19th Century Romantic Aesthetics

First published Tue Jun 14, 2016

Understanding romantic aesthetics is not a simple undertaking for reasons that are internal to the nature of the subject. Distinguished scholars, such as Arthur Lovejoy, Northrop Frye and Isaiah Berlin, have remarked on the notorious challenges facing any attempt to define romanticism. Lovejoy, for example, claimed that romanticism is “the scandal of literary history and criticism” (1960: 234). The main difficulty in studying the romantics, according to him, is the lack of any “single real entity, or type of entity” that the concept “romanticism” designates. Lovejoy concluded, “the word ‘romantic’ has come to mean so many things that, by itself, it means nothing” (1960: 235).

The more specific task of characterizing romantic aesthetics adds to these difficulties an air of paradox. Conventionally, “aesthetics” refers to a theory concerning beauty and art or the branch of philosophy that studies these topics. However, many of the romantics rejected the identification of aesthetics with a circumscribed domain of human life that is separated from the practical and theoretical domains of life. The most characteristic romantic commitment is to the idea that the character of art and beauty and of our engagement with them should shape all aspects of human life. Being fundamental to human existence, beauty and art should be a central ingredient not only in a philosophical or artistic life, but also in the lives of ordinary men and women. Another challenge for any attempt to characterize romantic aesthetics lies in the fact that most of the romantics were poets and artists whose views of art and beauty are, for the most part, to be found not in developed theoretical accounts, but in fragments, aphorisms and poems, which are often more elusive and suggestive than conclusive.

Nevertheless, in spite of these challenges the task of characterizing romantic aesthetics is neither impossible nor undesirable, as numerous thinkers responding to Lovejoy’s radical skepticism have noted. While warning against a reductive definition of romanticism, Berlin, for example, still heralded the need for a general characterization:

[Although] one does…have a certain sympathy with Lovejoy’s despair…[he is] in this instance mistaken. There was a romantic movement; it did have something which was central to it; it did create a great revolution in consciousness, and it is important to discover what it is. (1999: 20)

Recent attempts to characterize romanticism and to stress its contemporary relevance follow this path. Instead of overlooking the undeniable differences between the variety of romanticisms of different nations that Lovejoy had stressed, such studies attempt to characterize romanticism, not in terms of a single definition, a specific time, or a specific place, but in terms of “particular philosophical questions and concerns” (Nassar 2014b: 10, n.9).

This entry approaches the topic along similar lines in order to identify a cluster of related questions, concerns, themes, and approaches that are characteristics of the aesthetics of various romanticisms, and in order to bring out what is “romantic” in them. In lieu of a chronological, geographical, national, or figure-based organization, the following is structured thematically—it focuses on the central romantic commitment to the primacy of aesthetics (introduced in §1), and offers different philosophical explanations of this primacy (in the remaining sections).

While the German, British and French romantics are all considered, the central protagonists in the following are the German romantics. Two reasons explain this focus: first, because it has paved the way for the other romanticisms, German romanticism has a pride of place among the different national romanticisms (cf. Lovejoy 1960 and Berlin 1999). Second, the aesthetic outlook that was developed in Germany roughly between 1796 and 1801–02—the period that corresponds to the heyday of what is known as “Early Romanticism” [Frühromantik][1]—offers the most philosophical expression of romanticism since it is grounded primarily in the epistemological, metaphysical, ethical, and political concerns that the German romantics discerned in the aftermath of Kant’s philosophy.[2] The entry elaborates on these concerns and explains how they shed light on the romantic understanding of beauty and art as fundamental in human life.

1. The Primacy of the Aesthetic

One common concern strikingly unifies otherwise different romantic contributions. Early and late, German, British and French, the romantics advocated what may legitimately be called “the primacy of the aesthetic”. In romanticism, the “aesthetic”—most broadly that which concerns beauty and art—is not just one aspect of human life or one branch of the humanistic studies. Rather, if the romantic ideal is to materialize, aesthetics should permeate and shape human life. Friedrich Schlegel, one of the leading figures in Early German Romanticism, put this idea in a few memorable phrases: “The Romantic imperative demands [that] all nature and science should become art [and] art should become nature and science” (FLP: #586); “poetry and philosophy should be united” (CF: #115), and “life and society [should be made] poetic” (AF: #16).

Schlegel is not alone on this matter. Similar sentiments and slogans had been expressed just a little earlier in what is commonly regarded as the manifesto of German romanticism, The Oldest Programme:

The idea that unites everyone [is] the idea of beauty…I am now convinced that the highest act of reason, by encompassing all ideas, is an aesthetic act, and that truth and goodness are siblings only in beauty. (Hölderlin, in Bernstein 2003: 186).[3]

The British romantics have taken up and developed this view that the aesthetic is the foundation of knowledge and the pursuit of truth. “‘Beauty is truth, truth beauty,’—that is all//Ye know on earth, and all ye need to know”, Keats famously declared in the Ode on a Grecian Urn ([1820] lines 49–50, PJK). And in the Preface to Coleridge and Wordsworth's Lyrical Ballads (1800), we read, “Poetry is the first and last of all knowledge—it is as immortal as the heart of man” (paragraph 20, in PWWW, I, p. 141).

How is this core feature of romantic aesthetics, the primacy of the aesthetic, to be explained?

A textually grounded and philosophically viable way to approach the imperative is as a structural or formal demand. On that reading, the imperative requires that we model our epistemological, metaphysical, ethical, political, social and scientific pursuits according to the form of the aesthetic comportment to the world, exemplified in poetry. On such an approach, rather than aiming to replace “real” life, science and philosophy with poetry, the romantics urge human beings to fashion their ordinary lives and to do science and philosophy according to the model provided by poetry. Philosophy, science and everyday life need not be poetry, but poetic or poetry-like. Structurally, they should become similar. Why so? The main task of this entry is to offer an answer to this question and to show that the reasons for “poeticizing” life, science and philosophy are philosophical.

2. Aesthetics and Reason

2.1 Enlightenment and Sturm und Drang

For over a century, romanticism has standardly been regarded as a reaction against the Enlightenment (e.g., Haym 1870). The primacy of aesthetics may seem to speak in favor of this story because, on this interpretation, the romantics replaced the Enlightenment’s faith in the sovereignty of reason with a belief in the sovereignty of art and the affective and imaginative capacities that are involved in aesthetic experience. On this traditional interpretation, romanticism is antirationalist or irrationalist. But, while the romantic pursuit of the primacy of aesthetics marks a break with the Enlightenment, regarding romantic aesthetics as antirational or irrational and as antagonistic to the core Enlightenment values is unjustified for a host of reasons (cf. Beiser 2003, Engell 1981, Gregory 2005).

First, the romantics’ focus on and praise for rational and autonomous criticism is continuous with the Enlightenment’s commitment to the value of rational criticism. Admiring Goetthold Ephraim Lessing’s ideal of criticism and his devotion to independent thinking, Friedrich Schlegel writes, “critique is the common pillar on which the entire edifice of knowledge and language rests” (Critique: 271). Rather than discontinuing the Enlightenment’s call to submit every belief and every action to the authority of rational criticism, the romantics are responsible for continuing “the age of criticism”—which is usually taken to characterize the eighteenth century—well into the nineteenth century. In that sense, they are the “children” of the Enlightenment.

Second, many of the core features of romantic aesthetics in addition to criticism—like the relation between beauty, truth and goodness, the pursuit of unity among variety and the significance of the imagination and the sublime—would have been impossible independently of key Enlightenment thinkers.

Third, the romantic elevation of aesthetic feeling and the creative imagination did not come at the price of their faith in and respect for reason. Even Friedrich Schlegel, who is often considered to be the most enthusiastically inclined romantic, opened his Lectures on Transcendental Philosophy by arguing that philosophy is “a striving towards a knowledge…of the whole person” (ITP: 241). In one of his fragments, he commanded: “Never tire of cultivating the intellect until you will have finally found what is original and essential” (Ideas: #124). And yet in another fragment, he claimed that one of the two centers of genuine philosophy is “the rule of reason” (Ideas: #117).

Such proclamations challenge the alleged break between the Enlightenment and romanticism as much as they challenge another standard interpretation of romanticism, one that takes it to be a direct outgrowth of Sturm und Drang, a counter-Enlightenment movement that flourished in the 1760s and 1770s. Briefly, this response to the Enlightenment, expressed in works of literature, theatre, music and the plastic arts, heralded individual subjectivity and the free expression of unconstrained feelings as the proper replacements for the values of the Enlightenment.

No doubt, the romantics shared with this movement the belief in a call “back to feeling”. But regarding romanticism as simply a continuation of Sturm und Drang finds no grounding in romantic texts. In his review of Friedrich Jacobi, one of the main sources of influence on Sturm und Drang, Schlegel declared, “Only when striving toward truth and knowledge can a spirit be called a philosophical spirit” (Review of Jacobi’s Woldamer, KA II: 71–2). In the same review, Schlegel harshly criticized what is known as Jacobi’s salto mortale or “leap of faith”: this is Jacobi’s view that the only way to salvage our ethical and religious beliefs, in the face of the limitations of the Enlightenment, is to renounce reason in favor of mere sensation and faith. In contrast to Jacobi, the German romantics never attempted to replace reason with faith, sensation, unconstrained feeling or intuition. Instead, they wished to bring out the rationality of the passions and the passionate nature of reason as part of a unified and balanced picture of human life. Rather than a straight development of Sturm und Drang, then, romanticism is better understood as an attempt to synthesize the grain of truth in the movement with the grain of truth in the philosophy of Enlightenment, or simply put, to synthesize reason and sensibility.

