al-Farabi’s Philosophy of Logic and Language

First published Tue Apr 16, 2019; substantive revision Tue May 9, 2023

Abū Naṣr al-Fārābī (Iraq, c. 870–c. 950) devoted his career to introducing the work of Aristotle to educated Arabic-speaking citizens of the Islamic Empire. Several of his major writings are lost in whole or part. But many of his books explaining Aristotle’s Organon (the collection of Aristotle’s writings on logic and related subjects) have survived, and the number of them available in Western translations is increasing steadily. For general information on al-Fārābī see the entry on Al-Farabi.

Al-Fārābī studies the various roles of language in human life and society. He emphasises the use of language to convey information, to ask questions and resolve disagreements, and to describe distinctions and classifications. He believes that language in some sense copies meanings, and that mismatches between language and meanings need to be avoided. He presents Aristotle’s logic as a collection of methods for exercising persuasion, regulating debate, discovering truth and achieving certainty. He also explores its applications in poetry. Along the way he makes many acute observations on issues ranging from the sources of metaphysical questions to the temporal structure of events and the relationship between poetry and music.

1. Al-Fārābī’s Writings and Their Background

Al-Fārābī’s surviving works contain well over a thousand pages that are devoted to explaining the contents of Aristotle’s logical writings and aimed at educated readers of Arabic. Much of this material reveals al-Fārābī’s strong interest in the nature of language.

Al-Fārābī’s intellectual background was not so much Aristotle himself. Rather it was the Aristotelian part of the syllabus of the Neoplatonic school of philosophy that flourished in Alexandria (in Egypt) in the fifth and sixth centuries (see D’Ancona 2022). Al-Fārābī tells us that eventually “instruction was moved from Alexandria to Antioch” (in Syria), until the last members of the school scattered “taking their books with them”. He says that he himself studied with one of these last members, Yūḥannā bin Ḥaylān, and together they read Aristotle up to the end of Posterior Analytics. He adds that the Alexandrian school came to describe the part of Aristotle’s Organon from modal logic onwards as “the part that is not read”, since under the Christians the modal material had been kept hidden. (Al-Fārābī’s account is in a lost work quoted by the historian Ibn Abī Usaybi‘a [‘Uyūn 604f]; see the translation in Fakhry 2002: 159.)

Al-Fārābī has oversimplified the history (see Lameer 1997 and Watt 2008). But he correctly implies that his understanding of Aristotle is based on the Alexandrian syllabus and its later offshoots in the Middle East. For example, the account of logic in his influential [Catalogue] has been shown to be an edited translation of a work from the Alexandrian teaching materials.[1] So for understanding al-Fārābī it becomes important to know when he is giving his own considered view and when he is merely passing on parts of the Alexandrian syllabus. As yet there is no consensus about this, or about the order in which he wrote his works.

The Alexandrian Neoplatonists saw philosophy as an avenue by which we can achieve happiness through knowledge of The One (see Wildberg 2021). To add intellectual rigor to this mystical endeavor they included the logical writings of Aristotle in the early stages of their teaching syllabus. They devised a body of introductory texts to explain how Aristotle’s logic saves us from incorrect thinking and acting, and why Aristotle devised his logic syllabus—his Organon—in the form that he gave it.[2] Some features of al-Fārābī’s presentation are most easily explained in terms of the Alexandrians. For example, the Aristotelian part of their syllabus, after Porphyry’s Eisagoge, began with Aristotle’s Categories, so al-Fārābī duly seeks reasons why categories are an essential first step in logic. Their Organon also included Aristotle’s Rhetoric and his Poetics; so al-Fārābī explains why the arts of rhetoric and poetry are really parts of logic. If their Organon had contained a book on music, al-Fārābī would have explained why musical theory is a branch of logic.[3] (On music see Section 10 below.)

Al-Fārābī’s logical writings take various forms. Some of them are Long Commentaries on works of Aristotle, which dissect Aristotle’s text in sometimes excruciating detail; only the Long Commentary on De Interpretatione survives in full, though we have parts of others. More friendly are the Epitomes, in which al-Fārābī rewrites works in the Organon from his own point of view. There are also a number of texts that serve as introductions to the Organon, though they are not necessarily elementary. We call attention to three works in this last group. The first, [Indication], teaches that logic is the art of making correct discriminations, and hence is the key to happiness in life as a whole. It also explains that we must study language before we study logic. The second, [Expressions], is a sequel to [Indication] and introduces the vocabulary of logic.

The third work is the extraordinarily original and insightful [Letters], which weaves together language, logic, and metaphysics. We will take this work as the best basis for understanding al-Fārābī’s overall view of language and logic. Sections 2 to 5 below will review what we take to be the core of this view. The remaining Sections 6 to 10 will pick up particular themes.

