Affirmative Action

First published Fri Dec 28, 2001; substantive revision Mon Apr 9, 2018

“Affirmative action” means positive steps taken to increase the representation of women and minorities in areas of employment, education, and culture from which they have been historically excluded. When those steps involve preferential selection—selection on the basis of race, gender, or ethnicity—affirmative action generates intense controversy.

The development, defense, and contestation of preferential affirmative action has proceeded along two paths. One has been legal and administrative as courts, legislatures, and executive departments of government have made and applied rules requiring affirmative action. The other has been the path of public debate, where the practice of preferential treatment has spawned a vast literature, pro and con. Often enough, the two paths have failed to make adequate contact, with the public quarrels not always very securely anchored in any existing legal basis or practice.

The ebb and flow of public controversy over affirmative action can be pictured as two spikes on a line, the first spike representing a period of passionate debate that began around 1972 and tapered off after 1980, and the second indicating a resurgence of debate in the 1990s leading up to Supreme Court’s decisions in 2003 and 2016 upholding certain kinds of affirmative action. The first spike encompassed controversy about gender and racial preferences alike. This is because in the beginning affirmative action was as much about the factory, the firehouse, and the corporate suite as about the college campus. The second spike represents a quarrel about race and ethnicity. This is because the burning issue at the turn of the twentieth-first century is about college admissions. At selective colleges, women need no boost; African-Americans and Hispanics do.[1]

1. In the Beginning

In 1972, affirmative action became an inflammatory public issue. True enough, the Civil Rights Act of 1964 already had made something called “affirmative action” a remedy federal courts could impose on violators of the Act. Likewise, after 1965 federal contractors had been subject to President Lyndon Johnson’s Executive Order 11246, requiring them to take “affirmative action” to make sure they were not discriminating. But what did this 1965 mandate amount to? The Executive Order assigned to the Secretary of Labor the job of specifying rules of implementation. In the meantime, as the federal courts were enforcing the Civil Rights Act against discriminating companies, unions, and other institutions, the Department of Labor mounted an ad hoc attack on the construction industry by cajoling, threatening, negotiating, and generally strong-arming reluctant construction firms into a series of region-wide “plans” in which they committed themselves to numerical hiring goals. Through these contractor commitments, the Department could indirectly pressure recalcitrant labor unions, who supplied the employees at job sites.

While the occasional court case and government initiative made the news and stirred some controversy, affirmative action was pretty far down the list of public excitements until the autumn of 1972, when the Secretary of Labor’s Revised Order No. 4, fully implementing the Executive Order, landed on campus by way of directives from the Department of Health, Education, and Welfare. Its predecessor, Order No. 4, first promulgated in 1970, cast a wide net over American institutions, both public and private. By extending to all contractors the basic apparatus of the construction industry “plans,” the Order imposed a one-size-fits-all system of “underutilization analyses,” “goals,” and “timetables” on hospitals, banks, trucking companies, steel mills, printers, airlines—indeed, on all the scores of thousands of institutions, large and small, that did business with the government, including a special set of institutions with a particularly voluble and articulate constituency, namely, American universities.

At first, university administrators and faculty found the rules of Order No. 4 murky but hardly a threat to the established order. The number of racial and ethnic minorities receiving PhDs each year and thus eligible for faculty jobs was tiny. Any mandate to increase their representation on campus would require more diligent searches by universities, to be sure, but searches fated nevertheless largely to mirror past results. The 1972 Revised Order, on the other hand, effected a change that punctured any campus complacency: it included women among the “protected classes” whose “underutilization” demanded the setting of “goals” and “timetables” for “full utilization” (Graham 1990, 413). Unlike African-Americans and Hispanics, women were getting PhDs in substantial and growing numbers. If the affirmative action required of federal contractors was a recipe for “proportional representation,” then Revised Order No. 4 was bound to leave a large footprint on campus. Some among the professoriate exploded in a fury of opposition to the new rules, while others responded with an equally vehement defense of them.[2]

As it happened, these events coincided with another development, namely the “public turn” in philosophy. For several decades Anglo-American philosophy had treated moral and political questions obliquely. On the prevailing view, philosophers were suited only to do “conceptual analysis”—they could lay bare, for example, the conceptual architecture of the idea of justice, but they were not competent to suggest political principles, constitutional arrangements, or social policies that actually did justice. Philosophers might do “meta-ethics” but not “normative ethics.” This viewed collapsed in the 1970s under the weight of two counter-blows. First, John Rawls published in 1971 A Theory of Justice, an elaborate, elegant, and inspiring defense of a normative theory of justice (Rawls 1971). Second, in the same year Philosophy & Public Affairs, with Princeton University’s impeccable pedigree, began life, a few months after Florida State’s Social Theory and Practice. These journals, along with a re-tooled older periodical, Ethics, became self-conscious platforms for socially and politically engaged philosophical writing, born out of the feeling that in time of war (the Vietnam War) and social tumult (the Civil Rights Movement, Women’s Liberation), philosophers ought to do, not simply talk about, ethics. In 1973, Philosophy & Public Affairs published Thomas Nagel’s “Equal Treatment and Compensatory Justice” (Nagel 1973) and Judith Jarvis Thomson’s “Preferential Hiring” (Thomson 1973), and the philosophical literature on affirmative action burgeoned forth.[3]

In contention was the nature of those “goals” and “timetables” imposed on every contractor by Revised Order No. 4. Weren’t the “goals” tantamount to “quotas,” requiring institutions to use racial or gender preferences in their selection processes? Some answered “no” (Ezorsky 1977, 86). Properly understood, affirmative action did not require (or even permit) the use of gender or racial preferences. Others said “yes” (Goldman 1976, 182–3). Affirmative action, if it did not impose preferences outright, at least countenanced them. Among the yea-sayers, opinion divided between those who said preferences were morally permissible and those who said they were not. Within the “morally permissible” set, different writers put forward different justifications.

2. The Controversy Engaged

The essays by Thomson and Nagel defended the use of preferences but on different grounds. Thomson endorsed job preferences for women and African-Americans as a form of redress for their past exclusion from the academy and the workplace. Preferential policies, in her view, worked a kind of justice. Nagel, by contrast, argued that preferences might work a kind of social good, and without doing violence to justice. Institutions could for one or another good reason properly depart from standard meritocratic selection criteria because the whole system of tying economic reward to earned credentials was itself indefensible.

Justice and desert lay at the heart of subsequent arguments. Several writers took to task Thomson’s argument that preferential hiring justifiably makes up for past wrongs. Preferential hiring seen as redress looks perverse, they contended, since it benefits individuals (African-Americans and women possessing good educational credentials) least likely harmed by past wrongs while it burdens individuals (younger white male applicants) least likely to be responsible for past wrongs (Simon 1974, 315–19; Sher 1975, 162; Sher 1979, 81–82; and Goldman 1976, 190–1).[4] Instead of doing justice, contended the critics, preferential treatment violated rights. What rights were at issue? The right of an applicant “to equal consideration” (Thomson 1973, 377; Simon 1974, 312), the right of the maximally competent to an open position (Goldman 1976, 191; Goldman 1979, 24–8), or the right of everyone to equal opportunity (Gross 1977a, 382; Gross 1978, 97). Moreover, according to the critics, preferential treatment confounded desert by severing reward from a “person’s character, talents, choices and abilities” (Simon 1979, 96), by “subordinating merit, conduct, and character to race” (Eastland and Bennett 1979, 144), and by disconnecting outcomes from actual liability and damage (Gross 1978, 125–42).

