The Concept of Evolution to 1872
[Editor's Note: The following revised entry has a new title. It was previously titled Evolution.]
“Evolution” in contemporary discussions denotes the theory of the change of organic species over time. Prior to the second half of the nineteenth century, the term was used primarily, if not exclusively, in an embryological sense to designate the development of the individual embryo. These same ambiguities of usage also surround the German term “Entwicklungsgeschichte” which originally was used in an embryological context. In 1852 the English philosopher Herbert Spencer (1820–1903) used the term to denote both cosmic and biological changes from “homogeneity” to “heterogeneity.” In the 1860s the term was used in some contexts to designate species change (Bowler 1975). Darwin himself did not use this term for his theory until the Descent of Man (1871). Since this article will survey the broad history of these theories through the publication of the Descent of Man, the term “transformism,” a term that came into common use in French biological sources around 1835, will generally be used in this article to designate the theory of species change prior to the shift in meaning in the 1860s. Since Darwin's work, the designator “evolution” has been typically, if not exclusively, linked with the theory of natural selection as the primary cause by which such species change has occurred over historical time.
This entry intends to give a broad historical review of the topic through the initial Darwinian phase of the“Darwinian Revolution”. Other entries in this encyclopedia referred to in the bibliography and within this article should be consulted for discussions beyond this point. The issues will be examined under the following headings:
- 1. Species Permanence and Change Before Darwin
- 2. Early Modern Foundations
- 3. Darwinian Evolution
- 3.1 Pre-Darwinian Transformism in Britain, 1830–1859
- 3.2 Darwinian Evolution
- 4. Summary and Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Scientific theories of species change in the nineteenth century, associated traditionally with the names of Jean-Baptiste Lamarck (1744–1829), Charles Darwin (1812–1882), and to a lesser degree, Alfred Russel Wallace (1823–1913), were the product of a complex historical development of theories about the nature of organic life, the classification of forms, the relation of time to the world order, and the relation of the natural world to theories of origin. These inquiries were initiated by natural philosophers in the middle of the seventeenth century. As a scientific research program with institutional foundations, however, the investigations of the transformation of species can be traced to the work of Enlightenment naturalists nearly a century before the publication of Darwin's Origin in 1859. It was particularly among French natural historians associated with the King's garden and natural history collection in Paris that these discussions took on a new form. Through the combination of theoretical reflection and institutional structure, these inquiries were given a precise development that they otherwise would not have attained. This explains, at least in part, why evolutionary theory emerged in the nineteenth century rather than in direct response to the transformations in natural philosophy of the seventeenth.
In many respects, the general idea of the possibility of species change is an old concept. The reflections of Empedocles (ca. 495–35 BCE) and the views of the Greek Atomists among the Presocratic nature philosophers formed a Classical heritage on which later speculations could be developed. These Presocratic speculations combined naturalistic myths of origins with the workings of chance-like processes to create a naturalistic account of the origins of existing forms of life (see the entry ancient atomism). Particularly as the Presocratic Atomist speculations were restated by the Roman poet Titus Lucretius (ca. 99–50 BCE) in book five of his On the Nature of Things (De Rerum natura ), a source was available for early modern naturalistic reflections on species origins following the recovery (1417) and printing (1473) of Lucretius's poem. In book five, Lucretius sets out a speculative account of the gradual origin of living beings from an initial atomic chaos through an undirected process that sorts out the best adapted forms and eliminates those not suited to their conditions.
Such speculative accounts were, however, opposed on several levels by the subsequent mainstream Platonic, Neo-Platonic, Aristotelian, and Stoic philosophical traditions. The writings of Plato (427–327 BCE), particularly his long creation myth, Timaeus, the one Platonic dialogue available continuously in the Latin Western tradition, provided an influential non-Biblical source for arguments against the Atomist tradition. This dialogue serves as the locus classicus for the notion of an externally-imposed origin of living beings through the action of an intelligent Craftsman (demiurgos) who created the cosmos and all living beings in accord with eternal archetypes or forms, realizing through this both aesthetic and rational ends. Plato's account initiated the long tradition of reflection that was continued in Neo-Platonism and in aspects of Stoicism to form the foundation of the argument that organic beings could not be explained by chance-like processes either in their origins or in their complex design. Particularly as developed in the influential writings of the Greek physician Claudius Galenus (129–200 CE), a long heritage in the life sciences relied upon anatomy as evidence of rational design. These interpretations of “teleological design” interacted in complex ways with Jewish, Christian, and Islamic Biblical concepts of creation (Sedley 2007). One common meaning of “teleology” commonly encountered in discussions of evolution since Darwin—that of externally imposed design by an intelligent agency (demiurge, nature, God) on pre-existing matter— originates in these ancient discussions and is not accurately identified with the Biblical concept of creatio ex nihilo (Carroll 2014 in Sloan et al. 2015).
In Aristotle's (384–322 BCE) seminal biological writings, the external teleology of a designer-creator was replaced by an internal teleological purposiveness associated with the immanent action of an internal cause—in living beings their informing soul (psuche)— which functioned as the formal, final and efficient cause of life (De anima II: 415b 10–30). Aristotle also did not endorse the concept of an historical origin of the world, affirming instead the eternity of the world order.
Concerning another issue that Aristotle treated extensively with relevance to the conception of species, embryogenesis, this also had important implications for later discussions. In the traditions indebted in some way to Aristotle's natural philosophy, sexual generation and the subsequent embryological development of the individual from primordial matter was a sequential process that occurred in time under the teleological action of the soul (psuche). In Aristotle's own account, this soul-as-form is typically derived from the male parent, but it could also be derived even from the sun, as employed in his explanation of the origin of spontaneously-generated forms (Generation of Animals III: 762a 20–35).
This theory of the passing on of soul-as-substantial form in generation also formed the basis of one meaning of “species” in Aristotle's biological works—as the individualized enmattered form-as-soul that is perpetuated in generation eternally. Although connected by a complex theory of mental abstraction to the universal in thought and language, a “ species” in this biological sense is not a universal, but a serial sequence of individual generating another individual eternally De anima II: 415b 1–10).
The implications of Aristotle's complex thought for subsequent discussions of species that followed on the recovery of his writings in the Latin West in the twelfth and thirteenth centuries were varied. On one hand, Aristotle's apparent metaphysical requirement that the soul-as-form (eidos) be permanent and enduring through the process of the generation of “ like by like” seemed for much of the tradition to amount to a denial of the possibility that natural species could change over time in their essential properties, even though local adaptation in “accidental” properties was fully possible. Since individual beings were dynamic composites of a material substrate and an immaterial and eternal form (eidos), the accidental differentiation of the substantial form in individuals did not affect the metaphysical endurance of the species. It also made species extinction metaphysically impossible. In living beings, the soul-as-form is serially passed on through time in the act of generation to create an eternal continuity of the form. This supplied a metaphysical foundation for the notion of species permanence without reliance on an external creative agency. Denials have, however, been made to the claim that Aristotle was such a strong “essentialist” in his biology, and the “essentialism story” that has been established by the writings of John Dewey, Ernst Mayr, and David Hull (Hull, 1965) has been challenged by recent historical scholarship (R. A. Richards, 2010; Wilkins, 2009; Oderberg 2007, chp. 9; Winsor (2006), Lennox 2001a, 2001b). One interpretive issue in the exegesis of Aristotle's conception of species concerns the degree to which he was committed to asserting more than the eternity of the three main groups—plants, animals and humans—rather than the eternity of each individual kind (De generatione animalium II. 731b 32–732a5).
As Aristotle's views were developed in the West following the textual recoveries of the late Middle Ages, these were received into a theological context that had been strongly defined by Augustinianism, and a complex interplay between this tradition and the new philosophical views that entered with the recovery of the Greek texts defined a complex period of intellectual ferment. The assimilation of many of the positions of Aristotle, rather than those of Christian Neo-Platonism and Augustinianism by major synthesizers such as Thomas Aquinas (1225–1274), involved new insights into the conception of the soul-body relation, the autonomy of the natural order and the role of secondary causes in the creation of the world. One issue that reverberates through the Scholastic discussions and also into the early modern period is Augustine's concept of a temporalized creation, developed in his work The Literal Interpretation of Genesis. This advocated an interpretation of divine creation through the formation at one moment in time of primordial seeds of each species (“rationes seminales”), rather than their creation fully formed (Augustine 1982, chp. 23, 175–76). This allowed Augustine to argue that species emerged sequentially in historical time rather than all at once. This thesis was also endorsed in substance by Thomas Aquinas in his major theological synthesis (Summa Theologiae). As he comments:“New species, if they appear, pre-exist in certain active powers” (Aquinas 1987, Pars I, Qu. 73, Rep Obj. 3). This could suggest a reading of Aristotle that assumed an essential fixity of each definable substantial form, and the eternity of each species since creation. But the force of this must be read in the context of Aquinas' complex theory of creation and the discussions of the problem of universals in late Scholastic philosophy (see the entry on medieval problem of universals, and Wilkins 2009, Ch. 3). This prevents any simple picture of Scholastic implications for these issues. It cannot be claimed that either Aristotle or later Scholastics such as Aquinas are responsible for the strong “essentialist” position often attributed to them in the literature (R. A. Richards 2010, chp.2). As developed below, it can be argued that the species concept was only “hardened” in the early modern period with the rise of the mechanical philosophy and preformationist embryology.
The re-introduction of Greek and Roman atomism in the Renaissance, with the recovery and printing of Lucretius' philosophical poem On the Nature of Things, introduced to a literate European audience a series of influential cosmological speculations that included a naturalistic account of the origin of species and the principles governing the natural world that contrasted markedly with the received Scholastic, Aristotelian, and Platonic traditions. These speculations, and those drawn from other atomist sources, were often in the background of novel early modern reflections on species origins and their possible transformation in time throughout the eighteenth century (Bowler 2003, chp. 2; Oldroyd 1996; Greene 1959). A new starting point in systematic reflections on relevant issues, showing both some similarity and also major differences from atomism, dates specifically from the synthesis of natural philosophy and metaphysics put forth by René Descartes (1596–1650) in his Principia philosophiae (1st ed. 1644). This developed and summarized issues developed in fuller detail in the Le Monde (The World, or Treatise on Light) published posthumously in 1664, with an improved edition appearing in 1677.
It is significant for the subsequent history of this question that these Cartesian speculations were introduced in the form of a counter-factual hypothesis that explicitly sought to avoid conflict with accepted religious doctrines of origin (Descartes 1983, 1647, 181). In this hypothetical account, Descartes derived the earth from a cooled star “formerly…like the Sun” (ibid.). By its gradual solidification in a great celestial vortex, the Earth took form. Subsequent drying and cracking formed the ocean basins, the continents and the mountain ranges.
An outstanding lacuna in Descartes's account was his failure to incorporate the origins of living beings into this naturalistic story of creation by natural laws. Although manuscripts display the degree to which Descartes attempted on several occasions to work out some linkage between his general natural philosophy and the embryological formation of living beings, this was not discussed in print during his lifetime. Both in the published Principles, as well as in the posthumously published Treatise on Man (1662, 1664) and the The World, Descartes skipped over the issue of a naturalistic account of either the mechanical formation of the individual embryo or the origin of species, and dealt with the issues of the living state simply by positing a hypothetical statue-machine created directly by divine action, and possessed immediately of all human functions and structures (Descartes 1983, 1647, 275–76; idem., 1972, 1664, 1–5).
Descartes's speculations conveyed to his successors at least two issues of relevance. First, by presenting this historical account as a counterfactual hypothesis, a means of understanding the history of nature that was adapted to the limitations of the human mind, rather than as a literally true account, Descartes provided the option of a purely fictionalist reading of historical science that persisted into the nineteenth century. Second, the integration of living beings into the new natural philosophy of mechanistic naturalism was left unresolved. If anything, it accentuated the problem of providing a naturalistic explanation of the origins of living beings.
Two traditions can be traced out in the wake of Descartes's reflections. Beginning with the De solido intra solidum naturaliter contento dissertationis prodromus of 1669 by the Danish Cartesian Nicholas Steno (1638–86), efforts commenced to draw the historical origins of living beings into the Cartesian cosmology, in this case primarily by granting that fossils were the remains of once existing organisms on an earth that had formed historically. There was, however, no effort made to account for the origins of these beings on Cartesian principles (Rudwick 1972).
A second tradition established a series of published reflections in the later seventeenth and early eighteenth centuries that came to be known generically as “theories of the earth” in subsequent literature. This tradition commenced with the Telluris theoria sacra, published in 1681 (English edition 1684) by the English clergyman, Thomas Burnet (1635–1715). Burnet sought to reconcile a Cartesian-derived historical account of the origins of the Earth with the creation account of the Mosaic tradition. In Burnet's account, the Earth began from an original chaos fashioned by divine action into the existing Earth through a series of changes that involved the gradual separation of the continents, the reversal of the poles, and the Mosaic flood. To explain the origin of living beings, Burnet relied on the “spontaneous fruitfulness of the ground” in the primeval Edenic world, rather than on the direct creation of forms through divine action (Burnet 1965,1691, 141). By connecting this account to the Biblical story of Genesis I, Burnet broke with Cartesian counterfactualism, offering for the first time a fully realistic interpretation of a Cartesian-style developmental history of nature that also included the origins of living forms.
The issues involved in the subsequent “theory of the earth” tradition, as they were amplified by such natural philosophers as John Ray (1627–1705), John Woodward (1665–1728), and William Whiston (1667–1752), failed to achieve a consensus position on the question of a naturalistic explanation of the origins of organisms (Rudwick 1972, 2005). The changing understanding of the embryological origin of the individual organism in the seventeenth-century provided a particular point of focus for novel theories, and the reflections on this issue form a critical point in the concept of species origins.