Besides the Alexandrian material, al-Fārābī was able to call on highly professional Arabic translations of the books of the Organon. He also had translations of some logical writers from the Roman Empire, such as Alexander of Aphrodisias and Themistius. He is not known to have made any use of earlier Arabic texts relating to logic, such as the Logic of Ibn al-Muqaffa‘ and writings of al-Kindī. (Zimmermann [1981: lxviii–xcviii] and Lameer [1994: Chapter 1] discuss what earlier logical writings were available to al-Fārābī. See also Walzer [1962: 129–136] for al-Fārābī’s sources on Aristotle’s poetics.)

Al-Fārābī’s work on logic and language had a direct effect on several Arabic authors in the two hundred years after his death.[4] These include Ibn Bājja (in Latin Avempace), Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna), Al-Ghazālī (Algazel), and Ibn Rushd (Averroes). He also influenced a number of medieval Jewish authors including Maimonides. The Latins knew him as Alfarabius or Alpharabius or Abunaser. His influence can be seen in Scholastic treatments of determinism, poetic argument, and the classification of sciences.[5]

2. The Origin of Languages

Al-Fārābī describes how a language develops within a community. In [Letters] (114, 115) 134.16–135.14 he pictures a community whose members have concepts (ma‘qūlāt, literally “intellected things”, or “intelligibles” in Scholastic terminology) that allow them to pick out identifiable objects in the external world, either individually or as kinds of thing. He refers to these concepts drawn from perception of the external world as “primary concepts”. These people have beliefs, and they are able to reason about the world, to deliberate about their actions, and to communicate by pointing. But as yet these people have no language.

The first development towards language is that the people come to realize that they can communicate their needs to each other better if they agree to label some objects and concepts with vocal sounds. This sets up a conventional correlation between simple (i.e., uncompounded) primary concepts and words, and eventually this correlation comes to be accepted by the whole community. The words are said to “signify” the concepts to which they are correlated. Al-Fārābī envisages that a lawmaker will regulate the correlation and add some words to it for the benefit of the community ([Letters] (120) 138.4–8). Thus a national lexicon is created; the sounds that are used form a national alphabet.

Once the idea has become established that words signify meanings, the community will aim to develop the language so that words imitate the “ordering” or “regime” (intiẓām) of the primary concepts ([Letters] (122) 139.2–4). This regime includes any relationships that the concepts have as concepts. For example, two concepts may be similar; so an effort will be made to find a pair of similar words to express these concepts. Al-Fārābī notes that this effort may misfire and result in homonymy—a single word being used for two different concepts ([Letters] (124) 140.8–10). The pressure to copy similarities also leads to metaphors ([Letters] (127) 141.10).

Also some concepts are derived from others; the word for the derived concept should be grammatically derived from the word for the other concept. The words for underived concepts should not be grammatically derived. Al-Fārābī notes that in practice this correlation sometimes fails. For example, he takes it that the participle “living” (ḥayy) is derived, but it is sometimes used to signify the underived concept “animal” ([Letters] (26) 74.16, (36) 81.18f). Likewise the underived concept “is” is sometimes signified by the derived passive participle mawjūd ([Letters] (84) 113.9).

Also concepts can be combined into compound concepts, and this possibility will be copied in the language too. ([Letters] (126) 140.20–141.3.) Taking this view, al-Fārābī makes a number of remarks that contain the first explicit formulations of the thesis of compositionality.[6]

Al-Fārābī clearly believes that mismatches between words and concepts are a bad thing, but it’s less clear why he believes this, or what he thinks should be done about it. The original matching was set up by an artless consensus of the community, presumably because it served some social purpose. Al-Fārābī never analyses in detail what this purpose might be, or, for example, how it would be damaged by using derived words for underived concepts. Does he really fear that a mismatch could lead to a breakdown in communication, even if the whole community adopts the mismatch? Germann (2015/6: 138f) has suggested that his fear is more specific: he worries that if mismatches develop, teachers—including philosophy teachers—may be unable to pass information reliably to their students.

Another possibility is that he is afraid that a mismatch will cause errors in logical reasoning, because the relationships between concepts that make an argument valid will not be visible in the corresponding words. In [Expressions] 102.8–15, after telling us that demonstrations and syllogisms take place in internal speech, not external, he comments that

most students don’t have the ability to imagine how concepts are ordered in the mind, so instead one takes expressions that signify the concepts, so as to enable the student’s mind to make a transition from them to the concepts.

Any mismatch between concepts and words could disrupt this process.

In any event, al-Fārābī is in no hurry to reform the language. He is content to continue using the word mawjūd for “is”.

There is one part of the regime of primary concepts that al-Fārābī never suggests that language should replicate. Some concepts are more inclusive than others; for example, “animal” is more inclusive than “human”. Following one reading of Aristotle, al-Fārābī believes that there are ten maximally inclusive simple primary concepts (ignoring “thing”, “concept”, “one”, and “being” which include all concepts). He refers to these ten concepts as “categories” (maqūlāt, not to be confused with ma‘qūlāt above). But we will prefer to call them by their alternative name “supreme genera”, because al-Fārābī confusingly also applies the name “category” to all simple primary concepts. Languages do distinguish the minimally inclusive concepts, those that apply to just one thing, by using proper names for them. But it’s unrealistic to expect languages to copy the rest of this regime of inclusions, and we know of no place where al-Fārābī suggests that it should.

