First published Fri Apr 22, 2011; substantive revision Thu Jan 7, 2021

The Buddhist philosopher Vasubandhu (4th to 5th century C.E.) was a great light at the peak of India’s resplendent Gupta empire.[1] His works display his mastery of Buddhist as well as non-Buddhist thought of the day, and he made his mark, successively, upon three Buddhist scholastic traditions that are traditionally considered distinct: Vaibhāṣika, Sautrāntika, and Yogācāra.[2] His master work of Abhidharma thought, the Commentary on the Treasury of the Abhidharma (Abhidharmakośabhāṣya), is to this day the primary resource for knowledge of “Śrāvaka” or non-Mahāyāna philosophy among Tibetan and East Asian Buddhist schools.[3] His concise works on Yogācāra philosophy set a new standard for that school, which became mainstream Buddhist metaphysics in India for half a millennium thereafter.[4] Venerated as he is across the Buddhist world, he has always been a subject of disputation. This article will sketch his contested biography and works, and provide summary analyses of his most prominent arguments.[5]

1. Biography and Works

1.1 Biography (Disputed)

Vasubandhu (4th century C.E.) is dated to the height of the Gupta period by the fact that, according to Paramārtha, he provided instruction for the crown prince, and queen, of King “Vikramāditya”—a name for the great Chandragupta II (r. 380–415).[6] Vasubandhu lived his life at the center of controversy, and he won fame and patronage through his acumen as an author and debater. His writings, packed as they are with criticisms of his contemporaries’ traditions and views, are an unparalleled resource for understanding the debates alive among Buddhist and Orthodox (Hindu) schools of his time.

As a young Buddhist scholar monk, Vasubandhu is said to have traveled from his home in Gandhāra to Kashmir, then the heartland of the Vaibhāṣika philosophical system, to study. There, students were sworn to keep the tradition secret amongst themselves. Vasubandhu questioned Vaibhāṣika orthodoxy and made enemies there, but managed to return home an expert in the system. Immediately, he violated Kashmiri Vaibhāṣika norms by giving public teachings, going so far as to dare all comers to debate him at the end of each day. Vasubandhu’s Kashmiri colleagues were livid until they received a copy of the text from which he was teaching, the root verses of his Treasury of the Abhidharma. This brilliant summary of their system pleased them immensely. But then, Vasubandhu published his auto-commentary, which criticized the system in various ways, primarily from a Sautrāntika perspective. Livid again. Years later, Vasubandhu’s Vaibhāṣika contemporary Saṅghabhadra composed two treatises purporting to refute the Commentary, and traveled to Ayodhyā, where Vasubandhu was living under royal patronage, to challenge the master to a public debate (Vasubandhu refused). This narrative, reported in Chinese and Tibetan sources, accounts for the unusual fact that Vasubandhu’s Commentary often disagrees with positions affirmed in the Treasury’s root verses.

Vasubandhu’s elder half-brother was Asaṅga, the monk who meditated in solitude for twelve years until he was able to meet with and receive teachings directly from the future Buddha, Maitreya. Asaṅga thereby became the preeminent expounder of the Yogācāra synthesis of “Great Vehicle” (Mahāyāna) Buddhism, writing some texts himself, and transmitting the so-called “Five Treatises” revealed by Maitreya. When he was advanced in years, Asaṅga became worried about his younger brother’s karmic outlook (Vasubandhu had publicly insulted Asaṅga’s works). So he sent his students to teach Vasubandhu and convince him to adopt the Yogācāra system. It worked. This narrative provides a reason for Vasubandhu’s having written many texts from the Yogācāra perspective after his prior advocacy of so-called “Śrāvaka” positions. It explains why the author of the Treasury and its Commentary might have gone on to write several commentaries on Mahāyāna scriptures, a treatise that defends the legitimacy of Mahāyāna scriptures, and a series of concise Yogācāra syntheses.

The mythologized, hagiographic character of the traditional biographies, together with the (disputed) belief that they contradict one another, has led a number of modern scholars to doubt their veracity. Many have expressed doubts that the mass of extant texts attributed to Vasubandhu in the Tibetan and Chinese canons could have been written by a single individual. In the 1950s Erich Frauwallner proposed a thesis that there were two separate Vasubandhus, whom the traditional biographies mistakenly combined into one figure.[7] Versions of this theory hold sway in some areas of the academy. Some scholars have called into question the story of Vasubandhu’s conversion from Śrāvaka (non-Mahāyāna) to Yogācāra under the influence of his brother Asaṅga, by noting a more gradual set of transitions and commonalities across works previously thought to sit on opposite sides of this “conversion.”[8] An extension of this argument, advocated today by Robert Kritzer and colleagues, holds that Vasubandhu was secretly an advocate of Yogācāra all along.[9]

1.2 Doctrinal Positions and Works

Vasubandhu composed works from the perspectives of several different philosophical schools. In addition, his works often state doctrinal positions and arguments with which he disagrees, in order to refute them. For this reason, scholars have used his works, especially his Commentary on the Treasury of the Abhidharma to explicate a range of Buddhist and non-Buddhist positions prevalent during his time.

The main Buddhist schools represented in his works are the Vaibhāṣikas or Sarvāstivādins of Kashmir and Gandhāra, the Vātsīputrīyas, the Sautrāntikas (also called Dārṣtāntikas), and the Yogācārins. He also argues with non-Buddhist, Orthodox (Hindu) positions, including especially Sāṃkhya and Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika views. It would appear that the only Buddhist school with which he always expresses disagreement is the Vātsīputrīyas, also called the Pudgalavādins or “Personalists.” Vasubandhu’s works are most often said to have been written either from the Sautrāntika perspective or from the Yogācāra perspective, depending upon the work. Yet the verses of his Treasury of the Abhidharma summarize the doctrines of the Kashmiri Vaibhāṣika school. It is only in the commentary that the Sautrāntika system tends to win the day, through numerous arguments.[10] And, it is quite often the case, even in the Commentary, that Vaibhāṣika views are left unchallenged or unharmed.

A great number of texts of the Theravāda Abhidharma tradition are extant in Pāli, and a great number of Sarvāstivāda Abhidharma texts exist in their Chinese translations. In Sanskrit and Tibetan, however, nearly all of the “Śrāvaka” Abhidharma texts that remain are the works of Vasubandhu and the commentarial traditions stemming from them. It is tempting to take this as evidence of Vasubandhu’s philosophical mastery, to have so comprehensively defeated his foes that his tradition dominated from the 9th century on. Yet we may equally take this as evidence not of the victory of Sautrāntika, but of the influence of the rising popularity of Yogācāra in India and Tibet. Vasubandhu, a great systematizer of mainstream Abhidharma, provided arguments and doctrines, and a life story, that paved the way to, and justified, the later dominance of Mahāyāna.

Vasubandhu wrote in Sanskrit, but many of his works are known from their Chinese and Tibetan translations alone. It is beyond the purposes of this essay to summarize all of the works attributed to Vasubandhu, or to take into consideration the relevant criteria for determining his authorship. A quick mention of well-known works must suffice.[11] Vasubandhu’s most important work of Abhidharma is his Treasury of the Abhidharma (Abhidharmakośakārikā), with its Commentary (Abhidharmakośabhāṣya).[12] After these, his best known works are his concise, Yogācāra syntheses, the Twenty Verses (Viṃśikākārikā) with its Commentary (Viṃśikāvṛtti), the Thirty Verses (Triṃśikā), and the Three Natures Exposition (Trisvabhāvanirdeśa).[13] The majority of the arguments discussed below are taken from these works.

A number of Vasubandhu’s shorter independent works are also available. The Explanation of the Establishment of Action (Karmasiddhiprakaraṇa) draws together, synthesizes and advances somewhat the many discussions of karma from the Treasury of the Abhidharma—adding a defense of the Yogācāra concept of the “storehouse consciousness” (ālayavijñāna). The Explanation of the Five Aggregates (Pañcaskandhaprakaraṇa) is a summary of central Abhidharma terminology that includes some Yogācāra cross-referencing as well. The Rules for Debate (Vādavidhi) is lost, but numerous fragments preserved in later texts show it to be foundational for the development of formal Buddhist logic and epistemology.[14]

Vasubandhu wrote a number of commentaries on Buddhist scriptures, primarily (but not exclusively) those that are classified as Mahāyāna Sūtras. He also wrote a tremendously influential work on how to interpret and teach Buddhist scriptures, entitled the Proper Mode of Exposition (Vyākhyāyukti), in which (among other things) he argued for the legitimacy of the Mahāyāna Sūtras (which he called “Vaipūlya Sūtras”).[15]

Also quite influential, and still regularly studied in Tibetan educational settings, are Vasubandhu’s commentaries on major Yogācāra works. These include commentaries on three texts said to have been revealed to Asaṅga by the bodhisattva Maitreya, his Commentary on Distinguishing Elements from Reality (Dharmadharmatāvibhāgavṛtti), Commentary on Distinguishing the Middle from the Extremes (Madhyāntavibhāgabhāṣya), and Commentary on the Ornament to the Great Vehicle Discourses (Mahāyānasūtrālaṃkārabhāṣya). Finally, Vasubandhu is credited with an important commentary on Asaṅga’s Yogācāra summa, the Commentary on the Summary of the Great Vehicle (Mahāyānasaṃgrahabhāṣya).

Among these works, and numerous others attributed to Vasubandhu in the Tibetan and Chinese canons, one finds countless perspectives and approaches represented, and many scholars are skeptical as to the unity of the authorship even of the works listed. Many, however, still find it sensible to assume that Vasubandhu worked in various genres and schools, and adopted the norms of each, developing his own thinking along the way. Yet no narrative of Vasubandhu’s intellectual development has achieved scholarly consensus.

2. Major Arguments from the Treasury of the Abhidharma

2.1 Disproof of the Self

The Buddhist approach to the question of personal continuity attracts perhaps more attention from contemporary philosophy than any other aspect of the tradition.[16] Vasubandhu’s Commentary on the Treasury of the Abhidharma includes, as its final chapter, an extended defense of the Buddhist doctrine of no-self, entitled, “The Refutation of the Person.” The majority of the argument assumes a Buddhist interlocutor, and is intended to prove that no Buddhist ought to accept the reality of a so-called “self” (ātman) or “person” (pudgala) over and above the five aggregates (skandhas) in which, the Buddha said, the person consists. (The aggregates, as their name suggests, are themselves constantly-changing collections of entities of five categories: the physical, feelings, ideas, dispositions, and consciousness.) Vasubandhu apparently believed that the Vātsīputrīyas, also called Pudgalavādins or “Personalists,” represented a significant, Buddhist rival. Late in the chapter, Vasubandhu also provides some arguments that are targeted at a Vaiśeṣika (Hindu) view of the self.

