First published Mon Aug 16, 2010; substantive revision Wed Jun 1, 2022

The first centuries after Śākyamuni Buddha’s death saw the rise of multiple schools of thought and teacher lineages within the Buddhist community as it spread throughout the Indian subcontinent. These new forms of scholarly monastic communities had distinct theoretical and practical interests and, in their efforts to organize, interpret, and reexamine the Buddha’s scattered teachings, they developed a particular system of thought and method of exposition called Abhidharma (Pali, Abhidhamma). The Sanskrit term abhidharma seems to derive from the expression “concerning (abhi) the teaching(s) (Skt., dharma, Pali, dhamma).” For the Buddhist exegetical tradition, however, the term means approximately “higher” or “further” teaching, and it refers both to the doctrinal investigations of the new scholastic movement and to the body of texts yielded by its systematic exposition of Buddhist thought. This body of literature includes the third of the “three baskets” (Skt., tripiṭaka, Pali, tipiṭaka) of the Buddhist canon, namely, the Abhidharma-piṭaka (Pali, Abhidhamma-piṭaka), its commentaries, and later exegetical texts.

Both as an independent literary genre and a branch of thought and inquiry, Abhidharma is to be contrasted with Sūtrānta, the system of the Buddha’s discourses (Skt., sūtras, Pali, suttas). Unlike the earlier Buddhist discourses that are colloquial in nature, the Abhidharma method presents the Buddha’s teachings in technical terms that are carefully defined to ensure analytical exactitude. In content, Abhidharma is distinctive in its efforts to provide the theoretical counterpart to the Buddhist practice of meditation and, more broadly, a systematic account of sentient experience. It does so by analyzing conscious experience—and in this sense one’s “world”—into its constituent mental and physical events (Skt., dharmā, Pali, dhammā, hereafter dharmas/dhammas respectively). The overarching inquiry subsuming both the analysis of dharmas into multiple categories and their synthesis into a unified structure by means of their manifold relationships of causal conditioning is referred to as the “dharma theory.” The exhaustive investigations into the nature and interaction of dharmas extended into the fields of metaphysics, epistemology, and ontology, and generated doctrinal controversies among different Buddhist schools. The Abhidharma analysis of and methods of argumentation about these controversies provided the framework of reference and defined the agenda for the Mahāyāna schools of Madhyamaka and Yogācāra. As a distinct doctrinal movement, then, Abhidharma had a remarkable impact on subsequent Buddhist thought and gave rise to Buddhist systematic philosophy and hermeneutics.

1. Abhidharma: its origins and texts

The early history of Buddhism in India is remarkably little known and the attempt to construct a consistent chronology of that history still engrosses the minds of contemporary scholars. A generally accepted tradition has it that some time around the beginning of the third century BCE, the primitive Buddhist community divided into two parties or fraternities: the Sthaviras (Pali, Theriyas) and the Mahāsāṅghikas, each of which thenceforth had its own ordination traditions. Throughout the subsequent two centuries or so, doctrinal disputes arose between these two parties, resulting in the formation of various schools of thought (vāda; ācariyavāda) and teacher lineages (ācariyakula) (Vin 51–54; Mhv V 12–13. See Cousins 1991, 27–28; Frauwallner 1956, 5ff & 130ff; Lamotte 1988, 271ff; Wynne 2019, 269–283).

According to traditional Buddhist accounts, by the time the Mahāyāna doctrines arose, roughly in the first century BCE, there were eighteen sub-sects or schools of Sthaviras, the tradition ancestral to the Theravāda (“advocates of the doctrine of the elders”). The number eighteen, though, became conventional in Buddhist historiography for symbolic and mnemonic reasons (Obeyesekere 1991) and, in fact, different Buddhist sources preserve divergent lists of schools which sum up to more than eighteen. The likelihood is that the early formative period of the Buddhist community gave rise to multiple intellectual branches that developed spontaneously due to the geographical extension of the community over the entire Indian subcontinent and subject to the particular problems that confronted each monastic community (saṅgha). Each saṅgha tended to specialize in a specific branch of learning, had its own practical customs and relations with lay circles, and was influenced by the particular territories, economy, and use of language and dialect prevalent in its environment. Indeed, the names of the “eighteen schools” are indicative of their origins in characteristic doctrines, geographical locations, or the legacy of particular founders: for instance, Sarvāstivāda (“advocates of the doctrine that all things exist”), Sautrāntikas (“those who rely on the sūtras”)/Dārṣṭāntikas (“those who employ examples”),[1] and Pudgalavāda (“those who affirm the existence of the person”); Haimavatas (“those of the snowy mountains”); or Vātsīputrīyas (“those affiliated with Vātsīputra”) respectively. As noted by Gethin (1998, 52), rather than sects or denominations as in Christianity, “at least some of the schools mentioned by later Buddhist tradition are likely to have been informal schools of thought in the manner of ‘Cartesians,’ ‘British Empiricists,’ or ‘Kantians’ for the history of modern philosophy.”[2]

It is customarily assumed that the multiple ancient Buddhist schools transmitted their own versions of Abhidharma collections, but only two complete canonical collections are preserved, representing two schools: the Sarvāstivāda, who emerged as an independent school from within the Sthaviras around the second or first century BCE, became dominant in north, especially northwest India, and spread to central Asia; and the Sinhalese Theravāda, a branch of the Sthaviras that spread out in south India and parts of southeast Asia. These two extant collections comprise the third of the “three baskets” (Skt., tripiṭaka, Pali, tipiṭaka) of the Buddhist canon. The exegetical traditions of the Sarvāstivāda and Theravāda understand their respective canonical Abhidharma to consist of a set of seven texts, though each school specifies a different set of texts. The Sarvāstivādin Abhidharma-piṭaka consists of the Saṅgītiparyāya (Discourse on the Collective Recitation), the Dharmaskandha (Compendium of Dharmas), the Prajñaptiśāstra (Manual of Concepts), the Vijñānakāya (Compendium of Consciousness), the Dhātukāya (Compendium of Elements), the Prakaraṇapāda (Literary Exposition), and the Jñānaprasthāna (The Foundation of Knowledge). These seven texts survive in full only in their ancient Chinese translations. The Theravādin Abhidhamma-piṭaka comprises the Dhammasaṅgaṇi (Enumeration of Dhammas), the Vibhaṅga (Analysis), the Dhātukathā (Discourse on Elements), the Puggalapaññatti (Designation of Persons), the Kathāvatthu (Points of Discussion), the Yamaka (Pairs), and the Paṭṭhāna (Causal Conditions). These seven texts are preserved in Pali and all but the Yamaka have been translated into English.

Later generations composed commentaries on the canonical Abhidharma and introduced a variety of exegetical manuals that expound the essentials of the canonical systems. These post-canonical texts are the products of single authors and display fully developed polemical stances and sectarian worldviews of their respective schools. Much of the Theravāda Abhidhamma system is contained in Buddhaghosa’s comprehensive Visuddhimagga (The Path of Purification, fifth century CE). More direct introductory Abhidhamma manuals are Buddhadatta’s Abhidhammāvatāra (Introduction to Abhidhamma, fifth century CE) and Anuruddha’s Abhidhammatthasaṅgaha (Compendium of the Topics of Abhidhamma, twelfth century CE). The Sarvāstivāda tradition preserves in Chinese translation three different recensions of an authoritative Abhidharma commentary or vibhāṣā dated to the first or second century CE, the last and best known of which is called the Mahāvibhāṣā. The vibhāṣā compendia document several centuries of scholarly activity representing multiple Sarvāstivāda branches, most notably the Sarvāstivādins of Kashmir who are known as Sarvāstivāda-Vaibhāṣika. The Sarvāstivāda manual most influential for later Chinese and Tibetan Buddhism, however, is Vasubandhu’s Abhidharmakośa (Treasury of Abhidharma, fifth century CE). The Abhidharmakośa’s auto-commentary contains substantial criticism of orthodox Sarvāstivāda positions, which later Sarvāstivāda-Vaibhāṣika masters attempted to refute. Particularly famous in this category is the Nyāyānusāra (Conformance to Correct Principle) of Saṅghabhadra, a contemporary of Vasubandhu. This comprehensive treatise reestablishes orthodox Sarvāstivāda views and is considered one of the final Sarvāstivāda works to have survived.[3]

In sum, the Abhidharma/Abhidhamma texts are by and large compositions contemporary with the formative period in the history of the early Buddhist schools, providing the means by which one group could define itself and defend its position against the divergent interpretations and criticisms of other parties. Although much of the Abhidharma mindset and something of its method draw on the Āgamas/Nikāyas, i.e., the collections of sūtras (Pali, suttas), the main body of its literature contains interpretations of the Buddha’s discourses specific to each school of thought and philosophical elaborations of selectively emphasized doctrinal issues. These continued to be refined by subsequent generations of monks who contributed to the consolidation of the two surviving Theravāda and Sarvāstivāda schools.