Defenders of preferences were no less quick to enlist justice and desert in their cause. Mary Anne Warren, for example, argued that in a context of entrenched gender discrimination, gender preferences might improve the “overall fairness” of job selections. Justice and individual desert need not be violated.

If individual men’s careers are temporarily set back because of…[job preferences given to women], the odds are good that these same men will have benefited in the past and/or will benefit in the future—not necessarily in the job competition, but in some ways—from sexist discrimination against women. Conversely, if individual women receive apparently unearned bonuses [through preferential selection], it is highly likely that these same women will have suffered in the past and/or will suffer in the future from…sexist attitudes. (Warren 1977, 256)

Likewise, James Rachels defended racial preferences as devices to neutralize unearned advantages by whites. Given the pervasiveness of racial discrimination, it is likely, he argued, that the superior credentials offered by white applicants do not reflect their greater effort, desert, or even ability. Rather, the credentials reflect their mere luck at being born white. “Some white…[applicants] have better qualifications…only because they have not had to contend with the obstacles faced by their African-American competitors” (Rachels 1978, 162). Rachels was less confident than Warren that preferences worked uniformly accurate offsets. Reverse discrimination might do injustice to some whites; yet its absence would result in injustices to African-Americans who have been unfairly handicapped by their lesser advantages.

Rachels’ diffidence was warranted in light of the counter-responses. If racial and gender preferences for jobs (or college admissions) were supposed to neutralize unfair competitive advantages, they needed to be calibrated to fit the variety of backgrounds aspirants brought to any competition for these goods. Simply giving blanket preferences to African-Americans or women seemed much too ham-handed an approach if the point was to micro-distribute opportunities fairly (Sher 1975, 165ff).

3. Rights and Consistency

To many of its critics, reverse discrimination was simply incoherent. When “the employers and the schools favor women and blacks,” objected Lisa Newton, they commit the same injustice perpetrated by Jim Crow discrimination. “Just as the previous discrimination did, this reverse discrimination violates the public equality which defines citizenship” (Newton 1973, 310).[5]

William Bennett and Terry Eastland likewise saw racial preferences as in some sense illogical:

To count by race, to use the means of numerical equality to achieve the end of moral equality, is counterproductive, for to count by race is to deny the end by virtue of the means. The means of race counting will not, cannot, issue in an end where race does not matter (Eastland and Bennett 1979, 149).[6]

When Eastland and Bennett alluded to those who favored using race to get to a point where race doesn’t count, they had in mind specifically the Supreme Court’s Justice Blackmun who, in the famous 1978 Bakke case (discussed below), put his own view in just those simple terms. For Blackmun, the legitimacy of racial preferences was to be measured by how fast using them moves us toward a society where race doesn’t matter (a view developed in subtle detail by the philosopher Richard Wasserstrom in Wasserstrom 1976). While the critics of preferences claimed to find the very idea of using race to end racism illogical and incoherent, they also fell back on principle to block Blackmun’s instrumental defense should it actually prove both reasonable and plausible. “The moral issue comes in classic form,” wrote Carl Cohen. “Terribly important objectives…appear to require impermissible means.” Cohen asked, “might we not wink at the Constitution this once” and allow preferences to do their good work (Cohen 1995, 20)? Neither he nor other critics thought so. Principle must hold firm. “[I]n the distribution of benefits under the laws all racial classifications are invidious” (Cohen 1995, 52).

But what, exactly, is the principle—constitutional or moral—that always bars the use of race as a means to “terribly important objectives”? Alan Goldman did more than anyone in the early debate to formulate and ground a relevant principle. Using a contractualist framework, he surmised that rational contractors would choose a rule of justice requiring positions to be awarded by competence. On its face, this rule would seem to preclude filling positions by reference to factors like race and gender that are unrelated to competence. However, Goldman’s “rule” blocked preferences only under certain empirical conditions. Goldman explained the derivation of the rule and its consequent limit this way:

The rule for hiring the most competent was justified as part of a right to equal opportunity to succeed through socially productive effort, and on grounds of increased welfare for all members of society. Since it is justified in relation to a right to equal opportunity, and since the application of the rule may simply compound injustices when opportunities are unequal elsewhere in the system, the creation of more equal opportunities takes precedence when in conflict with the rule for awarding positions. Thus short-run violations of the rule are justified to create a more just distribution of benefits by applying the rule itself in future years. (Goldman 1979, 164–165).

In other words, if “terribly important objectives” having to do with equalizing opportunities in a system rife with unjust inequalities could in fact be furthered by measured and targeted reverse discrimination, justice wouldn’t stand in the way. Goldman’s principle did not have the adamantine character Cohen and other critics sought in a bar to preferences. Where can such an unyielding principle be found? I postpone further examination of this question until I discuss the Bakke case, below, whose split opinions constitute an extended debate on the meaning of constitutional equality.

4. Real-World Affirmative Action: The Workplace

The terms of the popular debate over racial and gender preferences often mirrored the arguments philosophers and other academics were making to each other. Preference’s defenders offered many reasons to justify them, reasons having to do with compensatory or distributive justice, as well as reasons having to do with social utility (more African-Americans in the police department would enable it better to serve the community, more female professors in the classroom would inspire young women to greater achievements). Critics of preferences retorted by pointing to the law. And well they should, since the text of the Civil Rights Act of 1964 seemed a solid anchor even if general principle proved elusive. Title VI of the Act promised that “[n]o person…shall, on the ground of race, color, or national origin, be excluded from participation in, be denied the benefits of, or be subjected to discrimination under any program or activity receiving Federal financial assistance.”[7] Title VII similarly prohibited all employment practices that discriminated on the basis of race, gender, religion, or national origin.[8]

In face of the plain language of Titles VI and VII, how did preferential hiring and promotion ever arise in the first place? How could they be justified legally? Part of the answer lies in the meaning of “discrimination.” The Civil Rights Act did not define the term. The federal courts had to do that job themselves, and the cases before them drove the definition in a particular direction. Many factories and businesses prior to 1964, especially in the South, had in place overtly discriminatory policies and rules. For example, a company’s policy might have openly relegated African-Americans to the maintenance department and channeled whites into operations, sales, and management departments, where the pay and opportunities for advancement were far better. If, after passage of the Civil Rights Act, the company willingly abandoned its openly segregative policy, it could still carry forward the effects of its past segregation through other already-existing facially neutral rules. For example, a company policy that required workers to give up their seniority in one department if they transferred to another would have locked in place older African-American maintenance workers as effectively as the company’s own prior segregative rule that made them ineligible to transfer at all. Consequently, courts began striking down facially neutral rules that carried through the effects of an employer’s past discrimination, regardless of the original intent or provenance of the rules. “Intent” was effectively decoupled from “discrimination.” In 1971, the Supreme Court ratified this process, giving the following construction of Title VII:

The objective of Congress in the enactment of Title VII…was to achieve equality of employment opportunities and remove barriers that have operated in the past to favor an identifiable group of white employees over other employees. Under the Act, practices, procedures, or tests neutral on their face, and even neutral in terms of intent, cannot be maintained if they operate to “freeze” the status quo of prior discriminatory employment practices.