The chapter begins with a brief statement of the soteriological purpose of the treatise, and something of a definition of the Buddha’s teachings. Vasubandhu says that for outsiders (meaning outsiders to Buddhism), there is no possibility of liberation, because all other systems impose a false construct of a self upon what is really only the continuum of aggregates (skandha). Since grasping the self generates the mental afflictions (kleśa), liberation from suffering is impossible for one who holds onto the false, non-Buddhist view that the self has independent reality.

Vasubandhu does not attempt, here, to prove the karmic causality that justifies his soteriological exclusivism. Instead, he moves directly to prove the non-existence of the self. What is real, he says, is known by one of two means: perception or inference.[17] Seven things are known directly, by perception. They include the five objects of the senses (visual forms, sounds, smells, tastes, and touchables), mental objects (mental images or ideas), and the mind itself.[18] What is not known directly can only be known indirectly, by inference. As an example, Vasubandhu provides an argument that the five sense organs (eye, ear, nose, tongue, skin) can each be inferred from the awareness of their respective sensory objects. But, he says, there is no such inference for the self. Since Vasubandhu believes in universal momentariness (see the section on Momentariness and Continuity), he would reject Descartes’ deduction of “I am,” as an enduring self, from the perception of the momentary mental event, “I think.”

Vasubandhu does not list the five aggregates here, but his discussion of perception and inference stands in for having done so. Any Buddhist scholastic would be able to see that he has claimed to have proven the reality of the twelve sense bases (āyatana), and these twelve are easy to correlate with the five aggregates. The first aggregate, the physical (rūpa), includes the five sensory organs and their five objects. The second, third, and fourth aggregates—feelings (vedanā), thoughts (saṃjñā), and dispositions (saṃskāra)—are kinds of mental objects. The fifth aggregate, consciousness (vijñāna), is equivalent to the twelfth sense base, the mind.[19] Earlier in the Treasury Vasubandhu had included other elements within the five aggregates (including, for instance, avijñapti-rūpa, which is imperceptible, within the physical), but since he had also provided arguments disproving those elements (see the section on Disproof of Invisible Physicality), perhaps he felt no compulsion to include them here. Focusing on the twelve sense bases may be Vasubandhu’s way of providing as clean and parsimonious a Buddhist ontology as he can.

 12 Sense Bases  5 Aggregates
Eye Physical
Visual Form
Mind  Consciousness 
Mental Object Feelings

In any event, Vasubandhu is affirming the mainstream Buddhist view that the constantly-changing elements, which seem to be the possessions of, or the components of, the so-called “self,” are real, while the self is unreal. Buddhists readily admit that this view is counterintuitive (if it were intuitive we would all be liberated), and many doubts may arise when it is posited: If there is no self, then what is the same about me as a child and as an adult? What is named by my name? What perceives perceptions, or experiences experiences, or enacts actions, if not the self? What is memory, without a self? And crucially, from a Buddhist perspective, what transmigrates from one body to the next, and reaps the karmic fruit of good and evil deeds, if not a self? These are all questions of great importance in Buddhist philosophical treatments of the doctrine of no-self, and Vasubandhu will address them each in due course. Vasubandhu begins, however, by focusing on certain commonsense advantages to the no-self view, and exposing the difficulties in holding to the reality of the self. His first target, then, is Buddhist “Personalists.”

For Vasubandhu, everything that is real or substantial (dravya) is causally efficient, having specifiable cause-and-effect relations with other entities. Everything that does not have such a causal basis is unreal, and if anything, it is merely a conceptual construct, a mere convention (prajñapti). The so-called “person,” like everything else, must be one or the other—real or unreal, causally conditioned or conceptually constructed. Vasubandhu places it in the latter category. Notice that, to call something a “conceptual construction” (parikalpita) is, for Vasubandhu, to remove it from the flow of causality. Abstract entities have no causal impetus and are unreal. This is Vasubandhu’s formalization, and expansion, of the Buddhist doctrine that all conditioned things are impermanent. Some Buddhists accept (for instance) that space and nirvana are real, though unconditioned. Vasubandhu says, instead, that all things that are engaged with the causal world must be, themselves, conditioned (this is a corollary of his proof of momentariness), so he rejects the causal capacity of eternal, unchanging entities. But even setting aside Vasubandhu’s expanded view, it is clearly out of the question for Buddhists to say that the self is unconditioned and eternal. That is a non-Buddhist view, which Vasubandhu treats later on.

Vasubandhu thus begins his argument by posing a dilemma for the Personalists, between saying that the “person” is uncaused—which would be to adopt a non-Buddhist view—and specifying the cause. Since the Buddha explained the aggregates to be the psychophysical elements that make up the person, any posited “self” must be in some way related to those entities. But the Personalists will not wish to say simply that the “person” is caused by the aggregates. For, the aggregates are temporary and impermanent in the extreme. The whole issue at hand is how to account for the continuity of the person as the aggregates change. If the aggregates are the cause(s) of the person, then the person, too, must change as they change. As Vasubandhu explains in criticizing a parallel context, “No unchanging quality is seen to inhere in changing substances.” (AKBh 159.20)[20] If the causal basis is accepted as changing, the “person” is no longer continuous across the aggregates and through time. So a “person” caused by the aggregates provides no answer to the doubts about personal identity raised above.

Yet for Vasubandhu, if the cause cannot be specified, then the person must be conceptually constructed. He adduces the following as an example of conceptual construction: When we see, smell, and taste milk, we have distinct sensory impressions, which are combined in our awareness. The “milk,” then, is a mental construct—a concept built out of discrete sensory impressions. The sensory impressions are real, but the milk is not. In the same way, the “self” is made up of constantly-changing sensory organs, sensory impressions, ideas, and mental events. These separate, momentary elements are real, but their imagined unity—as an enduring “I”—is a false projection.

The Personalists are willing to accept that the person is a conceptual construction, but they do not accept that this makes it unreal, or causally inert. They believe in a perceptible “person,” who is ineffably neither the same as nor distinct from the aggregates, but who comes into existence in a particular lifetime “depending upon” the aggregates. Vasubandhu considers this a muddled attempt to have one’s cake and eat it too. He focuses in on this term, “depending upon.” If, by this, the Personalists mean “dependent as a conceptual object,” he says, then really they are conceding that the term “person” actually just refers to the aggregates. It is to admit that the aggregates are understood as unified through a mere conceptual construction, “person,” just as the taste, touch, and smell of milk generate the conceptual construction, “milk.” If, on the other hand, they are saying the “person” is causally dependent upon the aggregates, then they are saying that the “person” is caused by the aggregates, which is to specify its causes among impermanent entities.

There is, for Vasubandhu, no acceptable explanation of conceptual constructs as real entities. His exclusive dichotomy (real & causal vs. unreal & conceptual) serves not only as a tool for refusing a separate self, but also as a method of denying apparent subject/object relations or apparent substance/quality relations, and translating them into linear, causal series. For instance, he says that objects of awareness do not exist as causally significant entities distinct from consciousness; rather, consciousness is caused by its apparent objects, from which it takes on a particular shape (ākāra). This is how Vasubandhu resolves some of the standard challenges to the no-self view, such as the question of how experience can exist without an experiencer. The answer is that any given awareness only appears to be made up of two parts, subject and object, a “cognizer” acting upon a cognitive object. In reality, any given moment of awareness consists in a full, constructed appearance of subject/object duality without there actually being any separate subject. The object is an aspect or shape of the consciousness itself. Similarly, when asked with regard to memory “who” remembers if not the self, Vasubandhu rejects the subject/object structure. What is really occurring is only a series of discrete elements in the continuum of aggregates, which arise successively, causally linked to one another. The reason I remember my past is because my aggregates now are the causal result of the past aggregates whose actions I remember. My consciousness today arises with the shape of my past aggregates imprinted upon it.

Moving on, the “dependence” relation that the Personalists are attempting to defend resists none of Vasubandhu’s arguments (a casualty, perchance, of its appearing as a counterargument within his text), but the Personalists persist by stating that the relation between the person and the aggregates is “ineffable.” To this, Vasubandhu argues, interestingly, that ineffability in regard to an entity that is ostensibly perceived undermines the functionality of perception as a source of knowledge. Without any way of distinguishing, clearly, what is perceived directly and what is perceived “ineffably,” all of perception becomes potentially ineffable. And, perhaps more importantly, not everything is said by the Buddha to be ineffable, or at least not equally so. For instance, when the Buddha denies the reality of the self, he does so in contradistinction to the sense bases. If the “person” also exists as an object of sensory perception, how can this distinction be upheld?

Vasubandhu’s dialogue with the Personalists takes some rather technical twists and turns, which I will not attempt to cover here. See the section on scripture for a summary of Vasubandhu’s methods of scriptural interpretation, which he employs decisively to defend against the Personalist adducement of the Buddha’s silence on the nature of the person. I will here mention only one further argument against the Personalists, before treating Vasubandhu’s arguments with non-Buddhists.

The Personalist challenges Vasubandhu to explain how it can be, if everything is only a constantly-changing fluctuation of causally-connected separate entities, that things do not arise in predictable patterns. Why is there so much unpredictable change, the Personalists are asking, if there is no independent person who enacts those changes? This is a question that seems to be affirming a greater degree of freedom of the will than would appear possible were there not some outside, uncaused intervener in the causal flow. If I am reading it correctly, it is something like an incredulous denial that we could be “mere automatons,” given our capacities for innovation and creativity. Vasubandhu’s answer is to emphasize the possibility of change in a self-regulating system.[21]

Vasubandhu points out that in fact, there are predictable patterns to the causal fluctuations of thoughts, so it is a mistake to call them unpredictable. Seeing a woman, he says, causes you to think thoughts that you tend to think when you look at women. (If we needed it, here’s confirmation that the implied reader is a heterosexual male—though probably a celibate one.) If you practice leaving a woman alone in your thoughts (for instance, by practicing thinking of the woman’s overprotective father, as monks are taught to do), then when you see a woman you’ll reject her in your thoughts. If you do not practice this, other thoughts arise: “…then those [thoughts] which are most frequent [or clearest], or most proximate arise, because they have been most forcefully cultivated, except when there are simultaneous special conditions external to the body.” (Kapstein 2001a: 370) This is an argument that undermines a naïve trust in the independence of the will. But of course, Vasubandhu adds, just because the mind is subject to conditions does not mean that it will always be the same. On the contrary, it is fundamental to the definition of conditioned things that they are always changing.

