Notes to 19th Century Romantic Aesthetics

1. “Early Romanticism”, also known as “Jena Romanticism”, refers to the group of philosophers, poets and literary critics formed mainly around Friedrich Schlegel and his brother, August Wilhelm Schlegel, in Jena and Berlin roughly between 1795 and 1802. The group consisted primarily of Friedrich von Hardenberg, known by the pseudonym Novalis, Friedrich Daniel Ernst Schleiermacher, Wilhelm H. Ludwig Tieck, Sophie Tieck, Dorothea Veit Schlegel, and Caroline Schlegel Schelling. For the periodization of German Romanticism into “Early Romanticism”, “Middle” or “High Romanticism”, and “Late Romanticism”, and the evolution of the term Frühromantik, see Behler 1993 (9–35) and Schmidt 2009. Although Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph Schelling was also part of this group, his views differ from the core views of the rest of the circle in a way that usually leads scholars to categorize him as a German Idealist, alongside Fichte and Hegel. However, whether to identify the early romantics with, or distinguish them from the better-known German Idealists is part of a scholarly controversy. (For the view that Early Romanticism is an integral part of the German Idealist movement, see Beiser 2002. For the opposing view, see primarily Frank 1997b.) For the purposes of this entry, romantic philosophy will be treated as different from the philosophy of the German Idealists, but Schelling’s philosophy will be regarded as a very central influence on the aesthetic views of the romantics.

2. That the German romantics are philosophers as much as they are literary critics and artists has been recognized and argued for in recent decades among others by such as Ameriks, Beiser, Bowie, Eldridge, Forster, Frank, Henrich, Kneller, Millán-Zaibert, Rush and Stone.

3. The precise source of this text is unclear. The manuscript is written in Hegel’s handwriting, but its first editor—Franz Rosenzweig—claimed in 1917 that the manuscript was really authored by Hölderlin and Schelling. Scholars widely agree today that the fragment resulted from the exchange of ideas between these three friends.

4. Some scholars believe that the romantics aimed to access the Absolute through a notion of intellectual intuition—that immediate, non-discursive grasp of things as they are in themselves (see Stone 2011 and Beiser 2002 and 2003). But this is controversial. Among the romantics, Hölderlin and Coleridge (following Schelling) indeed endorsed the possibility of intellectual intuition. But other romantics, like F. Schlegel and Novalis, rejected intellectual intuition as unavailable to the human mind. Novalis’s Fichte Studies, for example, starts with an exploration of intellectual intuition, but turns against it in the middle, and ends up advocating feeling, rather than intellectual intuition, as the proper approach to the Absolute. And F. Schlegel repeatedly questions the possibility of such an intuition.

5. When it comes to the lawfulness of poetry and criticism, Coleridge would probably beg to disagree. As he clarified, for example, in the opening of his BL and in some of his letters, he believed that philosophical principles should be applied, at least implicitly, both to poetry and to criticism.

6. It is worth noting that, on the romantic picture, language too is both individual and social. As expressing a shared world, language is social and shared. And yet, every individual expression, as an expression of a unique manifestation of the infinite universe, is distinctly individual and irreducible to any other. Here too poetry and aesthetic judgment are crucial for the balance between sociality and individuality, for, as F. Schlegel claims, “[aesthetic] critique [is] the common pillar on which the entire edifice of knowledge and language rests” (Critique: 271).

7. The marriage did not include, though, the former’s foundationalism and “empirical egoism” that the romantics harshly criticized, and the latter’s determinism that conflicts with the romantics’ commitments to freedom.

8. These statements may also sound eccentric, unpalatable, and, at best, controversial. Based on his reading of such formulations, Rudolf Haym, for example, described Novalis, as “a poetically exaggerated Fichte” (1882: 332). However, in recent years, Frank (e.g., 1997b), Beiser (e.g., 2003) and others following them validly established that, rather than Fichtean, the Early German Romantics were very harsh critics of Fichte’s project. Moreover, the main task of this entry is to interpret these statements in a way that shows that, rather than “exaggerated”, they are philosophically grounded.

Copyright © 2016 by
Keren Gorodeisky <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free