Some of the historical processes mentioned above will have the effect of making people think about the primary concepts and their regime. Al-Fārābī points out that as a result, people will now have concepts that classify concepts in the soul rather than identifiable objects in the external world. So these are a new kind of concept, and al-Fārābī calls them “secondary concepts” (often translated as “second intelligibles”). Thinking about secondary concepts will give us “tertiary concepts”, and so on to infinity. As examples of secondary concepts, al-Fārābī mentions “genus”, “species”, “more/less inclusive”, “known”, “concept”. (All this is in [Letters] (7,8) 64.9–65.8.)[7]

Although al-Fārābī doesn’t recommend any particular reforms of language, he does make some detailed recommendations for a philosopher who is seeking to translate philosophy from another language and needs to introduce technical terms for the purpose. ([Letters] (155) 157.19–158.21.) It would be interesting to compare al-Fārābī’s recommendations with his own practice, if we could be sure which of the technical terms used for translating Greek writers we can credit to him.

He does introduce some new names for notions that he himself pioneered. Three noteworthy examples are:

  1. He introduces yufīdu “provides” as a term of art for saying that the answer to a question posed in a philosophical debate “provides” information (cf. Section 4 below). The root is rare in his writings except for this usage, and its use in a related sense in linguistic writers probably antedates his use of it (see Giolfo & Hodges 2018).
  2. He borrows from the linguists the term istithnā’ (“exception”) as a name for the inference rules of his hypothetical logic (cf. Section 6 below). The choice rests on a formal similarity between these rules and a property of the syntactic construction known as “exception”.[8]
  3. His choice of the name “secondary concept” is based on an analogy with Porphyry’s theory of “second impositions”, i.e., words for talking about words.[9]

3. The Origins of Syllogistic Arts

Al-Fārābī’s tale of the origins of language runs on into a tale of how language makes it possible to handle concepts in new ways. For al-Fārābī one key difference between language and concepts is that language is public and allows communication between people. Hence many of the new uses of concepts have to do with social interaction. In each case he is interested in the development of new skills for handling concepts. Skills involve instruments and rules for handling these instruments; so the appearance of a new skill involves an acceptance of the rules (qawānīn, singular qānūn) for handling its instruments. A bundle of associated skills and their rules is called an “art” (ṣinā‘a).

The first new art that he calls attention to is rhetoric (khiṭāba), the art of the orator, which uses concepts in order to persuade people to do or believe certain things. The main users of this skill are political and religious leaders, who employ it in order to assert their authority. Alongside rhetoric al-Fārābī mentions the art of poetry (shi‘r), which uses concepts in order to bring people to certain states of mind. He sees this art as most useful for religious leaders. He also mentions an art which he calls the art of sophistry. This art embodies the skill of producing bad arguments from false premises. It’s hard to see what could have led him to the conclusion that there is such an art, beyond the fact that the Alexandrian syllabus contained, wedged between a book on dialectical methods and one on rhetorical methods, Aristotle’s treatise Sophistical Refutations. Aristotle’s treatise is usually understood to be teaching the art of detecting and refuting bad arguments, not that of creating them!

One effect of the introduction of language is that people are able to learn the opinions of other people. They will inevitably discover that some people disagree with them, not least in speculations about the nature of the universe. So the art of dialectics or debate (jadal) is introduced in order to resolve differences of opinion between two people. ([Letters] (140,141) 150.2–151.7.) But a dialectical resolution of a disagreement is no guarantee of the truth of the agreed conclusion; one of the debaters might just be better at arguing ([Debate] 40.9–13).

A realization that dialectics doesn’t lead to certain truth will inspire some individuals to seek other methods that do. At this point the community discovers the art of “demonstration” (burhān), which establishes truths with certainty. Al-Fārābī believes that among the Greeks this art was achieved by Plato:

Plato was the first to be aware of the demonstrative methods and to distinguish them from the dialectical, sophistical, rhetorical, and poetical methods. But from his point of view they were distinguished in use and according to matter, and in terms of what guidance he received from his considerations at leisure and his superior natural intelligence. He didn’t prescribe universal rules for them. Afterwards Aristotle did prescribe such rules in his book Posterior Analytics. ([Rhetoric] 55.13–17)

It was a commonplace in the Neoplatonic schools that the high point of logic was Posterior Analytics with its treatment of knowledge with certainty. The Neoplatonists also considered that Aristotle had arranged his Organon so that the path up to this summit through Categories, De Interpretatione, and Prior Analytics assembled the tools of logic, and the downward slope from Posterior Analytics onwards allowed the student to apply these tools within demonstrative methods, dialectical methods, sophistical methods, rhetorical methods, and poetic methods in turn. Al-Fārābī inherited this view of Aristotle; see [Aristotle] pp. 82–93.