Similarly, the British and French romantics did not mean to dismiss reason and replace it with passion and imagination, but strived after “a conjunction of reason and passion” (Wordsworth, “Essays on Epitaphs 1810” in PWWW). Accordingly, what Coleridge, for example, admired in Wordsworth was not imagination and feeling alone, but

the union of deep feeling with profound thought; the fine balance of truth in observing with the imaginative faculty in modifying the objects observed. (Coleridge, BL: Ch. 4)

The romantics, then, sought to supplement but not to supplant reason with the receptive capacities of the mind, primarily with the capacities involved in aesthetic apprehension and artistic production. They extended Kant’s renowned view of concepts and intuitions, suggesting that reason without feeling is empty and feeling without reason is blind. Without the former, human beings would be reduced to mere animality; without the latter they would lose their humanity:

We cannot deny the drive to free ourselves, to ennoble ourselves, to progress into the infinite. That would be animalistic. But we can also not deny the drive to be determined, to be receptive; that would not be human. (Hölderlin, Hyperion, HSA 3:194)

For the romantics, our receptive and spontaneous capacities could only be abstracted in thought, but not separated in reality: “Action and passion are inseparable as north and south” (Novalis, FS: #317). Human dignity is grounded in rational and normatively constrained receptivity just as much as it is grounded in spontaneity.

The restless striving after activity, the highest criterion of judgment, does not exclude all the virtues of receptivity but can only exist with them. (F. Schlegel, KA 12: 130)

Rather than dismissing the role and the significance of reason as such, the romantics challenged merely certain uses of reason—for example, dogmatic uses of reason, the laying down of absolute foundations, and system-building. And in a Kantian manner, they were concerned to expose the limits of reason and constrain its uses to legitimate boundaries. But even the romantic exposure of limits is, as it were, “aesthetic”. “Aesthetic?” one may ask. Yes, aesthetic in the sense that some of the romantic central devices for exposing the limits of reason are (originally) “aesthetic”, “artistic” or “literary”. “Romantic Poetry” is one such device and “Irony” is another.

2.2 Romantic Poetry and Romantic Irony

“Romantic Poetry” is a notion that Friedrich Schlegel coined and described in most detail in Athenaeum Fragments (AF) number 116. Rather than a particular genre or kind of poetry, Romantic Poetry is poetry as such insofar as “all poetry is or should be romantic” (Schlegel, AF: #116). Romantic Poetry brings out the limits of reason in virtue of being reflective, “[hovering] on the wings of poetic reflection, and [capable of raising] that reflection again and again to a higher power” (AF: #116). Rather than being merely the “portrayed” object itself—a poetic representation—it “hover[s] at the midpoint between the portrayed and the portrayer” (AF: #116), and so, like Kant’s transcendental philosophy, reflects on the conditions of its own possibility and of human mindedness itself. It is not surprising, then, that Romantic Poetry is called “transcendental” poetry: “a poetry and a poetry of poetry” (AF: #238). Goethe’s Wilhelm Meister, a romantic favorite, manifests this dual reflective and substantive nature:

It was so much the poet’s intentions to set up a comprehensive theory of art or rather to represent one in living examples and aspects.…This might suggest that the novel is as much an historical philosophy of art as a true work of art, and that everything which the poet so lovingly presents as his true aim and end is ultimately only means. But that is not so: it is all poetry, high, pure poetry. (F. Schlegel, WM: 274)

The transcendental nature of romantic poetry suggests that it does not transcend merely the boundaries of a particular genre, but even the boundaries of the literary as such. Romantic Poetry is poetry as much as it is a philosophical method and a vital approach to human life. It is a creative and reflective human power, manifested in the theoretical, practical and aesthetic aspects of life:

transcendental poetry…really embraces all transcendental functions…. The transcendental poet is the transcendental person altogether. (Novalis, Logological Fragments: #41)

Romantic poetry is not alone in exposing the conditions of finite existence, but accompanied by an ironic way of living. Irony is a mode of self-restriction, whose “value and dignity” as a crucial dimension of human life, must be recognized (F. Schlegel, CF: #28). Irony is the balance between “self-creation and self-destruction” (CF: #28), which means that irony is creative—it is constructive of its own perspective on the world. But at the same time, it is also “destructive” of the pretensions implicit in any perspective—the pretention to be holistic. Irony thus presents its perspective as restricted—as only one among many different perspectives on the unconditioned whole. Accordingly, what romantic irony insists on through its restricting function is (a) the conceptual inaccessibility of the “Absolute” (explained in §3), and (b) what is known as “perspectivism”—the view that human beings are capable only of finite and limited perspective on the universe as a whole. Being ironic is a way of consciously and intentionally bringing out the fragmentary nature of the human situation as lacking a “view from nowhere”.

Like Romantic Poetry, irony is not merely a literary or even a rhetorical device. Nor is it a purely theoretical method. Rather, in a Socratic spirit, romantic irony is a way of life. For it is,

after all, for the artist as well as the man, the first and the last, the most necessary and the highest duty…most necessary because wherever one does not restrict oneself, one is restricted by the world; and that makes one a slave. (CF: #37)

Everyone, then, not only the writer, should be ironic. For, as exposing our finitude, irony is not only another romantic analogue of Kant’s transcendental method—the antidote to reason’s natural but spurious tendency to transcend its limits—but also an existential condition of humility (On irony see also CF: #26, #42, #48, 108; AF: 51, 121; and On Incomprehensibility).

The romantic use of irony was sharply criticized, most famously by Hegel, as free floating form of subjectivity. But not only does this criticism fail to do justice to the romantic insistence that irony itself is a form of self-constraint, but also to the imperative: “Don’t exaggerate self-restriction” (F. Schlegel, CF: #37). This demand to constrain and regulate self-restriction itself is of equal importance to the demand to practice irony. Rather than a free floating form of subjectivity, then, romantic irony is a constrained, and normatively governed form of life, meant to expose the limits of reason and facilitate a life of humility (cf. Rush 2006: 187). Romantic irony is a commitment to the form of life that is governed by the acknowledgement of finitude; a “transcendentally-Socratic” life of humility.

Accordingly, rather than an irrational or an anti-Enlightenment stance, romantic aesthetics is marked by a respect for and devotion to reason and rationality “within their bounds”.

3. Aesthetics, Epistemology and Metaphysics

Even a cursory glance through the writings of the romantics assures the reader that their interest in art and aesthetics is closely tied to their epistemological and metaphysical concerns. The primacy that the romantics attributed to aesthetics is explained by (but is not reduced to) the roles that art and beauty may play in the pursuits of epistemic and metaphysical goals. One such goal concerns what the German romantics, and following them, Coleridge, called the “Absolute” [das Absolute].

Briefly, this is how this explanation goes: in the aftermath of Kant’s philosophy, the romantics were concerned with the Absolute, understood as the unconditioned totality of all conditions. Like Kant, they believed that such an unconditioned totality is inaccessible to discursive reason and is, to that extent, unknowable to human beings. But reason’s natural drive towards this “Absolute” is nonetheless significant and valuable (§3.1). In aesthetics they found a mode of life that best approximates (even if never reaches or grasps) the Absolute, insofar as the aesthetic approach to artworks (a) includes indeterminate affective aspect (§3.2), (b) involves a sui generis normativity, constituting its own norms in attunement with the artwork it faces (§3.3), (c) is particularly suited to approach individual unities (§3.4), and (d) is open-ended (§3.5).

3.1 The Absolute

Most broadly, by the “Absolute”, the romantics refer to the unconditioned totality of all conditions. While the absolute itself is conditioned by nothing, it conditions all the finite physical and mental manifestations of the world. Inspired by Kant’s discussion of omnitudo realitatis—“All of Reality”—and by Spinoza’s all encompassing “substance”, the romantic Absolute is a whole, rather than an aggregate, that encompasses everything else, physical and mental: “Only the whole is absolute” (Novalis, AB: #454); “The universe is the absolute subject, or the totality of all predicates” (AB: #633). Metaphysically, every finite thing is merely one manifestation of an unconditional totality: only a single perspective on the whole. It is thus ultimately finite but also infinite, as part and parcel of the infinite whole.

This notion of the Absolute is not distinctively romantic. The German Idealists, Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel, were also concerned with related conceptions of the Absolute. But the romantic treatment of the Absolute is distinctively different from the idealistic one. And it is the distinctive romantic treatment of the Absolute that explains much in romantic aesthetics: While the idealists took the Absolute to be transparent to the human mind, conceptually representable, and inferentially related to other items of knowledge, the romantics regarded it as (1) ungraspable by concepts (i.e., as “non-discursive”) and (2) as non-foundational.

Following Kant, the romantics believed that all knowledge is discursive: knowing requires conceptualization. But since concepts condition everything that might be known by determining it to be one way or another according to the forms of discursive thought, the Absolute, by its very definition as unconditioned, cannot be known.

Knowledge [Erkennen] already denotes conditioned knowledge. The unknowability of the absolute is, therefore, an identical triviality. (F. Schlegel, KA 18: 511, #64)

The romantics further argued that the attempt to ground the whole edifice of knowledge in the Absolute—familiar to them from Fichte’s project, which they both admired and harshly criticized—is futile. Like Kant, they believed that reason’s natural and necessary drive to proceed towards the unconditioned can never be fully realized. The unconditioned totality of experience is “a regulative idea” (Novalis, FS: #472): it cannot serve as a systematic grounding of experience. As Novalis memorably puts it:

We seek the unconditioned [Das Ubedingte] and always find only [conditioned] things [Dinge]. (Blüthenstaub, NS 2: 413, #1)

Skeptical as they were about the discursive accessibility of the Absolute and about its capacity to ground all knowledge, the romantics never questioned either its existence or the worth of (open-endedly) striving after it:

Neither our knowledge nor our action can ever attain the point at which…. All is one; the determinate line can be united with the indeterminate only through an infinite approximation [in unendlicher Annäherung] (Hölderlin, “Hyperion”, HSA 3: 326).

Therefore, philosophy, whose first theorem is “All is One and One is All” (F. Schlegel, ITP: 244), must be “a striving” (ITP: 244). Even though philosophy cannot systematically deduce all knowledge from the Absolute, it must nonetheless pursue its approximation. But if not through concepts, how can one approximate the Absolute?

