Intrinsic vs. Extrinsic Properties

First published Sat Jan 5, 2002; substantive revision Thu Jan 11, 2018

We have some of our properties purely in virtue of the way we are. (Our mass is an example.) We have other properties in virtue of the way we interact with the world. (Our weight is an example.) The former are the intrinsic properties, the latter are the extrinsic properties. This seems to be an intuitive enough distinction to grasp, and hence the intuitive distinction has made its way into many discussions in philosophy, including discussions in ethics, philosophy of mind, metaphysics, epistemology and philosophy of physics. Unfortunately, when we look more closely at the intuitive distinction, we find reason to suspect that it conflates a few related distinctions, and that each of these distinctions is somewhat resistant to analysis.

1. Introduction

The standard way to introduce the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties is by the use of a few orientating characterisations. David Lewis provides the following list:

A sentence or statement or proposition that ascribes intrinsic properties to something is entirely about that thing; whereas an ascription of extrinsic properties to something is not entirely about that thing, though it may well be about some larger whole which includes that thing as part. (Lewis 1983a: 197)

A thing has its intrinsic properties in virtue of the way that thing itself, and nothing else, is. Not so for extrinsic properties, though a thing may well have these in virtue of the way some larger whole is … (Lewis 1983a: 197)

If something has an intrinsic property, then so does any perfect duplicate of that thing; whereas duplicates situated in different surroundings will differ in their extrinsic properties. (Lewis 1983a: 197)

The other way to introduce the subject matter is by providing examples of paradigmatic intrinsic and extrinsic properties. One half of this task is easy: everyone agrees that being an uncle is extrinsic, as is being six metres from a rhododendron. The problem with using this method to introduce the distinction is that there is much less agreement about which properties are intrinsic. Lewis has in several places (1983a, 1986a, 1988) insisted that shape properties are intrinsic, but one could hold that an object’s shape depends on the curvature of the space in which it is located at, and this might not even be intrinsic to that space (Nerlich 1979), let alone the object (see also Bricker 1993 and Skow 2007). Lewis also mentions charge and internal structure as being examples of intrinsic properties. (For ease of exposition, we will assume below that shape properties are intrinsic. We will also assume that properties like being made of tin, and having a mass of 500kg are intrinsic.)

1.1 Philosophical Importance

The distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties plays an essential role in stating several interesting philosophical problems. Historically, the most prominent of these has to do with notions of intrinsic value. G. E. Moore (1903: §18) noted that we can make a distinction between things that are good in themselves, or possess intrinsic value, and those that are good as a means to other things. To this day there is still much debate over whether this distinction can be sustained (Feldman 1998, Kagan 1998), and, if it can, which kinds of things possess intrinsic value (Krebs 1999). In particular, one of the central topics in contemporary environmental ethics is the question of which kinds of things (intelligent beings, conscious beings, living things, species, etc) might have intrinsic value. While this is the oldest (and still most common) use of the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction in philosophy, it has not played much role in the discussions of the distinction in metaphysics, to which we now turn.

As P. T. Geach (1969) noted, the fact that some object $$a$$ is not $$F$$ before an event occurs but is $$F$$ after that event occurs does not mean that the event constitutes, in any deep sense, a change in $$a$$. To use a well-worn example, at the time of Socrates’s death Xanthippe became a widow; that is, she was not a widow before the event of her husband’s death, but she was a widow when it ended. Still, though that event constituted (or perhaps was constituted by) a change in Socrates, it did not in itself constitute a change in Xanthippe. Geach noted that we can distinguish between real changes, such as what occurs in Socrates when he dies, from mere changes in which predicates one satisfies, such as what occurs in Xanthippe when Socrates dies. The latter he termed ‘mere Cambridge’ change. There is something of a consensus that an object undergoes real change in an event iff there is some intrinsic property it satisfied before the event but not afterwards.

David Lewis (1986a, 1988) built on this point of Geach’s to mount an attack on endurantism, the theory that objects persist by being wholly located at different times, and that there can be strict identity between an object existing at one time and one existing at another time. Lewis argues that this is inconsistent with the idea that objects undergo real change. If the very same object can be both $$F$$ (at one time) and not $$F$$ (at another), this means that $$F$$-ness must be a relation to a time, but this means that it is not an intrinsic property. So any property that an object can change must be extrinsic, so nothing undergoes real change. Lewis says that this argument supports the rival theory of perdurantism, which says that objects persist by having different temporal parts at different times. While this argument is controversial (see Haslanger (1989), Johnston (1987) and Lowe (1988) for some responses), it does show how considerations about intrinsicality can resonate within quite different areas of metaphysics.

A third major area where the concept of intrinsicality has been put to work is in stating various supervenience theses. Frank Jackson (1998) defines physicalism in terms of duplication and physical duplication, which are in turn defined in terms of intrinsic properties. Similarly, Jaegwon Kim (1982) defines a mind/body supervenience thesis in terms of intrinsic properties. As Theodore Sider (1993) notes, the simplest way to define the individualist theory of mental content that Tyler Burge (1979) attacks is as the claim that the content of a thinker’s propositional attitudes supervenes on the intrinsic properties of the thinker. And many internalist theories in epistemology are based around the intuition that whether a thinker is justified in believing some proposition supervenes on the intrinsic properties of the thinker.

A fourth area where the concept of intrinsically has been employed is to state recombination principles intended to describe what possible states of the world there are. (See Lewis 1986a.) An initial attempt to state such a principle might be (R1), where $$x$$ is wholly distinct from $$y$$ iff $$x$$ and $$y$$ have no parts in common. (As is standard in philosophical usage, each thing is counted as a part of itself. Hence, things are not wholly distinct from themselves.)

• (R1) For any properties $$p$$ and $$q$$ , it is possible that there are two wholly distinct things, $$x$$ and $$y$$, such that $$x$$ has $$p$$ and $$y$$ has $$q$$.

Given an abundant theory of properties according to which each (non-defective) predicate expresses a property, however, (R1) clearly fails, since it isn’t possible for there to be an $$x$$ and a $$y$$ such that $$x$$ has the property of being made of gold, and $$y$$ has the property of being such that nothing is made of gold. This defect with (R1) can be fixed by replacing (R1) with (R2).

• (R2) For any intrinsic properties $$p$$ and $$q$$, it is possible that there are two wholly distinct things, $$x$$ and $$y$$, such that $$x$$ has $$p$$ and $$y$$ has $$q$$.

While being made of gold and being such that nothing is made of gold refutes (R1), they don’t refute (R2), since being such that nothing is made of gold is clearly non-intrinsic.

Most of the philosophical applications of intrinsicality are independent of its precise analysis. Work on its analysis, however, has helped clarify these applications by allowing us to distinguish between different notions of intrinscality and different notions in the vicinity of intrinsicality, and by giving us a greater understanding of these various notions and of what properties satisfy them. A good example of the latter kind of advance is Theodore Sider’s (2003) observation that most of the properties in folk theory are ‘maximal’ and hence not intrinsic properties. This observation provides a strong argument against various theories that appeal to the intuitive intrinsicality of some everyday property.

Though these are the most prominent uses of the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction in philosophy, they by no means exhaust its uses. Many applications of the distinction are cited by I. L. Humberstone (1996), including the following: George Schlesinger (1990) uses the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties to state a non-trivial version of Mill’s principle of the uniformity of nature. Wlodzimierz Rabinowicz (1979) uses the distinction to formulate principles of universalizability for moral principles and natural laws. And E. J. Khamara (1988) uses a distinction between relational and non-relational properties to state a non-trivial version of the principle of Identity of Indiscernibles.

1.2 Global and Local

In addition to the “global” concept of a property being intrinsic, there is a “local” concept of something having a property in an intrinsic fashion (see Humberstone 1996, p. 206). For each of Lewis’s characterisations concerning the concept of an intrinsic property quoted in section 1.1, there is a corresponding characterisation for the concept of a thing having a property in an intrinsic fashion. These are:

1. $$x$$ has $$F$$ in an intrinsic fashion iff a sentence ascribing $$F$$ to $$x$$ is entirely about that thing.
2. $$x$$ has $$F$$ in an intrinsic fashion iff $$x$$ has $$F$$ in virtue of how $$x$$ itself, and nothing else, is.
3. $$x$$ has $$F$$ in an intrinsic fashion iff every duplicate of $$x$$ has $$F$$.

It follows from at least the third of these characterisations that something can have an extrinsic property in an intrinsic fashion. For example, since every duplicate of a piece of tin has the property of being made of tin, every duplicate of a piece of tin also has the extrinsic property of being either made of tin or married. As a result, it follows from the third characterisation that each piece of tin has the property of being either made of tin or married in an intrinsic fashion, despite this property being extrinsic.

Two plausible principles linking the local and global concepts of intrinsicality are (GTL) and (LTG) (see Humberstone 1996, p. 228).