It is with this setup that Vasubandhu turns to address the non-Buddhist sectarians, asking them to account as elegantly as his causal, no-self view does, for the changing flux of mental events. For, the non-Buddhist opponent believes in an independent self who is the agent and controller of mental actions. If that is so, Vasubandhu challenges them, why do mental events arise in such disorder? Just what kind of a controller is the “self”? This is an important point, because it implies that Buddhists might use as evidence what is introspectively obvious to any meditator—namely, the difficulty of controlling the mind. If the “self” is an uncaused agent, why can’t I, for instance, focus my concentration indefinitely? Non-Buddhist (orthodox/Hindu) traditions generally affirm that the mind must be controlled, and harnessed, by the self; this is one of the central meanings of the term yoga (lit. “yoking”) in classical Hinduism. And, of course, the reason that such “yoking” is necessary is that the mind has its own causal impetus, which overwhelms the self unless and until the self attains liberation. Vasubandhu asks why, if changes in experience must be admitted to originate in the fluctuations of the mind, it should be believed that the “yoking” and other willful, agent-driven events originate outside of the mind in an unchanging “self.” The need for such an explanation is evidence that the “self” requires a more burdensome (less simple) theoretical structure than might appear at first blush.

The Buddhist view has an in-built explanation for the difficulty of changing the mind’s dispositions. Each temporary collection of psychophysical entities generates, through causal regularities, another collection in the next moment. The mind’s present dispositions are conditioned by its past, and its every experience is only an expression of its internal transformations, triggered of course by influences coming from outside the individual. It is widely considered a difficulty for the Buddhist no-self view that it has trouble accounting for our intuitive senses of continuity and control. But here we see Vasubandhu turning a disadvantage into an advantage. The intuitive sense of control is a mistake. This is introspectively obvious and is implicit in the non-Buddhist’s admission that a mental series, distinct from the “self,” is dependent upon its own causal impetus. Of course, the non-Buddhists have a panoply of theories explaining the relation between the self and the mental events with which it is complexly entwined. This is territory over which Indian thought contemplates free will and determinism. Vasubandhu does not enter into these debates in any detail. His interest is only to indicate the Buddhist position’s comparative simplicity and causal parsimony.

In the last stages of the chapter, Vasubandhu’s non-Buddhist believer in a permanent self proposes several potential counter-arguments. Here Vasubandhu addresses a number of common worries about the no-self view, including the questions of experience and agency without a self. With regard to experience, Vasubandhu simply makes reference to the argument above in which the subject/object relation was described in a causal line, with the object causing a consciousness to take on the “shape” or appearance of an object. An individual, momentary consciousness does not need to be possessed by a self in order to have a certain appearance. With regard to agency, Vasubandhu again redescribes the structure under consideration—in this case, the act/agent structure—as a unitary, causal line: “From recollection there is interest; from interest consideration; from consideration willful effort; from willful effort vital energy; and from that, action. So what does the self do here?”[22] (Kapstein 2001a: 373) The point, again, is not that there is no action, but that action takes place as one event in a causal series, no element of which requires an independent agent.

The last argument in the work addresses the crucial, Buddhist concern about karmic fruits. If there is no self, how can there be karmic results accruing to the agent of karmic acts? What can it mean to say that, if I kill someone, I go to hell, when there is no “I”? The way the question is phrased is in terms of a technical question about the nature of karmic retribution. The way that karma works in the non-Buddhist schools is, naturally, via the self. In one way or another, karmic residue adheres to the soul/self. If there is no soul that is affected by the karmic residue, how can you be affected at a later time by a previous cause? How can something I do now affect me at the time of my death, if at that time the deed will be in the past?

Vasubandhu gives a clear, if quick reply. A complete answer to this question would require a fuller discussion of the question of continuity.[23] (See the sections Momentariness and Continuity and Disproof of Invisible Physicality below.) The short answer is simply that the past action inaugurates a causal series, which eventuates in the result at a later time via a number of intermediate steps. When I act now, it does not alter some eternal soul, but it does alter the future of my aggregates by sparking a causal series. As he does many times throughout his disproof of the person, Vasubandhu encourages his opponents to recognize the term “I” as simply referring to the continuum of aggregates. The conceptual construction “I” is then understood to be only a manner of speaking, a useful shorthand. He mentions that when I say “I am pale,” I know that it is only my body, not my eternal self, that is pale. Why not apply such figurative use to the term overall? Then, when I say that “I” experience the result of “my” actions, it can be seen to be both clear and accurate. Granted, it seems like there is a real “self.” But it only looks that way, just as a line of ants looks like a brown stripe on the ground. Close philosophical and introspective attention reveals that what seemed like a solid, coherent whole is in fact a false mental construction based upon a failure to notice its countless, fluctuating parts.

2.2 Momentariness and Continuity

For centuries before Vasubandhu, Buddhist philosophers of the Sarvāstivādin tradition had believed in, and argued for, the doctrine of universal momentariness.[24] This view was a Buddhist scholastic interpretation and expression of the Buddha’s doctrine that all things in the world of ordinary beings were subject to causes and conditions, and therefore impermanent. Buddhists rejected the notion of substances with changing qualities, and affirmed instead that change was logically impossible. To be, for Buddhists, is to express certain inalienable characteristics, whereas to change must be to exhibit the nature of a different being. Vasubandhu adopts this view, employing it in many contexts: “As for something that becomes different: that very thing being different is not accepted, for it is not acceptable that it differs from itself.” (AKBh 193.9–10)

One can see how the impossibility of change, coupled with the doctrine of impermanence, served to prove that all things persisted for only a moment. Vasubandhu certainly shared this view, and he drew upon the premises of impermanence and the impossibility of change to establish momentariness in his own works. Yet, as von Rospatt (1995) has shown, Vasubandhu added a new twist to the argument. What he added was that things must self-destruct, for destruction cannot be caused. And why not? Because a cause and a result are real entities, and the ostensible object of a destruction is a non-existent. How, he asks, can a non-existent be a result?

Given that things must bring about their own destruction, then, Vasubandhu needs only to recall the impossibility of change to establish momentariness. If things have it as part of their nature to self-destruct, they must do so immediately upon coming into being. If they do not have it as part of their nature, it can never become so.[25]

The great difficulty for such a position is accounting for apparent continuities. The standard Buddhist explanation is that usually, when things go out of existence, they are replaced in the next moment by new elements of the same kind, and these streams of entities cause the appearance of continuity. Modern interpreters often illustrate the point with the example of the apparent motion on a movie screen being caused by a quick succession of stills. This is said to be the case with the many entities that appear to make up the continuous self, and of course this was the main reason the Buddha affirmed his doctrine of impermanence in the first place. Yet for some phenomena, to call their continuity merely apparent causes philosophical problems, even for Buddhists. Consequently, Vasubandhu, like his Sarvāstivāda forbears, was repeatedly preoccupied with the need to account for continuity.

Many of the more prominent problems in continuity have already been mentioned in the discussion of Vasubandhu’s disproof of the self (see above), including the problem of memory, the problem of the reference of a name, and the problem of karmic causality across multiple lifetimes. See also the section on the disproof of invisible physicality for Vasubandhu’s rejection of the Vaibhāṣika response to a specific problem of continuity.

One issue of great importance for the Vaibhāṣika and Yogācāra traditions, and consequently of interest to current scholarship,[26] is a problem specific to Buddhist meditation theory. The problem comes from an apparent inconsistency among well-founded early Buddhist scriptural positions. On the one hand, there was the orthodox belief that the body was kept alive by consciousness. Even in deep sleep, it was believed that there was some form of subtle consciousness that was keeping the body alive. On the other hand, there was the very old belief, possibly articulated by the Buddha himself, that there are six kinds of consciousness, and that each of them is associated with one of the six senses—the five traditional senses, plus the mental sense (which observes mental objects). The problem was that there are some meditative states that are defined as being completely free of all six sensory consciousnesses. So the question becomes, What keeps the meditator’s body alive when all consciousness is cut off?

Related to this is the problem that, given that each element can be caused only by a previous element of a corresponding kind (in an immediately preceding moment), there does not seem to be any way for the consciousness, once cut off, to restart. The distinctive, early Yogācāra doctrine of the “store consciousness” (ālayavijñāna) or the “hidden consciousness”—the consciousness that is tucked away in the body—was first introduced to solve these continuity problems. Equally problematic is the same issue in reverse: Without some doctrinal shift there does not seem to be any way that beings born into formless realms, with no bodies, could be reborn among those with physical form. The later, Yogācāra view that everything is only appearance takes care of this, too, by eliminating the need for real physicality. (See the section concerning disproof of invisible physicality.) Vasubandhu sets out these problems in the Treasury of the Abhidharma without resolving them; when he writes from a Yogācāra perspective, he resolves them with recourse to the store consciousness and appearance-only.

2.3 Disproof of Invisible Physicality

In a complex but significant passage from the Treasury of the Abhidharma, Vasubandhu provides refutations to arguments that defend the necessity of there being a special kind of physicality, called “unperceived physicality,” or “invisible physicality,” (avijñaptirūpa).[27] As is made clear throughout these arguments, this entity (dharma) was affirmed by the Kashmiri Vaibhāṣikas in order to account for the karmic effects of our physical and vocal actions.