1.1 Literary style and genre

Scholarly opinion has generally been divided between two alternative interpretations of the term abhidharma, both of which hinge upon the denotation of the prefix abhi. First, taking abhi in the sense of “with regard to,” abhidharma is understood as a discipline whose subject matter is the Dharma, the Buddha’s teachings. Second, using abhi in the sense of preponderance and distinction, abhidharma has also been deemed a distinct, higher teaching; the essence of the Buddha’s teachings or that which goes beyond what is given in the Buddha’s discourses, in a sense somewhat reminiscent of the term “metaphysics” (e.g., Dhs-a 2–3; Horner 1941; von Hinüber 1994). Buddhist tradition itself differentiates between the Sūtrānta and Abhidharma methods of instructing the teachings by contrasting the Sūtrānta “way of putting things” in partial, figurative terms that require further clarification, versus the Abhidharma exposition and catechism that expound the teachings fully, in non-figurative terms (A IV 449–456; Dhs-a 154). This coincides with additional distinctions the tradition makes between texts that have implicit meaning (Skt., neyārtha, Pali, neyyattha) versus those that have explicit meaning (Skt., nītārtha, Pali nītattha) (A I 60; Ps I 18), and texts that are expressed in conventional terms (Skt., saṃvṛti, Pali, sammuti) versus others that are expressed in ultimate terms (Skt., paramārtha, Pali, paramattha) (Vibh 100–101; Mp I 94–97).[4] From Abhidharma perspective, the sūtras were conveyed in conventional terms whose ultimate meaning required further interpretation.

The texts of the canonical Abhidharma are works that evolved over decades, if not centuries, out of materials already present in the Sūtra and Vinaya portions of the canon. This is evidenced in two characteristics of the genre that can be traced to earlier Buddhist literature. The first is the analytical style of the texts, which attempt to summarize meticulously the significant points of the Dharma and provide a comprehensive taxonomy of the mental and physical factors that constitute sentient experience. This analytical enterprise includes the arrangement of major parts of the material around detailed lists of factors and combinations of sets of their categories yielding matrices (Skt., mātṛkā, Pali, mātikā) of doctrinal topics. Already in the collections of the Buddha’s discourses, certain texts are arranged according to taxonomic lists, providing formulaic treatment of doctrinal items that are expounded elsewhere. Lists were clearly powerful mnemonic devices, and their prevalence in early Buddhist literature can be explained partly as a consequence of its being composed and for some centuries preserved orally.[5] For instance, one of the four primary Āgamas/Nikāyas, the collection of “grouped” sayings (saṃyukta/saṃyutta), groups the Buddha’s teachings according to specific topics, including the four noble truths, the four ways of establishing mindfulness, the five aggregates, the six sense faculties, the seven constituents of awakening, the noble eightfold path, the twelve links of dependent origination, and others. Similar taxonomic lists form the table of contents of the Vibhaṅga and Puggalapaññatti of the Theravāda and the Saṅgītiparyāya and Dharmaskandha of the Sarvāstivāda, which are structured as commentaries on those lists.

The second characteristic of Abhidharma literature is its bent for discursive hermeneutics through catechetical exposition. The texts seem to be the products of discussions about the doctrine within the early Buddhist community. Again, such discussions are already found in the Āgama/Nikāya collections (e.g., M I 292–305, III 202–257): they often begin with a doctrinal point to be clarified and proceed to expound the topic at stake using a pedagogical method of question and answer. The texts also record more formal methods of argumentation and refutation of rival theories that shed light on the evolution of the Abhidharma as responding to the demands of an increasingly polemical environment. The process of institutionalization undergone by Buddhist thought at the time and the spread of the Buddhist community across the Indian subcontinent coincided with a transition from oral to written methods of textual transmission and with the rise of monastic debates concerning the doctrine among the various Buddhist schools. Intellectual assimilation and doctrinal disputes also existed between the Buddhist monastic community and the contemporaneous Sanskrit Grammarians, Jains, and Brahmanical schools with their evolving scholastic and analytical movements, which must also have contributed to the Abdhidharma discursive hermeneutics and argumentative style. The dialectic format and the display of awareness of differences in doctrinal interpretation are the hallmarks of the Kathāvatthu and the Vijñānakāya. Later on, post-canonical Abhidharma texts became complex philosophical treatises employing sophisticated methods of argumentation and independent investigations that resulted in doctrinal conclusions quite far removed from their canonical antecedents.

Abhidharma literature, then, arose from two approaches to discussing the Dharma within the early Buddhist community: the first intended to summarize and analyze the significant points of the Buddha’s teachings, the second to elaborate on and interpret the doctrines by means of monastic disputations (Bronkhorst 2016, 29–46; Cousins 1983, 10; Dessein 2016, 4–7; Gethin 1992b, 165; Gethin 2022, 227–242).

1.2 Abhidharma exegesis: from Dharma to dharmas

The Buddha’s discourses collected in the Āgamas/Nikāyas analyze sentient experience from different standpoints: in terms of name-and-form (nāma-rūpa), the five aggregates (Skt., skandha, Pali, khandha), the twelve sense fields (āyatana), or the eighteen sense elements (dhātu). All these modes of analysis provide descriptions of sentient experience as a succession of physical and mental processes that arise and cease subject to various causes and conditions. A striking difference between the Sūtrānta and the Abhidharma worldviews is that the Abhidharma reduces the time scale of these processes so they are now seen as operating from moment to moment. Put differently, the Abhidharma reinterprets the terms by which the sūtras portray sequential processes as applying to discrete, momentary events (Cousins 1983, 7; Ronkin 2005, 66–78).

These events are referred to as dharmas (Pali, dhammas), differently from the singular dharma/dhamma that signifies the Buddha’s teaching(s). The Āgamas/Nikāyas use the form dharmas to convey a pluralistic representation of encountered phenomena, i.e., all sensory phenomena of whatever nature as we experience them through the six sense faculties (the five ordinary physical senses plus mind [manas]). The canonical Abhidharma treatises, however, draw subtle distinctions within the scope of the mental and marginalize the differences between multiple varieties of mental capacities. Within this context, dharmas are seen as the objects of a specific mental capacity called mental cognitive awareness (Skt., manovijñāṇa, Pali, manoviññāṇa) that is considered the central cognitive operation in the process of sensory perception. Mental cognitive awareness is a particular type of consciousness that discerns between the stimuli impinging upon the sense faculties and that emerges when the requisite conditions come together. Dharmas are not merely mental objects like ideas, concepts, or memories. Rather, as the objects of mental cognitive awareness, dharmas may be rendered apperceptions: rapid consciousness-types (citta) that arise and cease in sequential streams, each having its own object, and that interact with the five externally directed sensory modalities (visual, auditory, etc.) of cognitive awareness. The canonical Abhidharma texts portray dharmas, then, as psycho-physical events with diverse capacities by means of which the mind unites and assimilates a particular perception, especially one newly presented, to a larger set or mass of ideas already possessed, thus comprehending and conceptualizing it.[6]

Ultimately, dharmas are all that there is: all experiential events are understood as arising from the interaction of dharmas. While the analogy of atoms may be useful here, dharmas notably embrace both physical and mental phenomena, and are generally understood as evanescent events, occurrences, or dynamic properties rather than enduring substances.[7] The Abhidharma exegesis thus attempts to provide an exhaustive account of every possible type of experience—every type of occurrence that may possibly present itself in one’s consciousness—in terms of its constituent dharmas. This enterprise involves breaking down the objects of ordinary perception into their constituent, discrete dharmas and clarifying their relations of causal conditioning. The overarching inquiry subsuming both the analysis of dharmas into multiple categories and their synthesis into a unified structure by means of their manifold relationships of causal conditioning is referred to as the “dharma theory.”