What is required by Congress is the removal of artificial, arbitrary, and unnecessary barriers to employment when the barriers operate invidiously to exclude on the basis of racial or other impermissible classification.[9]

In a few short paragraphs the Court advanced from proscribing practices that froze in place the effects of a firm’s own past discrimination to proscribing practices that carried through the effects of past discrimination generally. The Court characterized statutory discrimination as any exclusionary practice not necessary to an institution’s activities. Since many practices in most institutions were likely to be exclusionary, rejecting minorities and women in greater proportion than white men, all institutions needed to reassess the full range of their practices to look for, and correct, discriminatory effect. Against this backdrop, the generic idea of affirmative action took form:

Each institution should effectively monitor its practices for exclusionary effect and revise those that cannot be defended as “necessary” to doing business. In order to make its monitoring and revising effective, an institution ought to predict, as best it can, how many minorities and women it would select over time, were it successfully nondiscriminating. These predictions constitute the institution’s affirmative action “goals,” and failure to meet the goals signals to the institution (and to the government) that it needs to revisit its efforts at eliminating exclusionary practices. There may still remain practices that ought to be modified or eliminated.[10]

The point of such affirmative action: to induce change in institutions so that they could comply with the nondiscrimination mandate of the Civil Rights Act.

However, suppose this self-monitoring and revising fell short? In early litigation under the Civil Rights Act, courts concluded that some institutions, because of their histories of exclusion and their continuing failure to find qualified women or minorities, needed stronger medicine. Courts ordered these institutions to adopt “quotas,” to take in specific numbers of formerly excluded groups on the assumption that once these new workers were securely lodged in place, the institutions would adapt to this new reality.[11]

Throughout the 1970s, courts and government enforcement agencies extended this idea across the board, requiring a wide range of firms and organizations—from AT&T to the Alabama Highway Patrol—temporarily to select by the numbers. In all these cases, the use of preferences was tied to a single purpose: to prevent ongoing and future discrimination. Courts carved out this justification for preferences not through caprice but through necessity. They found themselves confronted with a practical dilemma that Congress had never envisaged and thus never addressed when it wrote the Civil Rights Act. The dilemma was this: courts could impose racial preferences to change foot-dragging or inept defendants (and by doing so apparently transgress the plain prohibition in Title VII) or they could order less onerous steps they knew would be ineffective, thus letting discrimination continue (and by doing so violate their duty under Title VII). Reasonably enough, the federal courts resolved this dilemma by appeal to the broad purposes of the Civil Rights Act and justified racial preferences where needed to prevent ongoing and future discrimination.[12]

Thus, preferential affirmative action in the workplace served the same rationale as the non-preferential sort. Its purpose was not to compensate for past wrongs, offset unfair advantage, appropriately reward the deserving, or yield a variety of social goods; its purpose was to change institutions so they could comply with the nondiscrimination mandate of the Civil Rights Act.

5. Real-World Affirmative Action: The University

In the 1970s, while campuses were embroiled in debate about how to increase African-Americans and women on the faculty, universities were also putting into effect schemes to increase minority presence within the student body. Very selective universities, in particular, needed new initiatives because only a handful of African-American and Hispanic high school students possessed test scores and grades good enough to make them eligible for admission. These institutions faced a choice: retain their admissions criteria unchanged and live with the upshot—hardly any African-Americans and Hispanics on campus—or fiddle with their criteria to get a more substantial representation. Most elected the second path.

The Medical School of the University of California at Davis exemplified a particularly aggressive approach. It reserved sixteen of the one hundred slots in its entering classes for minorities. In 1973 and again in 1974, Allan Bakke, a white applicant, was denied admission although his test scores and grades were better than most or all of those admitted through the special program. He sued. In 1977, his case, Regents of the University of California v. Bakke, reached the Supreme Court. The Court rendered its decision a year later (438 U.S. 265 [1978]).[13]

An attentive reader of Title VI of the Civil Rights Act might have thought this case was an easy call. So, too, thought four justices on the Supreme Court, who voted to order Bakke admitted to the Medical School. Led by Justice Stevens, they saw the racially segregated, two-track scheme at the Medical School (a recipient of federal funds) as a clear violation of the plain language of the Title.

Four other members of the Court, led by Justice Brennan, wanted very keenly to save the Medical School program. To find a more attractive terrain for doing battle, they made an end-run around Title VI, arguing that, whatever its language, it had no independent meaning itself. It meant in regard to race only what the Constitution meant.[14] Thus, instead of having to parse the stingy and unyielding language of Title VI (“no person shall be subjected to…on the ground of race”), the Brennan group could turn their creative energies to interpreting the broad and vague language of the Fourteenth Amendment (“no person shall be denied the equal protection of the laws”), which provided much more wiggle-room for justifying racial preferences. The Brennan justices persuaded one other member, Justice Powell, to join them in their view of Title VI. But Powell didn’t agree with their view of the Constitution. He argued that the Medical School’s policy was unconstitutional and voted that Bakke must be admitted. His vote, added to the four votes of the Stevens group, meant that Allan Bakke won his case and that Powell got to write the opinion of the Court. The Brennan strategy didn’t reap the fruit it intended.

Against the leanings of the Brennan group, who would distinguish between “benign” and “malign” uses of race and deal more leniently with the former, Powell insisted that the Fourteenth Amendment’s promise of “equal protection of the law” must mean the same thing for all, black and white alike. To paraphrase Powell:

The Constitution can tolerate no “two-class” theory of equal protection. There is no principled basis for deciding between classes that deserve special judicial attention and those that don’t. To think otherwise would involve the Court in making all kinds of “political” decisions it is not competent to make. In expounding the Constitution, the Court’s role is to discern “principles sufficiently absolute to give them roots throughout the community and continuity over significant periods of time, and to lift them above the pragmatic political judgments of a particular time and place” (Bakke, at 295–300 [Powell quoting Cox 1976, 114]).

What, then, was the practical meaning of a “sufficiently absolute” rendering of the principle of equal protection? It was this: when the decisions of state agents ‘touch upon an individual’s race or ethnic background, he is entitled to a judicial determination that the burden he is asked to bear on that basis is precisely tailored to serve a compelling governmental interest (Bakke, at 300).

Powell, with this standard in hand, then turned to look at the four reasons the Medical School offered for its special program: (i) to reduce “the historic deficit of traditionally disfavored minorities in medical schools and the medical profession;” (ii) to counter “the effects of societal discrimination;” (iii) to increase “the number of physicians who will practice in communities currently underserved;” and (iv) to obtain “the educational benefits that flow from an ethnically diverse student body” (Bakke, at 307). Did any or all of them specify a compelling governmental interest? Did they necessitate use of racial preferences?

As to the first reason, Powell dismissed it out of hand.

If [the School’s] purpose is to assure within its student body some specified percentage of a particular group merely because of its race or ethnic origin, such a preferential purpose must be rejected not as insubstantial but as facially invalid. Preferring members of any one group for no reason other than race or ethnic origin is discrimination for its own sake.

As to the second reason, Powell allowed it more force. A state has a legitimate interest in ameliorating the effects of past discrimination. Even so, contended Powell, the Court,

has never approved a classification that aids persons perceived as members of relatively victimized groups at the expense of other innocent individuals in the absence of judicial, legislative, or administrative findings of constitutional or statutory violations (Bakke, at 308).

And the Medical School does not purport to have made, and is in no position to make, such findings. Its broad mission is education, not the formulation of any legislative policy or the adjudication of particular claims of illegality.…[I]solated segments of our vast governmental structures are not competent to make those decisions, at least in the absence of legislative mandates and legislatively determined criteria (Bakke, at 309).

As to the third reason, Powell found it, too, insufficient. The Medical School provided no evidence that the best way it could contribute to increased medical services to underserved communities was to employ a racially preferential admissions scheme. Indeed, the Medical School provided no evidence that its scheme would result in any benefits at all to such communities (Bakke, at 311).