This is where aesthetics comes into the picture. Although scholars of romanticism disagree about the exact nature of the romantic approximation of the Absolute,[4] they widely agree that it includes a variety of feelings associated with the aesthetic, like aesthetic pleasure, poetic feeling, “longing for the infinite [Sehnsucht nach dem Unendlichen]” and “love”, and that it depends on the deployment of critical notions like “romantic poetry”, wit, irony, allegory, myth and the creative imagination:

If we abstract from all knowledge and will…we still find something more, that is feeling and striving. We want to see if we will perhaps find something here that is analogous to the consciousness of the infinite…. (F. Schlegel, ITP: 244–45).

Poetry elevates each single thing through a particular combination with the rest of the whole, [by allowing] the individual [to] live in the whole and the whole in the individual. (Novalis, Poësie, NS 2: 533, #31).

The romantics believed that these aesthetic and affective attitudes make it impossible for us to deny that there is something “which is not I, nor comes from the I, and which is also not merely a Non-I” (F. Schlegel, Thoughts, KA 18: #83). Baudelaire summarizes these romantic sentiments, declaring,

The one who says romanticism says modern art—which is to say intimacy, spirituality, color, aspiration towards the infinite—expressed by all the resources of art. (Salon of 1846 [1981])

What is it about the aesthetic engagement with art and beauty that is particularly suitable for approximating the Absolute? The rest of this section will develop a few possible answers to this question.

3.2 Aesthetic Feeling

In the introduction to the Critique of the Power of Judgment, Kant writes that the feeling of pleasure in general, and aesthetic pleasure in particular, is the only representation that can never “become an element of cognition at all” (AK 5: 189).

One might think that feelings are thus placed outside of rationality. But this would be a mistake. On Kant’s picture, aesthetic feeling is rational insofar as it is grounded in a universal mental state that underlies our capacity to judge in general (the free play of the imagination and the understanding), and insofar as it is, through this mental state, responsive to the claims that beautiful objects make on everyone’s satisfaction (AK 5: 282). Rationality, then, is irreducible to cognition both in the Kantian framework and in its romantic inheritance. Aesthetic feeling is rational because of its ground and responsiveness to a claim, but non-cognitive insofar as it cannot be subsumed under concepts. Feeling does not determine any concrete property that its object has independently of subjectivity (as cognition would), but is rather responsive to a relation between a subject and an object. Aesthetic pleasure, particularly, is a non-determining mode of reflecting on the relation, not between a particular subject and a particular object, but between subjectivity and objectivity as such.

This rational but non-cognitive nature of feeling, in general, and of aesthetic feeling, in particular, is perhaps the central feature that renders aesthetic feeling an attractive ingredient in addressing the epistemic and metaphysical concerns that occupied the romantics. For while all cognition is determination through concepts, Kant’s aesthetics suggests a mode of reflective awareness that is not determining, but yet a way of being aware of and responsive to aspects of the world. This is exactly what the romantics have been looking for—a non-discursive, but rational and normatively governed mode of awareness. And they found it in poetry, regarding it as grounded in feeling:

Not art and artworks make the artist, but feeling and inspiration and impulse. (F. Schlegel, CF: #63)

Poetry is passion. (Wordsworth, “Note to the Thorn” in LB: 136)

All good poetry [originates in] the spontaneous overflow of powerful feelings. (Wordsworth, Preface to Lyrical Ballads (1800), paragraph 26, in LB)

If, then, feelings and passions are constitutive of art, and if aesthetic or poetic feeling is a key ingredient in the pursuit of the Absolute, then philosophy should become poetic and “poetry and philosophy should be made unified” (F. Schlegel, CF: #115). We are now in a position to appreciate that this romantic imperative is explained partly by the view that philosophy cannot be reduced to concepts and propositions, but must also include certain kinds of affective mental states. To paraphrase Wittgenstein, discursive reasoning comes to an end.

3.3 Sui-Generis Normativity

The non-determining character of aesthetic feeling is related to the distinctive kind of normativity that characterizes artistic production and aesthetic appreciation. An expression borrowed from Kant is fitting here: on the romantic picture, both artistic production and aesthetic appreciation are “lawful without a law”. Both are the source of their own normativity, without being subject to any external law. Given that, they are appropriate for approximating the Absolute insofar as this approximation must be non-determining (applying no conditions), but normatively governed rather than arbitrary.

Following Kant’s account of the genius, the romantics developed an understanding of the artist as, on the one hand, original and imaginative (rather than submitting to any law of nature or principle borrowed from the tradition of art), and, on the other hand, receptive to nature: “Every good poem must be wholly intentional and wholly instinctive” (F. Schlegel, CF: #23). This combination of being independent of given rules and attuned to something other than yourself is required not only for the genius, but also for approximating the Absolute. And it is this requirement that explains “the categorical imperative of genius[:] You should demand genius from everyone” (F. Schlegel, CF: #16). If everyone is to approximate the Absolute, then everyone should model herself after the genius.

Criticism consists of a related combination of features. While it is based on no prior rules, it is also open and receptive to the work it concerns. And it is through the engagement with the work that each critical judgment constitutes its own norms. Although we can and should legitimize our judgments of beauty and art, we cannot do so by appeal to any given concepts or norms that are external to the work at stake. The artwork, on this picture, is sui generis—it provides its own standards of appreciation: “Poetry is a republican speech: a speech which is its own law and end unto itself” (F. Schlegel, CF: #65). The critic should seek to express the work in a way that is faithful to its individual nature and be responsive to the specific norms that it constitutes:

To judge [Goethe’s Wilhelm Meister] according to an idea of genre drawn from custom and belief, accidental experiences and arbitrary demands is as if a child tried to clutch the stars and the moon in his hand and pack them in his satchel…. Fortunately, [the novel] turns out to be one of those books, which carries its own judgment within it. (F. Schlegel, WM: 275)

That means that beauty makes demands on us, demands that, according to the romantics, are analogous to the demands that other persons make on us. Beautiful objects make a claim on us to respond to them as the specific individuals that they are, on their own terms: “See your statues, your paintings, your friends as they are” (Diderot, Salon of 1767). Hence, the romantic declaration, “one cannot really speak of poetry except in the language of poetry” (F. Schlegel, DP).

This lawfulness without a law fits the requirements of the Absolute. For, if we adopt this structure of normativity and expression in our pursuit of the Absolute, we may approach it in a normatively governed and committed way, without determining and thus conditioning it according to any given law, principle, or concept. Here, then, is another reason why philosophy should become poetic, and the true philosopher, not merely a “half critic” (as the romantics alleged against Kant), but a complete critic: philosophy should be open and attuned to the Absolute without trying to subsume it under any principle of reason, just as criticism is open and attuned to each work without subsuming it under any external law.[5]

3.4 Concrete Individuality

Like Spinoza’s God and Kant’s omnitudo realitatis (All of Reality), the Absolute is an all-encompassing individual: while it comprehends everything else, the Absolute is also concrete. It is an individual whole—a totality, the parts of which could be understood only negatively, as its limitations. To approximate the Absolute, then, we need a mode of consciousness that is particularly suited to discern a holistic unity in an individual. While §5.3 discusses what is required in order to apprehend holistic unities, and the holistic unities of artworks and natural beauties, this section focuses on the individual character of artworks and natural beauties.

On the romantic picture, an artwork that does not present itself as a “living individual” (Novalis, Poësie, NS 2: 534, #35) is not worthy of the title of a work of art, and the one who does not approach artworks as unique individuals is not a genuine aesthetic critic: “Whoever conceives of poetry or philosophy as individuals has a feeling for them” (F. Schlegel, AF: #415). The aesthetic approach to beauty, then, is an approach to those things that are irreducibly individuals, those that should not be approached merely as ones of many—as instances of general kinds—but as concrete individuals: “Everything that is to be criticized must be an individual” (F. Schlegel, FLP: #634).And this is the very approach that is required in the pursuit of the Absolute given its individual nature.

3.5 Open-Endedness

Kant attributes to aesthetic pleasure:

a causality in itself, namely that of maintaining the state of the representation of the mind and the occupation of the cognitive powers without a further aim. We linger over the consideration of the beautiful because this consideration strengthens and reproduces itself. (AK 5: 222)

Aesthetic feeling is open-ended and future-oriented. In contrast to practical pleasures (the “pleasure in the good”) and to private, sensory pleasures (the “pleasure in the agreeable”) that need to bring forth an action or an object in order to maintain themselves, aesthetic pleasure is self-maintaining. This is partly because aesthetically enjoying an object involves a commitment to remain faithful to the beauty of that object, beauty that calls for and deserves an open-ended affective pursuit. The romantics welcomed this structure of aesthetic feeling as particularly suitable for the pursuit of the Absolute. Since the Absolute can never be determined, the stance that approximates it must itself be open-ended. It should involve a commitment to keep striving after the Absolute open-endedly.

Since the romantics take philosophy to be a tendency “towards the Absolute” (Schlegel, ITP: 242), philosophy itself should be reconceived. The systematic search after first principles is not only hopeless, but also unfortunate. It can only slight the significance of the Absolute by the effort to determine it through principles. Instead, philosophy should be aesthetically shaped, as an open-ended pursuit:

If knowledge of the infinite is itself infinite, therefore always only incomplete, imperfect, then philosophy as a science can never be completed closed and perfect, it can always only strive for these high goals, and try all possible ways to come closer and closer to them. (Schlegel, Lectures on Transcendental Philosophy, KA 12: 166)

4. Aesthetics, Ethics and Politics

The intersection between romantic aesthetics, ethics and politics offers a particularly clear challenge to the standard view of the romantics as anti-Enlightenment (discussed in §2). This is because the romantics turned to aesthetics to a large extent in order to pursue, rather than to reject, some of the core ethical and political values of the Enlightenment, such as autonomy or self-determination and the ideal of Bildung. Art and aesthetics also provided a model for the romantic political ideal: a democratic, egalitarian community grounded in the republican values of liberty, equality and fraternity.

In addition to proving the anti-Enlightenment interpretation of the romantics false, tracing these romantic notions of autonomy, Bildung and political community also offers a challenge to another well-known interpretation of the movement as apolitical (see Schmitt 1986). In contrast to this interpretation, we find the romantics exploring and emphasizing the importance of aesthetics for ethical and political concerns. Shelley, for example, wrote in a letter to a friend: “I consider Poetry subordinate to moral & political science” (Shelley, LS 2: 71). In his famous Defence of Poetry (1821), he proclaimed, “Poets are the unacknowledged legislators of the world” (SPP). Rather than “aestheticizing” politics, then, the romantics found in art and aesthetics resources for solving ethical and political problems.