• (GTL) If $$F$$ is an intrinsic property, then it is necessary that every $$x$$ that has $$F$$ has $$F$$ in an intrinsic fashion
• (LTG) If it is necessary that every $$x$$ that has $$F$$ has $$F$$ in an intrinsic fashion, then $$F$$ is an intrinsic property

In addition to the two-place predicate ‘has … in an intrinsic fashion’, we can introduce a modifier ‘intrinsically’, where, adapting one of the characterisations above, $$x$$ is intrinsically $$F$$ iff $$x$$ is $$F$$ in virtue of how $$x$$ itself, and nothing else, is. (cf. Humberstone 1996, p. 228). This modifier takes predicates as arguments rather than names of properties or variables ranging over properties. Nominalists, who don’t believe in properties, might attempt to use this modifier to capture the intuitive distinctions associated with intrinsicality without committing themselves to properties. For example, a nominalist might claim that a table is intrinsically rectangular, while claiming to consistently hold that there is no property of being rectangular. (For simplicity, we will assume in the following that nominalism is false and that there are abundantly many properties and relations, some of which are intrinsic and some of which are extrinsic.)

There might be further reasons to employ either the two place predicate ‘has … in an intrinsic fashion’, or the modifier ‘intrinsically’, rather than the one-place predicate ‘is intrinsic’. For example, one might think that at least one of the former two notions is more fundamental than the latter notion, or that the latter notion is misguided in some way that at least one of the former notions isn’t. (See, for example, Figdor 2008.)

1.3 Relations

While this article focuses on the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic one-place properties, it is important to recognize that the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic also applies to multiple place relations. As in the case of one-place properties, the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic multiple place relations can be introduced by characterisations and examples. One characterisation is the following:

An $$n$$-place intrinsic relation is an $$n$$-place relation that $$n$$ things stand in in virtue of how they are and how they are related to each other, as opposed to how they are related to things outside of them and how things outside of them are; whereas, this is not the case for extrinsic $$n$$-place relations.

Examples of extrinsic two-place relations include being as popular as, and having the same cousin as. Possible examples of intrinsic two-place relations include being 1 m away from and being made of the same type of metal as. (The claim that distance relations like being 1 m away from are intrinsic will be denied by philosophers who deny that shape properties are intrinsic.)

As well as the global notion of an $$n$$-place relation being intrinsic, there is the local notion of $$n$$ things standing in a relation in an intrinsic fashion. A characterisation of this local notion is:

$$n$$ things stand in a relation $$R$$ in an intrinsic fashion iff the $$n$$ things stand in $$R$$ in virtue of how they are and how they are related to each other, as opposed to how they are related to things outside of them and how things outside of them are.

2. Notions of Intrinsicality

A number of different distinctions have been called the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction. As J. Michael Dunn (1990) notes, some authors have used ‘intrinsic’ and ‘extrinsic’ to mean ‘essential’ and ‘accidental’. Dunn is surely right in saying that this is a misuse of the terms. A more interesting distinction is noted by Brian Ellis (1991; discussed in Humberstone 1996: 206). (See also Figdor 2008 and Figdor 2014 for a discussion of a related notion of intrinsicality.) Ellis suggests we should distinguish between properties that objects have independently of any outside forces acting on them (what we will call the Ellis-intrinsic properties), and those that they have in virtue of those outside forces (the Ellis-extrinsic properties). For many objects (such as, say, a stretched rubber band) their shape will be dependent on the outside forces acting on them, so their shape will be Ellis-extrinsic. If one is committed to the idea that shapes are intrinsic, one should think this means that the distinction between the Ellis-intrinsic and Ellis-extrinsic properties is not the same as the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction. Such a judgement may seem a little hasty, but in any case we will turn now to distinctions that have received more attention in the philosophical literature.

2.1 Relational vs. Non-Relational Properties

Many writers, especially in the literature on intrinsic value, use ‘relational’ for the opposite of intrinsic. This seems to be a mistake since many properties seem to be both be relational and intrinsic. For example, most people have the property having longer legs than arms, and indeed seem to have this property in an intrinsic fashion, even though the property consists in a certain relation being satisfied. Maybe the property is not intrinsic if whether or not something is an arm or a leg is extrinsic, so perhaps this isn’t a conclusive example, but it seems troubling. And, in any case, there are other examples that can’t be responded to in this way. For example, the property of having a proper part is surely intrinsic, but it also appears to be a relational property.

As Humberstone 1996 notes, some might respond by suggesting that a relational property is one such that if an object has it, then it bears some relation to a non-part of it. But this won’t do either. Not being within a mile of a rhododendron is clearly relational, but does not consist in bearing a relation to any non-part, as we can see by the fact that a non-rhododendron all alone in a world can satisfy it.

A further response might be to say that a relational property should be a property that involves a relation that can only relate wholly distinct things, and that, given this construal of a relational property, non-intrinsic properties are relational properties. However, this response faces difficulties also. For example, this account would presumably classify the property of being such that there is a cube as being intrinsic. This property, however, is not intrinsic.

While the notion of a relational property should be distinguished from the notion of a non-intrinsic property, it might be that the notion of intrinsic properties can be given an account in terms of relationality. One such account due to Francesscotti is discussed in the supplement:

The Relational Account of Intrinsicality.

2.2 Local vs. Non-Local Properties

We now turn to the notion of intrinsicality characterised by the characterisations listed in section 1. Or perhaps better, we now turn to the notions of intrinsicality characterised by these characterisations, since, while Lewis thought that each of these characterisations characterise a single notion of intrinsically, it is plausible that they characterise different notions. In this subsection, we will discuss the notion characterised by the first characterisation which involves aboutness. In the next two subsections, we will discuss the notions characterised by the other two characterisations.

Lewis’s first characterisation is:

A sentence or statement or proposition that ascribes intrinsic properties to something is entirely about that thing; whereas an ascription of extrinsic properties to something is not entirely about that thing, though it may well be about some larger whole which includes that thing as part. (Lewis 1983a: 111–2)

As Marshall 2016a points out, the notion of aboutness employed in this characterisation is plausibly that of intrinsic aboutness, where intrinsic aboutness can be intuitively characterised by (1).

• (1) A state of affairs $$s$$ is intrinsically about a thing $$x$$ iff $$s$$ (either truly or falsely) describes how $$x$$ and its parts are and how they are related to each other, as opposed to how $$x$$ and its parts are related to other things and how other things are.

Using the notion of intrinsic aboutness, Lewis’s first characterisation can be more precisely stated by the schema (2).

• (2) The property of being $$F$$ is intrinsic iff, necessarily, for any $$x$$, the state of affairs of $$x$$ being $$F$$ is intrinsically about $$x$$.

For any predicate $$F$$ expressing a property $$p$$, and any name $$n$$ referring to an $$x$$, define the ascription of $$p$$ to $$x$$ to be the state of affairs expressed by $$\ulcorner Fn\urcorner$$. Using this definition, we can replace the schema (2) with the sentence (3).

• (3) For any property $$p, p$$ is intrinsic iff, necessarily, for any $$x$$, the ascription of $$p$$ to $$x$$ is intrinsically about $$x$$.

(3) plausibly classifies being a cube as intrinsic, since, for any $$x$$, the state of affairs of $$x$$ being a cube plausibly describes how $$x$$ and its parts are and how they are related to each other, as opposed to how they are related to other things and how other things are. In contrast, (3) plausibly classifies being an uncle as non-intrinsic, since its ascription to a thing is not only about how it and its parts are and how they are related to each other, but also about how it is related to things outside of it. (3) also plausibly classifies being Obama as non-intrinsic since the ascription of being Obama to Clinton, namely the state of affairs of Obama being identical to Clinton, is not wholly about Clinton, but is also about Obama. Finally, (3) also appears to classify being such that there is a number as non-intrinsic, even if it is necessary that there are numbers. This is because the ascription of this property to Clinton, namely the state of affairs that Clinton is such that there is a number, appears to be not wholly about how Clinton is, but is also about how things wholly distinct from Clinton are. (We will assume that the intuition underlying this judgement is correct. However, this is not uncontroversial. See Sider 1996 for a rejection of a closely related intuition and Eddon 2011 for a reply to this rejection.)

In the following, we will call the properties classified as intrinsic by (3) local properties, and call the properties classified by (3) as not intrinsic non-local properties. (This notion of a local property needs to be distinguished from the local conception of something having a property in an intrinsic fashion discussed in section 1.2.)

2.3 Interior vs. Exterior Properties

The second characterisation listed in the quote by Lewis in section 1 was “A thing has its intrinsic properties in virtue of the way that thing itself, and nothing else, is”.

This characterisation can be stated more precisely by schema (4), where ‘how $$x$$ is intrinsically’ abbreviates ‘how $$x$$ and its parts are and how they are related to each other, as opposed to how $$x$$ and its parts are related to other things and how other things are’.
• (4) Being $$F$$ is intrinsic iff, necessarily, for any $$x$$, if $$x$$ is $$F$$ then $$x$$ is $$F$$ in virtue of how $$x$$ is intrinsically.