With the introduction of the theory of divine creation in Jewish, Christian and Islamic thought, a distinction had to be made between the first origin of species in historical time, and the normal generation of the individual. The origin of species was attributed to divine action, but its temporal emergence need not be instantaneous. Such a doctrine was the basis of Augustine's theory of the original creation of primordial seeds (rationes seminales) of each species at an original moment in time which then emerged in historical time as discussed in (1.2). This Augustinian view of the immediate creation of potential seeds of each species that simply unfolded or developed later in historical time was, however, in tension with the Aristotelian theory of the gradual development of the individual that could also be seen as an analogy of the species (Roger 1997a, 264–66). As many interpreted Augustine's arguments in the early-modern period, he was seen to provide support for the claim that both the species and the individual were products of direct divine creation.
In its seventeenth-century context, the issue of origins was also tied closely with the debates over the possibility of the spontaneous generation of forms (Roger 1997a, chp. 2). Thomas Burnet, for example, in his On the Increase of the Habitable Earth, seemed to imply that species could simply originate from unformed matter in the earth. The experimental refutations of such theories of spontaneous generation by life scientists such as Francesco Redi (1626–67), weakened, but did not destroy, the belief in spontaneous generation. Evidence for spontaneous generation could always be explained by appeal to Augustine's theory of the pre-existent “seminal reasons”.
Mechanistic accounts that attempted to explain either species or individual origins through an appeal to the properties of matter and the working of natural laws, as Descartes was attempting to do in his unpublished manuscripts, however, ran into severe conceptual and empirical difficulties. The empirical researches of William Harvey (1578–1657), published in his Observations on the Generation of Animals in 1651, claimed to refute on empirical grounds the theory of the male and female semen utilized in the posthumously (1677) published accounts of Descartes, and the earlier atomistic accounts of Pierre Gassendi (1592–1655) and Nathaniel Highmore (1613–85) (Fisher 2006 in Smith 2006). These empirical difficulties, along with the implausibility seen by contemporaries in these efforts at purely mechanical accounts of embryogenesis, suggested that universal mechanism could not deal with the question of embryological formation. “Mechanistic” epigenesis, as these theories might be termed, was for various reasons generally rejected in the latter seventeenth century. As we shall see below, however, such theories were to be revived in a modified form in the middle of the eighteenth century in a form that was closely tied to the origins of species transformism.
As a consequence of the failure of “mechanistic” epigenesis, post-Cartesian mechanists, particularly those on the Continent, who were concerned to bring organisms within the purview of the mechanical philosophy, opted instead for some version of a preformation theory of origins, or more accurately, a “pre-existence” theory of generation. On this view the new organism is not generated in secular time, but has pre-existed since the original creation of the world. This theory, often supported by appeals to Augustine's theory of the creation of original seeds, and buttressed with new empirical support from improved microscopes, was in some form to become the consensus view for nearly a century. First set forth by Dutch microscopist Jan Swammerdam (1637–80) in the late 1660s, and then given an influential philosophical statement by Oratorian priest Nicholas Malebranche (1638–1715) in his Recherche de la vérité of 1674, pre-existence theory was closely thereafter associated with the some form of the mechanical philosophy, and entered the medical textbooks as well as scientific treatises widely by the early eighteenth century. The question of both individual and species origin were by this theory removed to divine action at the first creation of the world (Roger 1997a, chp. 6).
At least three variants of the theory of pre-existence can be distinguished. Two of these assumed the pre-existence of forms in miniature, either encased in the ovaries of the female (Ovism), the original version, or after the discovery of spermatozoa in 1677, in the testes of the male (Vermism). These generally became the main options one finds expressed in the official medical and professional gynecological literature of the 1670–1740 period. A third alternative, having few followers in the seventeenth and early eighteenth century, but one that became particularly popular by the 1770s, was the theory of pre-formed “germs,” given its first clear statement by Claude Perrault (1608–80). This theory, closely resembling the Augustinian account (1.2 above), held that the first primordia of organisms were formed at the original creation as seeds dispersed in the soil, from which they were taken in with food. Under the proper conditions and within the correct organisms, these “germs” became implanted in the ovaries from which they then developed in response to fertilization. In all three accounts, the act of fertilization provided the occasion, and not the cause, of the development of organisms in time.
The theory of pre-existence was seen to solve many problems. First, it explained the intimate interrelation of structure and function that seemed to require the existence of parts of the organism in an integrated system. The heart presumably could not beat without ennervation, and the nerves could not exist without the heart. Consequently the entire organism must pre-exist, so the argument went. The existence of such integrated systems seemed otherwise difficult to explain by the sequential development of parts, as implied in Aristotelian and other “epigenetic” theories of development. Second, this account was easily harmonized with theological developments in the seventeenth century, particularly on the Continent with the growth of Calvinism (Protestant) and Jansenism (Catholic). In both of these traditions, Augustine's solution formed the basis for a “theistic” mechanism that emphasized God's omnipotence and the passivity of nature (Deason in Lindberg and Numbers, 1986; Roger 1997a, chp. 6). As a third strength of the theory, the pre-existence theory, at least in the versions that embraced the “germ” theory, allowed for the appearance of life in secular time, as seemed to be suggested by the existence of fossil forms. At the same time it did not imply any change of species or development of one species from another over history. Finally, some kind of preformation of the embryo could be reconciled with the best microscopic observations of the late seventeenth and early eighteenth centuries, as these were reported by such experts on this instrument as Anton van Leeuwenhoek (1632–1723), Jan Swammerdam, Marcello Malpighi (1628–94), and Henry Baker (1690–1774).
As embryological origin bears on the question of species transformism, the pre-existence theory effectively removed the organism from the effects of local circumstance and environmental conditions and placed the origin of species, as well as that of the individual, at a moment in the original creation. A quote from a contemporary source illustrates this point:
And indeed all the Laws of Motion which are as yet discovered, can give but a very lame account of the forming of a Plant or Animal. We see how wretchedly Des Cartes came off when he began to apply them to this subject; they are form'd by Laws yet unknown to Mankind, and it seems most probable that the Stamina of all the Plants and Animals that have ever been, or ever shall be in the World, have been formed ab Origine Mundi [from the foundation of the world] by the Almighty Creator within the first of each respective kind. (Garden 1691, 476–77)
The immediate consequence of this theory was a new rigidity given to the concept of species that it had not possessed in the Aristotelian and Scholastic traditions. Pre-existence theory reinforced a sharp distinction between “essential” and “accidental” properties to a degree not implied by the prior tradition. This theory made it difficult to explain obvious empirical phenomena, such as monstrosity, the regeneration of lost parts, the resemblances of offspring to both parents, evidence for geographical variation, racial differences, or even the existence of hybrid forms such as the mule. It seemed necessary to attribute these anomalies to divine action at an original creation. These difficulties in the theory resulted in a variety of criticisms that were eventually to lead to the downfall of preexistence theory in its original form, although the theory was to have a long subsequent history through a modification of the “germ” theory (Detlefsen 2006 in Smith 2006; Roger 1997a, chp. 7; Roe, 1981).
The dominance of some form of pre-existence theory of generation between roughly 1670 and the 1740s provides some explanation for the lack of efforts among natural philosophers to develop transformist theories of species origins in the same period. A notable exception to this claim was the Epicurean cosmology resembling some aspects of Lucretius' poem, developed by the French philosophe Benôit de Maillet (1656–1738) in his privately circulated manuscript Telliamed that was known in French circles for ten years before its publication in 1748. In this de Maillet offered bold speculations on how sea creatures developed into land forms over time. Nonetheless, the period before the middle of the eighteenth century was dominated by a theory of organic generation that effectively precluded the naturalistic development of species. The development of scientific transformism can be seen to be intimately tied to new theories of generation.
The first beginnings of these inquiries can be conveniently dated to the 1740s. In 1744 the Swedish naturalist, Carl von Linné (Linnaeus) (1707–1778) offered a speculative theory in his Oratio de telluris habitabilis incremento (Oration on the Increase of the Habitated World), in which he presented a narrative of a historical creation of the present world and its inhabitants by descent from a few original forms that had been created by divine action on a primeval equatorial island (R. A. Richards 2010, chp. 3; Wilkins 2009, chp. 4). In response to evidence for the sudden creation of new species that was drawn to Linnaeus's attention in 1744, he then developed a theory of how the original forms had likely hybridized to create new species in time. This Linnaean thesis of species origin by the hybridization of original forms was to have a long history, extending to the work of Gregor Mendel. The hybridization theory does not, however, imply a genuine historical change of species in response to external conditions in the way this developed in later transformism, and in some respects it was to form a source of opposition to Darwinian transformism.
The emergence of the first early modern systematic speculations on the changes of species in response to external changes of conditions was directly tied to the critiques of the pre-existence theory of generation. Beginning in the 1740s, efforts were made to replace the pre-existence theory with a reformulated version of “mechanistic” epigenetic embryology that had several resemblances to the discredited Cartesian and Atomist theories of the seventeenth century. Like these previous mechanistic theories of the previous century, the new reflections relied on the Galenic-Hippocratic theory of the “two semina,” rather than on Aristotle's form-matter theory. These equivalent male and female “seeds” combined in sexual generation to form the embryo. The new eighteenth-century versions supplemented these seventeenth-century accounts with a new role for organizing forces.
This effort was first given currency by the French natural philosopher Pierre de Maupertuis (1698–1759) in a popular series of treatises published between 1744 and 1751. To deal with the difficulty of explaining how atomistic seeds derived from the male and female could be formed into the complexity of the embryo without the intervention of an external organizing principle, or a simple unfolding of a preformed primordia, Maupertuis drew upon Newtonian attraction between corresponding particles as an explanatory principle. In his last formulations he relied on a theory that claimed the particles themselves were endowed with an internal principle that led them to arrange themselves to form specific parts of the fetus. With Maupertuis, we can distinguish a new version of mechanistic epigenesis that tied it to a theory of vital matter (Terrall 2002, chp. 7; Hoffheimer 1982). This was one of the first moves toward a theory of vital matter and vital forces that constituted a major intellectual break with the theory of universal mechanism in the eighteenth century (Reill 2005).
There are three ways in which this theoretical change in embryological theory instituted by Maupertuis bore on the transformation of species. First, this account allowed that the embryo actually comes to be de novo in historical time. Second, it involved a theory of material inheritance through the passing on of atomized material from one generation to the next. Third, the conservation of the identity of the species was only guaranteed by the transmission of this hereditary material unaltered. If this transmission was affected by external circumstances in any way, the possibility of significant change in the lineage of ancestor and descendant was not precluded. The embryo had been made subject to historical process. These options, opened up by Maupertuis's speculations, were then developed and elaborated within an institutional setting by his friend and intellectual collaborator, Georges-Louis LeClerc, comte de Buffon (1707–88).
As the head of the King's Garden and Natural History Cabinet in Paris for the last half-century of the Bourbon monarchy (1739–88), Buffon was institutionally situated to become one of the major theoreticians of the natural-historical sciences of his era, rivaled only by his contemporary Linnaeus, who had his own institutional base as Professor of Medicine and Rector of the University of Uppsala.
Buffon's concern with a broad set of fundamental theoretical questions warrants the special attention given here to his contribution in the history of evolutionary theory. These included (1) his analysis and proposed solution to the problem of animal and plant generation; (2) his reformulation of the “theory of the earth”; (3) his bio-geographical approach to the issues of animal distribution and variation; and (4) his methodological revolution in the epistemology of the natural-historical sciences. Through this combination, Buffon was able to set up a series of theoretical questions that were developed by a group of important successors associated with the Paris Museum into the nineteenth century. The wide popularity of his writings also encouraged speculations by others outside France, particularly in the Germanies. In this way he was the key figure in the pre-Darwinian period to open up the issues that were explored further in the early nineteenth century with reference to the origin and changes of organic species. The controversy generated by his rivalry with Linnaeus helped to create a fertile intellectual framework that encouraged new syntheses of issues by nineteenth-century naturalists.
Buffon's major work, the Histoire naturelle, générale et particulière, avec la description du cabinet du roi (1749–89), with the first series (1749–67) written in collaboration with the comparative anatomist Marie-Louis Daubenton (1716–1800), dealt not only with the material suggested by its title, but also with issues in the foundational epistemology and methodology of the natural-historical sciences. The Natural History offered to a wide readership a new vision of inquiry into plants, animals and the “theory of the earth” that assisted in re-orienting investigations into the natural-historical sciences after this point. Originally intended as a survey of the entire range of animals, plants and minerals, in actual realization his Natural History dealt only with the natural history of the primary quadrupeds in the first fourteen volumes (1749–67). The natural history of the birds was treated in a second series of nine volumes (1770–83). A series of seven volumes of supplements offered additional reflections on issues related to the quadrupeds. An additional five volumes (1783–88) dealt with issues of mineralogy, chemistry and historical cosmology, with the fifth volume (1788) subsequently published separately in 1789 as Des Époques de la nature. The latter work offered a grand synthesis of historical cosmology, the history of the earth, and the history of life that was influential on several subsequent syntheses. Continuations of these inquiries after his death were made by his understudy Bernard de Lacépède (1756–1825), who extended Buffon's general approach to the reptiles (1788–89), fishes (1798–1803) and cetaceans (1804). The “age of Buffon” became a defining era in natural history and established the King's garden and its Revolutionary successor, the Muséum national d'histoire naturelle, as the foremost institutional center of natural-historical inquiry through the nineteenth century (Spary 2000, chp. 1; Corsi 1988, 2001).
As a natural philosopher of major proportions, Buffon explored foundational methodological and philosophical questions of the Enlightenment along with his analysis of empirical questions, Buffon has been seen as deeply innovative in the unusual way in which he sought to validate the inquiry into natural history in relation to a naturalized epistemology that scholars have seen as novel for its time (Hoquet 2005; Sloan 2006b; Roger 1997a, chp. 9; Roger 1997b, chp. 6). In this methodological revolution, Buffon claimed to develop an epistemic warrant for a form of empirical certitude—“physical truth” [verité physique]—attained through inquiries into the concrete relations of beings in their material relations. This he opposed to the “abstractions” of mathematical physics, and he denied its claim to be the route to certitude in the sciences. Developed in a long “Discourse on Method” that opened his Natural History, Buffon argued that a science which is based upon repeated observation of concrete material relations of bodies can achieve a degree of epistemic certitude that surpasses that available from a mathematical analysis of nature (Hoquet 2005; Grene and Depew 2004; Roger 1997b, chp. 6; Sloan 2006b). From the basis of this novel epistemological framework, grounded on the search for “physical” truth, Buffon reoriented natural history away from a primarily classificatory project to one which sought to analyze organisms in relation to their conditions of existence, to biogeography, and in his later work, to cosmology and historical geology.