2. The dharma taxonomy: a metaphysics of experience

The Abhidharma attempts to individuate and determine the unique identity of each dharma yield complex intersecting taxonomies of dharmas organized by multiple criteria or sets of qualities. Abhidharma texts of different schools proposed different dharma taxonomies, enumerating a more or less finite number of dharma categories. It is important to remember, though, that the term dharma signifies both any category that represents a type of occurrence as well as any of its particular tokens or instances. The Theravāda introduced a system of eighty-two dhamma categories, meaning that there are eighty-two possible types of occurrence in the experiential world, not eighty-two occurrences. These are organized into a fourfold categorization. The first three categories include the bare phenomenon of consciousness (citta) that encompasses a single dhamma type and of which the essential characteristic is the cognizing of an object; associated mentality (cetasika) that encompasses fifty-two dhammas; and materiality or physical phenomena (rūpa) that include twenty-eight dhammas that make up all physical occurrences (Abhidh-av 1). All the eighty-one dhamma types in these three broad categories are conditioned (saṅkhata). Conditioned dhammas arise and cease subject to numerous causes and conditions and constitute sentient experience in all realms of the round of rebirth (saṃsāra).[8] The eighty-second dhamma that comprises the fourth category is unconditioned (asaṅkhata): it neither arises nor ceases through causal interaction. The single occurrence in this fourth category is nirvana (Pali, nibbāna).

The Sarvāstivāda adopted a system of seventy-five basic types of dharmas organized into a fivefold categorization. The first four categories comprise all conditioned (saṃskṛta) dharmas and include, again, consciousness (citta, one single dharma); associated mentality (caitta, encompasses forty-six dharmas); and physical phenomena (rūpa, eleven dharmas); but also factors dissociated from thought (cittaviprayuktasaṃskāra, fourteen dharmas). The last category is mentioned neither in the sūtras nor in the Theravāda lists, but is found predominantly in northern Indian Abhidharma texts of all periods. The specific dharmas included within it vary, but they are all understood as explaining a range of experiential events, being themselves dissociated from both material form and thought. The fifth category in the Sarvāstivāda taxonomy, that of the unconditioned (asaṃskṛta), comprises three dharmas, namely, space and two states of cessation (nirodha), the latter being a term that connotes the culmination of the Buddhist path (Cox 1995; 2004A, 553–554).

The Abhidharma analyzes in great detail each of these categories, thus creating relational schemata whereby each acknowledged experience, phenomenon, or occurrence can be determined and identified by particular definition and function. Especially important is the analysis of consciousness or citta, on which much of Abhidharma doctrinal thought is built. Consider the Theravāda analysis of consciousness, whose basic principles are shared with the other Abhidharma systems.

The epitome of the operation of consciousness is citta as experienced in the process of sensory perception that, in Abhidharma (as in Buddhism in general), is deemed the paradigm of sentient experience. Citta can never be experienced as bare consciousness in its own origination moment, for consciousness is always intentional, directed to a particular object that is cognized by means of certain mental factors. Citta, therefore, always occurs associated with its appropriate cetasikas or mental factors that perform diverse functions and that emerge and cease together with it, having the same object (either sensuous or mental) and grounded in the same sense faculty. Any given consciousness moment—also signified by the very term citta—is thus a unique assemblage of citta and its associated mental factors such as feeling, conceptualization, volition, or attention, to name several of those required in any thought process. Each assemblage is conscious of just one object, arises for a brief instant and then falls away, followed by another citta combination that picks up a different object by means of its particular associated mental factors.

The classic Abhidhamma scheme as gleaned from the first book of the Abhidhamma-piṭaka, the Dhammasaṅgaṇi, and as organized by the commentarial tradition describes eighty-nine basic types of consciousness moments, i.e., assemblages of citta and cetasika (Dhs Book I; Vism XIV 81–110; Abhidh-av 1–15; Abhidh-s 1–5). It classifies these basic citta types most broadly according to their locus of occurrence, beginning with the sense-sphere (kāmāvacara) that includes forty-five citta types, most prominently those that concern the mechanics of perception of sensuous objects; next come eighteen form-sphere (rūpāvacara) consciousnesses that concern the mind that has attained meditative absorption (jhāna); followed by eight formless-sphere (arūpāvacara) consciousnesses that constitute the mind that has reached further meditative attainments known as formless states; finally, there are eighteen world-transcending (lokuttara) consciousnesses that constitute the mind at the moment of awakening itself: these have nirvana as their object. Within these four broad categories many other classifications operate. For instance, some dhammas are wholesome, others unwholesome; some are resultant, others are not; some are motivated, others are without motivations. These attribute matrices, writes Cox (2004A, 552), form “an abstract web of all possible conditions and characteristics exhibited by actually occurring dharmas. The individual character of any particular dharma can then be specified in accordance with every taxonomic possibility, resulting in a complete assessment of that dharma’s range of possible occurrences.”

Various scholars have argued that this system reflects a dynamic conception of dharmas: that Abhidharma understands dharmas as properties, activities, or patterns of interconnection that construct one’s world, not as static substances (e.g., Cox 2004A, 549ff; Gethin 1992A, 149–150; Karunadasa 2010, Ch. 4; Nyanaponika 1998, Ch. 2 & 4; Ronkin 2005, Ch. 4; Waldron 2002, 2–16). The Abhidharma lists of dharmas are “explicitly open” and reflect “a certain reluctance and hesitancy to say categorically that such and such is the definitive list of dharmas” (Gethin 2017, 252), leaving room for continued debates about what is and is not a dharma. For the Abhidharma, as for Buddhism in general, the limits of one’s world are set by the limits of one’s lived experience, and the causal foundation for lived experience is the operation of one’s cognitive apparatus. According to the Buddhist path, the nature of lived experience as based on one’s cognitive apparatus is to be contemplated by investigating the very nature of one’s mind through the practice of meditation. From this perspective, Abhidharma represents the theoretical counterpart to the practice of meditation. Within this context of Buddhist practice, dharmas are distinct (but interrelated) functions, energies, or causally significant aspects—in this sense “components”—of consciousness moments.