Call the properties that are classified as intrinsic by (4) interior properties, and call the properties that are classified as non-intrinsic by (4) exterior properties. An important question is what meaning ‘in virtue’ is meant to have in (4). One possible answer is that it is meant to have a reading corresponding to metaphysical grounding, where metaphysical grounding is a non-causal explanatory relation on states of affairs, such that, if one state of affairs metaphysically grounds another state of affairs then it metaphysically necessitates it. Under such a reading of ‘in virtue’, (5) is necessarily true.

• (5) ‘$$\varphi$$ in virtue of it being the case that $$\phi$$’ is true iff the state of affairs expressed by $$\phi$$ metaphysically grounds the state of affairs expressed by $$\varphi$$.

While it might be initially appealing to think that ‘in virtue’ in (4) expresses metaphysical grounding, Marshall (2015, 2016a) has argued that (4) fails to characterise a notion of intrinsicality when ‘in virtue’ has this reading. Marshall’s argument relies on (6) being necessarily true and (7) being true on any notion of intrinsicality.

• (6) ‘$$\varphi$$ in virtue of how $$x$$ is intrinsically’ is true iff there is a sentence $$\phi$$ that expresses a true state of affairs that is intrinsically about $$x$$ such that ‘$$\varphi$$ in virtue of it being the case that $$\phi$$’ is true.
• (7) It is possible for there to be a sentence ‘$$a$$ is $$F$$’, where $$F$$ expresses an intrinsic property and ‘$$a$$ is $$F$$’ expresses a foundational fact in the sense of being a fact that is not metaphysically grounded by any other fact.

Marshall’s argument is the following. Suppose, for reductio, that (4) characterises a notion of intrinsicality when ‘in virtue’ expresses metaphysical grounding. It follows from this, and the necessity of (5) and (6), that (8) is necessarily true.

• (8) Being $$F$$ is intrinsic iff, necessarily, for any $$x$$, if $$x$$ is $$F$$ then there is a true state of affairs $$s$$ that is intrinsically about $$x$$ such that $$s$$ metaphysically grounds $$x$$ being $$F$$.

By (7), it is possible for a sentence $$\ulcorner a$$ is $$F\urcorner$$ to express a foundational fact, where $$F$$ expresses an intrinsic property. Hence, it follows from (7) and the necessity of (8) that (9) is possibly true.

• (9) $$a$$ being $$F$$ is a foundational fact and there is a state of affairs $$s$$ that is intrinsically about $$a$$ such that $$s$$ metaphysically grounds $$a$$ being $$F$$.

However, (9) is necessarily false, since foundational facts cannot be metaphysically grounded by any facts. Hence, the assumption that (4) characterises a notion of intrinsicality when ‘in virtue’ expresses metaphysical grounding is false.

Given ‘in virtue’ doesn’t express metaphysical grounding in (4) on its intended use, what does it express? One attractive option is to think that ‘in virtue’ in (4) is meant to be understood as having the same effect as ‘is a matter of’ and that, on this reading, it expresses the identity relation. On this reading, ‘$$\varphi$$ in virtue of it being the case that $$\psi$$’ is true iff the state of affairs expressed by $$\phi$$ is identical to the state of affairs expressed by $$\varphi$$. Since it follows from (6) that, on this reading ‘$$\varphi$$ in virtue of how $$x$$ is intrinsically’ is true iff there is a sentence $$\phi$$ that expresses a true state of affairs that is intrinsically about $$x$$, (10) follows from (4) on this reading of ‘in virtue’.

• (10) Being $$F$$ is intrinsic iff, necessarily, for any $$x$$, if $$x$$ is $$F$$ then the state of affairs of $$x$$ being $$F$$ is intrinsically about $$x$$.

An alternative option, which is investigated in Marshall 2016a, is to hold that ‘in virtue’ may express a number of different reflexive determination, or entailment, relations in (4), and that each of these relations determines a different notion of intrinsicality. In addition to identity, such entailment relations might include metaphysical necessitation, nomic necessitation, and weak metaphysical grounding, where $$p$$ weakly metaphysically grounds $$q$$ iff either $$p=q$$ or $$p$$ metaphysically grounds $$q$$. Given these relations determine different notions of intrinsicality for each relation $$R$$, we may call the notion of interiority corresponding to $$R$$ ‘$$R$$ interiority’. So, for example, the notion of intrinsicality obtained from (4) by interpreting ‘in virtue’ as expressing the identity relation might be called identity interiority, while the notion of interiority obtained from metaphysical necessitation might be called metaphysical necessitation interiority, and the notion of interiority obtained from nomic necessitation might be called nomic necessitation interiority. (Marshall uses a different terminology, calling the $$R$$ interior properties the possession intrinsic properties.)

If ‘in virtue’ expresses the relation $$R$$, then ‘$$\varphi$$ in virtue of it being the case that $$\phi$$’ is true iff the state of affairs of it being the case that $$\phi$$ stands in $$R$$ to the state of affairs of it being the case the $$\varphi$$. As Marshall notes, it follows from this, (4) and (6) that the $$R$$ interior properties satisfy (11).

• (11) Being $$F$$ is $$R$$ interior iff, necessarily, for any $$x$$, if $$x$$ is $$F$$ then there is a true state of affairs $$s$$ that is intrinsically about $$x$$ such that $$s$$ stands in $$R$$ to the state of affairs of it being the case that $$x$$ is $$F$$.

Just as being cubical is intuitively a local property, while being an uncle and being such that there is a number are intuitively non-local properties, the former property is intuitively an identity interiority property, while the latter properties are both intuitively not identity interior. (Those that claim that being such that there is a number is a local property, however, are likely to also claim that this property is identity interior. See, for example, Sider (1993a), Eddon (2011), Vallentyne (1997) and Francescotti (2014) for the relevant debate.) The identity interior properties, however, plausibly do not coincide with the local properties, since, while being identical to Obama is not a local property, it is plausibly an identity interior property. This is because, necessarily, for any $$x$$ that is identical to Obama, the state of affairs of $$x$$ being identical to Obama is plausibly about how $$x$$ and its parts are and how they are related to each other, as opposed to how they are related to other things and how other things are.

Since each identity interior property is also an $$R$$ interior property, for each reflexive relation $$R$$, the $$R$$ interior properties also do not coincide with the local properties for each $$R$$. The $$R$$ interior properties also differ from the identity interior properties for at least some $$R$$. For example, the metaphysical necessitation interior properties plausibly differ from the identity interior properties since, while being such that there is a number is plausibly not identity interior, it is metaphysical necessitation interior. This is because, given the assumption that numbers necessarily exist, any $$x$$ is such that how it is intrinsically necessitates that $$x$$ is such that there is a number.

2.4 Duplication Preserving vs. Duplication Non-Preserving Properties

The third characterisation Lewis lists when isolating the concept of intrinsicality is that duplicates never differ with respect to their intrinsic properties. Lewis holds a further principle that may not be obvious from the above quote: that any property with respect to which duplicates never differ is intrinsic. Adding this further principle to the characterisation gives us (12).

• (12) $$F$$ is intrinsic iff $$F$$ never differs between duplicates.

(12), however, has the following problem. Assume that no man has a mass of 500 kg (although it is possible for a man to have a mass of 500 kg). Since nothing has the property of being a popular man who is 500 kg, given this assumption, no two duplicates differ in whether they have this property. (12) therefore falsely classifies being a popular man who is 500 kg as intrinsic.

David Lewis doesn’t face this problem due to his concretist theory of possible worlds. Lewis holds that, in addition to the world we live in, there are many other concrete worlds of the same kind as the world we live in. Moreover, he holds that contained in some of these worlds are 500 kg duplicate men, some of whom are popular, and some of whom are not. Given Lewis’s concretist theory of possible worlds, then, being a popular man who is 500 kg is classified as extrinsic by (12).

Philosophers who instead endorse standard abstractionist theories of possible worlds, however, can’t accept (12). According to standard abstractionist theories of possible worlds, possible worlds do not contain concrete entities such as 500 kg men as parts. According to standard abstractionists, then, there are no 500 kg men, there are only possible worlds that represent that there are 500 kg men. Philosophers who endorse standard abstractionist theories of possible worlds, however, can replace (12) with (13) (see Moore 1922 and Francescotti 1999). (Or at least, they can replace (12) with (13) given they hold that there are things that exist according to non-actual possible worlds that don’t exist according to the actual world. Abstractionists who deny this will have to further modify (13).)

• (13) $$F$$ is intrinsic iff, for any $$x$$ and $$y$$, and for any possible worlds $$u$$ and $$v$$ such that $$x$$ at $$u$$ is a duplicate of $$y$$ at $$v, x$$ has $$F$$ at $$u$$ iff $$y$$ has $$F$$ at $$v$$

Given a standard abstractionist theory of possible worlds, there is a possible world $$u$$ that represents there being a popular 500 kg man $$x$$, and there is another possible world $$v$$ that represents there being an unpopular 500 kg man $$y$$, where $$x$$ at $$u$$ has the same intrinsic properties as $$y$$ at $$v$$, and hence $$x$$ at $$u$$ is a duplicate of $$y$$ at $$v$$. Given this, (13) classifies being a popular man who is 500 kg as extrinsic.