Yet, a central difficulty facing any interpretation of romantic ethics and politics lies in the change that this view has undergone during the later years of many a romantic: the strong democratic and egalitarian views of the likes of Friedrich Schlegel and Friedrich Schleiermacher gave way to a growing conservatism and religiosity after 1800. The first generation of British romantics likewise turned from their conviction that to be young during the revolution was, as Wordsworth said, “bliss” and “heaven”, to an acknowledgement of the challenges awaiting a genuine political reform. With this shift in mind, they turned from political optimism to religion. A unified account of romantic politics is thus untenable. Instead, the section will focus on the political views of the German romantics during their “formative years” (from 1797–1800) and of the British romantics mainly during their early and middle phases This is because the ideals developed during these phases, though different from some of the later ideals, can shed light on the romantic path towards conservatism later on (Beiser 1992). §4.5 will briefly present the romantics’ later political thought.

4.1 Autonomy

“Freedom is the only reality in wishing, willing, sensing and striving”, writes F. Schlegel (TPL II: 155). While the absolute reality of freedom might not admit of a proof, according to many of the romantics, human beings should nonetheless approximate freedom by developing autonomy—self-determination and self-legislation. Autonomy is the right of the individual to think for herself and act rationally and freely (TPL II: 155). The work of art and aesthetic judgment were seen as paradigmatic expressions of autonomy and, as such, as splendid models for the cultivation of individual human autonomy. For (as discussed in §3.3) neither the creation of art nor its appreciation is grounded in prior given laws. And yet, both the production and judgment of art are not lawless, but normatively governed by the laws generated autonomously by each individual work and by each individual aesthetic judgment. Poetry is a “law unto itself”.

This characteristic of the production and judgment of art should not only be incorporated into the way every person is to govern herself—as the source of her own rational laws rather than as subject to external laws, and as self-determining rather than passively determined—but also serve as a model for the way in which every person should be respected and treated. Aesthetics provides us with a paradigm for following two central ethical demands—the demand to govern oneself autonomously and the demand to respect everyone else as autonomous.

These two duties, then, constitute another explanation of the “categorical imperative of the genius” previously mentioned—the demand that every person be a genius. For if every individual is to be autonomous, she should fashion herself after the model of the artist.

4.2 Bildung

Bildung is another characteristic romantic value that each individual should develop in herself. While literally meaning “formation”, Bildung is best understood as a mode of ethical and cultural cultivation, or self-realization that allows the individual to mature into independence and responsibility. “Concerning Bildung, we speak not of external culture, but the development of independence” (F. Schlegel, TPL II: 148). Bildung is a particularly modern value, formed at least in part as a challenge to what the romantics regarded as the rift between sensibility and reason in modern life. To achieve Bildung, each individual has to constitute herself as a unified whole that coordinates a balance between sensibility and reason: “The end of humanity is…to achieve harmony in knowing, doing and enjoying” (F. Schlegel, On the Study of Greek Poetry, in KA I, 627).

The artwork is a good model for such an ideal insofar as it is, according to the romantics, an organic and harmonious whole of diverse and even conflicting parts:

Poetry…must be a harmonious mood of our mind…where everything finds its proper aspect…. Everything in a truly poetic book seems so natural—and yet so marvelous. We think it could not be otherwise…and we feel the infinite…sensations of a plurality in agreement. (Novalis, Last Fragments: #3)

This is why “Every human being who is cultivated and who cultivates himself”, namely, the person who achieves Bildung, “contains a novel within himself” (F. Schlegel, AF: #78).

Aesthetic judgment is also a harmony of reason and sensibility. On this issue too, the romantics were inspired by Kant’s aesthetics, according to which aesthetic judgment consists in the free play between the understanding, imagination and pleasure. Approaching the world, ourselves and one another aesthetically, then, is approaching it with a harmony of “knowing, doing, and enjoying”. And achieving this harmony constitutes a genuine moral being: a balanced rational, sensible and affective person. For that reason, it is not surprising to find Coleridge, the critic, aiming to establish “the close and reciprocal connections of Just Taste with pure Morality” (Lecture I, CLL).

Romantic Bildung was a political ideal as much as it was an ethical one. It was needed, not only for the sake of independent individual responsibility, but also for the possibility of a genuine non-revolutionary republic:

There is no greater need of the age than the need for a spiritual counterweight to the Revolution and to the despotism which the Revolution exercises over people…. Where can we seek and find such a counterweight? The answer isn’t hard: unquestionably in ourselves…the center of humanity lies there. (F. Schlegel, Ideas: #41)

The French revolution had shown the romantics both the value of a republic based on liberty, equality and fraternity, but also the dangers of anarchism and strife that revolutions carry with them. The proper path to a republic, they thought, is not through a revolutionary act, but through proper education. Art does not only offer a model for a harmonious, cultivated soul, but is also the best medium through which to achieve the moral education that leads to this harmony and, on its basis, to the best republic. Attending to art (as well as producing it) is a form of self-cultivation because the spirit of art allows human beings to transcend baseness (a particular danger given modern instrumentalism and materialism), and to develop their humanity.

As we now turn to see, the romantics regarded art also as a particularly effective medium for uniting people, no matter their differences, and so took it to be a great spur for united, social and political action.

4.3 Individuality and Sociality

The allegiance to autonomy and to the value of Bildung may seem to indicate individualism. And it does, to an extent. While individuality is indeed a romantic value, anti-communal individualism is not. The romantics never celebrated uncurbed individuality, but called for a balance between individuality and sociality: “A certain regulated interaction between individuality and universality…constitutes the first condition for moral well-being” (F. Schlegel, OP: 427).

Without doubt, the romantics criticized Kant’s categorical imperative as proposing a problematically universalistic ethics that discourages the free expression of unique personalities. They viewed such a universalist ethics as problematic because they regarded individual expression and the development of a unique, characteristic and unified self as intrinsically and morally valuable. Yet, the romantics were also critical of extreme individualism, such as the one they found promoted by some Enlightenment thinkers. In other words, they challenged those individualists who criticized any form of social and communal participation as potentially a form of passive submission to external authority.

In response to these two extremes of universalism and radical individualism, the romantics sought after a golden mean—romantic ethics strived to preserve and strengthen social bonds and encouraged a pluralistic communal life while supporting rational criticism, autonomy, individual rights, liberties and freedom of expression: “Does not the universal gain from the individual, the individual from universal relations?” (Novalis, Faith and Love: #5). The romantics believed that individualism is not merely compatible with sociality and communitarianism, but that it actually depends on genuine forms of the latter: “The vocation of man is attainable only through human society” (F. Schlegel, TPL II: 144). Autonomy and Bildung, in particular, though nothing other than individual freedom and self-realization, can never be divorced from the social:

Autonomy should be universal and not relate to the individual but the whole, for otherwise it would destroy itself…. We cannot consider human beings individually. (TPL II: 156)

On the romantic picture, the achievement of free, fully-formed individuality is impossible independently of strong sociality and vice versa. An ideal of sociality is deficient if it leaves no freedom for the distinct expression and liberties of each individual, and the individual is most herself, as an individual only insofar as she freely interacts with others: “A person can be a person only among people” (TPL II: 145).

Rather than contradictory impulses, as they are often regarded today, sociality and individuality, on the romantic picture, are not only compatible but also naturally harmonious—grounded in human nature:[6]

No man is merely man, but…at the same time he can and should be genuinely and truly all mankind. Therefore, man, in reaching out time and again beyond himself to seek and find the complement of his innermost being in the depths of another, is certain to return to himself. (F. Schlegel, DP: 54)

It is this romantic view of natural human sociability—rather than some exaggerated zeal or effusiveness—that explains and is explained by the centrality of love in romanticism. In contrast to many a modern thinker, the romantics regarded love rather than self-interest as a basic condition of human nature (“Love is…the core of ourselves” (F. Schlegel, TPL II: 151)), and as the proper basis for a genuine sociable but pluralistic community:

Yes, love, you power of attraction of the spiritual world! No individual life or development is possible without you. Without you everything must degenerate into a crude, homogeneous mass…. There is no individual development without love, and without the development of one’s individuality there is no perfection in love. When one complements the other, both grow together inseparably. I feel united within me the two fundamental conditions of ethical life! (Schleiermacher, ”Monologue II”, 180).

But as natural as it may be, the romantics believed that love has suffered paralysis in modernity. On their view, the rise of capitalism and instrumentalism had suppressed natural social bonds and encouraged self-interest. The consequent view of human beings as solely quantitatively distinct further leveled them and inhibited their distinctive and unique expressions.

How could people balance individuality and sociality in the face of modernity? Here too romantic poetry and the creative imagination come to the rescue. Poetry is not only based in love, but is itself a form of love insofar as it bonds different individuals:

Poetry befriends and binds with unseverable ties the hearts of all those who love it. Even though in their own lives they may pursue the most diverse ends, may feel contempt for what the other holds most sacred, may fail to appreciate or communicate with one another, and remain in all other realms strangers forever; in poetry through a higher magic power, they are united and at peace. (F. Schlegel, DP: 53)

The poet is, quintessentially, “a social being” (F. Schlegel, DP: 55) insofar as he both expresses, “in lasting works the expression of his unique poetry” (DP: 55) and reaches to others and reciprocally communicates with them. The poet integrates:

his part with the entire body of poetry…. He can do this when he has found the center point through communication with those who have found theirs from a different side, in a different way. Love needs a responding love. Indeed, for the true poet’s communication…can be beneficial and instructive. (DP: 55)

Following the “categorical imperative of the genius” is required, then, also for achieving Bildung and autonomous individuality in and through society: it is an ethical and social demand as well.

4.4 Political Community

While sociality and communal spirit are ethically required for the achievement of autonomy and Bildung, community was also a romantic political ideal. Such an ideal required that what the romantics viewed as modern alienation—estrangement of the self from others—be challenged in three ways: by promoting love (as discussed above), developing a sphere of free social interaction and pursuing a holistic, social unity.