The categorial analysis of dharmas is therefore a meditative practice of discernment of dharmas: it is not intended as a closed inventory of all existing dharmas “out there” in their totality, but rather “has a dual soteriological purpose involving two simultaneous processes” (Cox 2004A, 551). First, as “evaluative” analysis, the dharma typology maps out the constituents and workings of the mind and accounts for what makes up ordinary wholesome consciousness as opposed to the awakened mind. For instance, consciousness types that arise in a mind that has attained meditative absorption become increasingly refined and may never involve certain tendencies or defilements that might potentially occur in ordinary (even wholesome) consciousness. To watch dharmas as dharmas, writes Gethin (2004, 536), “involves watching how they arise and disappear, how the particular qualities that one wants to abandon can be abandoned, and how the particular qualities that one wants to develop can be developed. Watching dhammas in this way one begins to understand […] certain truths (sacca)—four to be exact—about these dhammas: their relation to suffering, its arising, its ceasing and the way to its ceasing. And in seeing these four truths one realizes the ultimate truth—dhamma—about the world.”[9]

The second, “descriptive” soteriological process involved in the categorization of dharmas reveals the fluid nature of sentient experience and validates the fundamental Buddhist teaching of not-self (Skt., anātman, Pali, anatta). The increasingly detailed enumerations of dharmas demonstrate that no essence or independent self could be found in any phenomenon or its constituents, since all aspects of experience are impermanent, arising and passing away subject to numerous causes and conditions. Even the handful dharmas that are categorized as unconditioned (that is, having no cause and no effect) are shown to be not-self. The practice of the discrimination of dharmas thus undermines the apparently solid world we emotionally and intellectually grasp at that is replete with objects of desire and attachment. “Try to grasp the world of the Dhammasaṅgaṇi, or the Paṭṭhāna,” Gethin notes (1992B, 165), “and it runs through one’s fingers.”

Nevertheless, the very notion of the plurality of dharmas as the building blocks or the final units of analysis of sentient experience signifies a considerable shift in the Buddhist understanding of dharma. Abhidharma thought was gradually drawn into espousing a naturalistic explanation of dharmas as the fundamental constituents of the phenomenal world, increasingly associating dharmas as primary existents. The category of the unconditioned within the dharma taxonomy also asserted the possibility of enduring or permanent dharmas, in contrast to all other dharmas that arise and cease through causal interaction. The Abhidharma exegesis, then, occasioned among Buddhist circles doctrinal controversies that could be termed ontological around such issues as what the nature of a dharma is; what, in the internal constitution of a dharma, makes it the very particular it is; the manner of existence of dharmas; the dynamics of their causal interaction; and the nature of the reality they constitute. The distinctive principles and their ensuing ontological interpretations constructed by the Buddhist schools were largely shaped by a radical construal of impermanence as momentariness.

3. Time: from impermanence to momentariness

Both the Sarvāstivāda and the post-canonical Theravāda constructed a radical doctrine of momentariness (Skt., kṣāṇavāda, Pali, khāṇavāda) that atomizes phenomena temporally by dissecting them into a succession of discrete, momentary events that pass out of existence as soon as they have originated. Albeit not a topic in its own right in the Buddha’s discourses, the doctrine of momentariness appears to have originated in conjunction with the principle of impermanence (Skt., anitya, Pali, anicca). This idea is basic to the Buddha’s empirically-oriented teaching about the nature of sentient experience: all physical and mental phenomena are in a constant process of conditioned construction and are interconnected, being dependently originated (e.g., A I 286; M I 230, 336, 500; S II 26, III 24–5, 96–9, IV 214). The Suttanta elaboration on these three interlocking ideas results in a formula (A I 152) that states that conditioned phenomena (Skt., saṃskārā, Pali, saṅkhārā) are of the nature of origination (uppāda), “change of what endures” (ṭhitassa aññathatta), and dissolution or cessation (vaya). This formula is known as the “three characteristics of what is conditioned” (tisaṅkhatalakkhaṇa). The Sarvāstivāda-Vaibhāṣika introduced four characteristics of conditioned phenomena: origination, endurance, decay, and dissolution. These are classified under the dharma category of “factors dissociated from thought.”

The Buddhist schools used the characteristics of conditioned phenomena as a hermeneutic tool with which to reinterpret impermanence in terms of momentariness. The Sarvāstivāda-Vaibhāṣika proposed a fully-fledged doctrine of momentariness according to which all physical and mental phenomena are momentary. The Sarvāstivādins use the term “moment” (kṣaṇa) in a highly technical sense as the smallest, definite unit of time that cannot be subdivided, the length of which came to be equated with the duration of mental events as the briefest conceivable entities. There is no Sarvāstivādin consensus on the length of a moment, but the texts indicate figures between 0.13 and 13 milliseconds in modern terms (Gethin 1998, 221; von Rospatt 1995, 94–110). This usage presupposes an atomistic conception of time, for time is not reckoned indefinitely divisible. Indeed, the term kṣaṇa is often discussed in juxtaposition to the concepts of material atoms and syllables, which are likewise comprehended as indivisible.

Within the Sarvāstivāda framework, material reality (rūpa-dharma) is reduced to discrete momentary atoms, and much attention is drawn to ontological and epistemological questions such as whether sense objects are real at any time, or whether atoms contribute separately or collectively to the generation of perception. Atomic reality is understood as constantly changing: what appears to us as a world made up of enduring substances with changing qualities is, in fact, a series of moments that arise and perish in rapid succession. This process is not random, but operates in accordance with the specific capability and function of each atom. The spirit of this atomistic analysis of material reality applies equally to mental reality: consciousness is understood as a succession of discrete consciousness moments that arise and cease extremely rapidly.[10] Thus, the ratio of change between material and mental phenomena in any given moment is one to one: they occur in perfect synchronicity (Kim 1999, 54). On this point the Sautrāntika agreed with the Sarvāstivāda.

The Sarvāstivādins (“advocates of the doctrine that all things exist”) were unique in their stance that the characteristics of conditioned phenomena exist separately as real entities within each moment. Their claim, then, is that all conditioned dharmas—whether past, present, or future—exist as real entities (dravyatas) within the span of any given moment. This induced a host of problems, one of which is that the Sarvāstivāda definition of a moment is difficult to reconcile with its conception as the shortest unit of time (von Rospatt 1995, 44–46 & 97–98). The Sarvāstivāda replies to this criticism by stating that the activities (kāritra) of the four characteristics of conditioned phenomena are sequential: the limits between the birth and dissolution of any event are referred to as one moment. This solution, however, implies that a single event undergoes four phases within a given moment, which inevitably infringes upon its momentariness (Cox 1995, 151; von Rospatt 1995, 52ff).

The Theravādins created their own distinct version of the doctrine of momentariness. They do not seem to have been as concerned as the Sarvāstivādins with the ontology and epistemology of material and mental realities per se. Rather, they were more preoccupied with the psychological apparatus governing the process of cognizing of sense data, and hence with the changing ratio between material and mental phenomena. The Yamaka of the canonical Abhidhamma offers what is probably the first textual occurrence of the term “moment” (khaṇa) in the sense of a very brief stretch of time that is divided into origination and cessation instants (Kim 1999, 60–61). Relying on the three characteristics of conditioned phenomena, the Pali commentaries later present a scheme wherein each moment of every phenomenon is subdivided into three different instants of origination (uppādakkhaṇa), endurance (ṭhitikkhaṇa) and cessation (bhaṅgakkhaṇa) (Spk II 266; Mp II 252). These are three phases of a single momentary phenomenon defined as one single dhamma or consciousness moment. A dhamma occurs in the first sub-moment, endures in the second, and ceases in the third (Karunadasa 2010, 234ff). The commentarial tradition thus analyzes phenomena temporally by dissecting them into a succession of discrete, momentary events that fall away as soon as they have originated in consciousness. As one event is exhausted, it conditions a new event of its kind that proceeds immediately afterwards. The result is an uninterrupted, flowing continuum (santāna) of causally connected momentary events. These succeed each other so fast that we conceive of the phenomena they constitute as temporally extended.