Putting aside for the moment the question of whether (13) correctly characterises a genuine notion of intrinsicality, let us call the notion it does characterise duplication preservation. (13), understood as a characterisation of duplication preservation has two important consequences. First, it has the consequence that identity properties, such as being Obama, aren’t duplication preserving. The reason for this is that, since Obama could have had a duplicate distinct from himself, there is a possible world at which Obama has a duplicate who is not Obama, and hence there is a possible world at which something having the property of being Obama has a duplicate which lacks this property.

A more general consequence can be stated using the distinction between qualitative and non-qualitative properties, where a qualitative property is intuitively a property that doesn’t concern any particular entities, while a non-qualitative property is a property that does concern one or more particular entities. Examples of qualitative properties include the property of being cubical and the property of being next to a tin, while examples of non-qualitative properties include the property of being Obama and the property of being next to Clinton. It plausibly follows from (13), understood as a characterisation of duplication preservation, that any non-qualitative property that is possibly instantiated is not a duplication preserving property.

Say that a property is indiscriminately necessary iff it is necessarily had by everything. The second consequence of (13), understood as a characterisation of duplication preservation, is that any two properties that are indiscriminately necessary are duplication preserving. Consider, for example, the indiscriminately necessary property of being such that there is a number (where we are assuming that numbers necessarily exist). Since all things at all possible worlds have this property, it is a duplication preserving property.

Since being such that there is a number is neither a local property or an identity interior property, but is a duplication preserving property (given numbers necessarily exist), the duplication preserving properties do not coincide with either the local properties or the identity interior properties. Since being Obama is a metaphysical necessitation interior property, but is not a duplication preserving property, the duplication preserving properties don’t coincide with the metaphysical necessitation interior properties either. (Moore (1922) and Dunn (1990), in effect, both distinguish duplication preservation from interiority on these grounds.) Hence, we have at least four distinct kinds of properties that are characterised by Lewis’s three characterisations: local properties, identity interior properties, metaphysical necessitation interior properties, and duplication preserving properties.

If Lewis’s three characterisations concerning intrinsicality characterise different notions, the three characterisations described in section 1.2 concerning having a property in an intrinsic fashion also characterise different notions. In order to distinguish these notions, we may employ these characterisations to define having a property in a duplication preserving fashion, having a property in an interior fashion (relative to different entailment relations), and having a property in a local fashion.

2.5 Which is the real distinction?

In the last three subsections, we distinguished a number of distinct notions that are characterised by Lewis’s three characterisation: locality, duplication preservation, and several different kinds of interiority. We now need to address the question of whether there is a single notion of intrinsicality, and, if there is, which of these notions is it? More precisely, we need to determine whether there is a single notion that philosophers typically use ‘intrinsic’ to express, and, if so, which notion is it.

One might attempt to answer this question by first noting that it is much more common for philosophers to use Lewis’s second “in virtue” characterisation (or some variant of it), than either of the other two characterisations when explaining what they mean by ‘intrinsic’. (For example, as far as we know, Lewis uses the “in virtue” characterisation whenever he explains what he means by ‘intrinsic’, but only uses the other characterisations once.) This suggests that philosophers typically use ‘intrinsic’ to express a notion of interiority rather than either of the notions of locality or duplication preservation.

Given philosophers typically use ‘intrinsic’ to express some notion of interiority, there are several reasons to think that the notion of interiority they typically express is that of identity interiority. First, identity interiority is more fundamental, or simpler, than the other notions of interiority, and philosophers are often interested in employing more fundamental notions than less fundamental notions. Second, the intrinsic properties of a thing should be the properties that thing has “in itself”, rather than merely the properties that are metaphysically necessitated, or nomically necessitated, or metaphysically explained, by the properties the thing has “in itself”. But this suggests that the intrinsic properties should be the identity interior properties, rather than the metaphysical necessitation interior properties, or the nomic necessitation interior properties, or the weak grounding interior properties. Finally, while the identity interiority of necessarily coextensive properties can intuitively differ, this is not true for at least some of the other notions of interiority, such as metaphysical necessitation interiority and nomic necessitation interiority. Since it is a widespread intuition that necessarily coextensive properties can differ in whether they are intrinsic, this suggests these other notions of interiority aren’t what philosophers typically express by ‘intrinsic’. (This last reason also provides a further reason to think that duplication preservation isn’t the notion of intrinsicality philosophers typically employ, since it also does not differ among necessarily equivalent properties.)

There are therefore reasons to think that the notion philosophers typically use ‘intrinsic’ to express is identity interiority. These reasons, however, are not decisive. First, philosophers often take intrinsic properties to be qualitative, and use ‘intrinsic’ to distinguish only among qualitative properties. (See Sider 1996.) Since each local property and each duplication preserving property is qualitative, but this is not true for interior properties, this possibly suggests that at least some philosophers at least some of the time use ‘intrinsic’ to express either locality or duplication preservation. Secondly, while identity interiority can do much of the theoretical work intrinsicality is meant to do, it arguably cannot do all of it, with some of this work being better done by some of the other notions of intrinsicality described above. For example, Sider (1996) and Marshall (2016a) have both argued that notions of intrinsicality other than identity interiority are better able to be used to define individualism about mental states, with Sider arguing that duplication preservation is the notion better placed to do this job, while Marshall arguing that the better placed notion is nomic necessitation interiority. Finally, the failure of many philosophers to clearly distinguish which notion of intrinsicality they are employing provides at least some reason to suspect that those philosophers have often used ‘intrinsic’ indeterminately to express a multiplicity of notions of intrinsicality.

In the next section, we will consider a number of attempts to analyse ‘intrinsic’. Unless otherwise made clear, we will use ‘intrinsic’ to express identity interiority, and we will assume that identity interiority is the most dominant notion of intrinsicality among philosophers. As we will see, however, a number of these attempts are most charitably seen as attempts to analyse notions of intrinsicality other than identity interiority.

3. Attempts at Analysis

We will look at several attempts to analyse the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties. One reason to attempt such an analysis is that the orientating characterisations of intrinsicality discussed in section 1 and sections 2.22.4 are all to some degree circular. (Cf Lewis 1983a and Yablo 1999.) For example, a property $$p$$ whose ascription to a thing $$x$$ is about $$x$$ is intrinsic only if it is about how $$x$$ is intrinsically; $$p$$ is not intrinsic if the ascription of $$p$$ to $$x$$ is about how $$x$$ is extrinsically. Similarly, a property $$p$$ that is had by $$x$$ in virtue of how $$x$$ is is intrinsic only if $$x$$ has $$p$$ in virtue of how $$x$$ is intrinsically; $$p$$ need not be intrinsic if $$x$$ has $$p$$ in virtue of how $$x$$ is extrinsically.

Some of the following attempts to analyse intrinsicality are best seen as attempts to analyse the distinction between duplication preserving and duplication non-preserving properties, while others are best seen as attempts to analyse the distinction between interior and exterior properties, or between local and non-local properties. (For a more detailed discussion of a number of the attempted analyses below, see Hoffmann-Kolss 2010a, Marshall 2012, and Marshall 2013. For a discussion of whether we need an analysis of intrinsicality, see Skiles 2014.)

It would be good if we could analyse intrinsicality using only broadly logical notions, where broadly logical notions are exhausted by the narrowly logical notions of conjunction, negation and existential quantification, the modal notion of metaphysical possibility, the mereological notion of parthood, and the basic notions associated with property theory and set theory, such as the notions expressed by ‘state of affairs’, ‘property’, ‘relation’, ‘possible world’, ‘instantiates’, ‘is a member of’ and ‘set’. (The locution ‘state of affairs’ is used differently by different philosophers. Here it is being used to refer to the zero-place analogues of one-place properties and multiple place relations. Just as a property is a way of a thing is or fails to be, a state of affairs, under our usage, is a way things are or fail to be.)

It is at least initially appealing to think that, if an object has a property in an intrinsic fashion, then it has it independently of the way the rest of the world is. The rest of the world could disappear, and the object might still have that property. Hence a lonely object, an object that doesn’t coexist with any contingent objects wholly distinct from it, could have the property. Many extrinsic properties, on the other hand, cannot be possessed by lonely objects – no lonely object has the property of being six metres from a rhododendron, for example. This suggests an analysis of intrinsicality: $$F$$ is an intrinsic property iff it is possible for a lonely object to be $$F$$. This analysis is usually attributed to Kim (1982) (e.g. in  Lewis 1983a and Sider 1993), though Humberstone (1996) dissents from this interpretation. If this analysis is successful then it would constitute a broadly logical analysis, since the expressions on the right hand side of the account can each be defined using only broadly logical vocabulary.