The ideal political community must facilitate a sphere of social life, which is free and independent of political control because free sociality and conversation, the ends of this sphere, are both valuable in themselves and the best alternative for external laws. The romantics believed that social bonds should not be upheld by laws that are imposed on individual citizens from outside, but by the love encouraged by a common culture and free interaction. Romantic poetry is an exemplary model for achieving such a free domain since it is “a republican speech…in which all the parts are free citizens and have the right to vote” (Schlegel, CF: #65).

Aesthetics is at the center of this political vision also because the political ends of free sociability and conversation are the very same ones that the romantics practiced in their intellectual-artistic salons and in their communal, cooperative aesthetic projects. The political community should allow for creative and artistic endeavors such as the Athenaeum journal, which was the mouthpiece of the German romantics at the end of the eighteenth century and a journal that was independent of the control of the publishing establishment. It was written in collaboration (mainly by the Schlegel brothers, Novalis, and Schleiermacher), and aimed at rational criticism and Bildung. Such aesthetic projects are a model for the politician. This is because “sympoetry” and “symphilosophy”, as Schlegel and Novalis called such cooperative intellectual and aesthetic projects, should be an integral part of political life:

Perhaps a whole new epoch of science and art would be inaugurated were symphilosophy and sympoetry to become so common and deeply felt that there would be nothing odd were several people of mutually complementary natures to create works in communion with each other. (F. Schlegel, AF: #125)

The ideal political community must also be characterized by a specific kind of relation between the political body as a whole and its members: the state should be an organic or holistic whole, which means most broadly that the state as a whole must be prior to the parts (see Beiser 1992).

First, the best state is prior to its parts since, as we saw, it is necessary for individual identity and self-realization.

Additionally, the romantic community as a whole is prior to the individual citizens (i.e., its parts), insofar as genuine social bonds and a well-functioning political entity cannot be “constructed” out of separate self-sufficient and self-interested individuals (as the modern social contract theory has it). To properly function and achieve the ethical aim of sociality, the links between the political members should be organic: the members should not be connected to one another by an externally imposed social contract, but by natural love, affection and attraction. Unsurprisingly, it is through poetry that the familial-like bonds, required for the ideal state, should be developed over and above the unit of the biological family. “Within the family, minds become organically one, and for this reason, the family is total poetry” (F. Schlegel, Ideas: #152).

While the state as a whole should be prior to its parts in this sense, the law of such a state should not be imposed on its citizens from outside, but be self-determined. Individual autonomy should be supported by promoting the direct and active participation of all individuals in the political process. The organic unity of the state, then, implies reciprocity: the parts are dependent on and are posterior to the whole, while the whole, in respect of its essential self-determination, also depends on and is posterior to its parts.

The work of art provides, once again, the structural model for this political ideal by virtue of its organic unity, where “every whole can be a part and every part really a whole” (Schlegel, CF: #14). When genuine, art is characterized exactly by the kind of holistic, organic, but egalitarian and pluralistic unity that must characterize the ideal community:

Many works that are praised for the beauty of their coherence have less unity than a motley heap of ideas simply animated by the ghost of a spirit and aiming at a single purpose. What really holds the latter together is that free and equal fellowship in which, so the wise man assures us, the citizens of the perfect state will live at some future date; it’s that unqualifiedly social spirit…. (F. Schlegel, CF: #103)

An organic state is called for also because the mechanistic structure of the modern state is responsible for the decline of religion. This structure caused, according to the romantics, a form of “enslavement” and a faith in materialism and instrumentalism, both of which prevent people from cultivating their spirituality and relation to the divine. Both in their early and late phases, the romantics believed that poetry was the best way for inspiring spirituality and religiosity. “Every artist is a mediator for all other men”, writes F. Schlegel (Ideas: #44), regarding this “mediator” as mediating between man and God. Schleiermacher confirms and develops this connection when suggesting that poets are:

the true priests of the Highest…. They place the heavenly and eternal before them as an object of pleasure and unity, as the sole inexhaustible source of that toward which their poetry is directed. They strive…to ignite a love for the Highest…This is the higher priesthood that proclaims the inner meaning of all spiritual secrets and speaks from the kingdom of God. (Schleiermacher, On Religion [translation modified]).

It is for these reasons that “at the time of the republic, the artists will not be a special class” (F. Schlegel, PF: #749). In such an ideal republic everyone must be an artist who, by means of the poetic spirit of love, is related to the other citizens as artists relate to one another.

4.5 Late Romanticism

Statements such as Blake’s claim, “Princes…and Houses of Commons & Houses of Lords [are] something Else besides Human Life” (“Public Address” (1809) in PPWB) clearly display the revolutionary nature of the romantics. But the romantic transition from a more liberal framework to a more conservative one is explained primarily by their reaction to the terror of the French revolution. Though many of the romantics kept allegiance to the revolution until fairly late (1798), the acknowledgement of its failures and the dangers involved in any revolutionary act led them to modify, though not to renounce, their republican ideal. Even during this stage of their development, the romantics believed that the republic offered the best political structure. But, while still involving democratic elements, a proper republic, they argued should also involve aristocratic and monarchical elements because the educated should rule over the uneducated:

A perfect republic would have to be not just democratic but aristocratic and monarchic at the same time: to legislate justly and freely, the educated would have to outweigh and guide the uneducated, and everything would have to be organized into an absolute whole. (F. Schlegel, AF: #214)

Rather than opposed to the original romantic ideal, this late view is a natural outgrowth of the earlier ideal since it does not only maintain the early republicanism, but also continues, through modification, the early romantic emphasis on Bildung as a necessary condition for a proper republic.

Since even during this later period, the romantic political ideal consisted of a republican, holistic community grounded in love, art and aesthetics still played significant ethical and political roles in the late romantic phase. Even later on in their careers, the romantics insisted that art and aesthetics were crucial models and resources for the pursuit of ethical and political ends.

5. Aesthetics and Nature

One of the romantics’ central aims was to (re)enchant nature in the face of what they regarded as a threat from modern science. The threat was embodied primarily in the worry that modern science alienated (rational and free) human beings from nature, which, through the lens of this new science, had been viewed as a domain of brute, determined, mechanical causality (§5.1). Aesthetics is capable of (re)enchanting nature insofar as it brings out a different conception of nature as organic rather than mechanic. On this organic conception, nature is (a) an organic whole, which is reciprocally interdependent on its parts; (b) a domain of teleological rather than merely mechanical causality; and (c) a dynamic and living force, which is self-organizing and self-generating (§5.2). “Science should become poetic” insofar as it should approach nature in the same way that criticism approaches romantic poetry. Like romantic poetry, nature should be viewed as an organic and spontaneous whole. Under this conception of nature, rational, autonomous human beings are not alienated from, but are rather part and parcel of, nature (§5.3).

5.1 The Worry

We have fallen out with nature, and what was once (as we believe) One is now in conflict with itself, and mastery and servitude alternate on both sides. It often seems to us as if the world were everything and we nothing, but often too as if we were everything and the world nothing. (Hölderlin, Preface to Hyperion, HSA 3: 326).

Hölderlin expresses here a ubiquitous romantic sentiment. Not only has modernity divided man from himself by enforcing the duality between reason and sensibility and severed the individual from his natural social relations (section 4), but it also alienated man from nature. Modern science, “[a] vulture, whose wings are dull realities”, was regarded as the main culprit (Edgar Allen Poe, “Sonnet—To Science”).

Through the lens of modern science, nature was regarded as an inanimate, mechanistic domain of dead and meaningless matter that is composed of separate atoms and thoroughly determined by efficient causality. Modern science “dissected [nature] atomistically like a dead corpse” (Eichendorff, EW 5: 423). The romantics regarded this approach to nature as reductive as much as they regarded it as “dissecting”: it reduces nature to mere matter, devoid of the features that the romantics took to be essential to it, like holistic unity, self-organization and life. The growing sense of man’s alienation from his natural surrounding was seen as a product of this reduction of nature: human beings seemed alienated from nature exactly because the rational, soulful and sense-making character that is usually associated with them is opposed to a mechanistic and deterministic domain.

The troublesome consequences of this approach to nature are multiple. First, there is the psychological and existential crisis that is well encapsulated by Novalis’s claim, “Philosophy is actually homesickness—the urge to be everywhere at home” (General Draft: #45), and commemorated by landmark romantic works, such as Caspar David Friedrich’s “The Wanderer above the Mist” (1818).

In the epistemological and metaphysical domains, varieties of skeptical doubts loom large behind the modern approach to nature. If modern science is right then the relation between nature and normativity is unclear. But if nature cannot provide rational norms, then how can we account for and justify our empirical claims to knowledge (human experience)? On the flipside of this epistemological worry is a metaphysical concern about the nature of the subject. For the subject, as the source of meaning, is seen as only that—a dematerialized source of meaning, devoid not only of a body, as Descartes emphasized, but, if Kant is right, of any substantiality at all (see Bernstein 2003).

Third among the consequences is the threat to any awe-inspiring stance towards the world. Not only can the divinity once attributed to nature no longer be found therein, but modern science was also seen as posing a challenge to any attempt at a secular alternative to religion. Seen as fully accessible to the calculative part of the human mind, nature becomes transparent and devoid of any mystery or human-transcending power. Are we left without a source of wonder, awe or reverence in our modern world?

According to the romantics, the way out of these worrisome consequences requires that we recognize that modern science is reductive not only in terms of its object—nature—but also in terms of its methodology: modern science employs merely what Wordsworth called the “independent intellect”. The romantics understood this as calculative reason when it is isolated from non-calculative reason, sensibility and imagination. Employed thusly, the independent intellect works as a “knife in hand” (Wordsworth, The Prelude (1805), book X, line 877).