This left the fourth reason. Here Powell found merit. A university’s interest in a diverse student body is legitimated by the First Amendment’s implied protection of academic freedom. This constitutional halo makes the interest “compelling.” However, the Medical School’s use of a racial and ethnic classification scheme was not “precisely tailored” to effect the School’s interest in diversity, argued Powell.

The diversity that furthers a compelling state interest encompasses a far broader array of qualifications and characteristics of which racial or ethnic origin is but a single though important element. [The Medical School’s] special admissions program, focused solely on ethnic diversity, would hinder rather than further attainment of genuine diversity (Bakke, at 316).

The diversity which provides an educational atmosphere “conducive to speculation, experiment and creation” includes a nearly endless range of experiences, talents, and attributes that students might bring to campus. In reducing diversity to racial and ethnic quotas, the Medical School wholly misconceived this important educational interest.

In sum, although the last of the Medical School’s four reasons encompassed a “compelling governmental interest,” the School’s special admissions program was not necessary to effect the interest. The special admissions program was unconstitutional. So concluded Justice Powell.

6. Equality’s Rule

This was a conclusion Justice Brennan tried vigorously to forestall. Brennan agreed with Powell that “equal protection” must mean the same thing—that is, remain one rule—whether applied to blacks or whites. But the same rule applied to different circumstances need not yield the same results. Racial preferences created for different reasons and producing different outcomes need not all be judged in the same harsh, virtually fatal, manner. This point was the crux of Brennan’s defense of the Medical School’s policy.

Powell thought there was no principled way to distinguish “benign” from “malign” discrimination, but Brennan insisted there was. He argued that if the Court looked carefully at its past cases striking down Jim Crow laws, it would see the principle at work. What the Court found wrong in Jim Crow was that it served no purpose except to mark out and stigmatize one group of people as inferior. The “cardinal principle” operating in the Court’s decisions condemned racial classifications “drawn on the presumption that one race is inferior to another” or that “put the weight of government behind racial hatred and separation” (Bakke, at 358 [Brennan, dissenting]). Brennan agreed with Powell that no public racial classification motivated by racial animus, no classification whose purpose is to stigmatize people with the “badge of inferiority,” could withstand judicial scrutiny. However, the Medical School’s policy, even if ill-advised or mistaken, reflected a public purpose far different from that found in Jim Crow. The policy ought not be treated as though it were cut from the same cloth.

Brennan granted that if a state adopted a racial classification for the purpose of humiliating whites, or stigmatizing Allan Bakke as inferior and confining him to second-class citizenship, that classification would be as odious as Jim Crow. But the Medical School’s policy had neither this purpose nor this effect. Allan Bakke may have been upset and resentful at losing out under the special plan, but he wasn’t “in any sense stamped as an inferior by the Medical School’s rejection of him.” Nor did his loss constitute a “pervasive injury,” in the sense that wherever he went he would be treated as a “second-class citizen” because of his color (Bakke, at 376 [Brennan, dissenting]).

In short, argued Brennan, the principle expressed in the Equal Protection Clause should be viewed as an anti-caste principle, a principle that uniformly and consistently rejects all public law whose purpose is to subject people to an inferior and degraded station in life, whether they are black or white.[15] Of course, given the asymmetrical position of whites and blacks in our country, we are not likely to encounter laws that try to stigmatize whites as an inferior caste (much less succeed at it). But this merely shows that a principle applied to different circumstances produces different results. Because the Medical School’s program sought to undo the effects of a racial caste system long-enduring in America, it represented a purpose of great social importance and should not be found Constitutionally infirm: so maintained Brennan (Bakke, at 363 [Brennan, dissenting]).

Justice Powell never successfully engaged this way of reading “constitutional equality.” His insistence on clear, plain, unitary, absolute principle did not cut against the Brennan view. The issue between Powell and Brennan was not the consistency and stringency of the principle but its content. If the Constitution says, “The state cannot deliberately burden someone by race if its purpose is to create or maintain caste,” then constitutional law doesn’t block any of the Medical School’s justifications.[16]

If we turn away from exegesis of the Constitution, are we likely to find in political theory itself any principle of equality implying that every use of racial preferences in every circumstance works an intolerable injustice?

The prospects seem dim. Won’t very general notions of equality lend themselves to defending affirmative action (and the social inclusion it effects) as well as condemning it (and the racial non–neutrality it involves)?[17] The challenge here is well-illustrated by Carl Cohen’s most recent effort, in a debate with James Sterba, to extract a strict prohibition on racial preferences from the Aristotelian principle that “equals should be treated equally” (Cohen and Sterba 2003, 23). This principle, urges Cohen, “certainly entails at least this: It is wrong, always and everywhere, to give special advantage to any group simply on the basis of physical characteristics that have no relevance to the award given or the burden imposed” (Cohen and Sterba 2003, 25). Whether anything interesting follows from this proposition depends on how we construe “relevance.” Cohen admits that public policy may rightly treat some people differently because of their physical characteristics. For example, the state might offer special assistance to the old or disabled. Now, this example suggests that the relevance of physical differences is something independent of social policy. Age and disability, it seems, are real features of persons and public policy simply tracks them. However, the difference that differences make is not something itself given by nature; it is determined by public purposes. Age and disability are made relevant in this manner—in the one case, by the social purpose of assuring that people do not have to live in poverty when they can no longer work; in the other case, by the social purpose of assuring that people are not foreclosed from developing and marketing their talents by impediments in the (largely constructed) physical environment.

Purpose determines relevancy, and this is true whether or not the relevant differences are physical. If the nation thinks it desirable to change white institutions so that they are less uniformly white, that purpose links skin color to recruitment.

Because the Aristotelian principle by itself doesn’t rule out racial preferences (since blacks and whites may be relevantly different with respect to certain legitimate public purposes), it is not surprising that Cohen also invokes a substantive conception of equality: “All members of humankind are equally ends in themselves, all have equal dignity—and therefore all are entitled to equal respect from the community and its laws” (Cohen and Sterba 2003, 24). This principle, however, brings us back to the interpretive questions about “equal protection of the laws” played out in the Powell-Brennan exchange in Bakke. By Justice Brennan’s lights, Allen Bakke’s basic dignity was not violated. The Medical School’s two-track policy that resulted in Bakke’s rejection did not, by intent or effect, stigmatize him as inferior, or mark him off as a member of a despised caste, or turn him into a second-class citizen. Bakke arguably had to bear a particular burden because of his race but the burden was not significantly different objectively from others that public policy might have thrown his way. If the Medical School had reserved sixteen of its seats for applicants from economically deprived backgrounds, no one would have suggested that it had violated the equal protection clause of the Fourteenth Amendment. Yet under this hypothetical policy Allan Bakke could have lost out as well—lost out to low-income applicants whose college grades and MCAT scores were inferior to his own. Allen Bakke may have felt aggrieved at losing out under the Medical School’s policy of racial preferences, but it is not enough to show that those who lose out under some public scheme feel offended or disgruntled. Cohen needs to specify a conception of dignity in which bearing unequal burdens on behalf of urgent social ends invariably amounts to an assault on dignity if the burdens happen to be assigned by race. This specification remains unfinished in his work so far.

7. Diversity’s Dominion

How, if it held the Medical School’s policy unconstitutional, did Justice Powell’s Bakke opinion become the basis upon which universities across the land enacted—or maintained—racially preferential admissions policies?