In addressing the history of the earth, Buffon also broke with the “counter-factual” tradition of Descartes, and presented a secular and realist account of the origins of the earth and its life forms. Buffon's new style of natural-historical inquiry also disconnected it from its long association with providential design-contrivance natural theology developed particularly by British natural historians after John Ray (1627–1705). This was another feature differentiating his style of natural history from that of Linnaeus. If he was not alone responsible for “bursting the limits of time,” he was one of the major figures in the “time revolution” of the latter eighteenth century (Rudwick 2005).
Even though all these points were made in fragmentary form, and often without satisfactory development from a general philosophical point of view, their presentation in Buffon's widely influential work profoundly affected the subsequent tradition of natural history.
Buffon was also able to give these inquiries a concrete institutional basis. As the autocratic director of the Paris Jardin du Roi, with its attendant large Cabinet of specimens from all over the world, he transformed the Jardin into a center of research into comparative anatomy, chemistry, mineralogy, botany, and biogeographical study (Spary 2000). By providing an institutional setting for these inquiries, the speculations and theoretical reflections of eighteenth-century natural historians could be subjected to organized critique and specialized examination in a context not found elsewhere in the natural-historical sciences of the period. Buffon's theoretical vision provided a concrete framework against which those immediately associated with the Jardin could develop further reflections on such issues as the nature and duration of species, the significance of comparative anatomical studies, the historical relationships of forms, and the systematic relations of living beings to one another.
The concrete manifestation of Buffon's combination of novel methodology and empirical inquiry is displayed by his treatment of embryological generation in the second volume of his Natural History. These principles underlie his unusual analysis of the meaning of “species” in natural history. In both instances, the notion of epistemic certainty gained from a “constant recurrence” of events seems to have played a fundamental role in his reflections. Following the lead of his friend Maupertuis, Buffon revived the classical theory of the two seeds to explain animal generation, deriving the origin of the embryo from the mechanical mixture of these ingredients. Amplifying upon Maupertuis's prior speculations, he explained the organization of the particles of these two seeds into a structured whole through microforces closely identified with Newtonian attractive forces that formed an organizing force-field, an “internal mould,” that assimilated matter in the proper order for embryological development. Viewed in longer historical perspective, Buffon's theory of the internal mould functioned in a way similar to Aristotle's notion of an immanent substantial form, and was likely influenced by Aristotle's discussions. It serves as an immanent principle of organization that acts in company with matter to form the unified organism. The internal mould also guaranteed the perpetuation of like by like over time. Unlike Aristotle's substantial form, however, Buffon's internal mould is passive and without an internal finality in its action. It is also not a principle of vitalization.
For this reason, Buffon was conceptually required to attribute some new powers to matter to account for vital action. In pursuing this option, Buffon broke with universal mechanism and the assumption of the passivity of matter that was a component part of the mechanical philosophy. Like Maupertuis before him, Buffon did not assume that an inert and common matter was sufficient for a plausible formulation of a theory of mechanical epigenesis. Vital properties therefore had to be attributed to a specific kind of matter confined to living beings, the organic molecules. These possessed inherent dynamic properties. This introduction of the concept of “vital” matter by Buffon, even with these restrictions on its actions, represents an important development in the history of the life sciences of this period. It broke with the uniformity of matter assumed by the Newtonian, Gassendist, and Cartesian traditions, and in a limited way it positioned Buffon at the opening of the “vitalist” revolution that was to open the door to genuine species transformism, even though Buffon himself never moved into this new domain (Reill 2005, chp. 1). It is a claim of this article that this vitalization of matter was central to the emergence of genuine species transformism.
In his original formulations, Buffon conceptualized these internal moulds and organic molecules to originate from divine creation. As the Natural History progressed, however, Buffon increasingly viewed the organic molecules as formed from an original “brute” matter, and the internal moulds themselves were seen to arise spontaneously, obtaining their specificity of action purely from the differential forces of attraction between different shapes of organic particles (Buffon 1765 in Piveteau 1954, 38–41).
It was following upon his proposed solution to the issue of organic generation that Buffon then addressed the issue of organic species and their permanence. In the fourth volume of the Natural History (1753) devoted to the large domestic quadrupeds, Buffon first raised the option of species transformism, only to reject it. In the article devoted to the domestic donkey, Buffon drew attention to the close similarity revealed between the horse and the ass, revealed by his collaborator Daubenton's anatomical descriptions. This similarity strongly suggested an underlying unity of plan of all the quadrupeds. Buffon explicitly raised the possibility that all quadrupeds might have been derived from a single stem (souche) which “in the succession of time, has produced, by perfection and degeneration, all the other animals” (Buffon 1753 in Piveteau 1954, 355). In a move that has confused commentators every since, Buffon then rejected this possibility.
The explanation of Buffon's 1753 rejection of transformism has taken many forms, most of these referring back to an early article by A. O. Lovejoy in which he is seen to have undergone a radical change of mind from a “nominalist” to a “realist” position (Lovejoy 1911. See Bowler 2003, chp. 3). Arguments have been made, however, that both his initial rejection of transformism, and his subsequent developments toward the concept of historical species change reflect coherent and consistent developments of his concept of “physical truth” (Sloan 2006b; 1987). Similar to Aristotle's concept of the substantial form—the metaphysical foundation for the essential identity of offspring and parent through sexual generation— Buffon's internal mould functioned in a similar way. The species is maintained in time and given its ontological reality by the passing on in a repeating material series an immanent formal principle.
But this implied for Buffon a significant redefinition of the concept of an organic species. This redefinition has affected the tradition of natural history and biology since the 1750s (Sloan 2012, 2009 in Ruse and Richards 2009; Gayon 1996). Explicitly denying the long-accepted meaning of ‘species’ as a universal or, in modern parlance, a class concept, constituted by a set of individuals on the basis of possession of explicit defining properties, Buffon defined a species in natural history solely as the historical succession of ancestor and descendant linked by material connection through generation. Such a species is “ … neither the number nor the collection of similar individuals which forms the species; it is the constant succession and uninterrupted renewal of these individuals which constitutes it” (Buffon 1753 in Piveteau 1954, 355). The empirical sign of this essential unity of the species over time is the ability to interbreed and produce fertile offspring, a criterion that takes precedence over similarities of anatomy or habits of life. The horse and ass must be two different species because they cannot interbreed and produce fertile offspring, whatever may be their anatomical resemblances. The dogs, on the other hand, must, in spite of great morphological differences between breeds, constitute one species because of their interfertility.
In setting forth this new meaning of ‘species’ in natural history, and distinguishing it from the traditional connotation as a logical universal— the concept maintained by such contemporaries as Linnaeus—, Buffon was doing more than distinguishing the “category” from the “taxon” as these terms have come to be understood in contemporary philosophy of biology. In an important sense, Buffon introduced an opposition between these two meanings, granting “reality” to the species conceived as a material succession spread out in time, and allowing only “abstractness” or “artificiality” to the species conceived as a class concept or universal in the logical sense. This opposition of concepts introduced by Buffon has been seen by some commentators as a fundamental confusion introduced into the conception of “species” in subsequent discussions in the biological literature, and that this has been one of the underlying causes of so-called “species problem.” These issues in their historical extension continue to generate contemporary disputes that oppose “species as sets” to “species as spatio-temporal individuals” (Dupré 1993; Ereshefsky “Species” this encyclopedia, 1992; Ghiselin 1997; Hull 1989, 1999; R. A. Richards 2010; Sloan 2012; Stamos 2003; Wheeler and Meier, 1999; Wilkins 2009; Wilson 1999).
The subsequent developments in Buffon's thought toward what an older tradition of scholarship mistakenly interpreted to be evolutionism, involved the gradual broadening of his natural-historical or “physical” species to include wider and wider degrees of material relationship. This expansion of his original concept Buffon expressed in the language of a “degeneration” of forms in time in response to environmental conditions. The encounter with a wide body of new data from the colonies and exploratory voyages returned to Paris during the course of the writing of the Natural History impressed Buffon with the degree to which species seemed to be affected by external circumstances such that from a single source numerous “degenerations,” could arise in some groups. This created the conceptual basis of his concept of race as distinguished from a Linnean Variety. A “race” in the Buffonian sense was a historical degeneration from a common ancestry that could result in degenerations in animal and even in the human species, leading to significant and valuational differences (Sloan 1995). Developed in main detail in his long article, “On the Degeneration of Animals” in volume XIV (1766) of the Natural History, Buffon's theory of the degeneration of species lumped the quadrupeds of both the Old and New worlds into a limited number of primary “families” (familles) and “genera” (genres) which had degenerated in time in response to migration from common points of origin to new locales. To explain these changes, Buffon appealed to slight alterations in the organic molecules in response to environmental conditions that could in turn affect the internal moulds.
Buffon subsequently made some steps toward combining the thesis of the historical degeneration of species with his theory of historical cosmology in The Epochs of Nature, published as a supplement to the Natural History in 1788–1789. In this treatise he reworked his earlier speculations on the “theory of the earth,” first set out in 1749, adding to this a historical chronology of the age of the earth determined experimentally in the 1770s by quantitative studies on cooling spheres of metal. In this imaginative synthesis, Buffon combined a history of the Earth with a historical sequence of the emergence of living forms (Buffon 1988, 1789). In this he expanded the time scale considerably beyond the accepted “Mosaic” chronology of less than 10,000 years from the beginning of the world to the present, to an estimate of approximately 75,000 years in the published version, and over two million years in his draft manuscript. In this treatise Buffon offered a naturalistic solution to the two inherited Cartesian dilemmas. First, his schema was offered as a realistic account. The Cartesian language of counterfactualism has disappeared. Second, he integrated the history of living forms into this naturalistic history of the world. Further naturalizing his theory of the internal moulds and organic molecules, both were now seen to arise by natural laws from the natural attraction of different shapes of matter and from the changes in matter as the earth cooled from its origin in matter cast off by the sun. Animals first originated by the spontaneous clumping together of these organic molecules on the cooling earth (Buffon 1988, 1789, époque 5).
The Epochs also offered a schema for a historical sequence of forms, beginning with marine life and plants and eventually resulting in present forms. This naturalistic account even verged on incorporating the origin of human beings, although this issue is left vague. Humankind appears, without explanation in the text, in a non-paradisal state in the northern latitudes of Eurasia, surrounded by ferocious animals, earthquakes and floods, and in a primitive social condition that required collaboration for survival. Buffon's liberal use of a form of spontaneous generation that allowed for the origin of even major animal groups from the clumping together of organic molecules as the earth cooled, rendered the actual derivation of forms from previous forms unnecessary. In several respects, the development of genuine transformist theories by Buffon's successors required a much more restricted use of the possibility of spontaneous generation.
The reception of Buffon's Epochs was uneven (Roger “Introduction” in Buffon 1988, cxxiv). The work was never translated into English and it seems to have played an insignificant role in anglophone discussions, in contrast, for example, to the major impact of the works of Linnaeus, which received a wide British exposition and translation. The boldly speculative character of the Epochs was also at odds with the new professionalized inquiries into geology and natural history undertaken by a younger generation of naturalists who may have adopted Buffon's naturalism and extension of geochronology, but not his grand rhetorical style (Rudwick 2005, chp. 3).
On the other hand, the Epochs had an important history in the Germanies. The treatise was quickly translated into German and it seems to have played an important role in the development of German historicism (Reill 1992 in Gayon et al, 1992). Although linkages are unclear, the importance of Buffon's work for the development of progressive, rather than degenerative, theories of historical transformism sketched out by Johann Gottfried Herder (1744–1803) in the first volume of his Ideen zur Philosophie der Geschichte der Menschheit (1784–91) is suggested by several lines of evidence. Through Herder's impact on the subsequent development of German Naturphilosophie and Romanticism, a general historical “development” of species from simple beginnings to more complex forms in company with a development of the history of the world was introduced broadly into German reflections of the early nineteenth century (R. J. Richards 2002, chps. 2, 3, 8). For Immanuel Kant, the Epochs formed the foremost example of a genetic history of nature (Naturgeschichte), as opposed to a Linnean description of nature (Naturbeschreibung). This set up within the German tradition an opposition between two alternative projects in natural history that persisted into the nineteenth century (Sloan 2006a; Wilson 2006 in Smith 2006).
Several individuals at the Paris Muséum national d'histoire naturelle—the restructured post-Revolutionary successor to the Jardin du Roi—pursued aspects of Buffon's project in the decades following his death, a list that included his former collaborator Marie-Louis Daubenton and his immediate understudy Bernard de Lacépède (1756–1825) (Corsi, 1988, chp. 1). Subsequent reflections drew most inspiration from the theoretical developments by Buffon's one-time understudy and the occupant of the new chair of invertebrates (Vers) from 1794–1829, Jean Baptiste Pierre Antoine de Monet, Chevalier de Lamarck (1744–1829).
Lamarck developed the theory of species change over time to the point that it introduced a new term—transformisme—to describe the theory of species change into the scientific literature. Formulated within the most prominent institution dedicated to natural history, Lamarck's theoretical views also had the necessary material conditions for their elaboration in relation to extensive museum collections of materials. Expounded through his annual lectures and writings within this environment, his theories could be tested, debated, and developed by others against the background of collections, museum displays, and other lectures taking place at the Paris Muséum.
Lamarck's theory of species transformism emerged gradually in his annual Muséum lectures on the “animals without backbones” that commenced in 1794. As the new occupant of the Chair dedicated to the invertebrates, Lamarck undertook in 1794 a massive reorganization of the Muséum collections of these animals. Adopting from his earlier method of arrangement of the plant groups in his work on French botany (1778) in which he had ordered groups serially from most complex to most simple, Lamarck adopted a similar method for the invertebrate groups. These taxonomic rearrangements took place before Lamarck made any public declaration of his views on species transformism. This linear rearrangement of the invertebrates provided him with an empirical base from which his transformist theory was then developed (Burkhardt 1977).