This is crucial because, if the romantics are to retrieve the lost unity of nature itself and our lost unity with nature, they must propose a new scientific methodology, or, what comes to the same thing, a new approach to nature. The romantics aspired to reform and counterbalance the merely calculative, quantitative and mathematical use of reason that is characteristic of modern science, and open an era “When no more numbers and figures feature//As the keys to unlock every creature” (Novalis, Henry von Ofterdingen, NS 1:344). Human beings should strive to return to “the laws of things which lie/beyond the reach of human will or power;/The life of nature” (Wordsworth, “The Tables Turned”, 1798, LB) by adopting a more holistic approach that includes practical reason, sensibility, feeling, imagination, and above all the aesthetic capacity of the mind.

It should be no surprise that this holistic approach to nature—the new romantic science—is, in essence, poetic. It is romantic poetry, which, as Athenaeum Fragments (AF) #116 announces, “fuses and mixes” opposing forces: reason, feeling, imagination, physics, poetry, philosophy, medicine and alchemy—when it comes to methodology—and matter, form, freedom and nature—when it comes to the object of study, nature:

Anyone who finds in infinite nature nothing but one whole, one complete poem, in every word, every syllable of which the harmony of the whole rings out and nothing destroys it, has won the highest prize of all. (Ritter, Fragmente 2: 205)

5.2 Romantic Science

While Kant’s discussions of nature, organisms and teleological judgment in the third Critique, and Schelling’s On the World Soul (1798) and First Outline of a System of Philosophy of Nature (1799) are the primary sources of inspiration for romantic science, the metaphysical starting point for the romantic view of nature is what Fredrick Beiser aptly dubbed “a strange wedding plan” between Fichte’s idealism and Spinoza’s realistic monism (2003: 131).[7]

Why synthetize these seemingly opposed philosophical projects—a form of idealism with realism, indeterminism with determinism, and dualism with monism? Briefly, in Fichte, the romantics found a philosopher that took the Kantian insight about the absolute value of freedom a step further, and in Spinoza, one who recognized the genuine monistic structure of the universe, where the mental (in the form of reason and subjectivity, the seats of freedom) is the flipped side of the physical (in the form of matter and objectivity). If nature itself is both physical and mental, if it has a soul or reason and a body, then, it differs from human beings only in degree, not in kind. Natural phenomena and human beings are simply different manifestations of an encompassing nature, which is therefore nothing other than Spirit: “Nature should be visible spirit, and spirit should be invisible nature” (Schelling, Ideas for a Philosophy of Nature, SW 2: 56).

Thus, the marriage between the philosophical outlooks of Fichte and Spinoza promises to consummate the valuable nucleus of modernity (the Enlightenment’s emphasis on freedom and individual rational criticism), while rebutting the modern ills of division and alienation. It promises to allow human beings to “feel at home” in a meaningful, free and natural world.

But this is only the metaphysical presupposition behind the romantic conception of nature. Their understanding of nature, not only as monistic but also as an organic whole that is self-forming and self-generating—in their terms, as a creative, living force—is inspired by what, according to them, Kant only started to point to, but failed fully to develop in the third Critique since he restricted it to a regulative and heuristic conception: namely, the conception of organic nature.

Thinking about nature as Spirit, different from the human merely in degree, already presupposes a holistic conception of nature, where the whole is prior to the parts. For, if all individuals are, in Spinoza’s words “modes” of nature, namely, merely different manifestations of the one and same whole, then these parts are necessarily dependent on the whole. But insofar as nature is also an (all encompassing) organism, then just as its parts are dependent on it (for their existence and intelligibility), so it depends on its parts for its existence as the organism that it is: independently of its parts, an organism could not sustain its particular organization, i.e., its life form. In an organism, the parts are the reciprocal cause and effect of one another and of the organism as a whole.

But an organism is also self-organizing and self-forming. While the organization of artifacts is imposed on them from outside by their producers, the particular organization and so the life form of any organism is self-produced. Consequently, to view nature as an organism is to view it dynamically—not as a dead matter, but as self-forming and self-generating. Indeed, for the romantics, nature is one living force, whose different parts—not only self-conscious philosophers, creative artists, animals, plants, and minerals, but also kinds of matter—are different stages of its organization.

From moss, in which the trace of organization is hardly visible, to the noble Form [Gestalt] which seems to have shed the chains of matter, the one and same drive within rules, a drive that strives to work according to one and the same ideal of purposiveness, strives to express ad infinitum one and the same archetype [Urbild], the pure form of our Spirit. (Schelling, “Review of the Newest in Philosophical Literature, 1796”)

5.3 Art’s Nature, Nature’s Art

Beauty in nature and art is a key for this organic and dynamic conception of nature for multiple reasons. First, the holistic and unifying character of poetry is suitable not only for the reformed scientific methodology that fuses together reason, imagination and feeling, but also for unraveling analogies and unities that are usually hidden from the bare eye, for example, the unity between kinds of matter and self-conscious human beings as different stages in the organization of the same life force.

Second, natural beauties and artworks inspire an interest in natural organization and life by their analogy with organisms, or as the romantics often put it, by being themselves organic in nature.

The transcendental poetry of the future could be called organic. When it is invented it will be seen that all true poets up to now made poetry organically without knowing it. (Novalis, Logological Fragments: I, #38).

Artworks and natural beauties are analogous to organisms in various respects.

To begin with, the analogy concerns their structure or unity. Both have holistic unities, where the parts and the whole are reciprocally interdependent. Artworks and natural beauties are so structured since (1) their beauty as a whole depends on the existence and the exact organization of their parts (for, if, say, any of the specific shapes, hues, or composition of a painting were to change, the painting as a whole may not be beautiful any longer), and (2) their parts are recognized as what they are (as beauty-making parts, or parts of a beautiful object) only in light of the whole (so that, for example, a mere shade of white may be beautiful only in light of the beauty of the painting to which it contributes as a whole, but not necessarily beautiful on its own, or when it figures in any other object). “In poetry”, then, just as in organisms, “every whole can be a part and every part really a whole” (F. Schlegel, CF: #14).

Kant claimed that the main difference between the holistic unity of organisms and the holistic unities of artworks and natural beauties is the difference between a causal or existential unity and what he called a formal unity. In organic life, the reciprocal interdependence between parts and wholes is causal and existential in the sense that it is life-sustaining. Kant thought that in aesthetics, the reciprocal interdependence is formal, rather than causal or existential, in the sense that it does not explain the existence of the objects at stake, but their beauty. While, for example, a painting might continue to exist as a painting even if some of its parts changed (say, if its composition, shapes, or hues changed), the beauty of this painting is unlikely to survive such a change. In this case, it is the beauty of the whole painting that depends on its parts, and it is the beauty of the parts, rather than their existence, that depends on the beauty of the whole: for were the painting as a whole not beautiful, its parts would not be recognized as what they are, namely, beauty-making parts.

The romantics seemed to diverge from Kant on that matter. For them, great poetry is materially and not merely formally organic:

The innate impulse of this work [Wilhelm Meister], so organized and organizing down to its finest detail to form a whole. No break is accidental or insignificant;…everything is at the same time both means and end. (F. Schlegel, WM: 273–74)

This means that the romantics took the work of art to be analogous to organisms in yet a stronger sense—not only in terms of its holistic unity, but also in terms of its life—its self-organization and self-judgment. Recall the sui generis character of artworks (discussed in §3.2): each work constitutes the norms according to which alone it could be properly judged. In romantic terms, every work has its own self-judgment. Seen as such, the artwork is not a mere artifact, but a quasi-organism in the sense that it organizes and regulates itself. And like other organic products of nature, the work too has, as it were, a life of its own, even though it is not self-organizing in the strict sense:

Just as a child is only a thing which wants to become a human being, so a poem is only a product of nature which wants to become a work of art. (F. Schlegel, CF: #21)

It is the holistic unity and life in the aesthetic domain that draws our attention to organisms and inspires us to seek the organic structure of nature as a whole.

Third, following Kant, the romantics believed that the beauty of nature reveals the purposiveness without a purpose of nature as a whole. It inspires and guides us in seeing nature as purposively organized—organized as if according to a specific purpose—even though we cannot attribute this purposive structure to any will, creator, or any end-governed activity:

That which reminds us of nature and thus stimulates a feeling for the infinite abundance of life is beautiful. Nature is organic, and therefore, the highest beauty is forever vegetative; and the same is true for morality and love. (F. Schlegel, Ideas: #86)

While this view is to be found in the third Critique, the romantics went a few steps further than Kant: first, they considered purposiveness, teleological structure and life real features of nature, rather than regulative principles for approaching nature. Second, they took these features to indicate that nature is different from self-conscious, creative human beings only in degree, but not in kind: like human beings, nature is end-governed. It is beauty, above all, that inspires this realization. As Novalis puts it, “Through beauty, nature transforms itself into a human being” (Heinrich von Ofterdingen, NS 1), the same being that governs itself by creatively and self-consciously setting ends. The more we properly attend to beauty and art the more capable we would be of seeing nature and humanity as different aspects of a single, unified phenomenon:

Actually criticism…that doctrine which in the study of nature directs our attention to ourselves…and in the study of ourselves directs it to the outside world, to outer observations and experiments—is…the most fruitful of all indications. It allows us to sense nature, or the outside world, like a human being. (Novalis, General Draft: #42).

Aesthetics is central for the romantic “scientific revolution” for yet another reason that concerns its capacity to “enchant” nature. “Enchanting” stands here for the process of rendering nature magical, or mysterious, and thus inspiring reverence and awe (see Stone 2005). While bringing out nature’s organic structure is decisive for rebutting modern alienation, enchantment is required primarily for challenging two other consequences of modern science: the threat of a detached and unresponsive treatment of nature and what the romantics regarded as a threat of secularization. Not only did modern science portray nature as a brute domain of mechanism, and thus devoid of any awe-inspiring power, but it also rendered it completely transparent to the human mind, and thus lacking in the kind of mystery and magic that may inspire awe in a secular world. Changing our attitude towards nature and inspiring awe for it requires that we recover a sense of mystery and magic in nature, and, indeed, in everything ordinary, in everything that we have come to take for granted. This process—of recovering a sense of mystery and magic in nature and the ordinary—is so central in romanticism that it takes on the movement’s name:

Romanticizing is nothing other than a qualitative raising into higher power…. By giving a higher meaning to the ordinary, a mysterious appearance to the ordinary, the dignity of the unacquainted to that of which we are acquainted, the mere appearance of infinity to finite, I romanticize them. (Novalis, Logological Fragments: #66)

Poetry is most suitable for the business of romanticizing by virtue of two of its main features: (a) its “defamiliarizing” power, and, (b) its “ironic” ability to point to the limits of our knowledge, and thus to what must remain mysterious—beyond our cognitive capacities.