The need for such an entity reflects a conundrum unique to Buddhist morality, premised as it is upon the lawlike, causal regularity of karma operating in the absence of any divine intervention. The issue at hand is not in itself the question of karmic continuity in the absence of a self, but rather a particular aspect of that larger problem. (See the sections concerning disproof of the self and momentariness and continuity.) For this argument, then, let us agree that the continuum of consciousness carries on after death, and that one’s future rebirth is therefore determined by the shape and character of one’s consciousness at death. Given that, we can see how a mental action—say, holding a wrong view, or slandering the Buddha in one’s thoughts—can have consequences for one’s future, by directly affecting the shape of one’s consciousness. But how do actions of speech and body—such as insulting, or hitting someone—bear their karmic fruit in the mental continuum? Surely forming the intention to hit someone is a consequential mental act. We might think that Buddhists would simply say that it is karmically equivalent, then, to intend to do something (which is a mental act) and to actually do it. Although there is some blurring of the line here (the Buddha does give great moral weight to merely intending to act), intentions and the bodily (or vocal) acts that follow from them are understood as distinct types of actions with distinct karmic results. Furthermore, the Buddha is said to have indicated that the karmic effect—and so the moral significance—of doing something is additionally dependent upon the success of the action. Attempted murder is not punished to the same degree as murder, even karmically.

These distinctions accord with widely held moral instincts, but the Abhidharma philosophers needed a full, causal explanation for why the successful results of physical actions bring about their distinctive effects in one’s consciousness. I can see how my plunging a knife into someone affects him; but how his dying (which may happen later, in the hospital) affects me is invisible, or uncognized. How does what goes around, come around? The Vaibhāṣika answer is that, since his death is a physical event, there must be another physical event—the invisible physicality—which impinges upon me.

Vasubandhu rejects this entity, and provides a compelling explanation of the Buddha’s differentiation between intentions, acts, and success that does not need to appeal to invisible physicality. Although here Vasubandhu answers through the mouth of another (and so, presents this position without explicitly endorsing it), he advocates something like this position more forcefully in his later, Explanation of the Establishment of Action.[28] He admits that there must be a karmic difference between (1) merely intending, (2) intending and acting, and (3) intending, acting and accomplishing the deed. But the difference does not come from the accomplishment of the result itself—that is, it does not come from the death of the murder victim. Rather, the karmic effect is the result of my experience and my beliefs. If I experience myself stabbing someone, and I know that the person died (even if by reading the newspaper the next day), I gain a fuller karmic result than I would have by simply intending to act.

The Vaibhāṣikas present a number of other arguments that suggest the necessity of invisible physicality, all of which follow a similar logic. A close parallel to the example above is a murder by proxy; why do I experience a karmic result if the hit man I’ve hired does his job, but not if he doesn’t? My action was the same either way. The Vaibhāṣikas also point to the enduring, karmic benefits of having taken vows to refrain from negative actions such as killing or stealing. These vows generate a karmic benefit in spite of their being fulfilled through not acting. How is this non-action different from that of someone who just happens not to be killing or stealing? Another argument suggests that advanced practitioners in refined meditative states cannot be said to be practicing the eight-fold path of the Buddha’s teachings, since it includes “right speech,” “right action” and “right livelihood”—but no action at all can be taken while in meditative equipoise. Finally, another argument points out that a donor gains great karmic merit when (obviously, later) the monk who receives and eats her gift of food uses its energy to attain a great meditative accomplishment.

Such arguments draw upon numerous scriptures to indicate that morally significant effects seem to take place in the world even when physical actions are no longer possible or relevant. In each case, Vasubandhu reinterprets the scripture, or the situation, or both, in such a way as to make it sensible to describe the effect without appealing to invisible physicality. In the case of the vow, Vasubandhu says that a vow helps a vow-taker to remember not to do immoral deeds, and the disciplinary vows of monks have the effect of transforming the whole character of the mind. Therefore a disciplined vow-taker does not act without the thought of the vow arising. The vow does not cause a magical imprint on some invisible entity; it transforms the dispositions of the vow-taker. The same is true of the meditating practitioner; there is no lack of “right action” during meditation, because the meditator’s continuum of aggregates is still disposed to act properly after the meditation session is complete. Such arguments exhibit Vasubandhu’s general pattern of reducing apparent continuities to causal chains of momentary events, and eliminating as many extraneous elements from the system as possible.

2.4 Disproof of a Creator God

In the Treasury, Vasubandhu provides an argument against the existence of Īśvara, a God who is the sovereign creator of everything.[29] For Vasubandhu, theism is essentially the absurd notion that all of creation might be the result of a single cause. He begins his disproof with what has been called verbal equivocation (Katsura 2003, p. 113), and might also be taken as a joke or a pun:

Living beings proceed from conditions; nor is it the case that “the cause (kāraṇa) of all the world is a single Īśvara, Puruṣa or Pradhāna [i.e., God].”

What is the reason (hetu) for this?

If you think it is established upon the provision of a reason (hetu), this is a refusal of the statement, “the cause (kāraṇa) of all is a single Īśvara.” (AKBh 101.19–21)

The pun is in the fact that the word for “reason,” hetu, also means “cause.” It is as if Vasubandhu is saying, “If you’re looking for my [just] cause for believing this, then clearly you don’t believe God is the cause of everything! If I believe it, it must be ’cause God made me believe it!” This is somewhat silly, and apparently an equivocation between reasons and causes.

A more serious reading, though, rises to the surface when we notice that Vasubandhu does not, in fact, verbally equivocate. He uses the word hetu to refer to reasons, and another word, kāraṇa, to refer to causes. In his own philosophy, Vasubandhu separates these two regions of reality quite strictly: “Causes” are real, substantial entities, whereas “reasons” are conceptual constructs devoid of causal capacity. (Cf. Davidson’s “Anomalism of the Mental”; see the entries on anomalous monism and Donald Davidson.) This is not to say that Vasubandhu would endorse Sellars’s notion that ideas which inhabit the normative “space of reasons” are irreducible to those within the “space of causes.” (See the discussion of the myth of the given, in the entry on Wilfrid Sellars.) He would not; on the contrary, for Vasubandhu, to say that something is a conceptual construct is to say that it is caused, but in a way quite different from how it appears. This is developed explicitly in his Yogācāra theory of the Three Natures of all entities, where one of the natures is said to be how things appear, and another is how things are caused. (See the discussion of three natures and non-duality.)

Yet here in the Treasury Vasubandhu is only gesturing in this direction. His non-Buddhist opponents would also like to distinguish reasons from causes, so instead of attempting to unify their causal basis himself, Vasubandhu suggests that commitment to the unitary nature of divine causality commits them to conflating them. The serious point behind the opening joke, then, is that philosophy requires that we make distinctions among ideas and entities, and debate assumes differences of opinion and perspective. For Vasubandhu, such differences are evidence that it is impossible that all things have issued from a single cause. He begins, then, with a shot across the bow, which expresses just how seriously he will hold the theists to their claim that all things have one cause.

The majority of Vasubandhu’s argument consists in his support for the notion that the diversity of the world—especially its changes through time—are inconsistent with the notion of a single creator. An important, implicit premise in this argument is the notion that things do not change their defining, characteristic natures. Everything is what it is: “As for something that becomes different: that very thing being different is not accepted, for it is not acceptable that it differs from itself.” (AKBh 193.9–10) Thus, if God is the cause of everything, God is always the cause of everything—or, if God’s nature at time t is to be the cause of everything, then God must cause everything at time t.

In response, the theist proposes a variety of predictable alternatives. One option is that God is posited as the creator of each specific thing at its specific time due to God’s having unique, temporally-indexed desires. One person is caused by God’s desire for a person to be born in Gandhāra in the fourth century, and another person is caused by God’s desire for a person to be born in New York City in 1969. Vasubandhu responds that if that is the case, then things are not caused by a unitary God, but rather each thing is caused by one of God’s countless, distinct desires. Furthermore, the theist is then responsible to account for the causes of those specific desires.

In addition, specific temporally-indexed desires imply that something is interfering with God’s creative action—namely, the particular temporal location. If God is capable of—not only capable of, but having it as His inherent nature to be—creating something, what could possibly prevent that thing’s occurrence at every moment in which God is expressing God’s own nature (which should be every moment forever)? If God has the desire for a tree in Washington Square Park in 2010, it should always be 2010, with a tree in Washington Square Park. Why should God wait? (This argument relies upon a typical Buddhist penchant for particulars and moments as the touchstone of the real.[30])

One unwise option the theist proposes is that God’s creation changes through time because God is using other elements—material causes, for instance—to bring things into being, and those elements follow their own causal laws. That, of course, makes God’s actions subject to other causes, and amounts to the Buddhist view that all things are the results of multiple causes and conditions. Furthermore, when it is proposed that God engages in creation for his own pleasure (prīti), Vasubandhu replies that this means that God is not sovereign because He requires a means (upāya) to bring about a cause, namely his own pleasure. As a cap to this argument, Vasubandhu mocks the idea that a praiseworthy God should be satisfied with the evident suffering of sentient beings. Thus, along with his causal argument, Vasubandhu throws in a barb from the argument from evil.

Vasubandhu’s final argument in this section is to say that theists are, or ought to be, committed to the denial of apparent causes and conditions. If you think that God is the only cause, then you must deny that seeds cause sprouts. This may seem like another overly literalistic reading of the nature of God as the only cause, but is God really deserving of the name “cause,” if He has intermediary causes do His work of creation? For, Vasubandhu points out, ordinarily we do not require that something be an uncaused cause in order to call it a “cause.” We call a seed a cause of a sprout, even if it is itself caused by a previous plant. So to say that God is the “cause” of the sprout whereas the seed is not amounts to denying a visible cause and replacing it with an invisible one. To avoid this, the theist might say that to call God the “cause” is to say that God is the original cause of creation. But if this is what God is doing to gain the name “cause,” and God is beginningless (uncaused), then creation too must be beginningless—which means that, once again, God has nothing to do.

3. Approaches to Scriptural Interpretation

Vasubandhu was a master of Buddhist scripture. A great number of scriptural commentaries are attributed to him, and we find Vasubandhu citing scripture literally hundreds of times throughout his philosophical works. (Pāsādika 1989) Furthermore, Vasubandhu is one of very few Indian or Tibetan authors to have written a treatise dedicated to the interpretation and exposition of Buddhist scripture, called the Proper Mode of Exposition (Vyākhyāyukti).[31] Here is not the place for a thorough survey of this material, which awaits future research. It is, however, worth sketching a characteristic pattern in Vasubandhu’s citation of scripture, and noting its relation to his view of scripture in the Proper Mode of Exposition.