If Powell had concluded with his assessment of the Medical School’s four justifications, Bakke would have left university affirmative action in a precarious situation. However, he didn’t stop there. In an earlier ruling on Bakke’s lawsuit, the California Supreme Court had forbidden the Medical School to make any use of race or ethnicity in its admissions decisions. Powell thought this went too far. Given higher education’s protected interest in “diversity,” and given that a student’s race or ethnicity might add to diversity just in the same way that her age, work experience, family background, special talents, foreign language fluency, athletic prowess, military service, and unusual accomplishments might, Powell vacated that portion of the California Supreme Court’s order.

Then he added some dicta for guidance. If universities want to understand diversity and the role that race and ethnicity might play in achieving it, they should look to Harvard, proposed Powell, and he appended to his opinion a long statement of Harvard’s affirmative action program. In such a program, Powell contended, racial or ethnic background might

be deemed a “plus” in a particular applicant’s file, yet it does not insulate the individual from comparison with all other candidates for the available seats.…This kind of program treats each applicant as an individual in the admissions process. The applicant who loses out on the last available seat to another candidate receiving a “plus” on the basis of ethnic background will not have been foreclosed from all consideration for that seat simply because he was not the right color or had the wrong surname. It would mean only that his combined qualifications…did not outweigh those of the other applicant. His qualifications would have been weighed fairly and competitively, and he would have had no basis to complain of unequal treatment under the Fourteenth Amendment (Bakke, at 318, 319).

In these off-hand comments, universities saw a green light for pushing ahead aggressively with their affirmative action programs. Justice Powell’s basic holding could not have been plainer: any system like the Medical School’s that assessed applications along two different tracks defined by race or that used numerical racial quotas must fail constitutional muster. Yet by the mid-1980s universities across the land had in place systems of admissions and scholarships that exhibited one or both of these features. When the University of Maryland’s Banneker scholarships—awarded only to African-American students—were held in violation of the Constitution in 1994, the house of cards forming university affirmative action began to fall.[18] In 1996, the Court of Appeals for the Fifth Circuit struck down the University of Texas Law School’s two-track admissions program. In 1998, the Court of Appeals for the First Circuit struck down a Boston plan assigning students to selective high schools by race.[19] In 2001, two more schools saw their admissions programs invalidated by federal courts: the University of Georgia[20] and the University of Michigan Law School.[21] In many of these cases, educational institutions were using schemes that made race something very much more than Justice Powell’s “plus” factor.[22] The Fifth Circuit Court’s ruling in the University of Texas case (Hopwood v. Texas, 78 F 3d 932 [Fifth Circuit, 1996]) threw a cloud even over this small window for affirmative action, boldly asserting that the Bakke holding was now dead as law and that race could not be used at all in admissions.

Given Justice Powell’s singular opinion, supported by no one else on the Court, and given the drift of Supreme Court decisions on racial preferences since 1978,[23] the Hopwood court was not outlandish, if a bit presumptuous, in declaring Powell’s holding in Bakke dead. As it happened, Powell’s opinion was far from dead. In the University of Michigan Law School case, Grutter v. Bollinger, eventually decided by the Supreme Court in June 2003, Justice Sandra Day O’Connor’s lead opinion declared: “today we endorse Justice Powell’s view that student body diversity is a compelling state interest that can justify the use of race in university admissions” (Grutter v. Bollinger, 539 U.S. 306 [2003], at 330). Diversity was alive after all. But how it worked its affirmative action elixir remained as unclear in 2003 as it had been in 1978.

To see why, consider how in Grutter Justice O’Connor posed the issue:

The [Law School’s] policy aspires to “achieve that diversity which has the potential to enrich everyone’s education and thus make a law class stronger than the sum of its parts.”…The policy does not restrict the types of diversity contributions eligible for substantial weight in the admissions process, but instead recognizes “many possible bases for diversity admissions.”…The policy does, however, reaffirm the Law School’s longstanding commitment to “one particular type of diversity,” that is, “racial and ethnic diversity with special reference to the inclusion of students from groups which have been historically discriminated against” (Grutter, at 325).

Now, posing the issue this way and allowing the Law School to assert a special interest in “one particular type of diversity” invites the conflation of general diversity—a diversity of opinions, experiences, backgrounds, talents, aspirations, and perspectives—with ethnic and racial diversity that Justice Powell appeared strongly to resist. After all, the Medical School too had asserted in its defense a similar special interest.

Recall Justice Powell’s principal objection to the Medical School’s set-asides. In making the race or ethnicity of an applicant a “plus,” a scheme like Harvard’s does

not insulate the individual from comparison with all other candidates for the available seats. The file of a particular African-American applicant may be examined for his potential contribution to diversity without the factor of race being decisive when compared, for example, with that of an applicant identified as an Italian-American if the latter is thought to exhibit qualities more likely to promote beneficial educational pluralism.…In short, an admissions program operated in this way is flexible enough to consider all pertinent elements of diversity in light of the particular qualifications of each applicant…. This kind of program treats each applicant as an individual in the admissions process (Bakke, at 318–19).

By contrast, Allan Bakke was not able to compete for all one hundred seats at the Medical School; sixteen were reserved for candidates not like him.

It is Powell’s resistance to this reservation that underpins Justice O’Connor’s opinion in Grutter, where she observed:

We find that the Law School’s admissions program bears the hallmark of a narrowly tailored plan. As Justice Powell made clear in Bakke, truly individualized consideration demands that race be used in a flexible, non-mechanical way. It follows from this mandate that universities cannot establish quotas for members of certain racial groups (Grutter, at 337).

What vindicated the Law School in O’Connor’s eyes was its “highly individualized, holistic review of each applicant’s file, giving serious consideration to all the ways an applicant might contribute to a diverse educational environment” (Grutter, at 339).[24] This “individualized consideration” is crucial; in Gratz v. Bollinger, decided the same day as Grutter, Justice O’Connor switched sides to hold unconstitutional the undergraduate admissions process at the University of Michigan. The undergraduate admissions office operated differently than the Law School. It computed an index score for each applicant by assigning numerical points for academic factors such as high school grades, admissions test scores, quality of high school, strength of curriculum; and for nonacademic factors such as being a resident of Michigan, a child of an alumnus, a recruited athlete, or a member of “an underrepresented minority group.” An applicant falling in this last category automatically received 20 points (Gratz v. Bollinger, 539 U. S. 244 [2003], at 287). In O’Connor’s view, this “mechanical” procedure meant that the undergraduate admissions office did not fully take account in each application “of all factors that may contribute to student body diversity” (Gratz, at 288).

But O’Connor’s conclusion here simply draws us back to the lacuna in Justice Powell’s Bakke opinion. Why should the undergraduate admissions office take account of all the factors that may contribute to student body diversity if it especially wants to select from certain parts of the diversity spectrum? Why can’t it, like the Law School, claim a special interest in “one particular type of diversity”? Why bar the undergraduate admissions office from using an effective tool to promote its interest even if the tool is “mechanical”? In fact, the Law School’s “non-mechanical” procedure differed from the undergraduate admissions policy only on its face, not in its results. During admissions season, the Law School’s director of admissions frequently consulted the “daily reports” that “kept track of the racial and ethnic composition” of the incoming class. He did so to make sure a “critical mass” of minority students was included (Grutter, at 326). In short, the Law School “managed” its admissions process so that roughly 6 to 7 percent of each entering class was African-American. The undergraduate admissions procedure, with its index scores, yielded a similar outcome (Grutter, at 367–69 [Rehnquist, dissenting] and 374 [Kennedy, dissenting]). Only surface appearance distinguished the two procedures. Justice Scalia called the Law School’s “holistic” admissions process “a sham,” and not without reason (Grutter, at 375 [Scalia, dissenting]).