First, by virtue of its power to subtly describe even the most concrete of details and to bring to life even what, independently of it, attracts no attention, poetry has a special capacity for defamiliarization—a power that was first noticed by the romantics in their account of “romanticizing”, but dubbed “defamiliarization” only later, by 20th century literary theorists. By its non-ordinary use of language, attention to details and evoking power, poetry brings out in vivid colors what we are usually blind to, even if it is, literally, the closest and most familiar to us. Poetry has the power to make the most familiar new, refreshing, and thus, other than familiar—different and even mysterious.

Like Novalis, Wordsworth is one of the first proponents of romanticizing in this sense. He instructs: while romantic poetry should start with the most familiar and contingent—“the incidents and situations from common life”—it should also strive to elevate them by

throw[ing] over them a certain coloring of the imagination, whereby ordinary things should be presented to the mind in an unusual way; and further and above all [poetry should aim] to make these incidents and situations interesting by tracing in them…the primary laws of our nature. (Preface to the Lyrical Ballads.)

Wordsworth calls on poets to write in the language of “low and rustic life”. But it is exactly the poetic use of this language that allows the “passions” of those whose language it is—ordinary people—to be “incorporated with the beautiful and permanent forms of Nature” (ibid.). And it is through this process of romanticizing that nature appears again as great and awe-inspiring, “The great Nature that exists in words/Of might Poets” (Wordsworth, The Prelude (1805), Book V, lines 618–19).

Second, romantic poetry is essentially ironic insofar as it brings our finitude, particularly the limits of our knowledge, to consciousness (see §2.2). While romantic irony is the basis for a way of life that is centered on humility, it also paves the way for awe and reverence for it suggests that there is much beyond our comprehension, much that remains mysterious, incomprehensible, greater than our capacities and possibly infinite rather than finite like us. There is much around us that merits awe.

Wordsworth’s description of nature is possibly the most powerful portrayal of the awe-inspiring character of nature as it is revealed by the poetic imagination:

A sense sublime
Of something far more deeply interfused,
Whose dwelling is the light of setting suns,
And the round ocean, and the living air,
And the blue sky, in the mind of man,
A motion and a spirit, that impels,
All thinking things, all objects of all thought,
And rolls through all things.

I, so long
A worshipper of Nature, hither came,
Unwearied in that service: rather say
With warmer love, oh! With far deeper zeal
Of holier love.
(Wordsworth, “Lines Written a Few Miles above Tintern Abbey” (1798), lines 96–103 and 154–57, in LB)

Through the romantic lens, then, nature becomes alive and a locus of Spirit. Rather than an alien force, nature speaks to us as we speak to it and to each other.

Nature is a temple where living columns
Sometimes let confused words come out;
Man walks through these forests of symbols
Which observe him with a familiar gaze.
(La Nature est un temple où de vivants piliers
Laissent parfois sortir de confuses paroles
L'homme y passe à travers des forêts de symbols
Qui l'observent avec des regards familiers) (Baudelaire, Correspondences, 1861 [2000])

This is liberating and re-enchanting, but it also puts certain demands on us, for example, the demands to love nature as we love other human beings:

Oh, most magnificent and noble Nature!
Have I not worshipped thee with such a love
As never mortal man before displayed?
Adored thee in thy majesty of visible creation,
And searched into thy hidden and mysterious ways
As Poet, as Philosopher, as Sage?
(unknown date, Humphry Davy [1778–1829], Fragmentary Remains, 14)

As eccentric as the romantic call to poeticize nature and science may initially seem, it is arguably of relevance today. The organic and re-enchanted conception of nature did not only anticipate some currents in the modern ecological movement, but it also contains resources for further developments in contemporary environmental philosophy and philosophy of science.

6. Romantic Legacy

Interestingly, scholars tend to explain romantic aesthetics not only in terms of its sources (discussed in §2.1), but also in terms of its legacy. While there are very interesting and well-established connections between romantic aesthetics and modernism (see Abrams 1971, Frye 1968, Cavell 1979), this section focuses on the attempt to draw a link between the former and postmodernism, a link whose ground is significantly weaker.

In recent decades, a large number of romantic scholars have argued that romanticism, in general, and the romantic primacy of aesthetics, in particular, is a precursor of the fundamental outlook of postmodernist and poststructuralist views (see, for example, Lacoue-Labarthe and Nancy 1988, Bowie 2003, Bowman 2014, and Gasche 1991). This reading is based on the skepticism the romantics raised about first principles and about systematicity, the romantic emphasis on human creation and language, historicism and hermeneutics, their view of the fragmented nature of modern life and on certain formulations of the primacy of aesthetics that may seem, initially, to erase any distinction between what is “real” and what is “poetic”, a product of the creative imagination. Friedrich Schlegel, for example, proclaims: “No poetry, no reality…. There is, despite all the senses, no external world without imagination” (AF: #350), and “Everything that rests on the opposition between appearance and reality…is not purely poetic” (FLP: #146).

These proclamations may seem to suggest that “there is no way out” of creative constructions, or “texts”, or that “art…does not need to point beyond itself” (Bowie 2003: 53), as if romantic aesthetics anticipates central trends in post-modernism and post-structuralism.[8] But there are reasons to worry about such a “postmodernist” reading. Some lines in romanticism—skepticism about foundationalist philosophy and system-building, the emphasis on human creation, language, and the role of historicism and hermeneutics—are indeed related to certain strands in postmodernism. But reading romantic aesthetics as proto-postmodernist is limited for a host of reasons.

First, the romantic faith in the imaginative and emotive capacities associated with the production and reception of art, and their skepticism of absolute principles and philosophical systems did not make them skeptical of reason, as many postmodernist thinkers are (see §2.1 and Beiser 2003: 3). Even romantic skepticism of absolute principles (see §3.1). cannot be equated with the rejection of all principles and rules. For example, though art and art appreciation cannot be reduced to any given, prior rules, they are not lawless, but the source of their own normativity (see §3.3).

Second, in spite of the romantic stress on the fragmentary nature of human experience (embodied in their choice of the aphoristic style, which is emphasized by their post-modernist readers), the romantics never gave up the striving after unity and wholeness. Art was not meant as a replacement for unity, but exactly as the best way to strive after and approximate unity in our modern and fragmentary condition.

For the philosopher…art is supreme, for it opens to him the holiest of holies, where that which is separated in nature and history, and which can never be united either in life and action or in thought, burns as though in a single flame in eternal and primordial unity. (Schelling, System of Transcendental Philosophy, 1800, in Heath 1978: 231)

Third, the romantics’ desire for and search after the Absolute (discussed in 3) is another reason to reject the post-modernist interpretation. For such a desire is anathema to most post-modernist thinkers, who resist and shun the possibility (and desirability) of any absolute reality.

Moreover, if one opposes the idea that there is “no way out of texts”, or that reality is “nothing other than construction”, then the post-modernist reading of the romantics appears uncharitable. Fortunately, this interpretation does not force itself on us since there are many other charitable and (historically, textually and philosophically) well-grounded readings of the proclamations just mentioned and of the romantic primacy of the aesthetics. Many of these readings were proposed in this entry under the umbrella of the formal approach to romantic aesthetics. On this formal account, rather than claiming that there is no distinction between “reality” and “fiction”, or that there is “no way out of imaginative constructions”, the romantics urged human beings to fashion their ordinary life and philosophy aesthetically for epistemological, metaphysical, ethical, political and scientific reasons.

Arguably, romantic aesthetics is not of merely historical interest. This entry has pointed to a few facets of the relevance of romantic aesthetics, thus supporting views like Berlin’s, for example, according to which the revolution brought about by romanticism is “the deepest and most lasting of all changes in the life of the West…” (1999: xiii). Its tremendous impact on generations to come all the way up to the present day is one explanation of the difficulty of precisely delimiting when the age of romanticism begins and when it ends. Indeed, rather than a post-romantic age, our age may be yet another phase in the age of romanticism:

Romanticism…is the first major phase in an imaginative revolution which has carried on until our own day, and has by no means completed itself yet. (Frye 1968: 15; see also, Larmore 1996)


Primary Literature

German Romanticism

  • Eichendorff, J. von, 1993, Joseph von Eichendorff Werke, H. Schultz (hrs.), Frankfurt a. M.: Deautscher Klassiker Verlag. [EW]
  • Hardenberg, F.L. von [Novalis], 1960–88, Novalis Schriften, H.J. and G. Schulz (hrs.), Stuttgart: Verlag W. Kohlhammer. [NS]
  • Hölderlin, F., 1975, Sämtliche Werke: Historisch-Kritische Ausgabe. D.E. Sattler (hrs.), Frankfurt/Basel: Verlag Roter Stern. [HSA]
  • Kant, I., 1902–, Akademie Ausgabe: Kants gesammelte Schriften, hrsg. von der Königlisch Preußischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, Berlin: de Gruyter. [AK]
  • Ritter, J.W., 1810, Fragmente aus dem Nachlasse eines jungen Phyiskers, Heidelberg: Schneider. [Fragmente]
  • Schelling, F.W.J von, 1856–61, Sämtliche Werke, Schelling, K.F.A. (hrs.), Stuttgart: Cotta. [SW]
  • Schlegel, F., 1958–, Kritische Friedrich-Schlegel-Ausgabe, E. Behler, J.J. Anstett, and H. Eichner (hrs.), Paderborn: Ferdinand Schöningen. [KA]

All citations from these German editions are cited by these abbreviations, and are followed by the volume, page and, when relevant, fragment numbers.

