Supplement to Actualism

Classical Possibilism and Lewisian Possibilism

David Lewis is often thought of as a typical, perhaps even the quintessential, possibilist. (See especially Lewis [1986].) In fact, however, Lewis’s possibilism is quite idiosyncratic. It is important, therefore, to contrast it with the “classical” variety of possibilism at issue in this article.

Classical possibilism is rooted in the idea that there is a significant ontological distinction to be drawn between being, on the one hand, and existence, or actuality, on the other. Being is the broader of the two notions, encompassing absolutely everything there is in any sense. For the classical possibilist, every existing thing is, but not everything there is exists. Things that do not exist but could have are known as (mere) possibilia. The being/existence distinction can be traced back at least to the Stoics[1]. It is also suggested by a number of medieval philosophers. Notably, Knuuttila [1993] sees adumbrations of the distinction in Scotus, and Prior [1957] (pp. 30-31) notes that it “seems to be presupposed in the medieval doctrine of ampliatio”.[2] The first clear, modern expression and defense of the distinction appears to be found in Bolzano (see Berg [1973] and Schnieder [2007]), but the best known exposition is found in Russell [1903], §427:

Being is that which belongs to every conceivable term, to every possible object of thought....“A is not” must always be either false or meaningless. For if A were nothing, it could not be said not to be....Numbers, the Homeric gods, relations, chimeras, and four-dimensional spaces all have being, for if they were not entities of a kind, we could make no propositions about them. Thus being is a general attribute of everything, and to mention anything is to show that it is. Existence, on the contrary, is the prerogative of some only amongst beings.

Russell is not explicit about what he means by ‘existence’ in this particular passage, but it is clear that what he has in mind is, not simply actuality, but concrete existence, existence in space-time.[3] Being, by contrast, encompasses not only concretely existing objects, but also abstract entities (which many contemporary philosophers consider to be actually existing entities) and fictional objects as well; indeed, for the young Russell, any logically coherent description — famously, for example, ‘the golden mountain’ — denotes an object that at least possess being, if not full-blown actuality.

Somewhat ironically, Russell's ontology in [1903] does not include possible objects, but this has nothing to do with the being/existence distinction, but rather with his own skepticism about the coherence of modal concepts.[4] What is important here, and distinctive of classical possibilism, is the idea that existence is an intrinsic, non-relational property that not all things have, a property that is “the prerogative of some only amongst beings.” What distinguishes classical possibilism in particular is the thesis that at least some nonactual objects, some of the objects that exemplify being only, are contingently nonactual; they fail in fact to be actual, but nonetheless could have been actual. There are, in fact, no actual golden mountains, for instance, but there are possible golden mountains, that is, things that, had they existed, would have been golden mountains. (Schnieder [2007] argues that Bolzano was a possibilist in exactly this sense.)

Lewis, following Quine [1948], rejects any distinction between being and existence and hence also the idea that there are things that do not exist (but could have). (He argues the point with particular cogency in Lewis [1990].) There is no special ontological property that separates merely possible objects from actual ones or, more specifically, merely possible worlds from the actual world. For Lewis, other possible worlds and their inhabitants exist in precisely the same sense, and no less robustly, than the actual world and its inhabitants. Because of this, Lewis cannot be considered a classical possibilist.

Lewis does, however, distinguish existence from actuality, and it is true that for him there exist things that fail to be actual. His explicit endorsement of this proposition is no doubt the central reason why he is considered to be a possibilist. However, this proposition, in Lewis’s mouth, does not express what it does for a classical possibilist. For Lewis, actuality is not an intrinsic property of things; rather, it is relational — one object is actual relative to another just in case they both occupy the same possible world. Semantically put, for Lewis, the predicate ‘actual’ is indexical, as when we talk about the present moment or a nearby store; it picks up its meaning, on a given occasion of utterance, from the spatio-temporal location of the speaker. Hence, the fact that there are things that fail to be actual, for Lewis, is no more ontologically significant than the fact that, say, there are things that fail to be within five meters of me. Nonactual objects are no different, ontologically, from actual objects; they are simply not here (in the broadest possible sense). (See Linsky and Zalta [1991] for related discussion.)

In sum, then, the distinction between being and existence is critical to classical possibilism. Lewis rejects this distinction and, therefore, he is not a classical possibilist.[5] Hence, because actualism in this article is contrasted entirely with classical possibilism, for purposes here, Lewis’s views — although of the highest importance for, especially, metaphysics and the semantical analysis of modal discourse — are simply not directly relevant.

Copyright © 2014 by
Christopher Menzel <>

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