In view of the many interpretations of Lamarck's views since 1809, the primary features of Lamarck's theory need to be carefully detailed. In most fundamental terms, his theory of species change was tied to his reversal of the taxonomic ordering of forms originally presented in his early systematic arrangements. In his first arrangements, these were ordered as a series of animal groups arranged in a simple linear series that began with the most complex forms (cephalopods) and terminated in the least organized (infusorians). By 1800, Lamarck decided that this ordering was artificial, and that the “natural” arrangement was from simple to complex. The evolutionary theory he developed involved the claim that this new order of arrangement was also the sequence in which forms had been historically generated one from another over time.
These themes were first presented in the Muséum lectures of 1800, and then were developed in more detail in his Recherches sur l'organisation des corps organisés (1802), with the full exposition in the Philosophie zoologique (1994, 1809). Some further significant elaborations of his ideas were then expressed in his many articles for the second edition of Joseph Virey's Nouveau dictionnaire d'histoire naturelle (1817–19) (Roger and Laurent 1991), and in the long introductory discourse to his major work of taxonomic revision of the invertebrates, the Histoire naturelle des animaux sans vertèbres (1815–22). The following claims formed the core of his theory:
- The origin of living beings is initially through spontaneous generation. This action is confined, however, to the origins of the most structurally-simple forms of life—infusoria. All subsequent forms necessarily have developed in some way in time from the elementary beginning in these simplest microscopic forms.
- The causal agency behind this “ascending,” rather than “degenerating,” history of life over time is supplied by the activity of dynamic material agencies—caloric and electricity. These material agencies produce the spontaneous generation of the infusorians and also provide the impetus by which these give rise to forms of higher complexity, the radiarians, and so on up the series. Moving beyond the distinction of “inert” and “living” matter of his mentor Buffon, Lamarck's theories generally can be considered “vitalist” in inspiration in that they attribute a genuine dynamism to living matter and grant it the ability to create new forms and structures through its inherent powers. Lamarck's appeal to the causal role of Newtonian aetherial fluids, however, grounded his theory on a concept of active matter rather than on special superadded vital forces, and in this respect it can be termed a theory of vital materialism.
- The principal axis of Lamarckian transformism is a linear series, realized in time. This moves from simpler forms up a scale of organization to more complex forms. This results in an axis of fourteen primary groups, terminating in the mammals. This parallels the “natural” linear order of classification of groups he had developed in his taxonomic system. Position on the series is defined primarily in terms of the structural and functional elaboration of the nervous system.
- The best-known feature of Lamarckianism in the subsequent tradition—the theory of transformism via the inheritance of acquired characters—functions as a subordinate, diversifying process through which major animal groups are adapted to local circumstances. Such adaptation is not, however, the primary cause of transformation from group to group up the series. Consequently, in contrast to Darwin's later theory, the primary evolution of life is not through local adaptation.
- Major transformations between lesser groups may, however, occur through the action of use and disuse of structures. For example, the transformation of primates into humans presumably has occurred by means of this adaptive process.
Revisions of the third point constitute the most significant change in these five points after 1809, although the connection of these changes to Lamarck's more general theory remain unclear. Both in the diagram supplied as an Appendix to the Zoological Philosophy (1809) and in the Introductory Discourse to the later Natural History of Animals Without Vertebrae (1815), Lamarck presented a branching image of group development. Likely responding to his younger colleague Georges Cuvier's (1769–1832) criticisms of linear relationships (see below), Lamarck admitted a more complex pattern of group relations, with some showing independent lineages and even different points of origin. This issue was not, however, developed in any theoretical elaboration by Lamarck himself, and has not had significant impact on the historical understanding of Lamarckianism. Some of these elements in Lamarck's later theory did, however, have some impact on British readings (Sloan 2007, 1997)
The reception of Lamarck's views remains a topic of active scholarly exploration (see www.lamarck.cnrs.fr/). Within the confines of the Muséum parallel, if not immediately continuous, developments of critical issues were made by Lamarck's younger colleague, the comparative anatomist Etienne Geoffroy St. Hilaire (1772–1844). Less concerned with the issue of species transformism than with the implications of comparative anatomy, Geoffroy St. Hilaire pursued the implications of the anatomical “unity of type”—the remarkable resemblance of anatomical structure between organisms revealed by comparative anatomy. Pursuing this issue in his Muséum lectures and in several papers (Guyader 2004), Geoffroy St. Hilaire proceeded to work out the implications of the inner anatomical similarities of vertebrates. Based upon two main principles, the “principle of connection” and the “law of balance,” Geoffroy St. Hilaire drew attention to the implications of comparative anatomy for the unity of the animal kingdom. In the mid-1820s, St. Hilaire developed a more historical position on the relation of the unity of type to issues of the fossil record and to the development of life (Guyader 2004, chp. 4).
By 1823, Geoffroy St. Hilaire had extended his theory of the “unity of type” to the claim that even the invertebrates shared a common plan with the vertebrates, and by 1825 he had embraced a limited version of transformism. This led him into direct opposition to the claims of his one-time friend and colleague, Georges Cuvier. Cuvier's researches in comparative anatomy and paleontology led him to conclude to the contrary that animals were formed on a series of four distinct and autonomous body plans (embranchements) that may display some unity of type within the embranchements. Cuvier denied, however, the possibility of such unity between these plans, and developed this into a general anti-transformist argument that formed the mainstay of subsequent critiques of transformism into the Darwinian era.
These conflicts underlie the “great debate” that broke out in French life science and quickly ramified into a popular public controversy in the late 1820s between Geoffroy St. Hilaire and Cuvier (Appel 1987). This debate also forms one of the historic encounters between differing conceptions of biology that affected many aspects of nineteenth-century life science. It drew division lines within French, and even British, biology over the relation of organisms to history, and it directly engaged the possibility of species change. This debate also served to focus issues within French life science in a way that significantly affected the later French reception of Darwin. This debate eventually was to involve issues of paleontology, comparative anatomy, transformism of species, and the relation of form to function.
Cuvier's arguments, reinforced by the authority he carried in French comparative anatomy and science generally, resulted in the dominance of his positions within the Paris Académie des sciences. Nonetheless, the tradition of Geoffroy St. Hilaire remained a strong current within the Muséum, continued by such individuals as Antoine Etienne Serres (1786–1868), whose arguments for a historical sequence of forms, backed by embryological evidence, were canonized in morphological circles as the Meckel-Serres law of recapitulation (Gould 1977, chp. 3). Outside official Academic French science, Geoffroy Saint Hilaire's theories had broad appeal to those who saw the relevance of developmental embryology for issues of group relationship, an issue that Cuvier, as a moderate preformationist, had ignored. The renewed interest in the relationship between evolution and developmental biology at the present has stimulated new interest in Geoffroy's views (Guyader 2004).
Until recent decades, a long historiographical tradition has emphasized the endemic developments in British natural history, geology, and British versions of natural theology as the primary background for understanding the origins of Darwin's own views. The new awareness of the importance of issues raised within British medical discussions, and the impact of French and German discussions on the British context have only recently been appreciated in rich detail (Rupke 2009; R. J. Richards 2002; Sloan 2007, 2003a; Desmond 1989).
Darwin's early Edinburgh mentor, Robert Edmond Grant (1793–1874), provided a crucial link between the Continental discussions centered around Lamarckianism and the Cuvier-Geoffroy debate, and Darwin's early formation. Coming into contact with Darwin in his years as a young medical student at the University of Edinburgh (1825–27), Grant served as Darwin's first mentor in science. Subsequently, Grant became the holder of the first chair in comparative anatomy at the new University College London. From this position Grant brought the attention of British natural history to the issues being debated between Geoffroy St. Hilaire, Cuvier and Lamarck, and advocated himself a variant of a Lamarckian-Geoffroyean transformism. The elaboration of these issues in British discussions in the 1830s and 40s by Grant and his disciples made these topics issues of scientific discussion. These issues were further developed through such public fora as the Hunterian Lectures in Comparative Anatomy at the Royal College of Surgeons, first as delivered by the British surgeon Joseph Henry Green (1791–1863), and then in a major series of lectures by the rising Green protégé, the comparative anatomist, Richard Owen (1804–92). This London background forms a context for understanding many aspects of the scientific world in which Darwin's theory was eventually formulated (Sloan 2007, 1992; Desmond 1989).
Richard Owen's role in the formation of some of Darwin's thinking is a topic still in need of deeper exploration. Following his return from the Beagle voyage in October of 1836, Darwin's early associations with Robert Grant ceased dramatically, while those with Owen developed for a time into one of friendship and social interactions. Darwin also may have attended some of Owen's Hunterian lectures. From his position as holder of the prestigious Hunterian lectureship in comparative anatomy from 1837–56, Owen developed a reinterpretation of the significance of the Cuvier-Geoffroy dispute. Owen had been made directly aware of these issues during a trip to Paris in 1831, and he resolved after his return to find a solution to the conflict. This eventually led to his positing the theory of the archetypal vertebrate in the Hunterian lectures in 1845, followed by its elaboration in an important set of publications in 1847 and 1848. Employing aspects of William Whewell's philosophy of science to develop these arguments, Owen formulated the theory of the unity of type in relation to Cuvierian form and function through the positing of an ideal archetypal form. This abstraction functioned for Owen both as a transcendental idealization similar to a Platonic form, and also as an immanent law working in matter, conceived on the analogy of a Newtonian law, which governed the development of forms in time (Sloan 2003; R. J. Richards 2002, 1992; Rupke 1993). By means of this theory, Owen claimed he could coherently explain both the deep resemblance of forms in their internal anatomy, emphasized by Geoffroy St. Hilaire, and also the close fitting of structure and function to the organism's “conditions of existence,” the point emphasized by Cuvier.
To distinguish these two meanings of relationship, Owen introduced into the literature a crucial distinction between resemblances of “homology,” meaning the presence of the same parts in every variety of form and function—Geoffroyean relationships—from “analogy,” denoting solely the similarity of parts in their functional adaptations—Cuvierian relationships. Developing this concept of homology in relation to his theory of the archetype, Owen claimed he could at last give a coherent meaning to the concept of “sameness” in anatomical relationships. Furthermore, as this theory was developed in relation to his work on the fossil record, the theory of the archetype as an immanent law working in time led Owen to embrace a concept of branching and diversifying relations of forms as divergences from this ideal archetypal form over time. Owen thus broke with a linear historical progressionism from simple to complex forms assumed in transformist theories like those of Lamarck, particularly in Lamarck's writings before 1815. He also distinguished this kind of historical relationship from that advocated by some of the German proto-transformists who developed their ideas on linear models.
Owen's model cannot be considered a genuine species transformism—species do not change historically one into another and the archetype exists as a law or idealization rather than as an actual historical form—. Nonetheless, his integration of comparative anatomy, paleontology, and even embryology in this framework set out a sophisticated model of relationship that later was reinterpreted by Darwin from the viewpoint of his theory of material derivation from common historical ancestors.
Several aspects of Darwin's theory of evolution and his biographical development are dealt with in other entries in this encyclopedia (see the entries on Darwinism; species; natural selection; creationism). The remainder of this entry will focus on the following points in relation to Darwin's theory not developed in the other entries. It will also maintain a historical and textual approach:
- 3.2.1 The Origins of Darwin's Theory
- 3.2.2 The Natural Selection Concept
- 3.2.3 The Central Argument of the Origin
- 3.2.4 The Popular Reception of Darwinism
- 3.2.5 The Professional Reception of Darwinism
- 3.2.6 The Descent of Man and Human Evolution
- 3.2.7 Darwinism and Ethics
Charles Darwin's version of transformism has been the subject of massive historical and philosophical scholarship almost unparalleled in any other area of the history of science. This includes the continued flow of monographic studies and collections of articles on aspects of Darwin's theory (Ruse 2013, 2009a, 2009b, 2009c; Ruse and Richards 2009; Hodge and Radick 2009; Hösle and Illies 2005; Gayon 1998; Bowler 1996; Depew and Weber 1995; Kohn 1985a). The flow of popular and professional biographical studies on Darwin continues (Bowler 2013; Johnson 2012; Moore and Desmond 2009; Browne 1995, 2002; Desmond and Moore 1991; Bowlby 1990; Bowler 1990). In addition, major editing projects on Darwin's manuscripts and correspondence continue to reveal details and new insights into the issues surrounding Darwin's own thought (Keynes 2000; Burkhardt et al. 1985-; Barrett et al. 1987). The Cambridge Darwin website (www.darwinonline.org.uk) serves as an international clearinghouse for this massive Darwinian scholarship.
This continued scholarly interest reflects not only concerns of historians, but also the continued relevance of Darwin's own writings as sources of creative reflection for contemporary work in evolutionary biology (Gayon 2009 in Hodge and Radick 2009, chp. 10). This historical phenomenon itself presents difficulties for the historical understanding of Darwinism. Particularly within anglophone philosophy of biology, the emphasis on the lines of the development of Darwin's evolutionary theory that have led to the consensus position achieved in the so-named “Synthetic” theory of evolution of the 1930s (Smocovitis 1996; Mayr and Provine 1998; Provine 1971), has tended to obscure the complex history of Darwin's own theoretical reflections and the history of Darwinian theory since 1859 (Depew and Weber 1995, Bowler 1983).
These internal complexities in the heritage of Darwin's works have shaped Darwinism into more than one tradition, with pre-existing social and intellectual contexts playing an important role in the interpretation of Darwin's achievement. French biology, for example, still pays greater respect to Lamarck than is true in English literature, and many Continental commentators seek to de-emphasize the contrasts between the presumably failed theories of Lamarck and those of Darwin, or else see some greater compatibility between a "molecularized" understanding of evolution and Lamarckianism (Gissis and Jablonka 2011; Laurent 1997). The long heritage of Kantianism and German Idealism has influenced lines of the German interpretations of Darwin up to the present (Hösle and Illies 2005).