He also inherited the zeal of the Neoplatonic schools to catalogue the ingredients of logic. Thus in [Letters] he catalogued the logical arts according to the social needs that brought them into existence, while in [Aristotle] he catalogued them according to the books of the Organon that Aristotle devoted to them. These two principles of classification led to essentially the same divisions between logical arts. But sometimes he used principles that draw distinctions in different places. For example in [Syllogism] he classified kinds of logic by the syllogisms (i.e. two-premise inferences) that they used; we come to this classification in Section 6 below. Elsewhere he classified kinds of logic by the kinds of premise that they accepted in their syllogisms.

All the kinds of logic, even the less syllogistic kinds, must have rules about what to adopt as starting premises. In the case of rhetoric, practicality implies that the orator should choose premises that the audience will accept; likewise in dialectics it makes sense to start with premises that have some plausibility. Al-Fārābī believes that in practice the community will insist on restrictions that add a note of objectivity: for example, that experts agree to the premise, or that nobody positively disagrees with it. He formulates some conditions along these lines, including that the premises must be at least “standard” (masshūr) or “received” (maqbūl). (For discussion of such conditions and where they apply, see Aouad 1992 and Black 1990: Chapter 5A. Chatti 2017 reviews how al-Fārābī catalogues the starting points of inferences in hypothetical logic. Kleven 2023 studies the treatment of the starting points of reasoning in some of al-Fārābī’s introductory essays, and adds some interesting information about the manuscripts.)

Rhetorical reasoning might be the hardest to make sense of, particularly when [Letters] suggests that the rhetorician’s job is done when he or she has persuaded the audience. Surely that aim could be achieved by means that don’t involve logic at all? But recently it has come to be accepted that the Latin essay [Didascalia] published in [Rhetoric] is probably a translation of the prologue to al-Fārābī’s lost Long Commentary on Rhetoric. In fact the work goes way beyond vague remarks about methods of persuasion; see Woerther 2020. For example al-Fārābī observes that medical reasoning about what remedies to apply to this present invalid, and agricultural reasoning about how to increase the yield of this particular field, cannot be demonstrative since they apply only to this particular individual (invalid or field); so we have to take them as rhetorical reasoning (Woerther (2020 p. 346)). On this reckoning, much of the reasoning of our most respected experts must count as rhetoric.

In sections 23 and 24 towards the end of Prior Analytics ii, Aristotle discusses argument by induction and argument by analogy, with a view to showing that both of them are reducible to syllogism. Since [Syllogism] is an epitome of Prior Analytics, al-Fārābī closes the book with some sections in which he gives his own reductions of induction and analogy to syllogism. Some manuscripts of [Syllogism], and some manuscripts of the later work [Short Syllogism],[10] include a pair of essays which we will refer to as the Tailpiece; the first essay is on the logical device of “transfer”, and the second is on the application of this device to reduce arguments in Islamic jurisprudence (fiqh) to syllogisms. In the first of these two essays al-Farabi refers to a number of named argument forms (for example “transfer from the observed to the unobserved”), and it is clear that he is referring to earlier debates about these argument forms; but there is no agreement on whether the debates were in Roman Empire medical circles or in Islamic theology.

One particular strand in this complex is a distinction that al-Fārābī makes between two forms of analogy, which he describes as taḥlīl and tarkīb respectively. Some authors have read these words as “analysis” and “synthesis” respectively, and tried to read these as descriptions of two different kinds of formal proof. But this is certainly wrong, since the distinction that al-Fārābī himself draws between the two kinds of argument is not about the form of the resulting proof, but about the criteria for success in the search for a middle term. Al-Fārābī himself is a little conflicted at this point; in loyalty to Aristotle he wants to emphasise the reduction to syllogism, but the point he makes about search, which is central for his application to fiqh in the second essay, is not about the form of the final syllogistic proof at all. (See Chatti and Hodges 2020 for further details on the Tailpiece, and Hodges 2020 for the increasing interest in search algorithms in this period.)[11]

Further remarks comparing al-Fārābī’s dialectics with Islamic fiqh can be found in Gyekye (1989) and Young (2017: 539–543).

4. Requests and Questions

Al-Fārābī has explained that language grew out of a need to communicate requests. Requests and questions of various kinds are a central feature of his thinking. At [Debate] 43.2f he distinguishes two main kinds of request: those that are requests for a commitment, and those that are requests for knowledge or information. This division corresponds to the roles of questions in debate and in science respectively. We begin with debate.