The Theravādins use the term khaṇa as the expression for a brief instant, the dimension of which is not fixed but may be determined by the context. For example, cittakkhaṇa refers to the instant taken by one mental event. In this basic sense as denoting a very brief stretch of time, the term “moment” does not entail an atomistic conception of a definite and ultimate, smallest unit of time, but leaves open the possibility that time is infinitely divisible (von Rospatt 1995, 59–60 & 94–95). Here the three moments of origination, endurance, and cessation do not correspond to three different entities. Rather, they represent three phases of a single momentary phenomenon and are defined as one single consciousness moment: a dhamma occurs in the first sub-moment, endures in the second sub-moment and perishes in the third one. In this way, the Theravādins avoided some of the difficulties faced by the Sarvāstivāda-Vaibhāṣikas, of how to compress the characteristics of the conditioned into one single indivisible moment and of how to account for their ontological status. The Theravādins also claimed that only mental phenomena are momentary, whereas material phenomena (e.g., common-sense objects) endure for a stretch of time. The Theravādin commentarial tradition subsequently elaborated on this proposition and produced a unique view of the ratio between material and mental phenomena, asserting that a material phenomenon lasts for sixteen or seventeen consciousness moments (Kv 620; Vibh-a 25–28; Vism XX 24–26; Kim 1999, 79–80 & §3.1).

Despite their different interpretations of the concept of momentariness, the early Buddhist schools all derived this concept from the analysis of impermanence in terms of the dynamics of dharmas qua physical and mental events. The equation of a moment with the duration of these transient events as extremely short occurrences—even the shortest conceivable—led to the direct determination of the moment in terms of these occurrences. Yet the doctrine of momentariness spawned a host of problems for the Buddhist schools, particularly with regard to the status of the endurance moment and to the explanation of continuity and conditioning interaction among the dharmas (see section 5 below). If dharmas go through an endurance phase or exist as real entities within the span of any given moment, how can they be momentary? And if experience is an array of strictly momentary dharmas, how can continuity and causal conditioning be possible?

One might argue that the conceptual shift from “impermanence” to “endurance” is a result of scholastic literalism and testifies to the Abhidharma tendency towards reification and hypostatization of dharmas (Gombrich 1996, 36–37, 96–97 & 106–107). Nevertheless, the object of the doctrine of momentariness is not so much existence in time or the passage of time per se, but rather, in epistemological terms and a somewhat Bergsonian sense, the construction of temporal experience. Instead of a transcendental matrix of order imposed on natural events from without, time is seen as an inherent feature of the operation of dharmas. The doctrine of momentariness analyzes dharmas as they transpire through time: as psycho-physical events that arise and cease in consciousness and, by the dynamics of their rise and fall, construct time. The sequence of the three times is therefore secondary, generated in and by the process of conditioned and conditioning dharmas. In fact, the conceptual shift from the principle of impermanence to the theory of momentariness is a shift in time scales. While the Sūtrānta worldview interprets the three times as referring to past, present, and future lives, the Abhidharma sees them as phases that any conditioned dharma undergoes each and every moment. Impermanence marks dharmas over a period of time, but is also encapsulated in every single consciousness moment (Vibh-a 7–8; Sv 991; Vism XIV 191; Collins 1992, 227).

4. Intrinsic nature: between categorization and ontology

To preserve the principle of impermanence and explain continuity and causal conditioning in ordinary experience, the Buddhist schools introduced novel interpretations of the nature of dharmas. At the heart of these interpretations is the concept of intrinsic nature (Skt., svabhāva, Pali, sabhāva) that plays a major role in the systematization of Abhidharma thought, is closely related to the consolidation of the dharma theory, and is regarded as that which gave an impetus to the Abhidharma growing concern with ontology.

The term svabhāva/sabhāva does not feature in the sūtras/suttas and its rare mentions in other Sarvāstivāda and Theravāda canonical texts offer no account of dharma as defined by a fixed intrinsic nature that verifies its real existence.[11] This situation changes significantly in the post-canonical literature, in which svabhāva becomes a standard concept extensively used in dharma exegesis. A recurring idea in the exegetical Abhidharma literature from the period of the early vibhāṣā compendia onward is that dharmas are defined by virtue of their svabhāva. For instance, a definition transmitted in the Abhidharmakośabhāṣya reads: “dharma means ‘upholding,’ [namely], upholding intrinsic nature (svabhāva),” and the Mahāvibhāṣā states that “intrinsic nature is able to uphold its own identity and not lose it […] as in the case of unconditioned dharmas that are able to uphold their own identity” (Cox 2004A, 558–559). Similarly, a definition prevalent in Theravādin Abhidhamma commentaries is: “dhammas are so called because they bear their intrinsic natures, or because they are borne by causal conditions” (e.g., Dhs-a 39-40; Paṭis-a I 18; Vism-mhṭ I 347). The commentaries also regularly equate dhammas with their intrinsic natures, using the terms dhamma and sabhāva interchangeably. For example, the Visuddhimagga proclaims that “dhamma means but intrinsic nature” (Vism VIII 246), and the sub-commentary to the Dhammasaṅgaṇi indicates that “there is no other thing called dhamma apart from the intrinsic nature borne by it” and that “the term sabhāva denotes the mere fact of being a dhamma” (Dhs-mṭ 28 & 94; see also Karunadasa 2010: Ch. 1).

These commentarial definitions of dharmas as carrying their intrinsic natures should not be interpreted ontologically as implying that dharmas are substances having inherent existence. The Pali commentaries, cautions Gethin (2004, 533), “are often viewed too much in the light of later controversies about the precise ontological status of dharmas and the Madhyamaka critique of the notion of svabhāva in the sense of ‘inherent existence.’” In fact, defining dharmas as bearing their intrinsic natures conveys the idea that there is no enduring agent behind them. Adding that dharmas are borne by causal conditions counters the idea of intrinsic natures borne by underlying substances distinct from themselves. Just as dharmas are psycho-physical events that occur dependently on appropriate conditions and qualities, their intrinsic natures arise dependently on other conditions and qualities rather than on a substratum more real than they are (ibid; Karunadasa 1996, 13–16; Nyanaponika 1998, 40–41).

We must also note that the context within which dharmas are rendered in terms of their intrinsic natures is that of categorization, where multiple criteria and qualities are applied to create a comprehensive taxonomic system that distinguishes the particular character of any given dharma. Cox (2004A: 559–561) has shown that in the early period of northern Indian Abhidharma texts, as represented by the Śāriputrābhidharmaśāstra and portions of the Mahāvibhāṣā, the concept of intrinsic nature develops within the context of the method of inclusion (saṃgraha), that is, the process by which the inclusion of dharmas within a specific category is to be applied. Dharmas are determined (pariniṣpanna) by the intrinsic nature that defines them and hence should not be considered to possess a separately existing intrinsic nature. “‘Determination’ implies two further features of dharmas […] First, just as categories in a well-structured taxonomic schema are distinct and not subject to fluctuation, so also dharmas, as ‘determined,’ are clearly and unalterably discriminated: they are uniquely individualized and as such are not subject to confusion with other dharmas. [Second,] determination by intrinsic nature undergoes no variation or modification, and hence, dharmas, which are in effect types or categories of intrinsic nature, are established as stable and immutable” (ibid, 562). In the early Sarvāstivāda exegetical texts, then, svabhāva is used as an atemporal, invariable criterion determining what a dharma is, not necessarily that a dharma exists. The concern here is primarily with what makes categorial types of dharma unique, rather than with the ontological status of dharmas.

Nevertheless, from the foregoing categorial theory, the mature Abhidharma drew ontological conclusions with regard to the reality of dharmas. This transition in the conception of dharma coincided with an inherent ambiguity in the term svabhāva, which is grounded logically and etymologically in the term bhāva that came to denote “mode of existence” (ibid, 565–568). In the vibhāṣā compendia and contemporaneous texts, “the explicit emphasis upon categorization per se recedes in importance as the focus shifts to clarifying the character and eventually the ontological status of individual dharmas. Accordingly, the term svabhāva acquires the dominant sense of ‘intrinsic nature’ specifying individual dharmas […] And determining individual dharmas through unique intrinsic nature also entails affirming their existence, as a natural function both of the etymological sense of the term svabhāva and of the role of dharmas as the fundamental constituents of experience. This then leads to the prominence of a new term that expressed this ontological focus: namely, dravya” (ibid, 569). Dravya means “real existence” and, within the Sarvāstivāda framework, dharmas that are determined by intrinsic nature exist as real entities (dravyatas), as opposed both to composite objects of ordinary experience that exist provisionally and to relative concepts or contingencies of time and place that exist relatively. The presence of intrinsic nature indicates that a dharma is a primary existent, irrespective of its temporal status, namely, whether it is a past, present or future dharma, and hence the Sarvāstivāda declaration that “all things exist.”