In its historical origins, Darwin's theory was different in kind than its main predecessors in important ways. Viewed against the longer historical scenario developed in the present entry, Darwin's theory does not deal with the creation of the world and the ultimate origins of life through naturalistic means, and therefore was more restricted in its theoretical scope than its main predecessors deriving from the reflections of Buffon and Lamarck. This restriction also distinguished it more immediately from the grand evolutionary cosmology put forth anonymously in 1844 by the Scottish publisher Robert Chambers (1802–71) in his immensely popular Vestiges of the Natural History of Creation, a work which in many respects prepared Victorian society in England, and pre-Civil War America, for Darwin's more restricted theory (Secord 2000). This restriction in scope also differentiated Darwin's theory from the historical developmentalism of his German contemporary, the paleontologist Heinrich G. Bronn (Gliboff 2008, 2007).
A long tradition of scholarship has interpreted Darwin's theory to have originated from a framework of endemic British natural history, a tradition of natural theology defined particularly by William Paley (1743–1805), the methodological precepts of John Herschel (1792–1871), and the geological theories of Charles Lyell (1797–1875). His conversion to the uniformitarian geology of Charles Lyell and to Lyell's thesis of gradual change over time during the voyage of the H. M. S. Beagle (December 1831–October 1836) has been seen as fundamental in his formation (Sloan 2009 in Hodge and Radick 2009; Herbert 2005; Hodge 1982). Complementing this predominantly anglophone historiography have been the social-constructivist analyses emphasizing the origins of Darwin's theories in British Political Economy and British natural theology (Young, 1985, chps. 2, 4, 5). Recently, it has been argued that the generating source of Darwin's inquiries was his involvement with British anti-slavery movements coupled with his experiences on the Beagle that led him to develop a response to scientific racism of the mid-nineteenth century (Desmond and Moore 2009).
A revisionist historiography, on the other hand, has de-emphasized some of the novelty of Darwin's views: questions have been raised regarding the validity of the standard biographical picture of the early Darwin; new emphasis has been placed on Darwin's relations to the Romantic movement, to British medical developments, and to his early formation in Scottish science (R. J. Richards 2002; Desmond and Moore 1991; Desmond 1989, Manier 1978).
Such revisions to a long-standing historiography in the understanding of the genesis of Darwinian theory are indebted to the wealth of manuscripts and correspondence that have become available since the 1960s. These materials have drawn attention to previously ignored aspects of Darwin's biography. The importance of his Edinburgh period from 1825–27, discounted in importance by Darwin himself in his late Autobiography, has been seen as critical for his subsequent development (Desmond and Moore 1991; Hodge 1985 in Kohn 1985a). It was at Edinburgh that he first encountered the writings of Lamarck and Geoffroy St. Hilaire through his mentor Robert Edmond Grant(1793–1874). This Scottish period also initiated an abiding interest in invertebrate zoology that would later emerge in full in his important work on the barnacles (Sloan 1985 in Kohn 1985a; see also Stott 2004; Love 2002).
Similarly, there is new appreciation of the importance of his work in physiological botany and in entomology during his studies in Cambridge from 1827–31 under the guidance of his mentor John Stevens Henslow (1795–1861), who exposed him to the physiological botany of Swiss botanist Alphonse De Candolle (1806–93) as well as the writings of both John Herschel and Alexander von Humboldt (1769–1859). Deeper understanding is now possible concerning his work in geology with Adam Sedgwick (1795–1873. All of this has considerably deepened the understanding of his scientific and intellectual preparation for the theoretical work that transpired during the voyage of the H.M.S. Beagle. Some scholars now interpret Darwin's initial reflections on transformism to have developed from lines of thought stimulated by Humboldt's version of German philosophy of nature as much as from the traditional sources usually assumed in Lyell, Herschel and British natural theology (R. J. Richards 2005 in Hösle and Illies 2005; idem. 2002, chp. 14. Sloan 2001). This scholarly work has revealed the multiplicity of origins that include the traditional British traditions as well as Continental sources (Sloan 2009b in Hodge and Radick 2009; Hodge 2009 in Hodge and Radick 2009; Hodge 1982).
Darwin's theory first took concrete written form in reflections in a series of notebooks composed by Darwin after the return of the Beagle in October of 1836. His reflections on species are first entered in March of 1837 (“Red Notebook”) and are developed in the other notebooks (B-E) through July of 1839 (Hodge 2009 in Hodge and Radick 2009; Barrett et al. 1987). Beginning with the notebook reflections of the third or “D” Notebook, composed between July and October of 1838, Darwin first worked out the rudiments of what was to become his theory of natural selection. In the parallel notebooks “M” and “N” dating between July of 1838 and July of 1839, and in a loose collection called “Old and Useless Notes”, dating from approximately 1838–40, he also developed many of his main ideas on human evolution that would only be made public in the Descent of Man of 1871.
To summarize a complex issue, these Notebook reflections show Darwin proceeding through a series of stages in which he first formulated a general theory of the transformation of species from common ancestry. He then attempted to work out a causal theory of life that would explain the tendency of life to complexify and diversify (Hodge 2009, 1985; Sloan 1986).
This causal inquiry into the underlying nature of life and the meaning of its tendency to develop and complexify was then replaced by a shift in focus to the control of population assumed to be expanding in a geometrical fashion. This allowed him to develop the implications of population increase for the transformation of species. Through his universalization of Thomas Malthus's (1766–1834) “principle of population,” Darwin introduced something similar to an “inertial” principle into his theory, although such language is never used in his text. Newton's first law, for example, established his physical system upon the tendency of a body in motion to persist either at rest or in uniform motion in a straight line, requiring a causal explanation for any deviations from this initial state. But it did not seek a deeper metaphysical explanation for this tendency. Similarly, the principle of population supplied Darwin with the assumption of an initial dynamic state of affairs that was not itself explained within the theory—there is no attempt to account causally for this tendency of living beings universally to reproduce geometrically. The principle of population might therefore be regarded as functioning axiomatically, defining a set of initial conditions from which any deviance from this ideal state demands explanation. This theoretical shift enabled Darwin to bracket his earlier efforts to develop a causal theory of life, and focus instead on the means by which the dynamic force of population was controlled, and determine how this control on population worked out in company with the phenomenon of slight individual variation and changing conditions of life to produce a gradual change of form and function. Darwin would later claim that he was able empirically to support the claim that living populations do tend to increase in this way, but he does not offer a causal theory of life to explain this tendency (Origin, Darwin 1964, 1859).
The foremost difference distinguishing Darwin's theory from previous explanations of species change centers on the different way in which he explained how this process occurred. Prior theories, such as Lamarck's, relied on the inherent dynamic properties of matter, or as in some of the German reflections, on special dynamic forces, such as those building upon the Bildungstrieb theory of Johann Blumenbach (1752–1840). The developmental change of species was not primarily through an adaptive process (2.6 above). Darwin's emphasis after Notebook D on the factors controlling population increase, rather than on a causal theory of life, such as we see developed in Lamarck's theory, accounts for many of the differences between Darwin's theory and those of his predecessors and contemporaries.
These differences can be summarized in the concept of natural selection as a central ingredient of Darwinian theory. Darwin's exact meaning, and the varying ways he stated the principle in the Origin over its six editions (1859–1872), however, varied and has given rise to multiple interpretations in its history.
One way to see the complexity of Darwin's own thinking on these issues is by following the textual development of this concept between the close of the notebook period (1839) and the publication of the Origin. This period of approximately twenty years involved Darwin in a series of reflections that form successive strata in the final version of his theory of the evolution of species. Understanding the historical sequence of these developments also has significance for the subsequent controversies over this concept. It also has some bearing on assessing Darwin's relevance for more general philosophical questions, such as those surrounding the teleology of nature.
The earliest set of themes in the manuscript elaboration of natural selection theory can be characterized as those developed on the positing of a strong analogy between human art and the workings of nature. As this was developed in the first coherent draft of the theory, a 39-page draft of 1842, this discussion transferred the concept of selection of forms by human agency in the creation of the varieties of domestic animals and plants, to the active selection in the natural world by an almost conscious agency, a “being more sagacious than man (not an omniscient creator)” (Darwin 1842 in Glick and Kohn 1996, 91). This agency selects out those features most beneficial to organisms in relation to conditions of life, analogous in its action to the selection by man on domestic forms in the production of different breeds. Interwoven with these references to an almost Platonic demiurge are appeals to the selecting power of an active “Nature”:
Nature's variation far less, but such selection far more rigid and scrutinizing[.…] Nature lets [an] animal live, till on actual proof it is found less able to do the required work to serve the desired end, man judges solely by his eye, and knows not whether nerves, muscles, arteries, are developed in proportion to the change of external form. (Ibid., 93)
These themes were continued in the 230 page draft of his theory written in 1844. Again he referred to the selective action of a wise imaginary being whose selection was made with greater foresight and wisdom than human selection. This agency worked as a secondary cause in a larger plan of a superintending creator such that “the process of selection could go on adapting, nicely and wonderfully, organisms, if in ever so small a degree plastic, to diverse ends. I believe such secondary means do exist” (Darwin 1844 in Glick and Kohn 1996, 103).
Darwin returned to these issues in 1856, following a twelve-year period in which he had published his Geological Observations on the Volcanic Islands (1844), the second edition of his Journal of Researches (1845), the Geological Observations on South America (1846), the four volumes on fossil and living barnacles (1851, 54, 55), and the Geological Observations on Coral Reefs (1851). In addition, he had published several smaller papers on invertebrate zoology, on geology, and reported on his experiments on the resistance of seeds to salt water, a topic that would be of importance in his explanation of the population of remote islands.
The intervening inquiries between 1844 and 1856 positioned Darwin to deal with the question of species change against an extensive empirical background. The composition of his long manuscript or “Big Species Book,” commenced in 1856, known in current scholarship as the “Natural Selection” manuscript, formed the immediate background to the published Origin. This text, although incomplete, provides insights into many critical issues in Darwin's thinking. It was also prepared with an eye to the scholarly community. This distinguishes its form of argument from that of the subsequent “abstract,” which became the published Origin of Species. This incomplete long manuscript contained tables of data, references to scholarly literature, and other apparatus expected of a non-popular work, none of which survived in the published Origin.
The “Natural Selection” manuscript also contained some new theoretical developments of relevance to the concept of natural selection that are not found in earlier manuscripts. Scholars have noted the introduction in this manuscript of the “principle of divergence,” the thesis that organisms under the action of natural selection will tend to radiate and diversify within their conditions of life (Kohn 2009 in Ruse and Richards 2009; Kohn 1985b in Kohn 1985a). Although the concept of group divergence under the action of natural selection might be seen as an implication of Darwin's theory since the 1830s, nonetheless Darwin's explicit definition of this as a “principle” and its discussion in a long insertion in the “Natural Selection” manuscript, suggests its importance for Darwin's mature theory. This principle was now seen by Darwin to form an important link between natural variation and the conditions of existence under the action of the driving force of population increase.
Still evident in the “Natural Selection” manuscript is Darwin's implicit appeal to some kind of teleological ordering of the process. The action of the “wise being” of the earlier manuscripts, however, has now been given over entirely to the action of a selective “Nature,” now referred to in the traditional feminine gender. This Nature,
…cares not for mere external appearance; she may be said to scrutinise with a severe eye, every nerve, vessel & muscle; every habit, instinct, shade of constitution,—the whole machinery of the organisation. There will be here no caprice, no favouring: the good will be preserved & the bad rigidly destroyed.… Can we wonder then, that nature's productions bear the stamp of a far higher perfection than man's product by artificial selection. With nature the most gradual, steady, unerring, deep-sighted selection,—perfect adaption [sic] to the conditions of existence.…(Darwin 1856, in Stauffer 1974, 224–25)
The language of this passage, directly underlying statements about the action of “natural selection” in the first edition of the published Origin, indicates the complexity in the exegesis of Darwin's meaning of “natural selection” when viewed in light of its historical genesis (Ospovat 1981). The parallels of art and nature, the intentionality implied in the term “selection,” the notion of “perfect” adaptation, and the substantive conception of “nature” as an agency working toward certain ends, all render Darwin's views on teleological purpose more complex than they are typically interpreted from the standpoint of contemporary Neo-selectionist theory (Lennox 1993). As will be discussed below, the changes Darwin subsequently made in his formulations of this concept over the history of the Origin lead to different conceptions of what he meant by this principle and underlie more contemporary meanings of natural selection.
The hurried preparation and publication of the Origin between the summer of 1858 and November of 1859, prompted by the receipt on June 18 of 1858 of the letter from Alfred Russel Wallace that outlined his remarkably similar views on the possibility of continuous species change under the action of a selection upon natural variation, had important implications for the form of Darwin's published argument. Rapidly condensing the detailed arguments of the “Big Species Book” manuscript into shorter chapters, Darwin also universalized several claims that he had only developed with reference to specific groups of organisms or with application to more limited situations in the manuscript. This resulted in a presentation of his theory at the level of a broad generalization. The absence of tables of data, detailed footnotes, and references to the secondary literature in the published version also resulted in predictable criticisms which will be discussed below in 3.2.4.
The structure of the argument of the Origin has been the topic of considerable literature and can only be summarized here (“ Darwinism” this encyclopedia, Waters 2009 in Hodge and Radick 2009; Depew 2009 in Ruse and Richards 2009; Ruse 2009 in Ruse and Richards 2009; Lennox 2005). Darwin himself described his book as “one long argument.” The exact nature of this argument is, however, not immediately transparent, and alternative interpretations have been made of his reasoning and rhetorical strategies in formulating his evolutionary theory.