Like other scholastic philosophers, Vasubandhu often cites scriptures in support of an argument. Unlike many others, however, Vasubandhu regularly presents a scriptural passage as a potential counter-argument, only to refute the traditional interpretation of the passage. The opponent’s interpretation, moreover, is quite often the most literal or direct reading of the passage in question. One of Vasubandhu’s characteristic philosophical moves, then, is to argue in favor of a secondary interpretation of a given scriptural passage that might, on its face, be thought to disprove his view.

A prominent, paradigmatic example of this use of scriptural citation takes place in the Twenty Verses Commentary. As will be discussed below (in the section concerning defense of appearance only), this text is dedicated to proving the central Yogācāra thesis of “appearance only” (vijñaptimātra)—that is, that everything in the many worlds of living beings is only apparent, with no real existence outside of perception. A central challenge to this idealistic view, then, comes from the objector’s simple statement that, “If the images of physical forms, and so on, were just consciousness, not physical things, then the Buddha would not have spoken of the existence of the sense bases of physical form, and so on.” (Viṃś 5) Vasubandhu thus adduces the Buddha’s word as the basis of the objection. Then, he turns to further scriptures to account for, and explain away, this extremely well-founded Buddhist doctrine.

Vasubandhu’s response to his internal objector is to explain that the passages in question need to be understood as spoken with a “special intention” (abhiprāya—on which, see Broido 1985, Collier 1998 and Tzohar 2018). Furthermore, in addition to defending the idea of reinterpreting scripture in general, Vasubandhu defends the act of reinterpretation in this case. In fact, we may distinguish four separate elements of the argument: (1) Vasubandhu explains the Buddha’s general practice of speaking words that are not technically true, but are beneficial to his listeners. (2) He proves that such interpretations are sometimes necessary, by providing two passages that without such a reading would prove the Buddha to have contradicted himself. (3) He provides an explanation of the Buddha’s “special intention” in the passage under discussion—that is, he declares what the Buddha actually believes on the topic. And, (4) he suggests why, in this case, the Buddha might have chosen to speak the words he did, instead of simply saying what he really believed.

For (1) and (2), Vasubandhu explains that the Buddha’s statement that “there is a self-generated living being (satva)” must be taken as having a “special intention,” so as to prevent its contradicting his statement that “there is no self or living being (satva), only entities with causes.” (Viṃś 5) Vasubandhu says that the Buddha spoke the first statement in the context of explaining karma, in order to indicate that the continuity of the mental series was not “cut off” (uccheda). If the Buddha had taught about the no-self doctrine at the time he delivered the discourse on “the self-generated living being,” his listeners would have been led to this false view that the mental stream comes to an end at death. Such a false view is often translated as “nihilism,” and among Buddhists it is considered far more dangerous than the false belief in a self, because it entails the further false view that our moral actions have no afterlife consequences.[32] If you believe that, then you are liable to act in a way that will lead you to hell.

The danger of nihilism is perhaps the primary justification for the Buddha’s having spoken words that were technically untrue. Vasubandhu provides a similar example in the “Disproof of the Person” section of the Treasury. (See the section concerning disproof of person.) There, Vasubandhu was arguing with the Personalists, who pointed to a scripture in which the Buddha remained silent when asked whether or not the person existed after death. The Personalists, of course, saw this as evidence that the Buddha affirmed the ineffability of the person. Vasubandhu says, in response, that the Buddha explained quite clearly (to Ānanda, his disciple, after the questioner left) why there had been no good way to answer. To affirm a self would be to imply a false doctrine, but to deny the self (in this case, stating the truth) would cause the confused questioner to fall into a still greater falsehood: Namely, the thought of formerly having had a self, but now having none. This is the view, once again, of the self being “cut off” or “destroyed” (uccheda), the view that leads to moral nihilism.

The danger of the false view of “destruction” is an extreme case, in which the Buddha is silent so as not to have to lead his disciple into a dangerous view. To what degree can this paradigm be extended to suggest other, perhaps less dire, cases in which the Buddha may have neglected to speak frankly? For Vasubandhu, apparently, the presence of a contradiction between two statements from the Buddha is one key. The Buddha cannot have literally meant both that there was no living being (satva) and that living beings (satva) came into being in a particular bodily form. A similar contradiction is brought to bear in the discussion with the Personalists, during their argument over the functionality of memory in the absence of an enduring self. There, Vasubandhu cites a scripture in which the Buddha says that whoever claims to remember past lives is only remembering past aggregates in his own continuum—a quote which vitiates the Personalists’ citation of the Buddha having said of his own past life, “I was such-and-such a person, with such-and-such a form.”

To return to the case at hand from the Twenty Verses Commentary, although Vasubandhu does not indicate a direct contradiction in the Buddha’s words, he does explain (3) what he takes to be the truth behind the Buddha’s statements about the “sense bases of physical form, and so on.” The literal meaning of the twelve sense bases, recall, is simply the listing of the six sensory organs and their six sensory objects. The truth behind this, for Vasubandhu, is the Yogācāra causal story, which tells how conscious events arise from karmic seeds within the mind’s own continuum. Each consciousness comes into being with a particular subject/object appearance imprinted upon it by its karmic seed. There are no subjects and no objects, only “dual” appearances. It is this causal story that was the “special intention”—the real truth—behind the Buddha’s words affirming the sense bases. Of course, the Yogācāra causal story denies the functionality of the senses, and so the “special intention” is a direct contradiction of the literal meaning of the sense bases.

In response to this supposed explanation, the opponent asks for the Buddha’s justification for speaking in this way, and (4) Vasubandhu provides two separate reasons, targeted at two different levels of listeners. For students who do not yet understand the truth of appearance-only, the Buddha taught the sense bases in order to help them to understand the absence of self in persons. This seems to cohere with Vasubandhu’s Treasury argument that uses the sense bases as a way to explain away the apparent self. For students who do understand the truth of appearance-only, the doctrine of the sense bases is useful for helping them to understand the absence of self in the elements—that is, in the sense bases themselves.[33] Thus, for Vasubandhu, the Buddha’s teachings are still useful, even when they are understood to have been spoken from a provisional standpoint.

Perhaps this point can be extended still further. For Vasubandhu, while scriptures are always valid sources of knowledge, to excavate their meaning often requires in-depth, sophisticated, philosophical reasoning. We find Vasubandhu mocking his opponents, in one place in the Treasury, for understanding “the words” rather than “the meaning” of a scriptural passage in question. (204.1) Vasubandhu often argues against his opponents’ overly literal interpretations of scripture as a crucial part of his argument against their philosophical positions. When he turns to a formal analysis of expository method and theory, Vasubandhu defends this broad, rationalist approach to scripture.

In the Proper Mode of Exposition, Vasubandhu defends the legitimacy of the Mahāyāna Sūtras against a “Śrāvaka” opponent, and defends their figurative, Yogācāra interpretation against a Mādhyamika opponent. Cabezon (1992) usefully summarizes Vasubandhu’s arguments here in three general categories: Arguments based on the structure of the canon; arguments based on doctrinal contents; and arguments based upon “intercanonical criteria for authenticity.” As we have seen in his Treasury and Twenty Verses arguments, Vasubandhu argues that naïvely to require that all scriptures be interpreted literally is to insist that the Buddha repeatedly contradicted himself. He cites many internal references to lost or unknown texts, and argues that this shows that no lineage or school can claim to have a complete canon. Unlike his Mādhyamika opponents, Vasubandhu believes that the Mahāyāna Sūtras must be read under a “special intention,” so as to prevent the danger of nihilism. As Cabezon writes, both the Śrāvaka and Madhyamaka position share an over-emphasis on literal readings. Vasubandhu’s emphasis on “correct exegesis” (a literal translation of Vyākhyāyukti) shows the Yogācāra to be the school of greatest hermeneutical subtlety and sophistication.

4. Major Yogācāra Arguments and Positions

4.1 Defense of Appearance Only

The Twenty Verses is Vasubandhu’s most readable, and evidently analytic, philosophical text, and it has consequently drawn a significant degree of modern scholarly attention.[34] It begins with a simple statement, which Vasubandhu defends throughout the brief text and commentary: “Everything in the three realms is only appearance (vijñaptimātra).”[35] The three realms are the three states into which Buddhists believe living beings may be reborn. For all beings except for Buddhas and advanced bodhisattvas, the three realms make up the universe. Vasubandhu glosses this statement with citations from scripture that make it clear that he means to say that there no things (artha), only minds (citta) and mental qualities (caitta). He says that the experience of the three realms is like the appearance of hairs in front of someone with eye disease. It is the experience of something that does not exist as it appears. Although the term has a history of controversy among interpreters of Yogācāra, it seems safe to say that the Twenty Verses defends at least some form of idealism. (See the section on the controversy over Vasubandhu as idealist.)

After stating his thesis that everything is “only apparent,” Vasubandhu immediately voices a potential counter-argument, which consists in four reasons that the three realms being appearance only is impossible: First and second, why are things restricted to specific places and times, respectively? Apparent objects can appear anywhere, at any time. Third, why do beings in a given place and time experience the same objects, and not different objects according to their distinct continua? And fourth, why do objects perform causal functions in the real world, when merely apparent mental objects do not?

These objections aim to prove the impossibility that the world is merely apparent by arguing that the elements of ordinary experience behave in ways that what is merely apparent does not. Vasubandhu sets up, and meets, these objections in order to prove the possibility, and hence the viability of the theory, that everything in experience is appearance only. He shows, essentially, that the objector has a narrow view of what is possible for merely apparent things; appearances are not necessarily limited in the ways the objector thinks.