The Theravāda rejected the Sarvāstivāda ontological model, claiming that dhammas exist only in the present. But the Theravāda Abhidhamma shares with the Sarvāstivāda the same principles of dhamma analysis as a categorial theory that individuates sentient experience. Here, too, the taxonomic function of sabhāva gave rise to ontological connotations of existence in the characterization of dhammas. As the final units of Abhidhamma analysis, dhammas are reckoned the ultimate constituents of experience. “There is nothing else, whether a being, or an entity, or a man or a person,” a famous Pali commentarial excerpt proclaims (Dhs-a 155).[12] While this statement is meant to refute the rival Pudgalavāda position of the reality of the person by insisting that there is no being or person apart from dhammas, there emerges the idea that the phenomenal world is, at bottom, a world of dhammas: that within the confines of sentient experience there is no other actuality apart from dhammas and that what constitutes any given dhamma as a discrete, individualized particular is its intrinsic nature. The Theravāda elaborates on the concept of sabhāva in juxtaposition to its theory of momentariness, and it acquires the sense of what underlies a dhamma’s endurance moment and as a point of reference to the moments of origination and cessation. Before a dhamma eventuates it does not yet obtain an intrinsic nature and when it ceases it is denuded of this intrinsic nature. As a present occurrence, though, while possessing its intrinsic nature, it exists as an ultimate reality and its intrinsic nature is evidence of its actual existence as such (Dhs-a 45; Vism VIII 234, XV 15). One commentarial passage even goes so far as naming this instant “the acquisition of a self” (Vism-mhṭ I 343).

5. Causation: existence as functioning

The Abhidharma’s ontological investigations occasioned a host of doctrinal problems that became the subject of an ongoing debate among the Buddhist schools. One primary controversy centered on the principle of impermanence: if all phenomena are impermanent, the Sautrāntika challenged the Sarvāstivāda and the Theravāda, then dharmas must be changing continuously and can neither exist in the past and future nor endure for any period of time, however short, in the present. On the other hand, the systematic analysis of experience in terms of momentary dharmas required the Abhidharma to provide a rigorous account of the processes that govern psychological and physical continuity. What fuels these processes is causal interaction, but the very notion of causation is allegedly compromised by the theory of momentariness. If causes, conditions, and their results are all momentary events, how can an event that has ended have a result? How can an event that undergoes distinct stages of origination, endurance, and cessation in a brief moment have causal efficacy? Notwithstanding their doctrinal differences, both the Sarvāstivāda and the Theravāda Abhidhamma had to confront these challenges, and they did so by formulating complex theories of immediate contiguity that grant causal efficacy.

The Sarvāstivāda developed an analysis of causal conditioning in terms of intricate interrelations among four types of condition (pratyaya) and six types of cause (hetu). As documented in the Abhidharmakośabhāṣya (AKB 2.49) based on canonical texts including the Vijñānakāya, the Prakaraṇapāda, and the Jñānaprasthāna, the four conditions are: 1) root cause (literally “cause as condition,” hetupratyaya), reckoned the foremost in inciting the process of fruition and origination; 2) immediate antecedent, which holds between a consciousness moment and its immediately preceding moment in that consciousness series; 3) object support, which applies to all dharmas insofar as they are intentional objects of consciousness; and 4) predominance, which facilitates sensory discriminative awareness, e.g., the faculty of sight’s predominance over visual cognitive awareness. The six causes are: 1) instrumentality (kāraṇahetu), deemed the primary factor in the production of a result; 2) simultaneity or coexistence, which connects phenomena that arise simultaneously; 3) homogeneity, explaining the homogenous flow of dharmas that evokes the seeming continuity of phenomena; 4) association, which operates only between mental dharmas and explains why the elements of consciousness always appear as assemblages of mental factors; 5) dominance, which forms one’s habitual cognitive and behaviorist dispositions; and 6) fruition, referring to whatever is the result of actively wholesome or unwholesome dharmas. The four conditions and six causes interact with each other in explaining phenomenal experience: for instance, each consciousness moment acts both as the homogenous cause as well as the immediate antecedent condition of the rise of consciousness and its concomitants in a subsequent moment.[13]

Underlying this analysis of causal conditioning is the notion of existence as efficacious action, or karma. Karma, a fundamental principle in Buddhist thought from its inception, is what fuels the repetitive experience in saṃsāra, the round of rebirth.[14] In Abhidharma exegesis, the efficacious action or distinctive functioning of dharmas is understood predominantly as causal functioning. For the orthodox Sarvāstivāda-Vaibhāṣika, the existence of dharmas as real entities (dravyatas) is determined by both their intrinsic nature and particular causal functioning. Intrinsic nature, however, is an atemporal determinant of real existence. What determines a dharma’s spatio-temporal existence is its distinctive causal functioning: past and future dharmas have capability (sāmarthya) of functioning, while present dharmas also exert a distinctive activity (kāritra). Present activity is an internal causal efficacy that assists in the production of an effect within a dharma’s own consciousness series. It is this activity that determines a dharma’s present existence and defines the limits of the span of its present moment. Capability, by contrast, is a conditioning efficacy externally directed towards another consciousness series: it constitutes a condition that assists another dharma in the production of its own effect (Cox 2004A, 570–573; Williams 1981, 240–243). A dharma’s present activity arises and falls away, but past and future dharmas all have potential for causal functioning and exist as real entities due to their intrinsic nature. For the Sarvāstivāda, this model—which insists on constant change within the limits of the present moment and implies the existence of dharmas in the three time periods—preserves both the principle of impermanence yet explains continuity and causal efficacy.

The Sarvāstivāda-Vaibhāṣika distinction between a dharma’s activity and capability implies that each dharma or consciousness moment effects the next moment within its series, but it can also act as a contributory condition towards producing a different sort of effect. Activity engenders the next moment within a dharma’s series, while capability generates a different effect and explains the causal efficacy of past dharmas. Williams (1981, 246–247) helpfully notes that we may render this “horizontal” and “vertical” causality, within a consciousness series and transcending it respectively. For example, an instant of visual awareness horizontally produces the next moment of visual awareness and may or may not, depending on other factors such as light and so on, vertically produce vision of the object. “It follows that to be present is to have horizontal causality, which may or may not include vertical causality—a fact which serves to remind us that we are dealing here with primary existents which are frequently positioned within the system in terms of what they do” (ibid). Thus activity or horizontal causality—a dharma’s function of precipitating the next moment of its own consciousness series—individuates that dharma as a particular event of its kind. A dharma’s capability or vertical causality, by which it facilitates the occurrence of other dharmas outside its consciousness series, locates it within the web of interrelations that connects it with the incessant rise and fall of other dharmas, and hence further individuates it as that very particular dharma by manifesting its unique quality and intensity of operation.