The scholarly reconstruction of Darwin's methodology employed in the Origin has taken two primary forms. One attempt has been to reconstruct it from the standpoint of currently accepted models of scientific explanation, sometimes presenting it as a formal deductive model (Sober 1984). Another, more historical, approach interprets his methodology in the context of accepted canons of scientific explanation found in Victorian discussions of the period (Waters 2009 in Hodge and Radick 2009; Hull 2009 in Hodge and Radick 2009; Lewens 2009 in Ruse and Richards 2009; Ruse 2009 in Ruse and Richards 2009; Lennox 2005; Hodge 1983). The degree to which Darwin did in fact draw from these available methodological discussions of his contemporaries—John Herschel, William Whewell, John Stuart Mill—is not fully clear from available documentary sources. The claim most readily documented, and defended particularly by M. J. S. Hodge (1991), has emphasized the importance of John Herschel's A Preliminary Discourse on the Study of Natural Philosophy (1830), which Darwin read as a young student at Cambridge prior to his departure in December of 1831 on the H.M.S.Beagle. In Herschel's writings he would have encountered the claim that science seeks to determine “true causes”—verae causae—that Newton had specified in the third of his Rules of Reasoning in Philosophy as the goal of scientific inquiry. Such causes, in Herschel's formulation, were those necessary to produce the given effects; they were truly active in producing the effects; and they adequately explain the effects (Herschel 1987, 1830; Lennox 2005; Waters 2009 in Hodge and Radick 2009). These criteria distinguished a satisfactory scientific account from the simple “saving of phenomena” by plausible explanations in the tradition of scientific conventionalism. The impact of Herschel's arguments on Darwin's intellectual development was evidently profound, and the effects of this reading of Herschel on his early work can be seen in his theorizing in geology in which he used the notion of true cause in the framework of his endorsement of Lyellian geology to explain such issues as the formation of coral reefs.
The other plausible methodological source for Darwin's mature reasoning was the work of his older contemporary and former Cambridge mentor, the Rev. William Whewell (1794–1866), whose three-volume History of the Inductive Sciences (1837) was read with care by Darwin after his return from his round-the-world voyage. On the other hand, the impact of Whewell's theory of scientific method, as set out in his Philosophy of Inductive Science (first ed. 1840), is less easy to document, with no evidence of the reading of Whewell's Philosophy in the Darwin reading notebooks or Correspondence.
Nevertheless, a plausible argument has been made that the actual structure of Darwin's text is more closely similar to a “Whewellian” rather than “Herschelian” model of argument (Ruse 1975). In Whewell's 1840 account, the emphasis of scientific inquiry is, as Herschel had also argued, to be placed on the discovery of “true causes.” But evidence for the determination of vera causae was to be demonstrated by the ability of disparate phenomena to be drawn together under a single unifying “Conception of the Mind,” exemplified for Whewell by Newton's universal law of gravitation. This “Consilience of Inductions,” as Whewell termed this process of theoretical unification under a few simple concepts, was achieved only by true scientific theories employing true causes (Whewell 1840, xxxix). In a restatement of this principle in a revised edition published only a year before the Origin, Whewell argued that “the cases in which inductions from classes of facts altogether different have thus jumped together, belong only to the best established theories which the history of science contains” (Whewell 1858, 77–96). It has therefore been argued that Darwin's theory fundamentally produces this kind of consilience argument.
In rhetorical structure, the text presents what might be termed a “constructive” argument, with a complex style of presentation indebted to what has been termed “situated argumentation,“ similar to the views developed by contemporary Oxford logician and rhetorician Richard Whately (1787–1863) (Depew 2009 in Ruse and Richards 2009). It proceeds by drawing the reader into Darwin's world by personal narration as it presents a series of limited issues for acceptance in the first three chapters, none of which required of the reader a considerable leap of theoretical assent, and most of which, such as natural variation and Malthusian population increase, had already been recognized in some form in the literature of the period.
These ingredients are then assembled together in chapter four into a remarkable synthesis that rapidly extends the claims by generalization to cover the full range of life, both in time and in space. With Darwin's carefully-designed rhetorical strategy of presentation, only by chapter four would the reader know the full character and broad implications of the claims being developed in the early chapters. By the end of chapter four, the reader would be presented with a remarkably comprehensive theory of the relations of living forms, and the mode of their origin, both in the present and in the past history of the planet.
Opening with a pair of chapters that draw upon the art-nature analogy developed in the manuscripts, Darwin framed the argument with an account of the probable origin of domestic animals, and by inference, of domesticated plants. These forms are presumed to have arisen through the action of human selection on the slight variations existing between individuals within the same species. A possible interpretation of this process as implying directional, and even intentional, selection, was at the same time downplayed in the published work through the importance given by Darwin to the role of “unconscious” selection, a concept not encountered in the Natural Selection manuscript. This denotes the selection practiced even by aboriginal peoples who simply seek to maintain the integrity of a breed by preserving the best forms. The domestic breeding analogy is, however, more than a decorative rhetorical strategy. It repeatedly functions for Darwin as the principal empirical example to which he could appeal at several places in the text as a means of visualizing the working of natural selection in nature, and this appeal remains intact through the six editions of the Origin. From this model of human selection working on small natural variations to produce the domestic forms, Darwin then developed in the second chapter the implications of “natural” variation, delaying discussion of the concept of natural selection until chapter four. The focus of the second chapter introduces another important issue. Here he extends the discussion of variation developed in chapter one into an attack on the traditional“ Linnaean” understanding of classification as a sorting out of species by means of essential defining properties. It is in this chapter that Darwin most explicitly develops his own positions on the nature of organic species in relation to his theory of descent.
Darwin's analysis of the “species question” is a complex issue that has many implications for how his work was read by his contemporaries and successors, and it still is a topic of extensive discussion in the literature (see “Species” and “Darwinism“ this encyclopedia; R. A. Richards 2010; Wilkins 2009; Stamos 2007; Sloan 2012, and idem. 2009b in Ruse and Richards 2009). His sometimes contradictory statements on this issue—alternating between overt denials of the reality of species in some places, and clear affirmation of the reality of species in others—have been seen as an intentional rhetorical strategy (Stamos 2007; Beatty 1985 in Kohn 1985a). A counter argument has been made that these contradictions represent Darwin's complex synthesis of competing strands of discourse about species available in the existent literature of the time (Sloan 2009b).
In his analysis of the “species question” Darwin can be seen to blend together the traditions that had regarded species either in the sense of universals of logic—what can be considered in his immediate context the Linnean tradition—with species in the sense of material historical lineages of ancestor and descendant—the Buffonian tradition (see 2.5 above). The result is a complex interweaving of concepts of varieties, races, sub-species, tribes, and natural families that can be shown to represent different traditions of discussion in the literature of the period. This creative conflation also led to many confusions about what Darwin did mean by species.
Darwin addresses the species question by raising the problems caused by natural variation in the practical discrimination of taxa at the species and varietal levels. Although the difficulty of taxonomic distinctions at this level was a well-recognized problem in the literature of the time, Darwin subtly transforms this practical problem into an ontological ambiguity—the fuzziness of formal taxonomic distinctions is seen to imply a similar ambiguity of “natural” species boundaries.
As analyzed above in Section 2.5, prior tradition had been heavily affected by Buffon's novel conception of biological species in which he made a sharp distinction between “natural” species defined by such properties as fertile interbreeding, and “artificial” species and varieties defined by morphological traits and measurements upon these. Particularly as conceptualized by German natural historians of the early nineteenth-century, “Buffonian” species were defined by the unity of common descent, and distinguished by their historical and ontological character from the taxonomic species of Linnaean natural history. This distinction between “natural” and “book” species, as one contemporary termed this difference, maintained the distinction between problems of practical classification of preserved specimens, from those relating to natural species unity, which most maintained as fixed on the basis of reproductive unity and the sterility criterion. Remarkable in Darwin's argument is the way in which he drew issues from these two traditions of discourse together, and then utilized ingredients drawn from each of these traditions to undermine the arguments for species realism of the other (Sloan 2009b).
For example, natural variation is employed by Darwin in chapter two of the Origin to break down the distinction between species and varieties as these concepts were commonly employed in the practical taxonomic literature. The arbitrariness apparent in making distinctions, particularly in plants and invertebrates, meant that such species were only what “competent naturalists” with substantial practical experience defined them to be (Darwin 1964, 1859, 47). These arguments form the basis for claims by his contemporaries that Darwin was a species “nominalist,” who defined species only as conventional and convenient divisions of a continuum of individuals.
But this only in part captures the complexity of his argument. Drawing also on the tradition of species realism developed within the Buffonian tradition, Darwin also affirmed that species and varieties were defined by common descent and material relations of interbreeding. However, Darwin then employed the ambiguity of distinction between species and varieties created by taxonomic variation in practical taxonomy to undermine the ontological fixity of “natural” species. Varieties are not the formal taxonomic subdivisions of a natural species as conceived in the Linnean tradition. They are, as he terms them, “incipient” species (ibid., 52). This subtly transformed the issue of local variation and adaptation to circumstances into a primary ingredient for historical evolutionary change. The conclusions to be drawn from this argument were, however, only to be revealed in chapter four of the text.
Before assembling the ingredients of these first two chapters, Darwin introduced in chapter three the concept of a “struggle for existence.” This he introduced in a ”large and metaphorical sense“ that included different levels of organic interactions, from direct struggle for food and space to the struggle for life of a plant in a desert. Although described as an application of Thomas Malthus's parameter of geometrical increase of population, Darwin's use of this concept in fact alters principle claimed by Malthus to govern only human population in relation to food supply. It now becomes a general principle governing all of organic life. Thus the organisms comprising food itself would be included. Through this universalization, the control on population becomes only in the extreme case grounded directly on the traditional Malthusian limitations of food and space. Normal controls are instead exerted through a complex network of relationships of species acting one on another in predator-prey, parasite-host, and food-web relations. This profound revision of Malthus's arguments rendered Darwin's theory deeply “ecological” as this term would later be employed. The presence of mice can be determined by the numbers of bumble bees, or the abundance of Scotch Firs by the number of cattle, to cite two examples employed by Darwin (ibid., 72–74). This recognition of complex species-species interactions as the primary means of population control also prevents one from reading the Origin as a simple extension of British political economy and the competition imbedded in Victorian industrialization to the natural world.
With the ingredients of the first three chapters in place, Darwin was positioned to assemble these together in his culminating fourth chapter on natural selection. In this long discussion, Darwin develops his main discussion of his central theoretical concept. For his contemporaries and for the subsequent tradition, however, Darwin's concept of “natural” selection was not unambiguously clear for reasons we have outlined above, and these unclarities were to be the source of several lines of disagreement and controversy. It is not clear in Darwin's discussion if he conceives of natural selection as an efficient or final cause, if it is an emergent result of other causes, or if it is a simple description of the working together of several independent causal factors and does not itself have causal status. Judging from the text of the Origin itself, it is difficult to verify the claim that natural selection is itself considered to be a vera causa in Herschel's sense (Waters 2009 in Hodge and Radick 2009, 124–27). Darwin instead reserves this designation for “community of descent,” the causes of “ordinary generation,” or even the mistaken beliefs of “special creationists” (Darwin 1964, 159, 352, 482; Depew 2009 in Ruse and Richards 2009, 243).
In the initial definition of natural selection presented in the first edition of Darwin's text, it is characterized as “preservation of favourable variations and the rejection of injurious variations” (Darwin 1964, 81). As Darwin elaborated on this concept in the first edition, he continued to describe natural selection in language suggesting that it involved an intentional selection, continuing the art-nature parallel found in the manuscripts. For example:
As man can produce and certainly has produced a great result by his methodical and unconscious means of selection, what may not nature effect? Man can act only on external and visible characters: nature cares nothing for appearances, except in so far as they may be useful to any being. She can act on every internal organ, on every shade of constitutional difference, on the whole machinery of life. Man selects only for his own good; Nature only for that of the being which she tends. Every selected character is fully exercised by her; and the being is placed under well-suited conditions of life. (Ibid., 82)
The manuscript history behind such passages prevents the simple discounting of these statements as mere rhetorical imagery. The parallel between intentional human selectivity and that of “nature” formed the original model upon which the concept of natural selection was originally constructed.
Criticisms that quickly developed over the overt intentionality imbedded in such passages, however, led Darwin to revise the argument in editions beginning with the third edition of 1861. From this point he explicitly downplayed the intentional and teleological language of the first two editions, denying that his appeals to the selective role of “nature” were anything more than a literary figure, and he moved decisively in the direction of defining natural selection as the description of the action of natural laws working upon organisms rather than as an efficient or final cause of life. He also regrets in his correspondence his mistake in not utilizing the designation “natural preservation” rather than ”natural selection“ (letter to Lyell 9/28/1860 in Burkhardt et al. 8:397) to characterize his principle. The adoption in the fifth edition of 1869 of Herbert Spencer's designator “survival of the fittest” as a synonym for “natural selection” further emphasized this shift of meaning from the early texts and drafts to the formulations in the final statements of the late 1860s and early 70s. It is these later expressions that underlie the tradition of later mechanistic and non-teleological understandings of natural selection, a reading developed by his disciples who, in the words of David Depew, “had little use for either his natural theodicy or his image of a benignly scrutinizing selection” (Depew 2009 in Ruse and Richards 2009, 253).
The conceptual synthesis of chapter four also introduced discussion of such matters as the conditions under which natural selection most optimally worked, the role of isolation, the causes of the extinction of species, and the principle of divergence. Many of these points were made through the imaginative use of “thought experiments” in which Darwin constructed possible scenarios through which natural selection could bring about substantial change. Although these did not count for his critics as empirical evidence for his claims, it has been argued that these assisted Darwin in satisfying certain criteria of adequacy as set forth by John Herschel in his methodological canons (Lennox 2005). One prominent use of an imaginative image is found in the one diagram to appear in all the editions of the Origin. In this single diagram was summarized the image of gradual change from common ancestral points, the depiction of the frequent extinction of most lineages, the general tendency of populations to diverge and fragment under the pressure of population increase, and a way of envisioning the relations of taxonomic affinity to time. It also depicted the persistence of some forms unchanged over long geological periods in stable conditions.