Notice that it is not incumbent upon Vasubandhu here to prove that all instances of the merely apparent transcend the limitations assumed by the objector. He has not set up this objection in order to try to prove, absurdly, that all mental images, for instance, are spatially restricted, or that all mere appearances perform observable causal functions in the real world. On the contrary, one upshot of the recognition that things are appearance only will be that things do not have the cause-and-effect structure that we ordinarily take them to have. In any event, the positive argument that ordinary experience is, in fact, illusory, comes later and takes the form of an argument to the best explanation. Before an explanation can be the best, though, it must be a possibility. So here, all Vasubandhu must do to counter these initial objections is provide, for each, a single example of a mental event that exemplifies the behavior that the objector claims is only available to physical objects.[36]

To defeat the objections that mental objects are not restricted in space and time, Vasubandhu provides the counterexample that in dreams objects often appear to exist in one place and time, as they do in ordinary waking reality. In a dream, I can be looking at shells on a beach on Long Island, during the summer of my eighth year. It is only upon waking that I come to realize that the dream objects (the shells, the beach) were only mental fabrications, temporally dislocated, with no spatial reality. Thus, what is merely apparent can sometimes have the character of appearing in a particular place and time. To say they do not is to misremember the experience.[37]

Next, to defeat the objection that unlike ordinary physical objects, merely apparent objects are not intersubjectively shared by different beings, Vasubandhu provides the counterexample that in hell, demonic entities appear to torment groups of hell beings. This is a case of a shared hallucination. When the objector wonders why the demons might not in fact be real, Vasubandhu appeals to karma theory: Any being with sufficient merit—sufficient “good karma”—to generate a body capable of withstanding the painful fires of hell would never be born into hell in the first place. Any creature in hell that is not suffering must be an apparition generated by the negative karma of the tormented.

Finally, to defeat the objection that merely apparent objects do not produce functional causal results, Vasubandhu provides the memorable counterexample of a wet dream, in which an evident, physical result is produced by an imagined sexual encounter with a nonexistent lover.

The initial objection to the mere possibility of the “appearance only” theory quelled, Vasubandhu turns to his main positive proof. This consists in a systematic evaluation of every possible account of sensory objects as physical, which ultimately leads Vasubandhu to conclude that no account of physicality makes more sense, or is more parsimonious, than the theory that it is appearance only.

Before turning to Vasubandhu’s treatment of physics, it is worth stopping to note the crucial importance that Buddhist karma theory plays in Vasubandhu’s argument, overall. First, the proof of shared hallucinations in hell depends upon the particulars of the Buddhist belief in the hells. Of course, we might have believed in shared hallucinations even without believing in karma. But the tormenters in hell play an important, double role in Vasubandhu’s argument. He has the objector raise the question again, and suggest as a last-ditch effort that perhaps, the tormenters are physical entities generated and controlled by the karmic energies of the tormented. At this, Vasubandhu challenges his objector: If you’re willing to admit that karma generates physical entities, and makes them move around (pick up swords and saws, etc.), so that they might create painful results in the mental streams of the tormented, why not just eliminate the physical? Isn’t it simpler to say that the mind generates mental images that torment the mind?[38] This a crucial question, because it resonates beyond hell beings, across Buddhist karmic theory.

In the Treasury of the Abhidharma, Vasubandhu expressed the widely-held Buddhist view that in addition to causing beings’ particular rebirths, karma also shapes the realms into which beings are reborn and the non-sentient contents of those realms. Such a belief provides Indian religions with answers to questions often thought unanswerable by western theisms, such as why the mudslide took out my neighbor’s house, but not mine. But this view of karmic causality requires that the physical causes of positive or negative experiences are linked back to our intentional acts. (For more on the continuity problems associated with karmic causality, see the discussion of the disproof of invisible physicality.) Vasubandhu does not say so explicitly, but if it is easier to imagine the causes of a mind-only hell demon than a physical one, it should also be easier to imagine the causes of a mind-only mudslide—assuming that both are generated as a karmic repercussion for the beings that encounter them. The background assumption that any physical world must be subject to karma, therefore places the realist on the defensive from the start. Can the external realist adduce a theory intellectually satisfying enough to counter Vasubandhu’s suggestion that we throw up our hands and admit that what appears to be out there is only in our minds?

It is in response to this that the objector cites scripture, saying that the Buddha did after all, teach of the sense bases, saying that eyes perceive physical forms, and so on. As discussed above, Vasubandhu reinterprets this scripture as having a “special intention” (abhiprāya). (See the section concerning scriptures.) The Buddha did not intend to affirm the ultimate reality of such entities. Yet the objector is not satisfied with Vasubandhu’s alternate reading of the Buddha’s words. In order to doubt such an explicit, repeated, statement, Vasubandhu needs to prove that it could not be interpreted directly. Even if the appearance-only world is possible, and even if it accounts better for karmic causality than the physical world, a direct reading of scripture is still supported, unless and until its doctrines are shown to be internally inconsistent.

4.2 Disproof of Sensory Objects

In order to disprove the possibility of external objects, Vasubandhu delves into the atomic theory of the Kashimiri Vaibhāṣikas as well as that of the (“orthodox”/Hindu) Vaiśeṣikas.[39] The purpose here is to undermine every possible theory that might account for perception as caused by non-mental entities. Vasubandhu’s argument at this stage is entirely based in mereology—the study of the relations between parts and wholes. He argues first that atomism—the view that things are ultimately made up of parts that are themselves partless—cannot work. Then, he argues that any reasonable explanation of objects of perception must be atomic, by arguing that the alternative—an extended, partless whole—is incoherent. Vasubandhu takes it that together, these conclusions prove that external objects must be unreal appearances.

I can only summarize Vasubandhu’s sophisticated mereological arguments. He begins with the assertion that anything that serves as a sensory object must be a whole made up of basic parts, a bare multiplicity of basic parts, or an aggregate. But none of these can work. A whole made up of parts is rejected on the grounds that things are not perceived over and above their parts. This is a well-developed Buddhist Ābhidharmika view, which coheres with the rejection of a self over and above the aggregates. A bare multiplicity of partless parts is rejected on the grounds that separate atoms are not perceived separately. Thus the only sensible option is a grouping of parts—an aggregate—that somehow becomes perceptible by being joined together.

The combination of partless entities, however, is conceptually impossible. Vasubandhu points out that if they if they combine on one “side” with one atom and another “side” with another—those “sides” are parts. The opponent must account for the relation between those parts and the whole, and we are brought back to the beginning. Furthermore, if they are infinitesimal, they cannot be combined into larger objects.

It is proposed, instead, that perhaps a partless entity may be extended in space, and so perceived. But perception is generated by contact between a sensory organ and its object. This requires the object to put up some kind of resistance. But if a thing has no parts, then its near side is its far side, which means that to be adjacent to it is to have passed it by. Partless atoms are therefore logically incapable of providing the resistance that is definitive of physicality and the basis for sensory contact (Vasubandhu says that they cannot produce light on one side and shade on the other). This confirms that entities must be combined into larger groupings in order to be functional and perceptible, which has already been shown impossible.

If atoms and extended partless entities are impossible, so also are unitary sensory objects. Vasubandhu is well practiced in the Abhidharma arguments reducing apparent wholes to their composite entities. Suppose we say I see something that has both blue and yellow in it. How, if it is one unitary thing, can I see these two colors at different points? What makes one point in an object different from another point, if the object is of a single nature? This is clearly parallel to the argument against Īśvara as a single cause of all things. A similar case is movement across an extended thing. As with a partless atom, to step on the near side of a partless extended singular entity would be to step on its far side, too. So there can be no gradual movement across a singular entity. As Vasubandhu concludes, one cannot but derive the need for partless, atomic units from such reasoning. But partless atomic units are imperceptible. So, perception is impossible; apparently perceived objects are only apparent.

The main part of his argument settled, Vasubandhu entertains another set of counterarguments, which are the charges of solipsism and moral nihilism: How, the internal objector asks, can beings interact with one another? What is the karmic benefit of helping or harming, when we are all merely apparent beings? Vasubandhu’s direct, candid response to these challenges may be viewed as a failure of imagination, or a surprising willingness to bite the bullet of anti-realism. Mental streams, he says, interact in essentially the same way as we imagine physical objects to interact. Minds affect minds directly. When you speak to me, and I hear you, we ordinarily think that your mind causes your mouth to produce sounds that my ears pick up and transform into mental events in my mind. Vasubandhu takes Occam’s razor to this account and says that—given that we have no sensible account of physicality, let alone mental causation of a physical event and physical causation of a mental event—it makes more sense if we eliminate everything but the evident cause and the result: Your mind and mine.

Note that Vasubandhu is not saying that nothing in our appearances exists; he is saying, on the contrary, that mere appearances bear all the reality that we need for full intersubjectivity and moral responsibility. It seems worth noting in this context that something similar to Vasubandhu’s option just may be the only option available for a modern physicalist who believes that human minds are constituted by, or out of, neurons. Human persons, for such a modern, do not exist as we imagine them to, and are not causally constituted in ways that we can intuit or even comprehend, except vaguely. Does this mean that we must advert to moral nihilism or solipsism? Vasubandhu’s alternative is to affirm our pragmatic acceptance of our own, and others’ experiences and causal responsibilities, and not to imagine that we must await an account of physicality before trusting the effectiveness of our mental, moral, causality. Read in this way, Vasubandhu seems much closer to Madhyamaka philosophy than is ordinarily assumed; see Nagao (1991).

4.3 Three Natures and Non-Duality

Vasubandhu did the work of defending the controversial, Yogācāra thesis of appearance-only (vijñaptimātra) in his Twenty Verses. In his short, poetic works the Thirty Verses and the Three Natures Exposition, he does not entertain objections.[40] Instead, he draws together the basic doctrinal and conceptual vocabulary of the Yogācāra tradition and forms an elegant, coherent system. The Thirty Verses includes a complete treatment of the Buddhist path from a Yogācāra perspective. In order to understand Vasubandhu’s contribution in this text, it would be necessary to place it against the wide backdrop of previous Yogācāra doctrine. This scholarly work is ongoing. Here, let us focus instead on introducing the basics of the intricate doctrinal structure formulated in the Three Natures Exposition.

The Three Natures Exposition takes as its topic, and its title, the three natures of reality from a Yogācāra perspective: These are the fabricated nature (parikalpita-svabhāva), the dependent nature (paratantra-svabhāva) and the perfected nature (pariniṣpanna-svabhāva). In Yogācāra metaphysics, things no longer have only one nature, one svabhāva; rather, things have three different, if interconnected, natures. We may note immediately how fundamentally this differs from the Treasury, in which the apparent purpose is, at all times, to determine the singular nature of each entity (dharma). In that context, to discover that an entity must be admitted to have more than one, distinct nature, would be to discover that that entity is unreal. Something that changes, for instance, is internally inconsistent because of exhibiting multiple natures. Vasubandhu employs exactly such arguments to deny the ultimate reality of many specific entities (dharma) in the Treasury. Such entities, he says, are unreal; like a “self,” they are only conceptual fabrications (parikalpita).