The Saturāntika and the Theravāda developed alternative theories of causal conditioning in conjunction with their rejection of the Sarvāstivāda ontological model and their claim that dharmas exist only in the present. The Sautrāntika explained causal interaction among past and future dharmas by reference to the idea of “seeds” (bīja), or modifications in subsequent dharma series. The Sautrāntika theory of seeds is the precursor of two extremely important concepts of later Mahāyāna Buddhist thought, namely, the Yogācāra’s concepts of “store consciousness” (ālayavijñāna) and of Buddha-nature (tathāgatagarbha) (Cox 1995, 94–95; Gethin 1998, 222). The Theravāda theory of causal conditioning, as set out in the Paṭṭhāna, proposes a set of twenty-four conditional relations (paccaya) that account for all possible ways in which a phenomenon may function in conditioning the rise of another phenomenon. The twenty-four conditional relations are: 1) root cause (hetupaccaya); 2) object support; 3) predominance; 4) proximity; 5) contiguity; 6) simultaneity; 7) reciprocity; 8) support; 9) decisive support; 10) pre-existence 11) post-existence; 12) habitual cultivation; 13) karma; 14) fruition; 15) nutriment; 16) controlling faculty; 17) jhāna – a relation specific to meditation attainments; 18) path – a relation specific to the stages on the Buddhist path; 19) association; 20) dissociation; 21) presence; 22) absence; 23) disappearance; 24) non-disappearance.[15] The majority of the Theravāda twenty-four conditions have counterparts in the Sarvāstivāda theory and both systems show various other parallel interests and points of resemblance. The likelihood, then, is that the two systems originated before the two schools separated and continued to evolve after their separation (Conze 1962, 152–153; Kalupahana 1961, 173).

Their differences notwithstanding, both the Sarvāstivāda and the Theravāda theories of causal conditioning are based on the notions that dharmas are psycho-physical events that perform specific functions, and that to define what a dhamma is requires one to determine what it does (Gethin 1992A, 150). It turns out, then, that the relative positioning of each dharma within a network of causes and conditions is, first and foremost, a means for its individuation. Only in a subsidiary sense is this network an analysis of causal efficacy. What reappears here is the categorial dimension of the dharma analysis qua a metaphysical theory of mental events in terms of sameness of conditional relations. Analogous to the space-time coordinate system that enables one to identify and describe material objects, the network of conditional relations may be seen as a coordinate system that locates within it any given dharma, implying that to be a dharma is to be an event that has a place in that web of relations—an idea reminiscent of Donald Davidson’s principle of sameness of causes and effects as a condition of identity of events (2001 119–120 & 154–161). Two dharma instances of the same type would fit into the web of causal conditions in exactly the same way, but would then be distinguished as individual instances on the grounds of their unique degrees and modes of causal efficacy.

6. Epistemology: Perception and the theory of the consciousness process

In attempting to account for what effects liberating insight and what makes up the awakened mind, Abhidharma inquiries extended into the field of epistemology. We have seen that the Abhidharma’s analysis of sentient experience reveals that what we perceive as a temporally extended, uninterrupted flow of phenomena is, in fact, a rapidly occurring sequence of causally connected consciousness moments or cittas (i.e., assemblages of citta and caitta/cetasika), each with its particular object. The mature Abhidharma thus assimilates the analysis of phenomena-in-time-as-constituted-by-consciousness with a highly complex description of the consciousness process, dissolving the causal relations between ordered successions of consciousness moments into the activity of perception. As previously noted in section 2, for the Abhidharma, as in Buddhist epistemology in general, sensory perception is the paradigm of perceptual, sentient experience. Like every instance of consciousness, sensory perception is intentional, encapsulated in the interaction among the sense faculties, their corresponding types of discriminative consciousness, and their appropriate sense objects. Different Buddhist schools, however, held different positions on the distinctive nature of perceptual experience, and on the specific roles of the sense faculties and status of sense objects in it. The Theravāda Abhidhamma and the Sarvāstivāda-Vaibhāṣika both espouse a view that proposes a direct contact between perceptual consciousness and its sense objects, the latter being understood as sensibilia, for what we perceive are not objects of common sense but their sensible qualities. We may characterize this view as phenomenalist realism (Dreyfus 1997, 331 & 336).

The Theravāda Abhidhamma sets out its theory of the consciousness process (citta-vīthi) in its commentaries and manuals, mainly in the works of Buddhaghosa, Buddhadatta (5th century CE), and Anuruddha (10th or 11th century CE), based on earlier descriptions in the Dhammasaṅgaṇi and the Paṭṭhāna (Vism XIV 111–124, XVII 126–145; Dhs-a 82–106 & 267–287; Vibh-a 155–160; Abhidh-s 17–21). The theory is not separate from the dhamma taxonomy and the analysis of citta as previously outlined in section 2. Rather, in congruency with the notion of existence (whether categorial or ontological) as functioning, it analyzes sensory perception as resulting from particular functions that are performed by the eighty-nine citta types revealed by the foregoing taxonomy. According to this analysis, the specific functions in the consciousness flow occur at particular instants of that continuum, as the normal flow of consciousness involves the mind picking up and putting down sense objects by means of successive sets of associated mental factors. The result is a fairly static account of mental and material phenomena as they arise in consciousness over a series of consciousness moments.[16]

Restricting the account to the consciousness process of ordinary beings, two types of process are described: five-sense-door processes (pañcadvāra) and mind-door processes (manodvāra). These may occur in succession, or mind-door processes may occur independently. Five-sense-door processes account for sensory perception as information is directly received from the fields of the five physical sense faculties. Mind-door processes internalize the information received through the sense faculties and characterize the mind that is absorbed in thought or memory. Objects at the “door” of the mind, which is treated in Buddhist thought as a sixth sense faculty, may be past, present, or future, purely conceptual or even transcendent. Normally, however, the object at the mind door will be either a past memory or a concept. If there is no perceptual activity, as is the case in deep, dreamless sleep, the mind is in a state of rest called inactive mode (bhavaṅga). Throughout one’s life, the same type of citta performs this function of the inactive mind that is the natural mode to which the mind reverts. The mind switches from its inactive mode to a simple mind-door process when a concept or memory occurs and no attention is directed to the other five sense fields. The simplest mind-door process is a succession of the following functions: 1) adverting to the object of thought: a function that lasts one moment and becomes internalized as an object support; 2) impulsion: occurs for up to seven moments and performs the function of the mind’s responding actively to the object with wholesome or unwholesome karma; 3) retaining: holding on to the object of the consciousness process for one or two moments.

The mind switches from its inactive mode to any of the five-sense-door processes when an object occurs at the “door” of the appropriate sense faculty. This process of sensory perception involves a greater number of functions: 1) disturbed inactive mind: a function that arises due to the stimulus of the sense object. It lasts for two moments, during which sensory contact takes place, i.e., a physical impact of the sense object on the physical matter of the appropriate sense faculty; 2) adverting: lasts one moment, during which the mind turns towards the object at the appropriate sense “door;” 3) perceiving: lasts one moment and is the sheer perception of the sense object with minimal interpretation; 4) receiving: lasts one moment and performs the intermediary role of enabling transit to and from the appropriate discriminative consciousness, whether visual, auditory, etc.; 5) investigating: lasts one moment and performs the role of establishing the nature of the sense object and of determining the mind’s response to that object that has just been identified; 6) impulsion: same as in the mind-door process; 7) retaining: same as in the mind-door process. As an example, visual perception involves not only seeing itself, but also a succession of moments of fixing of the visual object in the mind, recognition of its general features, and identification of its nature. In both the mind-door and five-sense door processes, the sense faculty and its sense object condition the arising of a present moment of a corresponding apprehending consciousness, that is, perception here is modeled on simultaneous conditioning. And in both the mind-door and five-sense door processes, when the retaining function ceases, the mind reenters its inactive mode.

The consciousness types that perform most of the functions that make up the mind-door and the five-sense-door processes fall into the category of resultant cittas, that is, those that are the result of past actively wholesome or unwholesome consciousness. This means that the experience of the sense data presented to one’s mind is determined by one’s previous actions and is beyond of one’s immediate control. Whenever one remembers or conceptualizes, sees, hears, smells, tastes, or touches something that is desirable or pleasing, one experiences a result of previous wholesome consciousness. And vice versa with objects that are undesirable or unpleasing and previous unwholesome consciousness respectively. Only in the final stage of the consciousness process, when the mind has chosen to respond actively to its object in some way, actively present wholesome or unwholesome consciousness operates and constitutes karma that will bear future results. The Abhidhamma thus “provides an exact small-scale analysis of the process of dependent arising” (Gethin 1998, 216).