Tree Diagram from Origin of Species
Remarkable about this diagram is the relativity of its coordinates. It is first presented as applying only to the divergences taking place at the varietal level, with varieties represented by the small lower-case letters within species A–L of a “wide ranging genus,” with the horizontal time coordinates measured in terms of a limited number of generations. However, the attentive reader could quickly see that Darwin's destructive analysis of the distinction between “natural” and “artificial” species and the relativity of the species-variety distinction, worked out in chapter two, allowed this diagram to represent all organic relationships, from those at the non-controversial level of diverging varieties within fixed species, to those of the relations of species within different genera. Letters A–L could also represent taxa at the level of Genera, Families or Orders. The diagram can thus be applied to relationships between all levels of the Linnaean hierarchy with the vertical coordinates representing potentially vast expanses of time, and the horizontal coordinates the degree of taxonomic divergence over time. In a very few pages of argument, the diagram was generalized to represent the most extensive group relations, encompassing the whole of geological time. Extension of the dotted lines at the bottom could even suggest, as Darwin argues in the last paragraph of the book, that all life was a result of “several powers, having been originally breathed into a few forms or into one” (Darwin 1964,1859, 490). This could suggest a naturalistic origin of original forms by material emergence or by means of a vitalistic power of life. Or it could be read as implying the action of a supernatural cause.
In response to criticisms of his unclarity on this latter point, Darwin quickly added to the final paragraph in the second edition of 1860 the phrase “by the Creator,” which remained in all subsequent editions. Coupled with the quotations on the frontispiece that remained in all editions of the work, this could imply Darwin's intent to locate work within the tradition of British natural theology and the long tradition running back to the Scholastics that conceptualized creation by secondary law. Conceptual space was thereby created for a reading of the Origin by some contemporaries, such as the American Asa Gray (1810–88), as compatible with traditional natural theology.
The sweep of the theoretical generalization that closed the natural selection chapter, restated even more generally in the final summary of the book, required Darwin to deal with several obvious objections to the theory that would occupy him through the numerous revisions of the text between 1859 and 1872. As suggested by David Depew, the rhetorical structure of the original text developed in an almost “objections and response” structure that resulted in a constant stream of revisions to the original text as Darwin engaged his opponents (Depew 2009 in Ruse and Richards 2009). Anticipating at first publication several obvious lines of objection, Darwin devoted much of the text of the original Origin to offering a solution in advance to predictable difficulties. As Darwin outlined these main lines of objection, they included the apparent absence of numerous slight gradations between species, both in the present and in the fossil record, of the kind that would seem to be predictable from the gradualist workings of the theory (chps. 6, 9). The existence of organs and structures of extreme complexity, such as the vertebrate eye, structures that had since the writings of Galen in Hellenistic antiquity served as a mainstay in the argument for external teleological design, needed some plausible explanation (chp. 6). The evolution of the elaborate instincts of animals and the puzzling problem of the evolution of social insects that developed sterile neuter castes, proved to be a particularly difficult issue for Darwin in the manuscript phase of his work and needed some account (chp. 7). The complex issue of the traditional distinction between natural species defined by interfertility, and artificial species defined by morphological differences, also required a full chapter of analysis in which he sought to undermine the absolute character of the interbreeding criterion as a sign of fixed natural species (chp. 8).
In chapter ten, Darwin developed his position on the fossil record. At issue here was whether the known fossil record displayed a gradual progression of forms from simple to complex, or whether it supported the claim for the persistence of major groups throughout the record as might be held by one in the tradition of Cuvier. The thesis of geological progressionism had in fact been denied by none other than Darwin's great mentor in geology, Charles Lyell in his Principles of Geology (1830–33) (Desmond 1984; Bowler 1974). Darwin defended the progressionist view in this chapter.
To each of these lines of objection Darwin offered his contemporaries plausible, if not for many critics compelling, replies. Additional arguments were worked out through the insertion of numerous textual insertions over the five revisions of the Origin between 1860 and 1872, including the addition of a new chapter dealing with “miscellaneous” objections to the sixth edition of the Origin. For reasons related both to the condensed and summary form of public presentation, and also to the bold conceptual sweep of the theory, the primary argument of the Origin could not gain its force from the data presented by the book itself. Instead, it presented an argument from unifying simplicity, gaining its force from the ability of Darwin's theory to draw together a wide variety of issues in taxonomy, comparative anatomy, paleontology, biogeography, and embryology under the simple principles worked out in the first four chapters (chps. 11–13). In important respects, this might be seen as reflecting the impact of Whewell's methodology, although Whewell is not cited.
This explanatory power also provided Darwin with a means of defeating certain major objections, such as those drawn from the existence of organs of great complication and function. Dealing with the question of the vertebrate eye in chapter six,for example, Darwin offered a few speculations on how such a structure could have developed by the gradual selection upon the rudimentary eyes of invertebrates. But the primary solution offered was the ability of his theory to draw together in its total argument numerous lines of inquiry that would not otherwise receive a coherent explanation. In such a case one would “admit that a structure even as perfect as the eye of an eagle might be formed by natural selection, although in this case he does not know any of the transitional grades” (Darwin 1964, 188). Here again, one might see Whewell's notion of a “consilience of inductions” at work.
As Darwin envisioned it, with the acceptance of his theory, “a grand untrodden field of inquiry will be opened” in biology and natural history. The long-standing issues of species origins, if not the ultimate origins of life, as well as the causes of their extinction, had been brought within the domain of naturalistic explanation. It is in this context that he makes the sole reference in the text that “light will be thrown on the origin of man and his history” (ibid., 488).
The broad sweep of Darwin's claims, the brevity of the empirical evidence actually supplied in the text, and the implications of his theory for several more general philosophical and theological issues, immediately opened up a controversy over Darwinian evolution that has waxed and waned over the past 155 years. As is well-known, Darwin developed his claims for explanatory superiority against a doctrine of “special creation,” which he posed as the main alternative to his account. This stylized opposition to “creationism,” rather than to the traditions of Cuvier and Buffon that can be demonstrated to have formed the basis for scientific opposition to transformism, presented Darwin's evolution in opposition to the thesis of a direct supernatural action of an intelligent deity who created each individual species exactly in its present condition. This was a point of considerable criticism by contemporaries such as Richard Owen, who held no such view. But this rhetorical strategy served to define much of the popular debate over Darwin's theory in the succeeding period, and continues to define it to the present.
On the level of popular culture, Darwin's theory fell into a complex social situation that took on different features in different national traditions. In the anglophone world, the great popularity of the anonymous Vestiges of the Natural History of Creation of 1844, which had reached 11 editions and sold 23,350 copies by December of 1860 (Secord "Introduction" to in Chambers 1994, 1844, xxvii), with several more editions to appear by the end of the century, certainly prepared the groundwork for the general notion of the evolutionary origins of species by natural law. The Vestiges's grand schema of a teleological development of life from the earliest beginnings of the solar system in a gaseous nebula to the emergence of humanity under the action of a great “law of development,” had also been popularized for Victorian readers by Alfred Lord Tennyson's epic poem In Memoriam (1850). This provided a context in which some could read Darwin as supplying additional support for the belief in an optimistic historical development of life under teleological guidance with the promise of ultimate historical redemption. Such readings also rendered the Origin seemingly compatible with the progressive evolutionism of Herbert Spencer (1820–1903) (see the entry on Herbert Spencer). Most of this popular reception ignored or revised Darwin's concept of evolution by natural selection to fit these progressivist alternatives (Bowler 1983). For this reason the popular image of a great public outcry against Darwin's work has been shown by careful historical analyses to be generally mythical, or at least in need of careful discrimination by social group, national tradition, and religious affiliation (Ellegard 1990).
Analysis of the various national receptions of Darwin's work currently forms a scholarly industry in its own right (Glick and Shaffer 2013; Engels and Glick 2008; Gliboff 2008; Numbers 1998; Pancaldi, 1991; Todes 1989; Glick 1988; Kelly 1981; Hull 1973). Studies of non-Western receptions currently forms a growth area in Darwin studies, and these display certain similar patterns to the reception in European contexts (Glick 1988 “Preface;” Pusey 1983). These studies display a common pattern in which the general reception of Darwin's theories was conditioned, if not determined, by the pre-existing intellectual, scientific, and social contexts into which Darwin's theories were inserted.
Two examples, France and Germany, can be elaborated upon. In France, Darwin's theory was received against the background of the prior debates over transformism of the 1830s that pitted the theories of Lamarck and Etienne Geoffroy St. Hilaire against Cuvier as discussed above in Section 2.6. These debates had been resolved, at least within official Parisian science, in favor of Cuvier's anti-transformism. Darwin was, as a consequence, viewed as involved in a tradition of rejected science by leading figures of French science. As the leading physiologist and methodologist of French Science, Claude Bernard (1813–78) put this in 1865, Darwin's theory was to be regarded with those of “a Goethe, an Oken, a Carus, a Geoffroy Saint Hilaire,” locating it within speculative philosophy of nature rather than granting it the status of genuine science (Bernard 1957, 1864, 91–92). The intellectual framework provided by the positive philosophy of Auguste Comte (1798–1857) also worked both for and against Darwin. On one hand, Comte's emphasis on the historical progress of science over superstition allowed Darwin to be summoned in support of a theory of the progress of science over religion, and the Origin was so utilized in the preface to the first French translation made by feminist Clémence Royer (Harvey 2008 in Engels and Glick 2008). On the other hand, the Comtean three stages view of history, with its claim about the historical transcendence of speculative and metaphysical periods of science by a final period of experimental science governed by determinate laws, placed Darwinism in a metaphysical phase of speculative nature philosophy, as captured in the Bernard quote above.
In the Germanies, Darwin's work entered a complex social, intellectual and political situation in the wake of the failed efforts to establish liberal democracy in 1848. By 1870, Darwinismus was involved in the so-called Kulturkampf that pitted Bismarck's government of the new Germany particularly against Roman Catholicism. The philosophical traditions of German Naturphilosophie, Romanticism, and the Idealism of Fichte and Hegel formed a fertile philosophical ground into which Darwin's developmental view of nature and theory of the transformation of species was often assimilated (R. J. Richards 2008, 2002).
Less concerned to relate Darwin to prior philosophical traditions, the first major interpreter of Darwin's theory for the German-speaking world, the paleontologist Heinrich Bronn (1800–62), was responsible for a sympathetic, but critical reading of Darwin that challenged his theory on substantial methodological and empirical points. These concerns then affected his important translation of the Origin in 1860 (Gliboff 2008, 2007).
On the other hand, the enthusiastic advocacy of Darwinism in Germany by University of Jena professor of zoology Ernst Heinrich Haeckel (1834–1919) made Darwinism a major player in the polarized political and religious disputes of Bimarckian Germany (R. J. Richards 2008). Through his polemical writings, such as the Natural History of Creation (1868), Anthropogeny (1874), and Riddle of the Universe (1895–99), Haeckel advocated a materialist monism in the name of Darwin, and used this as a stick with which to beat traditional religion. Much of the historical conflict between religious communities and evolutionary biology can be traced back to Haeckel's polemical writings, which went through numerous editions and translations, including several English and American editions that appeared into the early decades of the twentieth century.
Retaining his own conclusions on human evolution quietly in the background while the defense of his general theory had been conducted by advocates as diverse as Thomas Henry Huxley (1825–95) in England, Asa Gray (1810–88) in the United States, and Haeckel (1834–1919) in Germany, Darwin's position on the “human question” remained unclear, and his rhetorical situation of the text within a tradition of creation by secondary law retained in all editions of the Origin in some degree allowed many before 1872 to see Darwin as more open to religious views than those of some of his popularizers.
One cannot always distinguish between “popular” and “professional” receptions of Darwin, as the case of Ernst Haeckel vividly displays. The simplest solution is to confine the latter designation to the reception by people with professional research and teaching positions in universities and scientific societies, those intimately familiar with the empirical evidence and the technical scientific issues under debate in the 1860s in geology, comparative anatomy, embryology and classification theory. This group can usually be distinguished from lay interpreters who may not have made distinctions between the views of Lamarck, Chambers, Schelling, Spencer and Darwin on the historical development of life. This itself only gives a crude instrument of analysis, however. Haeckel displays this imprecision. He was a leading professor of zoology at an important German university (Jena) who formed a generation of scientific workers in embryology and natural history. From this position he was able to develop Darwinism both as a popular movement with social and political extensions, and also as a scientific research program that pursued the study of morphology and comparative embryology in the light of Darwin's general theory (R. J. Richards 2008, 1992, chp. 6; Nyhart 1995).
If we concentrate on the reception by workers with professional positions in museums, laboratories, and research and teaching positions in universities and membership in elite scientific societies, Darwin's reception was varied and the topic has formed the subject of complex interpretation (Bowler 1996; Pancaldi 1991; Hull et al 1978). Many prominent members of Darwin's immediate intellectual circle—Adam Sedgwick, William Whewell, Richard Owen, and Thomas Huxley— had previously been highly critical of Chambers's Vestiges in the 1840s for its speculative character and its scientific incompetence. Darwin himself feared a similar reception, and he recognized that his ability to convince this group and the larger community of scientific specialists, which included Joseph Hooker, Charles Lyell, and John Herschel and other international experts with whom he had corresponded widely, was a substantial challenge. With this group he was only partially successful.
Historical studies have revealed that only rarely did members of the scientific elites accept and develop Darwin's theories exactly as they were presented in his texts. Statistical studies on the reception by the scientific community in England in the first decade after the publication of the Origin have shown a complicated picture in which there was neither a wide-spread conversion of the scientific community to Darwin's views, nor a clear generational stratification between younger converts and older resisters, counter to Darwin's own predictions in the final chapter of the Origin (Hull et al., 1978). These studies also reveal a distinct willingness within the scientific community to separate acceptance of the broader claims of species descent with modification from common ancestors from the explanation of this descent through the action of natural selection (Bowler 1983). To utilize the categories of a Lakatosian “research program” analysis of scientific theories in their historical extension, one can distinguish between a “hard core” of central assumptions, a “protective belt” of auxiliary hypotheses that protect this central core from refutations, and a “positive heuristic” of applied research applications that are subject to continued revision and even refutation (Lakatos 1970 in Lakatos and Musgrave, 1970). With these distinctions in mind, it is difficult to claim that anything more than the belief in descent from common ancestry was maintained by a broadly international scientific community at the “hard core” level in the period between 1870–1930. This meant that the historical impact of Darwin's theories on the professional scientific community must consider the important deviations from his own formulations (Bowler 2003, 1983).