The major problem with this analysis is that the ‘if’ direction of the biconditional is clearly false. As Lewis (1983) pointed out, it is possible for a lonely object to have the property of being lonely, but the property of being lonely is not intrinsic.

One might try to deal with this problem by adding extra modal conditions to the above account. Say that a property $$F$$ is independent of accompaniment iff the following four conditions (taken from Langton and Lewis 1998) are met:

1. Possibly, there exists a lonely $$F$$
2. Possibly, there exists a lonely non-$$F$$
3. Possibly, there exists an accompanied (i.e. not lonely) $$F$$
4. Possibly, there exists an accompanied non-$$F$$

At first glance, if $$F$$ is intrinsic, then whether or not an object has $$F$$ should not depend on whether it is lonely. If this is right, then all four of these conditions should be satisfied. We might therefore try to give the following broadly logical analysis: $$F$$ is intrinsic iff $$F$$ is independent of accompaniment.

As Langton and Lewis (1998) point out, however, this strengthened analysis still fails (see also Lewis 1983a). Given intrinsic properties, such as being a cube, are independent of accompaniment, the extrinsic property of being either a lonely cube or an accompanied non-cube is also independent of accompaniment. Hence, provided the strengthened analysis correctly classifies being a cube as intrinsic, it will falsely classify being either a lonely cube or an accompanied non-cube as intrinsic.

In the face of this failure, we might still hope that a yet more sophisticated broadly logical analysis might succeed. An argument due to Marshall and Parsons, however, shows that, given standard views about what is possible, and given the absence of special assumptions about the abundance and structure of properties, no such analysis can be given. Marshall and Parsons consider the intrinsic property of being an electron and the extrinsic property of being either an accompanied electron or a lonely positron. They then show that, given certain common views about properties and possibility, these properties have the same pattern of instantiation through logical, mereological and set-theoretic space. Since formulas containing only broadly logical expressions cannot distinguish between properties having the same such pattern, it then follows that no broadly logical analysis of intrinsically is possible. (This argument was developed jointly by Marshall and Parsons, and then presented briefly in Parsons 2001 and in more depth in Marshall 2009.)

To give more of an idea of how this argument works, suppose for simplicity that there are only three possible worlds, $$w_1$$, $$w_2$$ and $$w_3$$, and only four possible individuals $$x_1$$, $$x_2$$, $$x_3$$ and $$x_4$$, and that

At $$w_1$$, $$x_1$$ and $$x_2$$ are the only things that exist, $$x_1$$ is an electron and $$x_2$$ is a positron

At $$w_2$$, $$x_3$$ is the only thing that exists and $$x_3$$ is an electron

At $$w_3$$, $$x_4$$ is the only thing that exists and $$x_4$$ is a positron.

Now assume a possible worlds theory of properties, according to which the property of being $$F = \{\langle x, w\rangle \mid x \text{ is } F \text{ at } w\}$$. Given this theory of properties:

$$q_1$$ = Being an electron = $$\{\langle x_1, w_1 \rangle, \langle x_3, w_2\rangle\}.$$

$$q_2$$ = Being either an accompanied electron or a lonely positron = $$\{\langle x_1, w_1\rangle, \langle x_4, w_3\rangle\}.$$

Suppose, for reductio, that the notion of an intrinsic property can be analysed in terms of broadly logical notions. Then, since analyses must be necessary, there is a formula $$\varphi(p)$$ such that (14) is necessarily true, where $$\varphi$$ contains only broadly logical vocabulary, such as variables, brackets, ‘&’, ‘$$\vee$$’, ‘$$\exists$$’, ‘is a possible world’, ‘at’ and ‘$$\in$$’.

• (14) $$p$$ is intrinsic iff $$\varphi(p)$$.

Since $$q_1$$ is necessarily intrinsic, while $$q_2$$ is necessarily not intrinsic, it follows from the necessity of (14) that $$\varphi(q_1)$$ is necessarily true, while $$\varphi(q_2)$$ is necessarily false. In other words, if there is a broadly logical analysis of intrinsicality, then there is a formula $$\varphi$$ contining only broadly logical vocabulary that necessarily applies to $$q_1$$, and necessarily does not apply to $$q_2$$. However, it can be proved that there is no such formula. For example, while ‘$$\exists w_1 \exists w_2 \exists x_1 \exists x_2 \exists x_3$$(p $$= \{\lt w_1, x_1\gt , \lt w_2, x_3\gt \})$$’ applies to $$q_1$$, it also applies to $$q_2$$. Hence, the reductio assumption is false, and there is no broadly logical analysis of intrinsicality. This argument can easily be adapted to show that there is no broadly logical analysis of intrinsicality given more realistic assumptions about what possible worlds there are.

It is important to note that, despite this argument, one might still be able to analyse intrinsicality in terms of broadly logical notions if one is prepared to make special (and controversial) assumptions about properties. As an illustration of this, suppose one assumes that all intrinsic properties have no proper parts while all extrinsic properties do have proper parts. Then one might give a broadly logical analysis of intrinsicality by giving account (15).

• (15) $$p$$ is an intrinsic property iff $$p$$ is a property that has no proper parts.

Even if an analysis like this one is true, however, its utility will be limited. For example, unless we already know somehow which properties have proper parts and which properties do not have proper parts, (15) will be useless in helping us to determine which properties are intrinsic and which properties are non-intrinsic.

Two more sophisticated attempts to give a broadly logical analysis of intrinsicality are Yablo’s contractionist account discussed in section 3.4, and Francescotti’s relational account, which is discussed in the supplementary document:

The Relational Account of Intrinsicality.

Both these accounts rely on controversial assumptions about properties or related entities such as possible worlds.

Given we cannot give a satisfactory account of intrinsicality using only broadly logical notions, it is natural to investigate whether we can give a satisfactory account using a larger set of notions. In the next four subsections, we will consider whether intrinsicality can be analysed in terms of the notions of perfect naturalness, non-disjunctivity, possible world contractions, and metaphysical grounding.

3.2 Perfect Naturalness Theories

The most influential attempt to analyse intrinsicality over the last 30 years has arguably been Lewis’s account of intrinsicality in terms of perfect naturalness. As Marshall 2012 explains, Lewis actually gave two importantly different accounts of intrinsicality in terms of perfect naturalness which philosophers often fail to distinguish: the first in Lewis 1983b, and the second in Lewis 1986a. Since the later Lewis 1986a account has been much more influential than the earlier Lewis 1983b account, we will restrict the following discussion to the later account. (For discussion of the earlier account, see Marshall 2012.)

The perfectly natural properties and relations are the fundamental properties and relations. Lewis wrote:

Sharing of [the perfectly natural properties] makes for qualitative similarity, they carve at the joints, they are intrinsic, they are highly specific, the set of their instances are ipso facto not entirely miscellaneous, there are only just enough of them to characterise things completely and without redundancy. Physics has its short list of ‘fundamental physical properties’: the charges and masses of particles, also their is so-called ‘spins’ and ‘colours’ and ‘flavours’, and maybe a few more that have yet to be discovered. (Lewis 1986b, p. 60, author’s emphasis)]

The notion of a perfectly natural, or fundamental, property or relation suggests an appealing approach to analysing intrinsicality. Consider the non-intrinsic property of being an uncle. It is appealing to think that the reason this property fails to be intrinsic is that it can be analysed in terms of more fundamental relations, such as being a sibling of and being a child of, in a manner that reveals how something being an uncle is at least partly a matter of how it is related to things that aren’t part of it. In particular, it is plausible to think that the reason being an uncle is non-intrinsic is that for $$x$$ to be an uncle is for $$x$$ to have a sibling that has a child, where this child fails to be part of $$x$$. More generally, it is plausible that, if being $$F$$ is a non-intrinsic property, then the fact that it is non-intrinsic can be revealed by analysing being $$F$$ in terms of more fundamental properties and relations in a manner that reveals how something being $$F$$ may partly be a matter of being related to a non-part or may be partly a matter of how non-parts are. If this is true, then it has the following two consequences. First, it follows that every fundamental property is intrinsic (since it being non-intrinsic cannot be revealed by analysis in terms of more fundamental properties and relations. Secondly, and even more importantly, it follows that whether a property is intrinsic should be analysable in terms of how that property can be analysed in terms of the fundamental properties and relations.

Lewis in effect adopts the above approach to analysing intrinsicality by analysing intrinsicality in terms of a particualr kind of supervenience on the fundamental properties and relations. Lewis’s 1986 account (formulated so as to be compatible with standard abstractionist theories of possible worlds) consists of (16) and (17).