4.1 Questions in Debate

Al-Fārābī cites Aristotle as saying that the primary aim in debate is to refute proposed views; reaching agreement is a secondary aim ([Debate] 14.7–9). Accordingly the rules of debate provide that one of the debaters, known as the “questioner” (sā’il), has the role of refuting the views offered by the other debater (the “responder”, mujīb). It’s also the questioner’s task to elicit from the responder commitments to statements. (Committing is called “conceding” or “submitting”, taslīm.) The questioner must then try to refute these statements and the responder must try to defend them. The questioner elicits a commitment by presenting to the responder a pair of incompatible possibilities, and the responder must choose which possibility to defend. This pair of incompatible possibilities is referred to as “what was sought after” (maṭlūb, in Latin quaesitum), or the “question” (mas’ala).

The simplest case is where the questioner requires the responder to commit to a view on whether some primary concept is instantiated in the world. For example, “Is there or is there not a vacuum?” More complicated, because it combines two concepts, is a question like “Is the sky spherical or not?” More bizarre, “Stone and human, which of the two is animal?” ([Debate] 43.16–20) When the responder has made a commitment, the questioner must devise a syllogism whose conclusion contradicts the commitment, and then attempt to get the responder to commit to the premises of this syllogism and to its validity. The responder is allowed to challenge on any of these points, whereupon the two participants swap roles.

Al-Fārābī comments that the rules of debate have been found useful for other purposes besides resolving differences of opinion. For example, in demonstrative science debate trains the participants to be nimble and systematic thinkers; it clears out of the way sophistical nonsense, and gives prima facie conclusions that can then be checked by demonstrative methods. In fact it’s not humanly possible to reach philosophical truth without engaging in debate. ([Debate] 29.21–38.3.) The relationship between questioner and responder can serve as a template for the relationship of teacher to pupil, so far as this is not simply passing information from teacher to pupil. It can also be a basis for collaborative research. ([Demonstration] 77.1–83.9.)

4.2 Questions Seeking Information

Al-Fārābī’s treatment of information-seeking questions is strongly influenced by two contexts in which Aristotle’s Organon uses question words. The first of these is in Categories, where Aristotle (at least as al-Fārābī reads him) classifies primary concepts under the ten supreme genera. Aristotle explains his classification partly through question words: “how much” (Arabic kam), “how” (kayfa), “where” (ayna), “when” (matā). Al-Fārābī takes note of most of these question words, and adds two more: “what” () and “which” (ayyu) ([Letters] (166) 165.17, (183) 181.16.) In [Expressions] 47.5–12 he notes that the answers to some of these questions can be classified by the question word or a word derived from it: “quantity” (kamiyya), “quality” (kayfiyya), “quiddity” or “whatness” (māhiyya). (See the discussion of these questions in Diebler 2005.)

The second context is the second book of Posterior Analytics. In the opening lines of this book Aristotle lists the four “things that we seek”, namely that it is so (annahu yūjadu), why it is (li-mādhā), what it is () and which it is (ayyu). In [Letters] (210) 200.16 al-Fārābī adds the question “is it the case that” (hal), which turns Aristotle’s “that it is” into a question.

Large parts of both [Expressions] and [Letters] are devoted to explaining how we can elicit philosophical information by asking these and similar questions.[12] Thus for each primary concept we can ask “What is it”? Al-Fārābī defines the genus (jins) of the concept to be the answer to this question. By asking “which thing” (in that genus), we get a more specific description that provides the species (naw‘) below the genus. Al-Fārābī explains how further questions can elicit the differentiae and the definitions of concepts. The “essence” (dhāt) of a concept consists of the concepts included in the definition of the concept; these concepts in the essence are also described as “constitutive” (muqawwim) for the concept.

Al-Fārābī tries hard to convince us that the philosophers’ questions are a natural extension of everyday questions. (Diebler 2005 draws a plausible comparison with ordinary language philosophy.) But the effort hardly succeeds. In what everyday context would we ask, about a date-palm, “What is it?” and accept the answer “It’s a body”? ([Letters] (167) 166.16) The outcome is that al-Fārābī unintentionally raises problems that are still resonant in the philosophy of questions. Compare “It’s a body” with the answer “[He] is a person who is over three inches tall” discussed by Cross and Roelofsen 2018.

5. The Definition of Logic

In his [Demonstration] (64.5–7) al-Fārābī tells us:

Two arts or sciences differ through having different subjects (mawḍū‘). If their subjects are identical then the arts or sciences are identical; if their subjects are different then the arts or sciences are different. Their subjects can differ either by having different features (aḥwāl, singular ḥāl) or in themselves.

Thus an art or science—al-Fārābī is very little exercised about the difference between the two—studies some entities called its subjects, and it ascribes to these entities some features. Like other Aristotelians, al-Fārābī flips between saying (for example) that the subjects of arithmetic are numbers and that the subject of arithmetic is number; the two locutions mean the same.

In [Letters] sections 11–18 al-Fārābī undertakes to identify several arts or sciences in these terms, namely “the art of logic and the sciences of nature, politics, mathematics and metaphysics”. The first step is to identify their subjects. In all these cases, he says, the “primary subjects” are the primary concepts ([Letters] 66.20f). For example, in mathematics we study primary concepts from the point of view of quantity, abstracting from their other features ([Letters] (15) 67.19–68.5). (See Druart 2007 and Menn 2008 on the important question of how metaphysics fits into this picture.)