Of central importance in analyzing this complex professional reception was the role assigned to normal individual variation and its causes. In the initial public presentation of his theory, Darwin had relied on the novel claim that small individual variations—the kind of differences considered by an earlier tradition as merely “accidental”—formed the raw material upon which, by unlimited addition through the action of natural selection, major changes could be produced sufficient to explain the differences in all the various forms of life over time. The causes of this variation were, however, left unspecified by Darwin. Variation was presented simply as governed by “unknown laws.” In keeping with his commitment to the gradualism of Lyellian geology, Darwin also rejected the role of major “sports” or other sources of discontinuous change in this process.
As critics focused attack on the claim that such micro-differences between individuals could be accumulated over time without natural limits, Darwin began a series of modifications and revisions of the theory through a back and forth dialogue with his critics that can be followed by revisions to the text of the Origin. In the fourth edition of 1866, for example, Darwin inserted the claim that the continuous gradualism illustrated by the branching diagram, was misleading, and that transformative change does not necessarily go on continuously. “It is far more probable that each form remains for long periods unaltered, and then again undergoes modification” (Darwin 1866, as in Peckham 2006, 213). This change-stasis-change model presumably allowed variation to stabilize for a period of time around a mean value from which additional change could then resume. Such a model would, however, presumably require even more time for its working than the multi-millions of years assumed in original theory.
The difficulties in Darwin's arguments by 1866 were highlighted in a lengthy and telling critique of Darwin's theory in 1867 by the Scottish engineer Henry Fleeming Jenkin (1833–85). Using an argument previously raised in the 1830s by Charles Lyell against Lamarck, Fleeming (as he was generally known) Jenkin cited empirical evidence from domestic breeding that suggested a distinct limitation on the degree of variation, and denied that selection upon this could be taken to the extent assumed by Darwin(Jenkin 1867 in Hull, 1973). Using a loosely mathematical argument, Jenkin argued that the effects of intercrossing would continuously swamp deviations from the mean values of characters and result in a tendency of the variation in a population to return to mean values over time. For Jenkin, Darwin's reliance on continuous additive deviation was presumed undermined by this argument, and only more dramatic and discontinuous change—something Darwin explicitly rejected—could account for the origin of new species.
Jenkin also argued that the time needed by Darwin's theory was simply inadequate, supporting this claim by appeal to the physical calculations of the probable age of the earth presented in publications by Jenkins's mentor, the Glasgow physicist William Thompson (Lord Kelvin) (1824–1907) (Burchfield, 1975). On the basis of Thompson's quantitative arguments, Jenkin judged the time since the origins of the solar system to be insufficient for the Darwinian gradualist theory of species transformation to take place. Jenkin's multi-pronged argument gave Darwin considerable difficulties and set the stage for more detailed empirical inquiries into variation and its causes. The time difficulties were only resolved in the twentieth-century with the discovery of radioactivity.
As a solution to the variation question, Darwin developed his “provisional hypothesis” of pangenesis, which he presented the year after the appearance of the Jenkin review in his two-volume Variation of Plants and Animals Under Domestication (1868). Although this theory had been formulated independently of the Jenkin review (Olby 1962), in effect it functioned as his reply to Jenkin. This offered a causal theory of variation and inheritance through a return to a theory resembling Buffon's theory of the organic molecules of the previous century (see 2.5 above). Invisible material “gemmules” were presumed to exist within the cells, and according to theory, these were subject to possible external alteration by environment and circumstance. The gemmules were then shed continually into the blood stream (the “transport” hypothesis) and assembled by “mutual affinity into buds or into the sexual elements” (Darwin 1868, 1875, vol. 2, p. 370). In this form they were then transmitted—the details were not explained—by sexual generation to the next generation to form the new organism out of “units of which each individual is composed” (ibid.). In Darwin's view, this hypothesis united together numerous issues into a coherent and causal theory of inheritance and explained the basis of variation. It also explained how use-disuse inheritance, which Darwin never abandoned, could work.
This pangenesis theory, although not specifically referred to, seems to be behind an important distinction he inserted into the fifth edition of the Origin of 1869 where he made a direct reply to the criticisms of Fleeming Jenkin. In this textual revision, Darwin distinguished “certain rather strongly marked variations, which no one would rank as mere individual differences” from ordinary variations (Darwin 1869, in Peckham 2006, 178–179). This revision shifted his emphasis away from his early reliance on normal individual variation, and gave new status to what he now called “strongly marked” variation. The latter was now the form of variation to be given primary evolutionary significance, and presumably this was more likely to be transmitted to the offspring, although details are left unclear. In this form it presumably could be maintained in a population against the tendency to swamping by intercrossing. Darwin's struggles over this issue defined a set of problems that British life scientists in particular were to deal with into the 1930s. The debates over variation placed Darwinism in a defensive posture that forced its supporters into major revisions in the Darwinian research program (Gayon 1998; Vorzimmer 1970).
The publication of the Descent and Selection in Relation to Sex in 1871 created a watershed in the public reception of Darwin's views. Although Darwin had first worked out many of his views on human evolution in the early “M” and “N” Notebooks of 1838–40, his conclusions were kept quietly in the background while the debates over his general theory were taking place and Darwin's own views on human evolution remained unclear, with only one vague sentence on the issue in the Origin itself. The Descent, however, drew his more radical reflections to the fore, and seemed to many of his readers, even those previously sympathetic to the Origin, to throw Darwin's weight behind materialist and anti-religious forces spearheaded by such individuals as German physiologist Friederich Ludwig Büchner (1824–1899),Dutch physiologist Jacob Moleschott(1822–93, English socialist and Darwin popularizer Edward Aveling (1849–98), and Ernst Haeckel. Although the question of human evolution had already been dealt with in part by Thomas Huxley in the Man's Place in Nature of 1863, by Charles Lyell in the same year in his Geological Evidences of the Antiquity of Man, by Alfred Russel Wallace in articles in 1864 and 1870, and by Haeckel in his Natürliche Schöpfungsgeschichte of 1868, these authors had either not ventured to deal with the full range of questions presented by the inclusion of human beings in the evolutionary process (Huxley), or they had emphasized the moral and mental discontinuity between humans and animals (Lyell, Wallace). Only Haeckel had drawn out a more general reductive conception of humanity from evolutionary theory and he had not ventured into the specific issues of ethics, social organization, the origins of human races, and the relation of human mental properties to those of animals, all of which are dealt with in the Descent. This work presented, as one commentator has put it, “a closer resemblance to Darwin's early naturalistic vision than anything else he ever published” (Durant 1985 in Kohn 1985a, 294).
Darwin's extension of his theory to a range of questions traditionally discussed within philosophy, theology, and social and political theory, hardened the opposition of many religiously-based communities to evolutionary theory, although here again, distinctions must be made between different communities (Ellegard 1990, chp. 14). Such opposition was not simply based upon the denial of the literal scriptural account of the origins of humankind, an issue which played differently within different religious communions (Artigas, Glick, and Martinez 2006; Moore 1981). More fundamentally, this opposition was due to the denial of distinctions, other than those of degree, between fundamental human properties and those of animals. Furthermore, the apparent denial now of some kind of divine guidance in the processes behind human evolution and the non-teleological character of Darwin's final formulations of the natural selection theory in the later editions of the Origin, with its adoption as a synonym the phrase “survival of the fittest,” hardened this opposition. As a consequence, the favorable readings that many influential figures, such as John Henry Newman (1801–1890) had given to the Origin, could no longer be maintained. The rhetoric of the Descent, with its conclusion that “man is descended from a hairy quadruped, furnished with a tail and pointed ears,” presented to the public a different Darwin than many had associated with the author of the Journal of Researches and the early editions of the Origin.
Most striking in comparing the Origin to the Descent was the strong emphasis on the workings of the secondary process of sexual selection in the animal kingdom. Sexual selection—the selection of females by males or vice versa for breeding purposes—had played a minor role in the original argument of the Origin, and its importance was denied by contemporaries like A. R. Wallace. Darwin now developed this secondary form of selection in extensive detail as a factor in evolution that could even work against ordinary natural selection. Sexual selection could now be marshaled to explain both sexual dimorphism and also those character and properties of organisms—elaborate feeding organs, bright colors on fish and birds, seemingly maladaptive structures such as the great horn on the Rhinoceros beetle—, that would appear to be anomalous outcomes of ordinary natural selection working to the optimal survival of organisms in nature. And in a dramatic extension of this to human beings, the combination of natural and sexual selection explains the origins of the human beings from simian ancestors, the sexual dimorphism displayed by human beings, and the origin of human races.
The many dimensions of “social” Darwinism demand several separate articles. In this closing subsection the author will focus on one important aspect of this broader social impact of the Descent, the Darwinian treatment of ethics. This will be examined within its specific Victorian context, rather than in light of more recent discussions of altruism within contemporary sociobiology that may owe some filiation with these Darwinian discussion (see articles morality and evolutionary biology, biological altruism).
Darwin applied his theory to ethics in detail in chapter three of the Descent. In approaching ethics “exclusively from the side of natural history” (Descent 1981, 71), he offered some innovations that do not easily map on to standard ethical positions formulated around the familiar categories of Utilitarianism and the Kantian heritage of Deontology. The closest connections might be drawn with certain aspects of contemporary virtue ethics and some aspects of Natural Law theory, although there are many specific differences that prevent assimilation to these traditions as well (Sloan 1999 in Maienschein and Ruse 1999). His closest historical affinities are with the Scottish moral sense tradition of Adam Smith, David Hume, and particularly as this was developed in the writings of Darwin's distant relative, Sir James Macintosh (1765–1832) (R. J. Richards 2009 in Hodge and Radick 2009; idem. 1999 in Maienschein and Ruse 1999, idem. 1987).
Traditional moral sense theory linked ethical behavior to an innate property or instinct that was considered universal in human beings, even though it required education and cultivation to reach its highest expression. This inherent property, or “moral sense,” presumably explained such phenomena as ethical conscience, and it also accounted for altruistic actions that could not be reduced to a hedonic seeking of pleasure and avoiding pain. It also did not involve the rational calculation of advantage.
As Darwin reinterpreted the moral sense tradition within his evolutionary framework, however, this implied important transformations. The moral sense, for Darwin, was derived by biological descent from animal instinct, and particularly from the social instincts developed by natural selection. From this perspective, Darwin could then argue for a genuine “homology” of ethical foundations holding between humans and animals, with the precursors of human ethical behavior found in the behavior of other animals, particularly those with social organization. Natural and sexual selection then shaped these ethical instincts in ways that favored group survival rather than immediate individual benefit (Darwin 1981, 1871, 98). Human ethical behavior is therefore grounded in a natural property, and ethical action can occur without moral calculus or rational deliberation. Because it was considered to be innate property, Darwin criticized John Stuart Mill's Utilitarian theory because it relied on acquired habits rather than something present in humans from the beginning (ibid. 71n5. This is his explanation for self-sacrifice and other altruistic acts that cannot be attributed to individual self-survival (ibid. 86). Humans can be “impelled by the same instinctive motive, which made the heroic little American monkey…attack the great and dreaded baboon, to save his keeper” (ibid., 87).
When moral conflict occurs, this is generally attributed to a conflict of instincts, with the stronger of two conflicting instincts favored by natural selection insofar as it favors group benefit (ibid., 84). In human beings the “more enduring Social Instincts” thus come to override the less persistent “individual” instincts (ibid., 87).
The adequacy of this as a foundation for ethical realism was point of contention for Darwin's contemporaries and successors. For some moral philosophers, Darwin had simply reduced ethics to a property subject to the relativizing tendencies of natural selection (Farber 1994, chp. 5). It was, in the view of Darwin's philosophical critics, to reduce ethics to biology and in doing to offer no way to distinguish ethical goods from survival advantages. Not even for some strong supporters of Darwinism, such as Thomas Huxley and Alfred Russel Wallace, was Darwin's account adequate (ibid, chp. 4). Much of subsequent moral philosophy, building upon the canonical acceptance of the “is-ought” distinction developed from this critique. Receiving its most influential expression by G. E. Moore (1873–1958) in his Principia Ethica of 1905—itself an attack on Spencer's version of evolutionary ethics—, the debate over evolutionary ethics has continued (Hauser 2006; Katz 2002; Maienschein and Ruse 1999).
The long historical scenario summarized in the present entry has sought to display the complexity of evolutionary theory as an historical phenomenon. This survey has intended to display a family of theoretical efforts to integrate the history of life and the history of the world together in naturalistic terms, involving issues of natural philosophy, epistemology, anthropology, ethical theory, theology, and empirical science in shifting relations. The historiography adopted in this article rejects a simple linear story of the development of increasingly true theories leading to a present consensus, but instead favors a more complicated “competing research programs” analysis (Lakatos 1970), programs which through historical competition have resulted in more adequate accounts of the relation of living beings to historical time and naturalistic processes. The intentional period limits of this article require additional articles to deal with the complex period after 1870 and the origins of contemporary evolutionary theory including those cross-referenced in this encyclopedia. The more general philosophical issues associated with evolutionary theory—those surrounding natural teleology, ethics, the relation of evolutionary naturalism to the claims of religious traditions, the implications for the relation of human beings to the rest of the organic world—continue as issues of debate. If contemporary neo-selectionist evolutionary theory displays continuity with select features of the theories of Darwin, alternative interpretations, such as the current movement known as evolutionary developmental theory or “evo-devo,” mark a return to presumably discarded traditions of the nineteenth and twentieth century that considered it essential to link evolution with embryonic development (Laubichler and Maienschein 2007; Gilbert, Opitz and Raff 1996). These interests also can claim filiation with Darwin's original insights. Such developments suggest that there are still substantial theoretical issues at stake that may alter the future understanding of evolutionary theory in important ways.
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- The Complete Works of Charles Darwin Online, maintained by John van Wyhe, Cambridge University Library.
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The author wishes to acknowledge the valuable comments on this article from David Depew, Michael Ruse, Edward Zalta, and the anonymous reviewers for the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.