As it turned out, Grutter failed to close the book on university affirmative action. A new legal challenge soon arose, this time against the University of Texas, which had revised its own admission program in 2004 to emulate the scheme validated in Grutter. The case, Fisher v. Texas, wound its way through the courts for a decade, twice landing on the steps of the Supreme Court before final disposition in 2016.

Justice Kennedy, writing for the Court, left the Grutter defense of racial preferences intact, essentially retracing Justice O’Connor’s opinion. Universities bent upon pursuing the “educational benefits that flow from student body diversity,” he wrote, are due a degree of judicial deference (Fisher v. University of Texas, 133 S. Ct. 2411, 2419 [2013]).

The University explains that it strives to provide an ‘academic environment’ that offers a ‘robust exchange of ideas, exposure to differing cultures, preparation for the challenges of an increasingly diverse workforce, and acquisition of competencies required of future leaders.’ … All of these objectives … mirror the ‘compelling interest’ this Court has approved in its prior cases (Fisher v. University of Texas, 136 S. Ct. 2198, 2211 [2016]).

Persuaded that race–neutral policies didn’t allow the University fully to succeed in deriving the “educational benefits” of diversity, the Court majority found the University’s modest use of race permissible.

But despite these legal victories, have universities actually made a case for diversity as the justifying basis for race–conscious admissions? Caught napping in the mid–1990s when the legal challenges began, higher education rushed to put meat on the Bakke bones and turn Justice Powell’s off–hand remarks into a full–fledged defense. As the University of Michigan cases approached a final test in 2003, the Supreme Court was bombarded with scores of friend–of–the–court briefs from business groups, military officers, higher education associations, coteries of scholars, and other interested parties lauding the benefits of diversity. A similar outpouring preceded the two decisions in Fisher v. University of Texas.[25]

Consider some of the claims in these briefs. “[S]tudent body diversity is essential” if universities are to provide students with “skills necessary for…success in an increasingly globalized world” (Leading Public Research Universities 2015, 11–12; emphasis added). Racial and ethnic diversity on campus are vital to securing a capable workforce; it is essential that [students] be educated in an environment where they are exposed to diverse people, ideas, perspectives, and interactions (65 Leading American Businesses 2003, 1, 2; emphasis added). Otherwise, the education of students is “degraded” (823 Social Scientists 2015, 5; emphasis added). “[S]tudents today must receive direct experience with people of different backgrounds” (American Council on Education 2015, 6; emphasis added). The “only means of obtaining properly qualified employees is through diversity at institutions of higher education…[Appropriate] skills can only be developed through exposure to widely diverse people, culture, ideas, and viewpoints” (Fortune 100 and Other Leading Businesses 2013, 3, 5; emphasis added). “Diversity is an indispensable prerequisite to establishing the most productive problem–solving groups” (Social and Organizational Psychologists 2015, 47; emphasis added).

According to the briefs the positive effects of diversity are bountiful. They include “improvements in cognitive abilities, analytical problem solving skills and complex thinking skills…[C]ross racial interactions are more strongly linked with cognitive growth than are interactions with non–racial diversity” (American Educational Research Association 2012, 12). “[R]esearch shows that by increasing diversity, universities can help their graduates enter society with better problem–solving capabilities than students who are not exposed to diversity” (Social and Organizational Psychologists 2015, 37).

Now consider four points. First, the promiscuous use of “diversity” in the argument for affirmative action opens the door to waffling and equivocation. Students learn through “exposure to widely diverse people, culture, ideas, and viewpoints” announces the Fortune 100 brief. Of course. But the issue at hand is racial diversity. Wrapping the latter into the former is not an aid to precision.[26] Second, can we imagine that the University of Michigan or the University of Texas would abandon its affirmative action program if studies showed no particular educational benefit to diversity? Suppose it turns out that students in general don’t show additional “cognitive growth” from increased racial diversity. Suppose it turns out students would best prepare for our “increasingly globalized world” by learning Mandarin Chinese or Spanish.

Third, the straining by academics to show that cross-racial interaction is essential, indispensable, vital, necessary, or imperative to a good education, if taken at face value, leads to an unpleasant conclusion, namely that a lot of black college students suffer a deficient education. The young woman who excels at Dunbar High School in Washington, DC (enrollment 95 % black, 1 % white) and then gets her Bachelor of Science degree in statistics magna cum laude at Spelman College (enrolling, in 2017, one white among its 2097 students) is, according to Fortune 100 companies, not the sort of employee they want. Graduates of Fisk University (0.7% white) or Tougaloo (0.6% white) or Florida A & M (3.5% white) haven’t achieved enough cognitive growth, haven’t sufficiently honed their problem–solving skills—is that what we are supposed to conclude? The University of Texas (enrolling 25% Hispanics and 5% blacks) contends that without a “critical mass” of minority students it can’t reap “the educational benefits of diversity.” Does this mean that Prairie View University, two hours down the road from Austin and enrolling 7% Hispanics and 1.8% whites, has to do without those benefits? Are its students poorly prepared for “our increasingly diverse workforce and society” (Fisher 2016, at 2210, 2211)? Defenders of affirmative action should think twice about claiming an education in a “non–diverse” setting must be degraded.

Fourth, there is a noticeable lack of “fit” between university affirmative action practices and the diversity rationale (see, for example, Anderson 2002, 27; Anderson 2004, 1217, 1221; Anderson 2010, 142–143). Race is not treated just like any other special factor that might warrant an admission “plus.” Universities work diligently to maintain a relatively constant percentage of black and Hispanic enrollees but give variable attention to other of the myriad qualities students can bring to campus. As one proponent of affirmative action notes, “affirmative action programs…do not look or operate as if they were testing for ‘diversity’.” He suggests that many supporters of affirmative action nevertheless disregard this fact, believing “that there is no harm in [a] miscast reliance on diversity because, with a wink and a nod, everyone understands that diversity is really a proxy for integration” (Issacharoff 2002, 30, 34; emphasis added).

8. The Integration Argument

Although the University couched its legal defense in terms of the “educational benefits of diversity,” another rationale lay ready at hand. The main reason the University of Michigan strives for a reasonable representation of minorities on campus is because of the way it conceives of its mission: to prepare Michigan’s future leaders.

The argument is straightforward:

  1. The leadership of the state ought roughly to represent the state’s population, ethnically and racially.
  2. As the state’s premier training ground for leadership, the University ought to graduate rising generations of future leaders that conform to this representational goal.
  3. To graduate such rising generations, it needs to admit racially and ethnically representative classes.

This is the “Michigan Mandate” (Gratz v. Bollinger, 135 F. Supp. 2d 790 [2001], at 796–797). Racial and ethnic diversity aren’t incidental contributors to a distinct academic mission; they are part of the mission of the University, just as educating young people from Michigan is part of it (see Fullinwider and Lichtenberg 2004, 165–188). And something like a national version of the mandate underlies the Michigan Law School’s affirmative action policy, since its graduates move into elite law firms or government service outside Michigan (see Lempert et al. 2000, 399; Wilkins 2000, 530–534).

This “integration” rationale seems better aligned with the actual practice of university affirmative action than the diversity rationale. Indeed, in the midst of her nominally Powell-like defense of the Law School, Justice O’Connor in Grutter for a moment veered away from the “educational benefits of diversity” to go down a quite different path. Institutions like the University of Michigan and its Law School, she noted, “represent the training ground for…our Nation’s leaders.” She went on:

In order to cultivate a set of leaders with legitimacy in the eyes of the citizenry, it is necessary that the path to leadership be visibly open to talented and qualified individuals of every race and ethnicity. All members of our heterogeneous society must have confidence in the openness and integrity of the educational institutions that provide this training.…Access…must be inclusive…of every race and ethnicity, so that all members of our heterogeneous society may participate in the educational institutions that provide the training and education necessary to succeed in America (Grutter, at 336).