• (16) $$p$$ is an intrinsic property iff (i) $$p$$ is a property, and (ii) for any $$x$$ and $$y$$, and for any worlds $$w_1$$ and $$w_2$$ such that $$x$$ at $$w_1$$ is a duplicate of $$y$$ at $$w_2$$, $$x$$ has $$p$$ at $$w_1$$ iff $$y$$ has $$p$$ at $$w_2$$.
• (17) $$x$$ at $$w_1$$ is a duplicate of $$y$$ at $$w_2$$ iff there is a one-to-one correspondence $$f$$ between $$x$$’s parts at $$w_1$$ and $$y$$’s parts at $$w_2$$ such that, for any perfectly natural property or relation $$R$$, for any $$x_1, x_2,\ldots$$ that are part of $$x$$ at $$w_1$$: $$x_1, x_2\ldots$$ stand in $$R$$ at $$w_1$$ iff $$f(x_1), f(x_2)\ldots$$ stand in $$R$$ at $$w_2$$.

Lewis’s account is best seen as an attempt at analysing duplication preservation, rather than identity interiority which we argued in section 2.5 is the dominant notion of intrinsicality in philosophy. Lewis’s account rests heavily on the claim that all perfectly natural properties are intrinsic, and, implicitly, that the perfectly natural properties and relations are sufficient to characterise the world completely. The last assumption is needed because the theory rules out the possibility that there are two things having no proper parts that share all their perfectly natural properties, but differ with respect to some of their intrinsic properties.

The first assumption that all perfectly natural properties are intrinsic has been rejected by Weatherson (2006). (See also Yablo 1999 who holds that, even if every perfectly natural property is intrinsic, this fact is at best a lucky accident, and that this renders Lewis’s account unsuccessful as a philosophical account of intrinsicality.) Weatherson claims that it is metaphysically possible for the instantiated perfectly natural properties to be vector properties. He then argues that, since vector properties must be extrinsic, it follows that at least some perfectly natural properties fail to be intrinsic, namely the perfectly natural properties instantiated at such worlds. The claim that vector properties need to be extrinsic, however, is highly contentious. It is natural to understand a vector property to be a property that is usefully represented for theoretical purposes by a certain kind of mathematical object, namely a vector. Given this construal, however, there is no reason to think that vector properties cannot be intrinsic. For example, due to the similarity relationships between colours represented by the colour solid it might be useful to represent colours by vectors. However, doing this is compatible with metaphysical theories of colour on which colours are intrinsic. There might be other conceptions of being a vector property on which vector properties cannot be intrinsic. However, it is unclear whether there an conception of vector properties on which they cannot be intrinsic, but can be fundamental. (See Busse (2009) and Marshall (2016b) for more discussion.)

The second assumption, that the perfectly natural properties and relations are sufficient to characterise each possible world, has been rejected by Sider (1995) and Schaffer (2004). Both claim that it is metaphysically possible for there to be endless sequences of more and more natural properties, without any set of perfectly natural properties out of which all the other properties can be defined. In response to this problem, Sider (1993b) has proposed a modification of Lewis’s account which he claims is consistent with there being such endless sequences of more and more natural properties. Sider (2011) and Marshall (2016b) have recently argued in favour of the second assumption, with Sider’s argument appealing to his Humean theory of metaphysical possibility.

As noted above, Lewis’s account fails to provide an account of the standard notion of intrinsicality (which is identity interiority), and at best provides an analysis of duplication preservation. Marshall has recently provided an account in terms of perfect naturalness that, if successful, instead provides an analysis of identity interiority. If Marshall’s account works, then it can also be modified to provide successful analyses of the other notions of intrinsicality described in section 2.4.

The basic idea behind Marshall’s account is that the ascription of a property to a thing is intrinsically about that thing iff the ascription can be expressed in fundamental terms while only referring to, and quantifying over, the parts of $$x$$. More formally, the account first analyses intrinsicality in terms of intrinsic aboutness by (3), and then provides an account of intrinsic aboutness in terms of perfect naturalness by (18). (In (18), perfectly natural operators and quantifiers are fundamental operators and quantifiers.)

• (3) $$p$$ is intrinsic iff, necessarily, for any $$x$$, the ascription of $$p$$ to $$x$$ is intrinsically about $$x$$.
• (18) $$s$$ is intrinsically about $$x$$ iff $$s$$ is a non-qualitative state of affairs that can be expressed by a sentence $$\phi$$ containing at most brackets, commas, lambda abstractors, names referring to parts of $$x$$, predicates expressing perfectly natural relations, operator expressions expressing perfectly natural operators, and quantifier expressions that express perfectly natural quantifiers and whose occurrences in $$\phi$$ quantify only over parts of $$x$$.

(18), as it stands, fails to provide a completely specified account of intrinsic aboutness, since it contains the locution ‘quantifies only over parts of $$x$$’ which needs to be defined, and it is not straightforward to give the needed definition of this locution. Marshall’s account of ‘quantifying over parts of $$x$$’ can be simplified if we assume mereological essentialism and the view that ‘some’ is the only perfectly natural quantifier. (Mereological essentialism is the view that necessarily, for any $$x$$, necessarily, for any $$y$$, if $$y$$ is part of $$x$$, then necessarily if $$x$$ exists, then $$y$$ is part of $$x$$.) Given the simplifying assumption of mereological essentialism, Marshall endorses (19), where $$F$$ and $$G$$ are predicates expressing properties and ‘$$\leq$$’ symbolises ‘is part of’.

• (19) The initial occurrence of ‘Some’ in $$\ulcorner [\text{Some } v|Fv]Gv\urcorner$$ quantifies only over parts of $$x$$ iff, under any assignment $$g$$ to $$v$$, $$\ulcorner Fv\urcorner$$ necessitates $$\ulcorner v\leq a\urcorner$$, where $$a$$ refers to $$x$$.

More generally, Marshall endorses (20).

• (20) For any formulas $$\phi$$ and $$\psi$$, the initial occurrence of ‘Some’ in $$\ulcorner [\text{Some }v\mid \phi]\psi\urcorner$$ quantifies only over parts of $$x$$ iff, under any assignment $$g$$ to $$v$$ and the free variables in $$\phi$$, $$\phi$$ necessitates $$\ulcorner\bigvee\{v\leq u \mid u \text{ is a free variable in } \phi \text{ other than } v\} \vee (v\leq a)\urcorner$$, where $$a$$ refers to $$x$$.

Given the simplifying assumption that ‘some’ is the only perfectly natural quantifier expression, (3), (18) and (20) provide a complete account of the notion of an intrinsic property.

As with Lewis’s original account, Marshall’s account assumes that each perfectly natural property is intrinsic and that the perfectly natural properties and relations are able to completely describe every possible world. If someone rejects these assumptions, they will therefore be unable to endorse this account.

3.3 Non-Disjunctivity Theories

Instead of analysing intrinsicality in terms of perfect naturalness, one might try to analyse it in terms of non-disjunctivity, where non-disjunctivity is regarded as an objective metaphysical feature of properties rather than merely a syntactical feature of predicates. The most prominent attempt to do this is the account of Langton and Lewis 1998. (A similar theory is in an appendix to Zimmerman 1997.)

Langton and Lewis’s account involves the following three steps. First, they analyse the non-disjunctive properties as follows:

[T]he disjunctive properties [are] those properties that can be expressed by a disjunction of (conjunctions of) natural properties; but that are not themselves natural properties. (Or, if naturalness admits of degrees, they are much less natural than the disjuncts in terms of which they can be expressed.) (Langton and Lewis 1998: 61, author’s emphasis)

Secondly, they say a property is basic intrinsic iff it is non-disjunctive and independent of accompaniment. Finally, they say that (i) two objects are duplicates iff they share the same basic intrinsic properties, and (ii) $$F$$ is an intrinsic property iff two duplicates never differ with respect to it.

The last step of their account is in a form that requires Lewis’s concretist theory of possible worlds. The last step in a form suitable for a typical abstractionist theory of possible worlds is instead:

1. $$x$$ at $$u$$ is a duplicate of $$y$$ at $$v$$ iff, for any basic intrinsic property $$P, x$$ has $$P$$ at $$u$$ iff $$y$$ has $$P$$ at $$v$$; and
2. $$F$$ is intrinsic iff, for any $$x$$ and $$y$$, and for any possible worlds $$u$$ and $$v$$ such that $$x$$ at $$u$$ is a duplicate of $$y$$ at $$v, x$$ has $$F$$ at $$u$$ iff $$y$$ has $$F$$ at $$v$$.

Note that (ii) is just the abstractionist version of the duplication characterisation for intrinsicality given by (13) in section 2.4.

Langton and Lewis claim their account works given a variety of ways of understanding ‘natural’ and ‘more natural than’ in their analysis of ‘non-disjunctive’. In particular, they hold that the account will work if ‘natural’ is understood to express the notion of perfect naturalness, or fundamentality, in the Lewis (1986a) account, and ‘more natural than’ is understood to mean ‘is more fundamental than’. They also claim that the account will work if the natural properties are those taken to correspond to Armstrongian universals, or the properties expressed by the predicates in canonical formulations of physics, or the properties expressed by the predicates in canonical formulations of common-sense. Langton and Lewis say that it should not matter how we draw the distinction between natural and non-natural properties for present purposes, as long as we have it, and properties like being lonely and round or accompanied and cubical are not natural. As a result of this, Langton and Lewis think that their account is more neutral than Lewis’s earlier account and should therefore should appeal to a larger range of philosophers than the earlier account.

