there is such a thing as x at w. But if haecceities are ontologically dependent upon their instances, then there are no uninstantiated haecceities. In particular, then, there are no haecceities that could be instantiated by Aliens, since, by hypothesis, no actual individual is possibly an Alien. Hence, Plantinga's semantics for (1) do not work, as they depend upon the existence of an uninstantiated haecceity. Plantinga, of course, could (and, in fact, does) just resist the idea that Quine is a constituent of being identical with Quine. However, he identifies no other problems with this conception of logical complexity, and provides no alternative account. Hence, this response seems ad hoc.

A somewhat stronger move for Plantinga is to deny that haecceities are logically complex and take them instead to be logically simple, as suggested by grammatically simple gerunds like ‘being Quine’ that do not involve reference to identity or any other property or relation. Now, the fact that one still has to refer to Quine in order to refer to his haecceity might suggest that being Quine is no less ontologically dependent upon Quine than is being identical with Quine. The important difference in this case, however, is that there is no apparent logical complexity that needs explaining: being Quine — or perhaps better, quineity — as it happens, simply holds essentially and uniquely of Quine. True enough, we can only refer to Quine's haecceity by referring, at least obliquely, to Quine. However, all that follows from that is that if Quine hadn’t existed, it would not have been possible to refer to his haecceity, at least, not by means of a gerund involving a proper name of Quine. The haecceity itself is, arguably, no more ontologically dependent upon Quine than is the number 2. Hence, there is no reason to deny that logically simple haecceities, like other logically simple properties, are necessary beings, and hence no reason to think that they cannot play all of the metaphysical roles demanded of them in Plantinga's account.

The chief objection to this move now, however, is whether Plantinga has distinguished his own view sufficiently from possibilism. On his account, haecceities are logically simple but non-general properties. But this seems a very odd combination. Intuitively, at first blush anyway, properties and relations are common, general, repeatable characteristics of, or connections between, things — redness, wisdom, humanity, marriage, adjacency, etc. Recognition of shareability among many particulars, awareness of a one over many, is what gave rise to the concept of a property in the first place. In fact, of course, not all properties are general. But, intuitively again, non-generality comes about by virtue of logical complexity, by virtue of the manner in which the components of a complex property are “woven together” logically, e.g., being smaller than every other prime number, possibly being the father of Xantippe, or being identical with Quine. Hence, it follows from these intuitions that, necessarily, all logically simple properties are general. However, Plantinga flouts these intuitions in order to introduce an entirely new class of simple property whose sole function is to serve as an actualist counterpart to possibilia. But given their oddity, it is far from clear that there is any greater philosophical virtue in postulating logically simple but essentially non-general properties than in postulating that there are objects that are not actual. So whatever victory Plantinga can claim for actualism here seems Pyrrhic at best. (Some readers may be interested in the supplementary document Qualitative Essences and a Final Defense for Plantinga.)

Problems for Prior's Q

Since BF, NE, and CBF are no longer theorems, one might think that Prior had succeeded in finding the correct modal logic for actualism. However, few actualists have adopted this logic. There are a number of reasons for this. First, Prior never actually provided a formal semantics for Q. While the underlying ideas are evocative, indeed rather compelling, they are never formally developed. Consequently, there are no soundness and completeness theorems for the logic, which puts the defender of Q at a significant formal and philosophical disadvantage.

As for the logic itself, the interdefinability of possibility and necessity is widely considered both too intuitive and too elegant to abandon — it seems to capture something deep about the logical relationships among our modal beliefs. This raises strong concerns about the philosophical viability of Prior's account (though ones he admittedly attempts to address). Second, Prior's somewhat plausible explanations notwithstanding, it is undeniably awkward that ¬◇¬E!t is theorem of Q for any term t and hence that one cannot consistently assert in Q that it is impossible that a given contingent being fail to exist. As Deutsch observes, “... surely there is a sense in which ‘Prior exists’ might have been false; and there is no way to express this in Prior's system” ([1990], 92-93).