Al-Fārābī tells us what features of the primary concepts are studied in logic:

Insofar as [the primary concepts] are signified by expressions, and insofar as they are universals, and insofar as they are predicates or subjects, and insofar as they are defined in terms of each other, and insofar as they are asked about and taken in a question about them, they are logical. They are taken so as to investigate the compounds of them, one with another, where the aforementioned things attach to them, and the features of the compounds after they have been compounded. ([Letters] (12) 67.1–5).[13]

He gives no examples, but here is one. In his book [Syllogism] 27.6f he claims that the following argument is a valid syllogism:

No stone is an animal. Some body is an animal.

This yields: Some body is not a stone.

We can paraphrase his claim:

If a first sentence is taken as universal negative with subject “stone” and predicate “animal”, and a second sentence is existential affirmative etc., and a third sentence etc., then the third sentence follows from the first two.

This paraphrase (*) illustrates why “predicate” and “subject” are listed among the logical features, and also why logic has to consider compounds of primary concepts (since the three sentences express propositions, which are compounds of concepts). Al-Fārābī’s reference to being “asked about and taken in a question about them” could refer either to dialectical questions, or to the questions that extract information about concepts, or possibly to both.

The features listed as characterizing the art of logic are concepts that classify other concepts, and so they are secondary concepts. This distinguishes logic from mathematics and natural science. For example, natural science finds causes, but these causes are “not outside the categories” ([Letters] (16) 68.17).

By describing simple primary concepts as the “first” or “primary” subjects of logic, al-Fārābī suggests that there might be further subjects of logic. This makes sense; why shouldn’t the rules of logic apply to secondary concepts just as much as to primary concepts? In fact the way al-Fārābī has set things up would allow him to explain how this should go. Laws about secondary concepts will need tertiary concepts. But there is no need to restate the laws of logic using tertiary concepts, because “the features that attach to the primary concepts are exactly the same as those that attach to the secondary concepts”, and so on all the way up ([Letters] (9) 65.16f).

There is an obvious criticism of al-Fārābī’s definition of logic, namely that the features that he lists are too vague. For example, how could we use his list to determine whether the art of poetry is or is not a part of logic? The real problem is that for al-Fārābī himself with his Neoplatonic heritage, logic consists of whatever Aristotle said in the Organon, and al-Fārābī never comes near finding any abstract way of characterizing this body of material.[14]

Al-Fārābī gives an even vaguer characterization of the subjects of logic in his [Catalogue] (59.9–11):

As for the subjects of logic, about which it gives rules, they are concepts insofar as expressions signify them, and expressions insofar as they signify concepts.

This definition could have been copied from a text in the Neoplatonic tradition.

We return briefly to the question why al-Fārābī includes the subject of categories in a logic syllabus. Commentaries in the Alexandrian tradition normally started with a statement of the purpose of the material to be discussed. Al-Fārābī’s epitome [Categories] has no such statement, but the surviving fragments of the longer [Commentary on Categories] do address the question. They tell us (p. 196) that Aristotle’s Categories was intended to catalogue the simple universal primary concepts, but Aristotle found it sufficient to catalogue the ten supreme genera instead. Some people (p. 202) didn’t think Categories was specifically intended for logic; but “under the conditions we have mentioned, the contents of Categories turn out to be a specific part of logic”. But in fact no such conditions have been mentioned, at least in the surviving fragments. What needs to be shown is that the features (the aḥwāl) of categories studied in the first book of the syllabus are ones that will serve some purpose in later books. But this issue is not addressed at all. Al-Fārābī does address it in [Rhetoric] 87.16–89.4, where he says that the terms of premises can be in any of the ten supreme genera, in any combination. This only confirms the suspicion that the supreme genera are irrelevant to logical reasoning.

6. Tools for Inference

In this section we run quickly through al-Fārābī’s formal systems of logic. We assume some knowledge of Aristotle’s syllogistics, as in Smith (2022). Al-Fārābī discusses four logical systems: 6.1 Categorical syllogisms, 6.2 hypothetical syllogisms, 6.3 modal syllogisms, 6.4 demonstrative syllogisms.

6.1 Categorical Logic

In [Syllogism] and [Short Syllogism] Al-Fārābī recognizes three figures of categorical syllogisms, following Aristotle.[15] In these three figures he recognizes respectively four, four, and six valid moods, as listed by Smith (2022) but not always in the same order. (For example in [Syllogism] he puts Darii before Celarent). Following Aristotle again, he regards the first figure syllogisms as “perfect”, i.e., self-evident and not in need of justification. For the moods in second and third figures he gives justifications by reduction to first figure, following Aristotle in the main. (His chief departure from Aristotle in these justifications is that he never uses proof by reductio ad absurdum, though he does recognize such proofs as valid.) Aristotle’s justification of Darapti[16] relies on the conversion implication: from “Every B is an A” infer “Some A is a B” (cf. [Syllogism] 30.3). This implication fails to hold if we allow “Every B is an A” to be true when there are no Bs. Accordingly al-Fārābī declares that “Every B is an A” is false unless there is at least one B ([Categories] 124.14). Though he sometimes seems to forget he said this, he is the earliest logician on record as having spelled out this implication of “Every B is an A”.