Langton and Lewis put forward their account as only an analysis of qualitative intrinsic properties, rather than intrinsic properties in general. Their account, however, arguably fails as an account of qualitative identity interior properties since, given numbers necessarily exist, it classifies being such that there is a number as intrinsic. Therefore, like the Lewis 1986a account, the Langton and Lewis account is arguably most charitably interpreted as an account of duplication preservation, or perhaps of qualitative metaphysical necessitation interiority.

In addition to failing to give an account of the standard notion of intrinsicality, there are reasons to think that Langton and Lewis cannot be as neutral as they claim with respect to what account of naturalness is combined with their account. As noted above, Langton and Lewis claim that their account of intrinsicality is compatible with any construal of naturalness on which the natural properties are those that play a special role in our thinking. On one such conception of naturalness, the natural properties include those properties for which we have simple words or concepts, which do not strike us as strange or odd, and on which we have relied in past inductions (Sider 2001: 362). Given this conception of naturalness, the property of being a rock is a natural property, and hence is classified as intrinsic on the Langton and Lewis account. However, as Sider 2001 argues, being a rock is plausibly not an intrinsic property. Just as an object that is qualitatively intrinsically the same as a house and is a large part of a house is not itself a house, an object that is qualitatively intrinsically the same as a rock and is a large part of a rock is not itself a rock. Hence, whether something is a rock is partly a matter of what is the case outside of it. Hence, contra the combination of the Langton and Lewis account with the above conception of naturalness, being a rock is not intrinsic.

Another objection to the Langton and Lewis account is that there appear to be counterexamples to the account, even given Lewis’s favoured conception of naturalness. On this conception, the perfectly natural properties and relations are the fundamental properties and relations, and a property $$p$$ is more natural than a property $$q$$ iff the shortest definition of $$p$$ in terms of the perfectly natural properties and relations is shorter than the shortest definition of $$q$$ in terms of the perfectly natural properties and relations. (See (Lewis 1986: 61).) As Marshall and Parsons 2001 argue, given this construal of naturalness, the property of being such that there is a cube appears to be neither a disjuntive property nor the negation of a disjunctive property according to Langton and Lewis’s account of disjunctivity. If this is the case, however, then, since being such that there is a cube is independent of accompaniment, the Langton and Lewis account classifies this property as a basic intrinsic property, and hence classifies it as an intrinsic property. This property, however, is clearly not intrinsic.

Langton and Lewis 2001 have responded to this objection by claiming that being such that there is a cube is less natural than both being a cube and being accompanied by a cube, since (I) being such that there is a cube can be expressed as the disjunction ‘being either a cube or accompanied by a cube’, (II) disjoining unrelated properties always reduces naturalness, and (III) being a cube and being accompanied by a cube are unrelated properties. As Marshall 2012 fn. 35 points out, however, this response is far from convincing. First, it is not clear why (II) is meant to be true given Lewis’s favoured conception of naturalness above, or what other notion of naturalness it might be true of. Second, even granting (II) is true, it is not clear what it is for two properties to be unrelated in the sense that is at issue in (II). As a result, it is not clear why being a cube and being accompanied by a cube are meant to be unrelated.

A prominent attempt to design a theory of intrinsicality in terms of non-disjunctivity that avoids these last two objections is that of Brian Weatherson (2001). In his theory, combinatorial principles of possibility are not used to derive characteristics of individual intrinsic properties, as Langton and Lewis do, but characteristics of the whole set of intrinsic properties. He argues that this set, call it $$SI$$, will have the following properties:

• If $$F \in SI$$and $$G \in SI$$, then $$F$$ and $$G \in SI$$ and $$F$$ or $$G \in SI$$ and not $$F \in SI$$
• If $$F \in SI$$ then Having $$n$$ parts that are $$F \in SI$$ and Being entirely composed of exactly $$n$$ things that are $$F \in SI$$
• If $$F \in SI$$ and $$G \in SI$$ and there is a possible world with $$n+1$$ pairwise distinct things, and something in some world is $$F$$ and something in some world is $$G$$, then there is a world with exactly $$n+1$$ pairwise distinct things such that one is $$F$$ and the other $$n$$ are $$G$$.
• If $$F \in SI$$ and $$G \in SI$$ and it is possible that regions with shapes $$d_1$$ and $$d_2$$ stand in relation $$A$$, and it is possible that an $$F$$ wholly occupy a region with shape $$d_1$$ and a $$G$$ wholly occupy a region with shape $$d_2$$, then there is a world where regions with shapes $$d_1$$ and $$d_2$$ stand in $$A$$, and an $$F$$ wholly occupies the region with shape $$d_1$$ and a $$G$$ wholly occupies the region with shape $$d_2$$.

The first two principles are closure principles on the set. The third principle says that any two intrinsic properties that can be instantiated can be instantiated together any number of times. And the fourth says that if objects having two intrinsic properties can be in two regions, and those two regions can be in a particular spatial relation, then the regions can be in that relation while filled by objects having those properties. The third principle suffices to show that being such that a cube exists could not be in $$SI$$, and the fourth to show that being a rock could not be.

Weatherson’s theory still requires an appeal to a concept of naturalness. Without such an appeal, then if $$F$$ and $$G$$ are intrinsic properties that atoms could have, nothing in his theory rules out the property being simple, lonely and $$F$$ or being $$G$$ from being intrinsic. There are a few ways for the appeal to go at this point, see Weatherson (2001) and Lewis (2001) for a few suggestions. The following moves, taken directly from Langton and Lewis, will probably work if any will. Say that the basic intrinsic properties are those non-disjunctive properties such that their membership in $$SI$$ is consistent with the above four principles. Two objects are duplicates if they do not differ with respect to basic intrinsic properties. A property is intrinsic iff it never differs between duplicates.

Unfortunately, Weatherson’s theory still faces apparent counterexamples, similar to those faced by Langton and Lewis’s account. While Weatherson’s account might successfully classify being such that there is a cube as extrinsic, it arguably fails to correctly classify other similar quantificational properties. One example discussed by Hawthorne 2001 is the property of standing in relation $$R$$ to something, where $$R$$ is a perfectly natural relation a thing can stand in to itself and to things wholly distinct from it. Another example discussed by Marshall (2012), which relies on less controversial assumptions about what types of perfectly natural relations there are, is the property of having a part that is 1 m away from something. Both these properties are arguably non-disjunctive. Given the set of intrinsic properties satisfy the above conditions for $$SI$$, both these properties plausibly satisfy them as well, and hence are plausibly falsely classified as intrinsic by Weatherson’s account.

A further problem that applies to both Langton and Lewis’s account and Weatherson’s account is that they are incompatible with certain metaphysical views that posit necessary connections between wholly distinct entities. On a popular view of sets, for example, each thing $$x$$ is wholly distinct from its singleton set $$\{x\}$$, and is such that, necessarily, it exists iff its singleton $$\{x\}$$ exists. Given this view, however, no contingently existing things can be lonely, and hence no intrinsic property that can only be had by contingently existing things can be independent of accompaniment. Given being made of tin is such a property, it follows that each of the above combinatorial accounts falsely classifies being made of tin as extrinsic, given the above view of sets. (See Cameron 2008, 2009 for more discussion.)

An account that does not appeal to non-disjunctivity, but which uses principles similar to those used in the accounts described above, has been proposed by Denby 2010. (This account is a modified version of an earlier account given in Denby 2006 which takes into account objections made by Hoffman-Kolss 2010b.) Instead of appealing to naturalness or non-disjunctiveness, Denby’s account employs the notion of an object instantiating a property under a relation. Denby, however, gives very little explanation of what this technical notion is meant to mean, and it is therefore not clear what to make of Denby’s account.

3.4 Contractionist Theories

One attractive idea is that a thing’s intrinsic properties are those properties it would have if it were alone in the world. An elegant theory of intrinsicality that develops this idea is that of Peter Vallentyne (1997).

Vallentyne defines a contraction of a world as “a world ‘obtainable’ from the original one solely by ‘removing’ objects from it.” (211) As a special case of this, an $$x-t$$ contraction, where $$x$$ is an object and $$t$$ a time, is “a world ‘obtainable’ from the original one by, to the greatest extent possible, ‘removing’ all objects wholly distinct from $$x$$, all spatial locations not occupied by $$x$$, and all times (temporal states of the world) except $$t$$, from the world”, as well as all laws of nature from the world. (211) Vallentyne claims that $$F$$ is intrinsic iff, for any thing $$x$$, for any time $$t$$, and for any worlds $$u$$ and $$w$$ such that $$u$$ is an $$x-t$$ contraction of $$w, x$$ has $$F$$ at $$t$$ at $$u$$ iff $$x$$ has $$F$$ at $$t$$ at $$w$$. In short, a property is intrinsic to an object iff removing the rest of the world doesn’t change whether the object has the property. Vallentyne’s account classifies identity properties, like being Obama, as intrinsic. It is therefore best seen as an account of interiority. The account also classifies all indiscriminately necessary properties as intrinsic. It is therefore arguably most charitably interpreted as an account of metaphysical necessitation interiority

As Vallentyne notes, this definition will not be very enlightening unless we understand the idea of a contraction. This seems related to the objection Langton and Lewis (1998) urge against Vallentyne. They say that Vallentyne’s account reduces to the claim that a property is intrinsic iff possession of it never differs between an object and its lonely duplicates, a claim they think is true but too trivial to count as an analysis. Their position is that we cannot understand contractions without understanding duplication, but if we understand duplication then intrinsicality can be easily defined, so Vallentyne’s theory is no advance.