This “legitimacy” argument—not in any way about enriching the climate of opinion on campus or improving students’ complex thinking skills—parallels the simple syllogism set out just above. Justice O’Connor inserted this new rationale into the middle of her Grutter opinion—inserted it unexpectedly and then abandoned it just as quickly to resume tracing the byways of diversity. Justice Kennedy did the same in Fisher (2016, 2211).

Certainly, something in the spirit of the “Michigan Mandate” has animated elite universities, including those studied by William Bowen and Derek Bok in The Shape of the River: Long-Term Consequences of Considering Race in College and University Admissions. The primary aim of these institutions is not through vigorous affirmative action to enhance the liberal learning of their students (although they welcome this gain for all students). Their main motive for assuring that the percentage of African-Americans and Hispanics on their campuses is more than token derives from their self-conceptions as institutions training individuals who will some day take up national and international leadership roles in the professions, arts, sciences, education, politics, and government (Bowen and Bok 1998, 7). Society, they believe, will be stronger and more just if the ranks of its leading citizens include a racially and ethnically broader range of people than it does now. Nor are they wrong in thinking that the pipeline to local and national elites runs through top-notch universities.

Elizabeth Anderson, in two long essays (2002, 2004), bookending the Grutter decision, makes a thorough and cogent case for putting racial integration at the center of conceptions of affirmative action. The diversity argument is insufficient, she writes. “Considered as a purely cognitive end, divorced from the values of democracy and social justice, the ‘robust exchange of ideas’ cannot support the scope of racial preferences in college admissions” (Anderson 2002, 1221). She goes on:

The integrative model of affirmative action offers an alternative rationale for race–sensitive admissions that unites educational with democratic and social justice concerns. It begins with a recognition that Americans live in a profoundly segregated society, a condition inconsistent with a fully democratic society and with equal opportunity. To achieve the latter goals, we need to desegregate—to integrate, that is—to live together as one body of equal citizens (Anderson 2002, 1222).

The integrative model has several legal advantages over the diversity and compensation models of affirmative action. It makes sense of the scope and weight that educational institutions actually give to race in the admissions process. It thus closes the gap between theory and practice that makes affirmative action programs so vulnerable under strict scrutiny. It also shows how race can be directly relevant to a compelling state interest, rather than merely a proxy for something else, such as diversity of opinions (Anderson 2002, 1226).

Given the realities of race in the U.S., people of different races occupy different walks of life. So in the U.S., democracy requires racial integration of the main institutions of civil society, the places where discussion of public import among citizens take place: public accommodations, workplaces, schools, and neighborhoods. The same point applies to society’s elites, those who play a pivotal role in formulating and adopting policies of public import. Elites, to be legitimate, must serve a representative function: they must be capable of and dedicated to representing the concerns of people from all walks of life, so that the policies they forge are responsive to these concerns. An elite drawn only from segments of society that live in isolation from other segments will be ignorant of the circumstances and concerns of those who occupy other walks of life (Anderson 2004, 22).

Anderson sees integration as an end courts can accept, one that informs many past judicial opinions and acts of legislation, and one given endorsement in Grutter:

The “diversity” defense of affirmative action, articulated in Justice Powell’s Bakke opinion, limits integration to those cases in which it can be shown to yield educational benefits. Grutter advances a more robust integrationist perspective, which affirms racial integration as a compelling interest apart rom its educational benefits (Anderson 2004, 23).

(It is hard to see how Grutter represents a “robust” defense of integrative affirmative action. Justice O’Connor introduced the “legitimacy” argument without prior preparation and left it hanging without further development. Justice Kennedy in Fisher likewise seemed not to notice that the “legitimacy” argument departs considerably from the diversity rationale he was rehearsing. Nevertheless, there it is in the majority opinions, to be seized on and developed by a future court if it is so disposed.)[27]

Other writers, too, have talked about affirmative action in terms of integration (Warnke 1998; Estlund 2002; Jacobs 2004; Boddie 2016).

The integration argument, like the diversity argument, is straightforwardly instrumental. It points to hoped-for outcomes of affirmative action. If those outcomes don’t materialize, then affirmative action’s cause is weakened. Moreover, the little integration syllogism isn’t complete as it stands. It needs to include another premise: that the gains from achieving racially and ethnically integrated classes don’t come at a disproportionate cost.

Perhaps the cost is high, or even too high. Stephan and Abigail Thernstrom certainly think so. They contend that most of the cost falls on the very persons affirmative action is supposed to benefit. Under-prepared African-Americans are thrown into academic environments where they cannot succeed (Thernstrom and Thernstrom 1997, 395–411). In the Thernstroms’ view, race-blind admissions policies will result in a desirable “cascading,” with African-American and Hispanic students ending up at colleges and universities where the academic credentials of their fellow students match their own. However, the Bowen and Bok study provides some evidence that cascading isn’t necessarily a valuable phenomenon. In fact, at the schools they studied, the better the institution a student entered, whatever his academic credentials, the more likely he was to graduate, go on to further education, and earn a good income (Bowen and Bok 1998, 63, 114, 144).

Even so, the select schools Bowen and Bok studied may be quite unrepresentative of the full range of schools that resort to racial preferences and the cost-benefit picture that holds for these schools may not hold for the rest. Indeed, the picture drawn by Richard Sander in a lengthy review of affirmative action in law schools, published in the November 2004 Stanford Law Review, lends credence to the Thernstrom’s academic mismatch thesis. Ranking law schools from best to worst, Sander found that affirmative action boosts African-American students 20 or more steps up the ladder, putting them in schools with white classmates who possess considerably better LSAT scores and undergraduate college grades. The upshot: “close to half of black students end up in the bottom tenth of their classes.” This bad performance yields three bad consequences. First, African-American students suffer high attrition rates. Second, they fail the bar exam at a high rate (the principal predictor of a student’s passing or failing is her grades, not the quality of her school). Third, they suffer a significant employment penalty for low grades “in all schools outside the top ten.” Sander estimates that under a race-blind admissions system, American law schools would actually create more African-American lawyers than they do under affirmative action (Sander 2004, 449, 460, 478, 479).

Sander’s article inspired a flurry of responses disputing his methodology and conclusions (e.g., Ayers and Brooks 2005, Chambers, et al. 2005, Wilkins 2005, Ho 2005, Barnes 2007, and Rothstein and Yoon 2008). Sander replied to his critics (Sander 2005); other writers found evidence of mismatch effects in educational domains outside law schools (Elliott et al. 1996, Smith and McArdle, 2004, Arcidiacono et al. 2012); yet other scholars presented independent confirmation of Sander’s hypothesis (Arcidiacono et al. 2011b, Williams 2013), One critic, upon re-analysis, had to withdraw her refutation of Sander (Barnes 2007, Barnes 2011); and in 2012 Sander joined with co-author Stuart Taylor to publish Mismatch, a book-length treatment setting out old and new research supporting Sander’s hypothesis. Others continue to find the law school mismatch hypothesis dubious and unsupported (Camilli and Welner 2011; Camilli and Jackson 2011; Kidder and Lempert 2015)

Other researchers, following the lead of Bowen and Bok, have focused on undergraduate performance. Fischer and Massey, for example, concluded that though affirmative action has “both positive and negative implications for minority students, [such policies] operate, on balance, to enhance the academic achievement of minority students” (Fischer and Massey 2007, 546). In another study, Massey and Mooney found “little support for the mismatch hypothesis” (Massey and Mooney 2007, 114). Dale and Krueger determined that “the effect of attending a school with a higher average SAT score is positive for black and Hispanic students” (Dale and Krueger 2014, 350). Similarly, Melguizo held:

that for minority students who were admitted to…selective institutions under affirmative action (i.e., with slightly below–average SAT scores but with other personal characteristics and experiences correlated with persistence), their probability of graduation was not lower as was predicted by critics of affirmative action. On the contrary, their probability of graduation was higher at the most and very selective institutions compared to the non–selective ones (Melguizo 2008, 233).