Third, a serious formal shortcoming in Prior's account is that there is simply no formal semantics. Prior justifies the axioms and rules of Q on purely intuitive grounds; he provides no real logic for which Q is a complete (or even incomplete) proof theory. Finally, perhaps the most awkward consequence of Prior's logic, however, is the fact that logical contradictions that aren’t necessarily statable turn out to be weakly possible! As note, in response to the previous problem, Prior would emphasize that the contingency of a contingent being a, i.e., the contingency of the proposition [E!a, is properly expressed by the fact that E!a is not necessarily true (since it is not necessarily statable). However, if that is what it is to say that a fact is contingent, then any literal contradiction involving a will be contingent! For example, the contradiction Pa & ¬Pa is not necessarily true, since neither is statable in a world where a doesn’t exist. So this contradiction, on Prior's telling, becomes contingent. Indeed, if we suppose that ¬□¬φ (using Prior's defined sense of □) defines a weak sense in which φ is possible, it turns out that both the intuitively contingent ¬E!a and the contradictory Pa & ¬Pa are possible in exactly this sense. As described elsewhere (Menzel [1991], 348), Prior's modal logic “cannot distinguish the expression of [a's] contingency from the possibility of manifest repugnancies”.

Problems for World Stories

Though promising and intuitive, Adams' account, like Plantinga's, suffers from some serious objections.

Loss of Compositionality

One of the traditional strengths of possible worlds semantics is that it provides a compositional semantics for modal notions. A virtue of the Plantinga/Jager approach is that it preserves compositionality. Haecceities, however, are the key to their approach. Adams’ account by contrast, with its rejection of haecceities, sacrifices compositionality. Notably, the semantics of (1) must stop at:

  • (1*) The proposition expressed by ‘∃xAx’ (i.e., There are Aliens) is true at some world story.

For, because there are in fact no Aliens, the proposition There are Aliens that is expressed by ‘∃xAx’ has no witnesses, no objects that, by virtue of their actual or possible properties, make it true. Hence, unlike compositional accounts, one cannot further analyze (1*).

The Iterated Modalities Objection

However, perhaps the sacrifice of compositionality is not too high a price for the strict actualist to pay. After all, we understand quantification well enough from standard, nonmodal Tarskian semantics. And given strict actualism, it is no surprise that (1*) should be unanalyzable, for there are no possible Aliens to serve as witnesses to (1*). The real goal of a semantics of modality is to provide a truth conditional analysis of our ordinary use of modal operators: specifically, to supply, for each sentence of our ordinary modal discourse, truth conditions expressible solely in terms of worlds and propositions in which no such modal operators occur. From that perspective, the unanalyzability of (1*) is unproblematic, as the important work has been done in analyzing the modal operator in (1).

However, at this point Adams falls victim to the iterated modalities objection. Recall the following proposition:

  • (7) Joseph Ratzinger could have had a son who could have become a priest

that is, formally,

  • (8) ◇∃x(Sxp & ◇Px).

On Adams’ semantics, (8) is true if and only if

  • (12) ‘∃x(Sxp & ◇Px)’ (i.e., the proposition Ratzinger has a son who could have become a priest that is expresses) is true at some world w.

The problem now is that, if we stop the analysis of (8) with (12), the semantic prize noted above — the analysis of our ordinary modal locutions in terms of possible worlds — is lost, as (12) contains an embedded modal operator that cannot be analyzed in terms of world stories. For to do so, unlike the case of (1*), one must produce a witness for ‘∃x(Sxp & ◇Px)’ about whom it is true at some world that he is a priest. That is, in order to analyze the embedded modal operator, (12) seems to require analysis along the following lines:

  • (13) For some some individual x, the proposition expressed by ‘Sxp & ◇Px’ (i.e., x is a son of Ratzinger and x could have become a priest) is true at some world w,

which then enables us to analyze the embedded modal operator:

  • (14) For some some individual x, the proposition expressed by ‘Sxp’ (i.e., x is a son of Ratzinger) is true at some possible world w and, for some possible world u, the proposition expressed by ‘Px’ (i.e., x is a priest) is true at u.

But by strict actualism, there is no such instance x, as the pope has no children and, assuming that one's actual parents are necessarily one's parents (provided one exists), nothing actual could have been the pope's child. Hence, given strict actualism, there is no information about any such x, no singular proposition that is directly about any such x. Hence, there is no proposition of the requisite form x is a son of Ratzinger specified in (14) to be true at some possible world, that is, to be a member of some world story. Granted, there could be such a proposition, but, given strict actualism, there isn’t in fact. Hence, Adams’ account fails to provide the sort of truth conditional analysis of our ordinary modal discourse that it purports to provide. Rather, at least some ordinary modal statements with iterated modal operators will not have truth conditions expressible solely in terms of worlds and propositions in which no such modal operators occur.