German Romanticism in English

  • Behler E. and Struc R. (eds.)1968, Friedrich Schlegel: Dialogue on Poetry and Literary Aphorisms, University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Beiser, F. (ed. and trans.), 1996, The Early Political Writings of the German Romantics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bernstein, J.M. (ed.), 2003, Classic and Romantic German Aesthetics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Firchow, P. (ed. and trans.), 1991, Friedrich Schlegel: Philosophical Fragments, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Hölderlin, F., 1797, “Das älteste Systemprogramm des deutschen Idealismus,” translated as “Oldest Programme for a System of German Idealism”, in Bernstein 2003.
  • Novalis, Logological Fragments I, in Stoljar 1997.
  • –––, Last Fragments, in Stoljar 1997.
  • –––, General Draft, in Stoljar 1997.
  • –––, Faith and Love, in Stoljar 1997.
  • Novalis, 2003, Novalis: Fichte Studies, J. Kneller (ed. and trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. [FS]
  • Schulte-Sasse, J., H. Horne, and E. Mittman (eds. and trans.), 1997, Theory as Practice: A Critical Anthology of Early German Romantic Writings, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Schlegel, F., “Introduction to Transcendental Philosophy”, in Schulte-Sasse et al. 1997. [ITP]
  • –––, “Fragments on Literature and Poesy”, in Schulte-Sasse et al. 1997. [FLP]
  • –––, “Philosophical Fragments”, in Schulte-Sasse et al. 1997. [PF]
  • –––, “Concerning The Essence of Critique (1804)”, in Schulte-Sasse et al. 1997. [Critique]
  • –––, “On Philosophy: To Dorothea”, in Schulte-Sasse et al. 1997. [OP]
  • –––, “Philosophical Lectures: Transcendental Philosophy, Part II”, in Beiser 1996. [TPL II]
  • –––, “On Goethe’s Meister”, in Bernstein 2003. [WM]
  • –––,“On Incomprehensibility”, in Bernstein 2003.
  • –––, “Critical Fragments”, in Firchow 1991. [CF]
  • –––, “Athenaeum fragments”, in Firchow 1991. [AF]
  • –––, “Ideas”, in Firchow 1991. [Ideas]
  • –––,“Dialogue on Poetry”, in Behler and Struc 1968. [DP]
  • Schelling, F.W.J, 1978 [1800], System of Transcendental Philosophy, P. Heath (trans.), Charlottesville: University Press of Virginia.
  • Schleiermacher, F., “Monologue II”, in Beiser 1996.
  • Schleiermacher, F., 1996 [1799], On Religion, R. Crouter (ed. and trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Stoljar, M.M. (ed. and trans.), 1997, Novalis: Philosophical Writings, Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
  • Wood, D.W. (ed. and trans.), 2007, Notes for a Romantic Encyclopedia: Das Allgemeine Brouillon, Albany, New York: SUNY Press. [AB]

British Romanticism

  • Blake, W., 1982, The Complete Poetry and Prose of William Blake, D.V. Erdman (ed., rev.edn.), Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press. [PPWB]
  • Coleridge, S.T., 1987, Lectures 1808–1819 On Literature, R.A. Foakes (ed.), NJ: Princeton University Press. [CLL]
  • –––, 1983, Biographia Literaria, J. Engell and W.J. Bate (eds.). NJ: Princeton University Press. [BL]
  • Coleridge, S.T. and W. Wordsworth, 2008, Lyrical Ballads: 1798 and 1800, M. Gamer and D. Porter (eds.), Peterborough, Ontario: Broadview. [LB]
  • Keats, J., 1978, The Poems of John Keats, J. Stillinger (ed.), Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press. [PJK]
  • –––, 1970, Letters of John Keats, R. Gittings (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press. [LJK]
  • Shelley, P.B., 1964, The Letter of Percy Bysshe Shelley, Frederick L. Jones (eds.), Oxford: Clarendon Press. [LS]
  • –––, 2002, Shelley’s Poetry and Prose, D.H. Reiman and N. Fraistat (eds.), New York: Norton. [SPP]
  • Wordsworth, W., 1974, The Prose Works of William Wordsworth, W.J.B. Owen and J. Smyser (eds.), Oxford: Clarendon Press. [PWWW]
  • –––, 1974, The Prelude: the 1805 Text, Gill, S. (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.

French Romanticism in English

  • Baudelaire, C., 2000, Selected Poems from Les Fleurs du Mal: a Bilingual Edition, N. Shapiro (trans.), Chicago: University of Chicago Press). Includes: Correspondences 1861.
  • –––, 1981, Art in Paris, 1845–1862: Salons and Other Exhibitions Reviewed by Charles Baudelaire, J. Mayne (ed.), Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press. Includes: Salon of 1846.
  • –––, 1995, The Painter of Modern Life and Other Essays, J. Mayne (ed.), London: Phaidon.
  • Diderot, D., 1995, Diderot on Art, J. Goodman (ed.), New Haven, CT: Yale University Press. Includes: Salon of 1767.
  • Nerval, G. de, 1957, Selected Writings, G. Geoffrey Wagner (ed.), Ann Arbor: The University of Michigan Press.

American Romanticism

  • Poe, E.A., 1984, Edgar Allen Poe: Poetry and Tales, P.F. Quinn (ed.), New York: Library of America. Includes: “Sonnet: To Science” (1829).

Secondary Literature

  • Abrams, M.H., 1971, Natural Supernaturalism: Tradition and Revolution in Romantic Literature, New York: W.W. Norton & Company.
  • Ameriks, K., 2006, Kant and the Historical Turn, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, (ed.), 2000, The Cambridge Companion to German Idealism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Behler, E., 1993, German Romantic Literary Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 1992, Frühromantik, Berlin: de Gruyter.
  • Beiser, F.C., 2002, German Idealism: The Struggle Against Subjectivity 1781–1801, Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2003, The Romantic Imperative, Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1987, The Fate of Reason: German Philosophy from Kant to Fichte, Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1992, Enlightenment, Revolution and Romanticism, Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press.
  • Benjamin, W., 1996, “The Concept of Criticism in German Romanticism”, Selected Writings, vol. 1, 1913–1926, M.W. Jennings and M. Bullock (eds.), Cambridge, Mass: The Belknap Press, 116–200.
  • Berlin, I., 1999, The Roots of Romanticism, H. Hardy (ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Bernstein, J.M., 2003, “Introduction”, in Classic and Romantic German Aesthetics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bowie, A., 2003, Aesthetics and Subjectivity: From Kant to Nietzsche, Manchester, England: Manchester University Press.
  • Bowman, B., 2014, “On the Defense of Literary Value”, in Nassar 2014b: 147–162.
  • Cavell, S. 1979, The World Viewed, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1988, In Quest of the Ordinary, Chicago: Chicago University Press.
  • Davy, H., 1858, Fragmentary Remains, Forgotten Books.
  • Eichner, H., 1970, Friedrich Schlegel, New York: Twayne Publishers.
  • Eldridge, R., 2001, The Persistence of Romanticism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Engell, J. 1981, The Creative Imagination: Enlightenment to Romanticism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Forster, M., 2011, German Philosophy of Language, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2010, After Hereder: Philosophy of Language in the German Tradition, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Frank, M., 1997a, Einführung in die frühromantische Ästhetik, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp.
  • –––, 1997b, Unendliche Annäherung: Die Anfänge der Philosophischen Frühromantik, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp
  • –––, 1997c “Wie Reaktionär war eigentlich die Frühromantik”, Athenäum, 7: 141–66.
  • Frye, N., 1968, A Study of English Romanticism, Random House.
  • –––, 1963, Romanticism Reconsidered, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Gasche, R., 1991, “Forward: Ideality in Fragmentation”, in Friedrich Schlegel: Philosophical Fragments, P. Firchow (ed.).
  • Gjesdal, K., 2009, Gadamer and the Legacy of German Idealism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Gorodeisky, K., 2011, “(Re)encountering Individuality: Schlegel’s Romantic Imperative as a Response to Nihilism”, Inquiry, 54 (6): 567–90.
  • Gregory, A., 2005, “Philosophy and Religion”, in Oxford Guide to Romanticism, R. Nicholas (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Haym, R., 1882, Die romantische Schule, Berlin: Gaertner.
  • Heine, H., 1985, The Romantic School and Other Essays, J. Hermand and R.C. Holub (eds.), New York: Continuum.
  • Henrich, D., 1997, The Course of Remembrance and Other Essays on Hölderlin, E. Förster (ed.), Stanford: Stanford University Press.
  • Kneller, J., 2007, Kant and the Power of the Imagination, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kompridis, N., 2006, Philosophical Romanticism, New York: Routledge.
  • Lacoue-Labarth, P. and J.L. Nancy, 1988, The Literary Absolute, P. Barnard and C. Lester (trans.), Albany, New York: SUNY Press.
  • Larmore, C. 1996, The Romantic Legacy, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Lovejoy, A., 1960, Essays in the History of Ideas, New York: Capricorn.
  • Millán-Zaibert, E., 2007, Friedrich Schlegel and the Emergence of Romantic Philosophy, Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
  • Nassar, D., 2014a, The Romantic Absolute, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • ––– (ed.), 2014b, The Relevance of Romanticism: Essays on German Romantic Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Pinkard, T., 2002, German Philosophy 1760–1860, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Richards, R., 2002, The Romantic Conception of Life, Chicago: Chicago University Press.
  • Rush, F., 2006, “Irony and Romantic Subjectivity”, in Kompridis 2006: 173–96.
  • Saul, N. (ed.), 2009, German Romanticism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Schmitt, C., 1986, Political Romanticism, G. Oakes (trans.), Cambridge, Mass: The MIT Press.
  • Schmidt, R., 2009, “From Early to Late Romanticism”, in German Romanticism, N. Sould (ed.), 21–40.
  • Stone, A., 2005, “Friedrich Schlegel, Romanticism, and the Re-enchantment of Nature”, Inquiry, 48: 3–25.
  • –––, 2008, “Being, Knowledge, and Nature in Novalis”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 46: 141–64.
  • –––, 2011, “The Romantic Asbolute”, British Journal of the History of Philosophy, 19: 497–517.

Other Internet Resources

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