Probably his main difference from Aristotle in categorical syllogisms is his treatment of the pairs of formal premises (i.e., with letters for terms) where Aristotle says “no syllogism occurs” in the sense that no syllogistic conclusion follows validly. Al-Fārābī calls these premise-pairs “nonproductive” (ghayr muntij). Aristotle had used the fact that valid inference rules preserve truth as a means to proving nonproductivity of a formal premise-pair; for any proposed conclusion, he found nouns that could be put for the letters, in such a way that the premises came out true and the conclusion false. During the Roman Empire period a tendency developed for logicians to skip these proofs and fall back instead on “laws of syllogism” that were supposed to give necessary and sufficient conditions for a premise-pair to be productive (cf. Lee 1984: 119f). This was generally a lapse from the rigor of Aristotle’s work, because the arguments given to justify the laws of syllogism were of a poor standard. Though al-Fārābī does once briefly mention Aristotle’s counterexample method ([Syllogism] 20.2–5), in practice he relies entirely on the laws of syllogism. By contrast the earlier logic texts of Paul the Persian and Ibn al-Muqaffa‘, both heirs of the Alexandrian view, copied Aristotle’s nonproductivity proofs in categorical logic with total formal rigor.

For further discussion of al-Fārābī’s categorical syllogisms, see Chatti and Hodges 2020 and Chatti 2019.

6.2 Hypothetical Logic

A hypothetical sentence consists of two shorter sentences joined together, as in the connected (muttaṣil) form “If p then q” or the separated (munfaṣil) form “Either p or q”. For the logic of these sentences, al-Fārābī confines his attention almost entirely to simple inferences like modus ponens:

If this visible thing is a human, then it is an animal; but it is a human. Therefore it is an animal.

or an inference with exclusive disjunction:

This number is either even or odd; but it is even. Therefore it is not odd.

His treatment is so similar to the contents of Boethius’ De Syllogismis Hypotheticis that they must have drawn on a common source now lost.

Al-Fārābī points out that hypothetical sentences can be chained so as to form “compound syllogisms”, as for example in

Either p or q. If p then not r. If not r then s. If s then t. Not t. Therefore q.

This formalizes an argument at his [Short Syllogism] 90.6–9. He also gives examples of categorical syllogisms chained together—though these can be found already in Aristotle.

6.3 Modal Logic

There is almost no mention of modal syllogisms in any of al-Fārābī’s surviving works. He must have discussed modal syllogisms in his [Commentary on Prior Analytics]; but the relevant part of this work is lost and we have to rely on citations by Avicenna, Averroes, and Maimonides. These citations between them tell us of only one modal syllogistic mood that al-Fārābī either accepted or rejected.[17]

From [Commentary on De Interpretatione] 193.3–19 and quotations in Maimonides, we know that al-Fārābī claimed, against Galen, that logic with possibility statements is useful in practical arts where actual outcomes have to be predicted, such as medicine, agriculture, and navigation (Schacht & Meyerhof 1937: 67). This looks at first sight like a confusion between possibility and probability. But more likely al-Fārābī believed that the laws of modal logic could be tweaked so as to work with “Probably” in place of a modal operator. In fact al-Fārābī does say at [Demonstration] 44.20–22 that in many of the arts, “Necessarily every A is a B” and “Most As are Bs” are treated as equivalent. (But wouldn’t this correlate “Probably” with “Necessarily” rather than “Possibly”? Al-Fārābī is not here to answer the question.)

There is further evidence of al-Fārābī experimenting with other sentence forms in modal logic. Both Avicenna (Street 2001) and Averroes (Ibn Rushd, Maqālāt 102.13f) cite al-Fārābī as considering syllogistic premises containing “insofar as”, for example, “Every A can be a B insofar as it is a B”.

From Averroes (Ibn Rushd, Maqālāt 129.11–17) we also know that al-Fārābī observed that to get the syllogism

Every C is a possible B. Every B is a possible A.

Therefore every C is a possible A.

(a form that Aristotle accepted as perfect) we need that “Every B” in the second premise means “Every possible B”; otherwise the Cs might be possible Bs but not actual Bs, so that they would escape the quantifier of the second premise, and hence violate the dictum de omni. From this al-Fārābī inferred that at least in this modal syllogism, Aristotle intended ‘Every B’ to be read as ‘Every possible B’.