One of the basic distinguishing features of Great Vehicle (Mahāyāna) metaphysics is the affirmation that not only the person, but all entities (dharma) are empty of a “self” or an inherent nature (svabhāva). That means, in the terms laid out in the Treasury, that all dharmas are only conceptual fabrications. But that is not the only way of looking at things. To say that all things have three inherent natures is not to take back the Great Vehicle’s denial of inherent natures, but rather to explain it. It is to say that, what we ordinarily take to be a thing’s individual character or identity is best understood from three angles, so as to explode its unity. The first nature is the fabricated nature, which is the thing as it appears to be. Of course, to use this term is to indicate the acceptance that things do not really exist the way they appear. This is a thing’s nature as it might be defined and explained in ordinary Abhidharma philosophy, but with the added proviso that we all know that this is not really how things work. The second nature is the dependent nature, which Vasubandhu defines as the causal process of the thing’s fabrication, the causal story that brings about the thing’s apparent nature. The third nature, finally, is the emptiness of the first nature—the fact that it is unreal, that it does not exist as it appears.

Let’s take the most important example, for Buddhists, of a thing that appears real but has no nature: the self. With this as our example of something mistakenly thought to have a nature (svabhāva), we may run through its three natures. The self as it appears is just my self. I seem to be here, as a living being, typing on a keyboard, thinking thoughts. That is the first nature. The second nature is the causal story that brings about this seeming self, which is the cycle of dependent origination. We might appeal to the standard Abhidharma causal story, and say that the twelve sense bases or the five aggregates, causally conjoined, bring about the conceptually-fabricated self. In the Yogācāra, this causal story is entirely mental, of course, so we cannot appeal to the sense bases themselves as the real cause. Rather, the sense bases only appear to be there due to karmic conditioning in my mental stream. For this reason, the second nature should instead be said to be the causal series according to which the mental seeds planted by previous deeds ripen into the appearance of the sense bases, so that I think I am perceiving things—which, in turn, makes me think I have a self. Finally, the third nature is the non-existence of the self, the fact that it does not exist where it appears. Of course, if there was a real self, I could not have provided my explanation of how it comes to appear to be there. In Vasubandhu’s telling, the three natures are all one reality viewed from three distinct angles. They are the appearance, the process, and the emptiness of that same apparent entity.

With this in mind, we can read the opening verses of the Three Natures Exposition:

1. Fabricated, dependent and perfected: So the wise understand, in depth, the three natures.

2. What appears is the dependent. How it appears is the fabricated. Because of being dependent on conditions. Because of being only fabrication.

3. The eternal non-existence of the appearance as it is appears: That is known to be the perfected nature, because of being always the same.

4. What appears there? The unreal fabrication. How does it appear? As a dual self. What is its nonexistence? That by which the nondual reality is there.[41]

These verses emphasize the crystalline, internal structure to the three natures. “What appears” is one nature (the dependent), whereas “how it appears” is the fabricated. “The eternal non-existence of the appearance as it appears” is the perfected. These are ways of talking of the same entity, or event, from different perspectives. Also evident here is the crucial Yogācāra concept of “duality.” The fabricated is said to appear as a “dual self,” whereas reality (dharmatā) is nondual. Since, as we have seen above, Vasubandhu believes in the selflessness of all dharmas, the “dual self” is the false appearance of a self that is attributed to any entity. Things and selves mistakenly appear “dual.” What does this mean?

The twosome denied by the denial of “duality” has many interpretations across Yogācāra thought, but for Vasubandhu the most important kinds of duality are conceptual duality and perceptual duality.[42] Conceptual duality is the bifurcation of the universe that appears necessary in the formation of any concept. When we say of any given thing that it is “physical,” we are effectively saying, at the same time, that all things are either “physical” or “not physical.” We create a “duality” according to which we may understand all things as falling into either one or the other category. This is what it is to define something, and to ascribe it its characteristic nature (svabhāva). This is why every “self” is “dual.” To say something is what it is imposes a duality upon the world. And, given that the world is in causal flux and does not accord with any conceptual construct, every duality imposes a false construct upon the world. To illuminate this with regard to the person, when I say that “I” exist, I am dividing the universe into “self” and “other”—me and not-me. Since, for Buddhists, the self is unreal, this is a mistaken imposition, and of course many ignorant, selfish actions follow from this fundamental conceptual error.

In addition, but closely related to conceptual duality, is perceptual duality. This is the distinction between sensory organs and their objects that appears in perception. When I see a tree, I have the immediate impression that there is a distinction between that tree, which I see, and my eye organs, which see the tree. I take it that my eyes are “grasping” the tree, and furthermore I understand that the eyes (my eyes) are part of me, whereas the tree is not part of me. The same is true of all of the sensory organs and their objects. The Abhidharma system calls the sensory organs the “internal” sense bases, and the sensory objects the “external” ones. It is the combination of the “internal” sense bases upon which I impose the false construction of self. Thus perception provides the basis for the conceptual distinction between self and other.

For Yogācāra Buddhists, however, sense perception is just as false a “duality” as are false conceptual constructions. Given that the external world must be only mind, the sensory experience that we have of a world “out there” is only a figment of our imagination. The self/other distinction implicit in perception is as much a false imposition as is the self/other distinction implicit in the concept, “self.” Perception, like conceptualization, is only a matter of the mind generating “dual” images. As counterintuitive as this sounds, it may be clarified by analogy to the idea of a multi-player virtual reality game. In a shared virtual reality experience, the first thing the computer system must be able to track is where, objectively, everything is (where the various players are, where the castle with the hidden jewels is, where the dragon is hiding, etc.). Then, when any new player logs in, the system can place that player somewhere in the multi-dimensional, virtual world. At that point, the computer must generate a sensory perspective for that individual. Immediately that person experiences herself to exist in a world of a certain kind, with certain abilities to move around, and fight, and so on. But this is only a trick of the software. The world is unreal, and so is the player’s subjective perspective on that world.

For the Yogācāra, our sensory experience is something like this. We are all only mental, and so the apparent physicalities that intervene between us are merely false constructions of our deluded minds. Furthermore, the physical body that we take ourselves to have, as we negotiate the world, making use of our senses, is also not there. Both external and internal realities are mistaken to the degree that we see them as “two” and not “nondual” constructions arising out of a single mental stream.

Vasubandhu’s clearest, most evocative, and most famous explanation of the three natures appears later on, when they are analogized to a magician’s production of an illusion of an elephant, using a piece of wood and a magical spell:

27. It is just as [something] made into a magical illusion with the power of an incantation (mantra) appears as the self of an elephant. A mere appearance (ākāramātra) is there, but the elephant does not exist at all.

28. The fabricated nature is the elephant; the dependent is its appearance (ākṛti); and the nonexistence of an elephant there is the perfected.

29. In the same way, the fabrication of what does not exist appears as the self of duality from the root mind. The duality is utterly nonexistent. A mere appearance (ākṛtimātraka) is there.

30. The root-consciousness is like the incantation. Suchness (tathatā) is understood to be like the piece of wood. Construction (vikalpa) should be accepted to be like the appearance of the elephant. The duality is like the elephant.[43]

Notice the two different elements here in the ending of Verse 30: The “appearance of the elephant” is “construction,” that is, the ongoing process of imagination that arises from the karmic causal stream. The real problem, though, “duality,” the dangerous, false distinction between self and other, is analogized to the illusory elephant itself. If I am at a magic show, I should expect to see the “appearance of an elephant.” That will make the show worth attending. But if I am not a fool, I will not imagine myself to actually see an elephant. That would be to construct duality. For Vasubandhu, this is a crucial distinction. The basic problem for living beings in his view is not that we experience an illusory world; the problem is that we are fooled into accepting the reality of our perceptions and our concepts. Once we no longer believe, once we see the falsity of the illusion, the illusion goes away and we can come to experience the truth that lies behind the illusion—the ineffable “suchness” (tathatā), the piece of wood.

5. Controversy over Vasubandhu as “Idealist”

Let us posit that metaphysical idealism need not be the counterintuitive view that all that exists is, simply, mental. To call a view idealist it is sufficient merely that it hold that everything is dependent upon mind—a mind, or many minds. Idealists hold that the natures or forms of things are mind-dependent. Of course, such dependence is, in itself, counterintuitive, given that we generally take the physical world to have existence independent of minds. Contemporary prevailing wisdom holds that the direction of causal dependence goes in the opposite direction; the physical world in fact generates and sustains minds (using neurons to do so). Idealism says that ideas, or minds, are in one way or other behind, or prior to, all other forms of existence.

Given this definition, is Vasubandhu, the author of the Twenty Verses and the Thirty Verses and probably the Three Natures Exposition, a metaphysical idealist? At first blush, it seems quite sensible to say that he is. The evident purpose of the Twenty Verses is to argue that the core background assumptions of Mahāyāna Buddhism (especially its views on karma) suggest the idealistic thesis that is asserted in the text’s opening: “In the Great Vehicle, the threefold world is only appearance.”[44] Vasubandhu argues throughout the Twenty Verses that whatever aspects of the world appear to be independent of mind, they are better explained as mental constructions. What that means is, apparently, that not only is Vasubandhu an idealist in the sense that he believes that everything in experience is dependent upon mind, but he also believes that everything simply is mind. This is the radical “mind only” (cittamātra) position that he believes is necessitated by adherence to a Mahāyāna worldview.

Things are not quite this simple, however. First, it is important to note two levels to Vasubandhu’s “idealism.” The first level points to an analysis of what appears in perception. Vasubandhu says that everything that we ordinarily ascribe existence in the world—such as a self or an object—is actually only mental. Tables and nebulae and eyes are mental fabrications that have no existence apart from their “shape” (ākāra), the way they appear.[45] The second level points to the causal story that brings about such appearances. Along with other Yogācārins, Vasubandhu argues that that causal story too is only mental. Perception, in the form of active sensory and mental consciousnesses, is caused by the “storehouse consciousness” (ālayavijñāna), which stores, in mental form, the seeds of all of our future experiences. The storehouse is constantly replenished, because new “seeds” (bīja) are created every time we enact a morally significant action (karma).

