Notes to Abstract Objects

1. See Swoyer 2007 and Cowling 2017 for further discussion of abstract and concrete entities.

2. Some (van Inwagen 1977, 1983; Kripke 1973 [2013]), analyze these names as referring to theoretical entities of literary criticism or abstract objects, but only in so far as they occur in the context of statements about fictions (e.g., when we critically reflect on the characters of a story), while others (Thomasson 1999) regard all the uses of these names as signifying abstract artifacts (and thus ontologically dependent on concrete objects).

3. Indispensability arguments in other areas of philosophical enquiry, such as ethics, have also been developed. See Enoch 2011, 2016; Leibowitz & Sinclair 2016.

4. Lewis was trying to determine whether any of the ways for defining abstract objects would categorize nonactual possible worlds (as he understood them) as abstract.

5. Donato and Falguera 2020 make a similar case in connection with the idea that scientific models are abstract artifacts.

6. The two distinctions allow us to consider four kinds of properties: qualitative intrinsic (e.g., being human); extrinsic qualitative (e.g., being the largest planet); intrinsic non-qualitative (e.g., being Barack Obama); non-qualitative extrinsic (e.g., being 5 cm taller than Napoleon Bonaparte).

7. Note, however, the limitations of the example, since the molecular compositions of \(A\) and \(B\) cannot be the same.

8. Cowling (2017, 89) also discusses a ‘non-duplication’ criterion.

9. Some reminiscences of this proposal can be traced in the work of Meinong (1904, 1915) and in that of Mally (1912); more recently in Parsons’ attempt (1980) to reconstruct Meinong’s theory axiomatically.

10. The fact that only abstract objects encode properties cannot be used to define abstract objects because it leaves out the null abstract object, an abstract object which encodes no properties.

11. Zalta’s theory of properties extends to a theory of relations and propositions. The comprehension principle for relations and propositions is just a generalization of the principle for properties, extended to the cases where \(n\geq 2\) and \(n\! =\! 0\). Relation and proposition identity are then defined in terms of property identity. See Zalta 1983, 1988, and 1993.

12. Balaguer (1998) also formulates a plenitude principle for what he calls ‘full-blooded’ platonism. But his principle is primarily about mathematical objects and is a conditional one; his principle essentially asserts that every possible mathematical object exists, though see Colyvan & Zalta 1999 for criticism. Balaguer (2020) asserts a similar principle for wrong-like properties. In any case, Balaguer does not advocate for platonism, not even one based on a plenitude principle (though he agrees that the latter is the best version of platonism). Nor does he advocate for nominalism (not even for the fictionalist version). His view is that there may be no fact of the matter since the best arguments for platonism and the best arguments for nominalism/fictionalism cancel each other out and are inconclusive.

13. See, for example, Zalta 2006 for a discussion of how object theory handles the case of the unit set of Socrates, i.e., \(\{\textrm{Socrates}\}\).

14. These rules include syntactic and semantic rules, rules of reasoning, and methods of proof.

15. When the concept of reality occurs in internal questions about the existence of things, then it “is an empirical non-metaphysical concept” (Carnap 1950 [56]).

16. See Fine 2005 for a different postulational proposal, namely his procedural postulationist account of mathematical knowledge.

17. This criterion goes back to Hilbert, who suggested that mathematical existence is guaranteed by consistency.

18. See Rosen 2011 for an analysis of the notion of grounding in relation to these issues.

19. Thin objects in an absolute sense (i.e., pure sets, directions, numbers) simply make no substantial demand on the world (see Linnebo 2018, 4).

20. Linnebo does attempt to make the notion of having a shallow nature precise. He appeals to the notion of an intrinsic relation and the notion of a relation being reducible on a sortal \(F\). Intrinsic relations are similar to intrinsic properties (which were discussed earlier, in Section 3.5.4); they are relations that things bear to one another in virtue of how they are and how they are related to each other, as opposed to how they are related to things outside of them and how things outside of them are (see the entry on intrinsic vs. extrinsic properties). (For example, the relation of being parallel is intrinsic because of how the lines are related to each other, and the relation of similarity, which may hold between concrete geometrical figures, is intrinsic because of the shape of the figures.) The definition of a relation being reducible on a sortal \(F\) occurs in 2018, 192–195, and we omit the explanation here. But with these notions, Linnebo says that an object \(x\) has a shallow nature if and only if there is a sortal \(F\), such that \(x\) is an \(F\) and all the intrinsic relations on \(x\) are reducible on \(F\).

Copyright © 2021 by
José L. Falguera <>
Concha Martínez-Vidal <>
Gideon Rosen

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