No Formal Semantics

Finally, while a fairly definite logic appears to emerge from Adams’ world story semantics, no genuine formal semantics is forthcoming; things are left at a purely intuitive, philosophical level. Notably, Adams provides no formal account of propositions and hence no formal understanding of worlds. Hence, Adam's account provides no formal semantics for defining of entailment, consistency, and the like, and no basis for proving the soundness and completeness of his logic. Consequently, regardless of the philosophical advantages Adams’ strict actualism has over Plantinga’ haecceitism, as it stands Adams’, unlike Plantinga's (as formalized by Jager [1982]), does not provide a viable formal alternative to SQML and the logic of Kripke's semantics.

Problems for Role Semantics

Intuitive Problems with De Re Modality

McMichael's semantics seems reasonably successful in coping with the problems facing the semantics of Plantinga and Adams. The account is actualist, but neither requires haecceities nor falls prey to the compositionality and iterated modalities objections. However, the success of the account comes at a fairly steep intuitive price, as it abandons strong intuitions about de re modality. McMichael would have us understand (9), the statement that Socrates could have been foolish, to be expressing a fact about a complex, abstract property, a role, that bears some sort of accessibility relation to another role that is exemplified by Socrates. actual role of Socrates. Similarly, (8) expresses a fact about a role accessible to the Pope's actual role. But one still wonders: what do such facts about roles and their accessibility to one another have to do with the properties Socrates could have had? What, in particular, is the connection between the accessibility of one role to another and the modal properties of individuals? What we’d like to say is that a role S is accessible to, say, Socrates’ actual role Rs just in case it is a role Socrates could have exemplified. But, in McMichael's semantics, to say that Socrates could have exemplified any given property P (a role in particular) is only to say that some role that includes P is accessible to Rs, and we are back where we started with no insight into the connection between accessibility and the modal properties of Socrates. On this score, both possibilism and haecceitism account far more satisfactorily for our modal intuitions.

No Proof Theory

A formal problem for McMichael's account is that, unlike Plantinga, Prior, the model-theoretic actualists, and (to a lesser extent) Adams, he provides no proof theory for his semantics, no set of logically true axioms which one could, ideally, prove to be sound and complete with respect to the semantics. This is a severe liability, as McMichael's account does not provide the actualist the means genuinely to do modal logic. This puts the account at a severe practical disadvantage compared to SQML and the other actualist accounts.

Problems for Model-Theoretic Actualism

Perhaps the central problem for the no-world account is that is abandons traditional ideas about truth and modality. The no-worlder counts his eschewal of worlds as a virtue. However, as Linsky and Zalta [1996] note, this is problematic for several reasons. For if we abandon possible worlds, we must also abandon the “seminal insight” that necessary truth is truth in all possible worlds. And this is problematic for several reasons, for it not only undermines the elegant, extensional characterization of the truth conditions of modal claims, but also dismisses the intuition so strongly evident in ordinary thinking about modality that there exist alternative ways the world might have been. For the no-worlder, however, there are no worlds, and hence no intended model whose indices are genuine possible worlds. There are instead only purely formal intended* models that possibly model the structure of modal reality. But, Linsky and Zalta ask,

… surely there is something more to modal truth than this; surely necessity and possibility are about something besides the structure of intended* models, something which grounds modal truth and which is modeled by an intended model. ([1994], 444)

But intended* models are not really models of anything. At best they have the property of being actual objects that possibly model the structure of modal reality. But a model of the pure structure of modal reality, the objection might continue, is not the same as a genuine model of modal reality. On the no-worlds approach,

...we cannot say that modal discourse is in part about the objects over which the quantifiers range, at least not in the same way that we can say that nonmodal language is about these objects. (Linsky and Zalta, [1994], 444)

And if not, it is hard to see in what sense the no-worlds approach accounts for modal truth at all.

Copyright © 2014 by
Christopher Menzel <>

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