It is mental causation, then, that brings about our mental experiences. It is this second level, then, that confirms Vasubandhu as an idealist. Not only the reality that we inhabit (which we ordinarily think of as at least partly non-mental), but also the causal supports upon which such a reality depends, are only mental. Even if the storehouse consciousnesses of living beings provided ongoing support to a real, physical world, we would still want to call that view “idealism” for its insistence on the causal priority of the mental. Since Vasubandhu does not say as much, but instead says that everything that is created by minds is itself mental, we might say that in addition to a causal idealism, Vasubandhu’s is a universal, ontological idealism.

Behind both of these levels, however, there is an important sense in which Vasubandhu is not really an idealist. Like all Mahāyāna Buddhists, Vasubandhu believes that whatever can be stated in language is only conventional, and therefore, from an ultimate perspective, it is mistaken. Ultimate reality is an inconceivable “thusness” (tathatā) that is perceived and known only by enlightened beings. Ultimately, therefore, the idea of “mind” is just as mistaken as are ordinary “external objects.” For this reason, we can say that Vasubandhu is an idealist, but only in the realm of conventions. Ultimately, he affirms ineffability.

Level 1 Experience  False Appearances (self, objects, concepts)  Idealism
Level 2 Causality Storehouse Consciousness (produces consciousness) Idealism
Level 3 Ultimate Reality Only Buddhas Know (tathatā)  Ineffability 

Levels of Analysis of Vasubandhu

It is extremely important to keep these levels apart, in order to prevent Vasubandhu from committing an evident self-contradiction. At the end of his commentary to verse 10 of the Twenty Verses, Vasubandhu imagines an interlocutor challenging the appearance-only view by saying that if no dharmas exist at all, then so also appearance-only doesn’t exist. How, then, can it be established? This charge of self-referential incoherence is faced by anti-realists of all stripes, and it is familiar to Buddhist philosophers from Nāgārjuna’s Vīgrahavyāvartanī. (See the entry on Nāgārjuna in this encyclopedia.) Vasubandhu’s reply in the Twenty Verses Commentary is that appearance-only does not mean the nonexistence of dharmas. It only means the absence of a nature (svabhāva) that is falsely attributed to a constructed self (kalpitātmanā), and Vasubandhu is quick to say that when one establishes appearance-only, appearance-only must also be understood to be itself a construction, without a self. Otherwise, there would be something other than an appearance, which would by definition contradict appearance-only. All there is, is appearance, and everything that appears is a false construction of self.

We can take two important lessons from this. First, representation-only cannot be the ultimate truth. If Vasubandhu were affirming the ultimate reality of the “mind-only” causal story that brings about appearances, or the appearances themselves (levels 2 and 1, respectively), then he would surely have said so in response to the charge of self-referential, nihilistic incoherence. Instead, his argument adverts to another level for ultimate reality. Madhyamaka critics of Yogācāra have made much of the notion that the latter have reified the mind and made it a new “ultimate.”[46] Yet Vasubandhu’s position is clearly intended to elude such a critique.

Second, for Vasubandhu the lack of a self-nature (svabhāva) just is, precisely, what he means by “appearance-only.” This is also contrary to a common understanding of Yogācāra which arises from the equation of “appearance-only” with “mind-only.” This equation is not, technically, a mistake in the case of Vasubandhu. He says, specifically, that “mind” (citta) and “appearance” (vijñapti) are synonyms. The mistake is what we moderns tend to think, based on a background assumption of mind/matter Cartesian dualism—namely, that the expression “mind only” is used to affirm the reality of the mental at the expense of the physical. Here, reality is certainly not physical, but that is not Vasubandhu’s point. His point is to equate the lack of independent nature (svabhāva) with the product of mental construction. This is a simple statement of idealism, as mentioned above: Everything that exists must either have independent existence, or be dependent upon mind, a mental construction; and since, for the Great Vehicle, nothing has independent existence, everything is only a mental construction. What it means to be “mind only,” then, is not simply to be made of mental stuff rather than physical stuff. It is to be a false construction by a deluded mind. Again, we can see that there is no possibility that Vasubandhu is talking about the “ultimate” here.

These points, and the above table, may clarify some of the difficulties in the ongoing, contentious debates over whether Vasubandhu and other Yogācārins should be classified as idealists or mystics. A quarter century ago, Thomas A. Kochumuttom (1982) argued quite powerfully and sensibly for his time that Vasubandhu should not be called an idealist, but he was arguing primarily against authors such as Theodore Stcherbatsky and S. N. Dasgupta, about whom he wrote (200):

All of the above quoted passages clearly show that their authors almost unanimously accept vijñapti-mātratā or prajñapti-mātratā or citta-mātratā as the Yogācārin’s description of the absolute, undefiled, undifferentiated, non-dual, transcendent, pure, ultimate, permanent, unchanging, eternal, supra-mundane, unthinkable, Reality, which, according to them, is the same as Parniṣpanna-svabhāva, or Nirvāṇa, or Pure Consciousness, or Dharma-dhātu, or Dharma-kāya, or the Absolute Idea of Hegel, or the Brahman of Vedānta.

One can appreciate Kochumuttom’s frustration. Vasubandhu is cautious not to conflate a description of perceived entities as reducible to only mind (Level 1) with a description of the ineffable ultimate reality (Level 3). Vasubandhu explicitly denies that “mind” has ultimate reality. He is not a Hegelian idealist.

But not all idealists are Hegelian, absolute idealists. Among idealisms, Vasubandhu’s is more closely aligned with Kant’s, in that both assert that the objects of our experience are only representations, while both also affirm the reality of unknowable things in themselves (Ding an sich).[47] Kochumuttom was aware of this, and even in the course of his extended argument against using the term “idealism” for Vasubandhu, he allowed that the term might be appropriate if understood in this way:

This should not be understood to mean that there are no things other than consciousness. On the contrary, it means only that what falls within the range of experience are different forms of consciousness, while the things-in-themselves remain beyond the limits of experience. (48)
The form in which a thing is thought to be grasped is purely imagined (parikalpita), and therefore is no sure guide to the thing-in-itself. It is in this sense, and only in this sense, that Vasubandhu’s system can be called idealism. It by no means implies that there is nothing apart from ideas or consciousness. (53)

Is the term “idealism” acceptable for the view that, even if nothing expressible in language has ultimate reality, mental events are still more real than physical events, which do not have even conventional reality? Perhaps “conventionalist idealism” would be a good term for this view, but surely it sits squarely within the range of idealisms. To say, with emphasis, as some do, that this view is not idealism, may be to privilege a narrow understanding of the term.

In addition, the issue may be more than semantic. It will strike some as overstating the case to say, as Kochumuttom does, that the fact that everything within perception is only mind “by no means implies that there is nothing apart from ideas or consciousness.” Vasubandhu’s arguments in the Twenty Verses are intended to exclude the possibility of anything at all that may be coherently asserted to be non-mental.[48] So the doctrine of appearance-only does imply that there is nothing apart from ideas or consciousness, at least, as far as logic and implications are allowed to go. The only exceptions would be things about which we can say nothing. So what could allow us to say about them that they are exceptions?[49]

Whether or not one wants to use the word “idealism” for Vasubandhu thus depends to a large degree upon just how strongly one wants to lean upon the idea that idealists must affirm the ultimate reality of mind. The main arguments that remain against viewing Vasubandhu as an idealist, exemplified prominently today by Dan Lusthaus, emphasize this idea. Given that many Buddhists in India, Tibet and East Asia have understood the Yogācāra to be affirming the ultimate reality of the mental, the denial of such a view on Vasubandhu’s behalf is an important and useful corrective. Lusthaus believes that Vasubandhu is not a “metaphysical idealist” or an “ontological idealist” but rather an “epistemological idealist,” meaning that Vasubandhu is concerned only about awareness and its contents, and is not in the business of affirming or denying anything about ultimate reality. For this reason, Lusthaus refers to Yogācāra as “phenomenology.”[50]

A final complaint is that the use of the term “idealism” is anachronistic or for some other reason inappropriate in its application to pre-modern India. Kochummutom’s point that the term encompasses too much is well taken. It is one thing (perhaps already stretching the meaning) to apply the term “idealism,” as R.P. Srivastava (1973) does, to modern thinkers whose views have been influenced by European idealists, such as Aurobindo, Vivekananda and Radhakrishnan. But it is anachronistic if we are to impose upon Vasubandhu the modern associations and baggage that come along with the term, which would include an advocacy of private, personal, sacred, “religious experience.” Vasubandhu may be an idealist, in a strict sense, but he is not what 20th century religious studies textbooks call a “mystic philosopher.” Vasubandhu does not, generally, appeal to his own, individual personal experience as evidence or confirmation of his positions. On the contrary, Vasubandhu repeatedly employs reasoning to cast doubts upon the apparent realities evident through perception, whether external or internal. This is, perhaps, a reason to avoid describing Vasubandhu as a “phenomenologist.” His work does not take the direct examination of “experience” as its theme, but, rather, it draws upon scripture and rational argumentation for its critiques of the available accounts of reality.


Primary Sources

Pradhan, Prahlad (ed.), 1975. Abhidharmakośabhāṣyam of Vasubandhu. Tibetan Sanskrit Works 8. First Edition 1967. Patna: K. P. Jayaswal Research Institute. See also Śāstrī (2008).
La Vallée Poussin, Louis de (ed.), 1932–33. “Le petit traite de Vasubandhu-Nagarjuna sur les trois natures,” Melanges chinois et bouddhiques 2: 147–161. See also Mimaki et al. (1989).
Lévi, Sylvain (ed.), 1925. Vijñaptimātratāsiddhi: Deux Traités de Vasubandhu: Viṃśatikā et Triṃśikā. Paris: Bibliothèque de l’École des Hautes Études. See also Mimaki et al. (1989).

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Other Internet Resources

  • Tzohar, Roy, “Vasubandhu,” in Oxford Bibliographies Online.
  • Vasubandhu,” entry by K. T. S. Sarao, in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • Vasubandhu,” entry by Dan Lusthaus on the Yogācāra Buddhism Research Association webpages.

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