One reason disputes persist about cause and effect is imperfect data. Although often operating with large sets of information, researchers must decide which statistical models most appropriately tease out significance, decisions that involve debatable assumptions about filling in missing pieces. Two researchers note that “[b]etter data would undoubtedly permit more relevant and convincing analyses of the effects of mismatch and and would especially help to identify any threshold below which potential mismatch effects become more probable” (Camilli and Welner 2011, 500). Much of the back–and–forth about the effects of affirmative action could be resolved if educational institutions disclosed information about their admissions processes, student grades, graduation rates, and the like. But institutional resistance makes this unlikely.[28]

9. Desert Confounded, Desert Misapplied

The affirmative action debate throws up many ironies but one in particular should be noted. From the time in 1973 when Judith Jarvis Thomson conjectured that it was “not entirely inappropriate” that white males bear the costs of the community’s “making amends” to African-Americans and women through preferential affirmative action, the affirmative action debate has been distracted by intense quarrels over who deserves what. Do the beneficiaries of affirmative action deserve their benefits (Allen 2011)? Do the losers deserve their loss?

Christopher Edley, the White House assistant put in charge of President Clinton’s review of affirmative action policy in 1994–95, speaks of how, during the long sessions he and his co-workers put in around the conference table, the discussion of affirmative action kept circling back to the “coal miner’s son” question (I’ve changed the gender for expository purposes).

Imagine a college admissions committee trying to decide between the white [son] of an Appalachian coal miner’s family and the African American son of a successful Pittsburgh neurosurgeon. Why should the black applicant get preference over the white applicant? (Edley 1996, 132ff)

Why, indeed? This is a hard question if one defends affirmative action in terms of compensatory or distributive justice. If directly doing justice is what affirmative action is about, then its mechanisms must be adjusted as best they can to reward individual desert and true merit. The “coal miner’s son” example is meant to throw desert in the defender’s face: here is affirmative action at work thwarting desert, for surely the coal miner’s son—from the hard scrabble of Harlan County, say—has lived with far less advantage than the neurosurgeon’s son who, we may suppose, has reaped all the advantages of his father’s (or mother’s) standing. Why should the latter get a preference?

A defender might answer in the way that Charles Lawrence and Mari Matsuda do in their 1997 book, We Won’t Go Back: “All the talk about class, the endless citings of the ‘poor white male from Appalachia,’ cannot avoid the reality of race and gender privilege” (Lawrence and Matsuda 1997, 190–191). As they see it, because white privilege persists racial preferences really do balance the scales. Because male privilege persists, gender preferences really do make selections fairer. Lawrence and Matsuda brook no concession: in every case the loser in affirmative action is not the more deserving.

Even Justice Brennan tried his hand at this argument, writing in Bakke:

If it was reasonable to conclude—as we hold that it was—that the failure of minorities to qualify for admission at [the University of California at] Davis [Medical School] under regular procedures was due principally to the effects of past discrimination, then there is a reasonable likelihood that, but for pervasive racial discrimination…[Bakke] would have failed to qualify for admission even in the absence of Davis’ special admissions program (Bakke, at 365–6 [Brennen, dissenting]).

Bakke was not denied anything to which he had moral claim in the first place.

Just as Mary Anne Warren and James Rachels in the 1970s thought that the losers under affirmative action were losing only illicit privileges, and the gainers merely gaining what should have been theirs to start with, so Michel Rosenfeld in the 1990s, in his extended “dialogic” defense of affirmative action, echoes the same thought:

Although affirmative action treats innocent white males unequally, it need not deprive them of any genuine equal opportunity rights. Provided an affirmative action plan is precisely tailored to redress the losses in prospects of success [by African-Americans and women] attributable to racism and sexism, it only deprives innocent white males of the corresponding undeserved increases in their prospects of success…. [R]emedial affirmative action does not take away from innocent white males anything that they have rightfully earned or that they should be entitled to keep (Rosenfeld 1991, 307–8, emphasis added).

However, programs that give blanket preferences by race or gender are hardly “precisely tailored” to match desert and reward since, as Lawrence and Matsuda themselves acknowledge at one place, the white male “privilege” is “statistical” (Lawrence and Matsuda 1997, 252). Yet it is individuals, not statistical averages, who gain or lose in admissions determinations and employment selections.[29]

The persistence of this strategy of defense reflects a residual feeling that the fruits of affirmative action are somehow spoiled if they are not deserved (Harris 2003). Nevertheless, it is the wrong strategy for defending real world affirmative action. The programs legitimated under the Civil Rights Act, in both their nonpreferential and preferential forms, had—and have—a clear aim: to change institutions so that they can meet the nondiscrimination mandate of the Act. Selection by race or gender was—and is—a means to such change. To the extent that such selection also compensates individuals for past wrongs or puts people in places they really deserve, these are incidental by-products of a process aimed at something else.

The same is true with university admissions policy. When the Medical School of the University of California at Davis offered four reasons in defense of the special admissions program that left Bakke on the outside, none of these reasons said anything about matching admissions and desert. The criteria of the special admissions program—race and ethnicity—were instruments to further ends: integrating the classroom, the profession, and the delivery of medical services, and breaking the chain of self-reproducing societal discrimination. Likewise, when the University of Michigan and the University of Texas defended their programs they pointed not to desert rewarded but educational value generated.

Now, if the neurosurgeon’s son because of his race can advance each of these goals and the coal miner’s son, because of his race, cannot, then isn’t the selection decision easy? Pick the African-American neurosurgeon’s son (however advantaged he may be) over the white coal miner’s son (even if he is the most deserving creature imaginable). The aims of real world affirmative action make race and ethnicity (and sometimes gender) salient, not personal desert or merit. The test of real world affirmative action lies in the urgency of its ends (preventing discrimination, promoting diversity or integration) and the aptness (moral and causal) of its means (racial, ethnic, and gender preferences). Both remain much in dispute.


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  • 823 Social Scientists, 2015: Brief Supporting Respondents in Fisher v. University of Texas, 136 S. Ct. 2198 (2016): 1–42.
  • Allen, Anita L., 1990–1991, “On Being a Role Model,” Berkeley Journal of Gender, Law and Justice (formerly Berkeley Women’s Law Journal), 6: 22–42.
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  • –––, 2004, “Racial Integration as a Compelling Interest,” Constitutional Commentary, 21 (Spring): 15–40.
  • –––, 2010, The Imperative of Integration, Princeton, New Jersey: Princeton University Press.
  • Appiah, Kwame Anthony, 2011, “Group Rights and Racial Affirmative Action,” Journal of Ethics, 15 (September): 265–280.
  • ––– and Amy Gutmann, 1996, Color Conscious: The Political Morality of Race, Princeton, New Jersey: Princeton University Press.
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  • –––, 2011b, “Does Affirmative Action Lead to Mismatch? A New Test and Evidence,” Quantitative Economics, 2 (November): 303–333.
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