The Sarvāstivāda-Vaibhāṣika proposes a similar account of sensory perception, but argues that the sensory object exists as a real entity. The Sautrāntika theory of perception, however, is rather different. It rests on the Sautrāntika radical view of momentariness, according to which there is no real duration but only a succession of infinitesimal moments, and on its view of causation, according to which causes cease to exist when their effects come into existence. The application of these principles to sensory perception makes it difficult to explain how perception directly apprehends sense objects, for it implies that objects have ceased when their apprehending consciousness arises. The Sautrāntika reply is that consciousness does not have direct access to its sense objects. By contrast to phenomenalist realism, the Sautrāntika view of perceptual consciousness may be characterized as representationalism: it sees perception as apprehending its objects indirectly, through the mediation of aspects (ākāra) representative of their objects (Dreyfus 1997, 335 & 380–381).

What is common to all the three main Abhidharma traditions—Theravāda, Sarvāstivāda, and Sautrāntika—is that they manifest a somewhat similar paradigm shift towards reducing the phenomenal, causally conditioned world into the activity of cognition and consciousness. This shift was part of a broader movement in Indian philosophy in which Hindu, Jain, and Buddhist thinkers turned away from traditional metaphysical questions about the nature of the external world and the self, and focused instead on the study of epistemology, logic, and language. Their purpose was to provide systematic accounts of the nature and means of valid cognition. Within Buddhist circles, this epistemological turn saw the rise of thinkers such as Asaṅga and Vasubandhu, the founders of the Yogācāra (400–480 CE), and, most notably, Dignāga and Dharmakīrti (around 500 CE) who developed sophisticated logical and philosophical systems (ibid, 15–19). The Abhidharma, then, sets the stage for this epistemological turn. The new emphasis becomes dominant from the period of the vibhāṣā compendia onward and is evident in a shift in the terminology used by the Abhidharma to describe the nature of dharmas. This terminological shift is indicated by the terms “particular inherent characteristic” (Skt., svalakṣaṇa, Pali, salakkhaṇa) and “general characteristic” (Skt., sāmānyalakṣaṇa, Pali, sāmānyalakkhaṇa).

The term lakṣaṇa/lakkhaṇa means a mark, or a specific characteristic that distinguishes an indicated object from others. The Logicians use this term in the sense of “definition” of a concept or logical category. The Abhidharma applies it to the practice of the discernment of dharmas, distinguishing between multiple generic characteristics a dharma shares with other dharmas and (at least) one particular inherent characteristic that defines a dharma as that very individual occurrence distinct from any other instances of its type. The post-canonical Abhidharma thus assimilates the concept of the particular inherent characteristic with that of intrinsic nature. “Dhammas,” the Theravādin commentarial literature states, “are so called because they bear their particular inherent characteristics” (Vibh-a 45; Vibh-mṭ 35; Paṭis-a I 79; Vism XV 3), and a particular characteristic “is the intrinsic nature that is not held in common by other dhammas” (Vism-mhṭ II 137). Used in conjunction or interchangeably with intrinsic nature, the particular inherent characteristic constitutes a dhamma’s unique definition (Vism VI 19, 35). It is an epistemological and linguistic determinant of a dhamma as a knowable instance that is defined by a distinct verbal description.

The Mahāvibhāṣā of the Sarvāstivāda-Vaibhāṣika similarly distinguishes between a dharma’s particular inherent and generic characteristics and identifies the former with intrinsic nature, thus discriminating “levels in the apprehension or discernment of dharmas that serve to clarify the ambiguity encountered in the application of the term svabhāva to both individual dharmas and to categorial groups” (Cox 2004A, 575). The difference between the analytical description of dharmas in terms of their intrinsic nature or their characteristics, notes Cox (ibid, 576), is that “whereas intrinsic nature acquires its special significance in the context of exegetical categorization, the starting point for the characteristics lies in perspectivistic cognition. Ontology is a concern for both systems, but the shift in terminology from intrinsic nature to the characteristics reflects a concurrent shift from a category-based abstract ontology to an epistemological ontology that is experientially or cognitively determined.” This new epistemological emphasis looms in through a modified definition of existence proposed by the mature Sarvāstivāda exegesis that sees the causal efficacy underlying all existence as cognitive. Representing this development in the history of Sarvāstivāda thought is Saṅghabhadra (fifth century CE), who states in his Nyāyānusāra: “to be an object-field that produces cognition (buddhi) is the true characteristic of existence” (ibid). This means that dharmas as the constituents of our experiential world are objectively identifiable through cognition.

In sum, the Abhidharma project, as evident by the dharma theory and its supporting doctrines, is, at bottom, epistemologically oriented. Yet the project also intends to ascertain that every constituent of the experiential world is knowable and nameable, and that the words and concepts used in the discourse that develops around the discernment of these constituents uniquely define their corresponding referents. The dharma analysis therefore paves the way for conceptual realism: a worldview that is based on the notion of truth as consisting in a correspondence between our concepts and statements, on the one hand, and the features of an independent, determinate reality, on the other hand. Conceptual realism does not necessarily have implications for the ontological status of this reality as externally existing. But to espouse such a position is to make a significant move away from the earliest Buddhist teaching that presents the Buddha’s view of language as conventional.[17]


Primary Sources

The texts are ordered according to the Pali/Sanskrit alphabet. References to Pali texts are to the editions of the Pali Text Society unless noted otherwise.

  • [A] Aṅguttara-nikāya
  • [Dhs-a] Atthasālinī (Dhammasaṅgaṇi commentary)
  • [Abhidh-av] Abhidhammāvatāra
  • [Abhidh-s] Abhidhammatthasaṅgaha
  • [Akb] Abhidharmakośabhāṣya, P. Pradhan, (ed.), Patna: Jayaswal Research Institute, 1975
  • [Kv] Kathāvatthu
  • [Dhs] Dhammasaṅgaṇi
  • [Dhs-mṭ] Dhammasaṅgaṇi-mūlaṭīkā (Dhammasaṅgaṇi sub-commentary)
  • [Nett] Nettippakaraṇa
  • [Paṭis] Paṭisambhidāmagga
  • [Ps] Papañcasūdanī (Majjhima-nikāya commentary)
  • [Peṭ] Peṭakopadesa
  • [Bv] Buddhavaṃsa
  • [M] Majjhima-nikāya
  • [Mp] Manorathapūraṇī (Aṅguttara-nikāya commentary)
  • [Mhv] Mahāvaṃsa
  • [Mil] Milindapañha
  • [Vin] Vinaya-piṭaka
  • [Vibh] Vibhaṅga
  • [Vibh-mṭ] Vibhaṅga-mūlaṭīkā (Vibhaṅga sub-commentary)
  • [Vism] Visuddhimagga, H.C. Warren (ed.), Harvard Oriental Series, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1950
  • [Vism-mhṭ] Visuddhimagga-mahāṭīkā (Visuddhimagga commentary)
  • [S] Saṃyutta-nikāya
  • [Paṭis-a] Saddhammappakāsinī (Paṭisambhidāmagga commentary)
  • [Vibh-a] Sammohavinodanī (Vibhaṅga commentary)
  • [Spk] Sāratthappakāsinī (Saṃyutta-nikāya commentary)
  • [Sv] Sumaṅgalavilāsinī (Dīgha-nikāya commentary)

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Other Internet Resources

Abhidharma translations, information, and lectures:

Abhidhamma/Abhidharma canonical and exegetical texts in digital Pali and Sanskrit Buddhist canons:

Copyright © 2022 by
Noa Ronkin <noa.ronkin@wolfson.oxon.org>

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