This criticism might be too quick. Stephen Yablo (1999) has argued that Vallentyne should best be understood as working within a very different metaphysical framework than Lewis. For Lewis, no (ordinary) object exists at more than one world, so Vallentyne’s contractions, being separate worlds, must contain separate objects. Hence $$x-t$$ contractions can be nothing other than lonely duplicates, and the theory is trivial. Yablo suggests that the theory becomes substantive relative to a metaphysical background in which the very same object can appear in different worlds. If this is the case then we can get a grip on contractions without thinking about duplications — the $$x-t$$ contraction of a world is the world that contains $$x$$ itself, and as few other things as possible.

There are, however, problems with Yablo’s defense of Vallentyne’s contractionist approach to intrinsicality. One problem, discussed in Parsons 2007 and Marshall 2014, is that, on Yablo’s version of contractionism, we need to be able to make sense of sentences like ‘In $$w$$, Prince Philip is not a husband’, where $$w$$ is the world consisting of just Prince Philip. Making sense of such sentences, however, is difficult without appealing to the distinction between intrinsic and non-intrinsic properties. Appealing to this distinction when interpreting Yablo’s account, however, would render it circular. Further criticism and discussion of Yablo’s account is given in Parsons 2007 and Marshall 2014. For further discussion of Vallentyne’s account, see Marshall 2013.

3.5 Grounding Theories

Over the last few years, there have been a number of attempts to analyse intrinsicality in terms of metaphysical grounding, a prominent instance of which is that of Rosen (2010). Other accounts of intrinsicality in terms of grounding include those of Witmer, Butchard and Trogdon (2005), Trogdon (2009), Bader (2013), and Witmer (2014). For a discussion of the first two of these accounts, see the supplementary document:

More on Grounding Theories of Intrinsicality.

The state of affairs of it being the case that $$A$$ is grounded by the state of affairs of it being the case that $$B$$ iff $$A$$ in virtue of it being the case that $$B$$, where the relevant notion of “in virtue” is meant to be a metaphysically explanatory one. Grounding is supposed to be a metaphysical analogue of causation: just as causation is what connects the explanans of an explanation with its explanandum in causal explanation, grounding is meant to be what connects the explanans of an explanation with its explanandum in metaphysical explanation. An example of a metaphysical explanation would be an explanation of why a certain type of act is wrong in terms of more fundamental moral facts.

Rosen’s account presupposes Russellianism about facts, according to which facts are structured out of things, properties and operators in the same kind of way sentences are built up out of names, predicates and operator expressions. Given this background, Rosen’s analysis can be stated as follows:

$$F$$ is an intrinsic property iff, necessarily, for any $$x$$: (i) if the ascription of $$F$$ to $$x$$ is grounded by a fact with constituent $$y$$, then $$y$$ is part of $$x$$; and (ii) if the negation of the ascription of $$F$$ to $$x$$ is grounded by a fact with constituent $$y$$, then $$y$$ is part of $$x$$

Given the negation of the ascription of being Obama to Clinton is grounded by the negation of the ascription of identity to Obama and Clinton (a claim plausibly required by Rosen’s account) the account classifies being Obama as non-intrinsic since Obama is not part of Clinton. The analysis also classifies intuitively non-intrinsic indiscriminately necessary properties, such as the property of being such that there is a number, as non-intrinsic. Being such that there is a number is classified as non-intrinsic by the account since, for example, its ascription to Obama is grounded by the fact that 2 is a number, which has a constituent, namely the number 2, that is not part of Obama. These consequences of the account suggest that it is best thought of as an account of the distinction between local and non-local properties.

Marshall (2015) has given the following objection to Rosen’s account. (The objection is meant to generalise to all attempts to analyse intrinsically in terms of grounding, including the attempts of Witmer, Butchard and Trogdon (2005), Trogdon (2009), Bader (2013) and Witmer (2014). For an objection that is meant to apply to Rosen’s account, but not Bader’s account, see Bader 2013:fn. 53.) According to Marshall’s objection: a) there is nothing incoherent in supposing that a state of affairs that is intrinsically about $$x$$ might ground a state of affairs that is intrinsically about something that is wholly distinct from $$x$$, and b) on a number of popular metaphysical theories, there are such grounding relationships. If there are such grounding relationships, however, Rosen’s account fails.

To consider an example of such a grounding relationship, let us assume that standard set theory is necessarily true, and that existence is a local property. (If one thinks that existence is not a local property, perhaps because one thinks that existence is the non-local quantificational property of being such that, among all the things there are, there is something that is identical to one, replace existence with the property of being such that, among all the parts of one, there is something identical to one, which is intuitively local.) Let us also assume the common (though not universal) view that members of sets are not literally parts of those sets. (See Lewis (1986a) for an example of a prominent theory of sets that denies members of sets are parts of those sets.) Given these assumptions, it is plausible that the fact that $$\{Obama\}$$ exists is grounded by the fact that Obama exists. However, if this is correct, then, since the fact that Obama exists has a constituent that is not part of $$\{Obama\}$$, it follows that Rosen’s account falsely classifies existence as a non-local property.

Borrowing from the recent account of Witmer (2014) (which is similar to Rosen’s account), we might attempt to fix Rosen’s account by replacing parthood in the account with ontological dependence, where the relation of ontological dependence is defined by (21).

• (21) $$x$$ ontologically depends on $$y$$ iff the fact that $$y$$ exists at least partly grounds the fact that $$x$$ exists.

Applying this modification to Rosen’s account results in (22).

• (22) $$F$$ is an intrinsic property iff, necessarily, for any $$x$$: (i) if the ascription of $$F$$ to $$x$$ is grounded by a fact with constituent $$y$$, then $$x$$ ontologically depends on $$y$$; and (ii) if the negation of the ascription of $$F$$ to $$x$$ is grounded by a fact with constituent $$y$$, then $$x$$ ontologically depends on $$y$$.

This modified version of Rosen’s account appears to correctly classify existence as a local property given the above metaphysical theses. Given these metaphysical theses, however, it ends up classifying too many properties as local. In particular, given the above theses, it appears to falsely classify the non-local property of having a member as a local property. It does this, since, given the above metaphysical theses, necessarily, if $$x$$ has a member, then the fact that $$x$$ has a member is plausibly be grounded by the fact that $$y$$ is a member of $$x$$, where $$y$$ is some member of $$x$$, and where $$x$$ is ontologically dependent on $$y$$.

A defender of the above modified version of Rosen’s account might respond to this objection by claiming that the account shouldn’t be understood as attempting to analyse the notion of a local property. Instead, such a proponent might argue, it should be understood as attempting to account for a further notion of intrinsicality not discussed in sections 2.22.4. This notion of intrinsicality might be called the notion of a local* property, where the notion of a local* property is characterised by (23) and (24).

• (23) A state of affairs $$s$$ is intrinsically* about a thing $$x$$ iff $$s$$ (either truly or falsely) describes how $$x$$ and the things it is ontologically dependent on are and how they are related to each other, as opposed to how $$x$$ and the things it is ontologically dependent on are related to other things and how other things are.
• (24) The property of being $$F$$ is local* iff, necessarily, for any $$x$$, the state of affairs of $$x$$ being $$F$$ is intrinsically* about $$x$$.

A problem with this response is that there doesn’t appear to be any reason to regard the notion of a local* property as a notion of intrinsicality. While it is common to intuitively characterise intrinsicality by either explicitly using talk of parts or using talk that very plausibly makes reference to parts, this is not the case for ontological dependence talk. As a result, the notion of a local* property seems no more a notion of intrinsicality than, for example, the notion of a local** property, which is characterised by (25) and (26).

• (25) A state of affairs $$s$$ is intrinsically** about a thing $$x$$ iff $$s$$ (either truly or falsely) describes how $$x$$ and the things it is less than 1 meter from are and how they are related to each other, as opposed to how $$x$$ and the things it is less than 1 meter from are related to other things and how other things are.
• (26) The property of being $$F$$ is local** iff, necessarily, for any $$x$$, the state of affairs of $$x$$ being $$F$$ is intrinsically** about $$x$$.

Since the notion of being a local** property is clearly not a notion of intrinsicality, the notion of being a local* property appears also not to be one.

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