Exactly what al-Fārābī meant by the dictum de omni is hard to make out from Averroes’ account. But al-Fārābī’s use of it seems to contain an attempt to give a set-theoretic justification of Barbara[18] in modal contexts. Another quotation from Averroes (Ibn Rushd, Maqālāt 154.18f) shows al-Fārābī using the dictum de omni (again presumably a set-theoretic argument) to justify a syllogism where the major premise has a negative subject:

A sculpture is not an animal. What is not an animal is not a human.

Therefore a sculpture is not a human.

This is Celarent[19] but with the middle term made negative.

6.4 Demonstrative Logic

We saw in Section 3 above that al-Fārābī believed Aristotle had prescribed universal rules for demonstrative reasoning in his Posterior Analytics. But apart from some discussion of techniques for finding definitions, the only rules that al-Fārābī offers us in [Demonstration] are categorical syllogisms in mood Barbara with extra pieces clamped on. (These are in the section [Demonstration] 33.1–39.4; they are quoted in Strobino 2019.)

This is disappointing, but at least it’s clear where the extra pieces come from. Demonstrative reasoning gives knowledge with certainty, and in [Certainty] al-Fārābī writes down some necessary and sufficient conditions for certainty. (These “conditions of certainty” are listed by López-Farjeat 2020 and discussed by Black 2006.) The condition that is relevant here is the last one:

If the previous conditions hold, it is not accidental that they do.

([Certainty] 100.18.) In other words they hold by reason of essence. Also in a discussion of demonstration in [Attainment] 51.15–52.17 al-Fārābī tells us that demonstration must proceed from some primary concepts, and the concepts in question are those that are answers to the questions “what”, “by what”, “how”, “from what”, and “for what”. These are not exactly the questions listed in Section 4.2 above, but they are clearly in that territory. Again they indicate that a demonstration should follow from the constitutive properties of the subjects under discussion, i.e., from their essences.

Suppose we have constitutive properties of A and B which between them ensure that every A is a B, and likewise constitutive properties which ensure that every B is a C. Then by Barbara we know that every A is a C; but for demonstrative certainty we want “Every A is a C” to be ensured by the constitutive properties of A and C. Some of al-Fārābī’s syllogisms confirm that this is so, considering different kinds of constitutive property.[20] In some other cases the constitutive properties fail to yield the required sentences, and al-Fārābī comments that the syllogism gives fact but not cause.

Galston (1981) offers reasons for thinking that al-Fārābī may have considered demonstrative proofs a distant ideal, to be reached only after a substantial amount of work at the dialectical level.[21]

7. Logical Consequence

Al-Fārābī’s most sophisticated definition of syllogism is at [Expressions] 100.3–5: a syllogism is

things that are arranged in the mind in an order (tartīb) such that when the things have been put in this order, the mind as a result finds itself unavoidably looking down at something else of which it was ignorant before, so that it knows it now, and thus the mind is equipped to submit to the thing it looked down at, just as if it [already] knew that thing.

The reference to “order” must owe something to Aristotle’s remark at Topics 156a22–26 that in a debate, the questioner can sometimes hoodwink the responder by asking the questions in the wrong order. But by bringing the notion of order into the definition of syllogism itself, al-Fārābī opens up a new chapter in logic (see Hodges 2018 on this and Avicenna’s development of the theme).

For further illumination on al-Fārābī’s understanding of logical consequence, we need to explore what he says about logical rules. At [Catalogue] 53.5–9 he tells us:

The art of logic provides in general the rules whose nature is to constitute the intellect and to guide a person along the correct and true path in everything where there can be conceptual error, and the rules that protect and guard him against mistakes and slips and errors in concepts, and the rules through which one tests things in concepts where one can’t be trusted not to make an error.

But these are Neoplatonic commonplaces.[22] Elsewhere al-Fārābī says deeper things about the rules of logic, as follows.

Recall from Section 3 above that on al-Fārābī’s understanding, the correct methods of logic were known by the time of Plato, who had them “according to matter”, and it was Aristotle who reformulated them as “universal rules”. He very probably has the same thing in mind when he says that Aristotle in Prior Analytics considered declarative sentences “from the point of view of their composition (ta’līf) and not of their matter” ([Commentary on De Interpretatione] 53.3f). The point he is making here becomes clear if we go back to the example syllogism spelled out at (*) in Section 5 above. This is actually al-Fārābī’s second shot at this syllogistic mood. In his first shot ([Syllogism] 26.11f) he followed Aristotle’s preferred style and used letters A, B, C in place of the “matters” stone, animal, and body respectively. So a corresponding paraphrase will read

For all primary concepts A, B, and C, if a first sentence is taken as universal negative with subject A and predicate B, etc. etc.

Here (**) is a universal rule in the sense that it is for all A, B, and C; the premises and conclusion contain no matter and are bare compositions.

Mallet (1994: 329–335) calls attention to a passage in [Analysis] 95.5–8, where al-Fārābī says he will explain “how we define syllogism” and how it is used.

Firstly, it is through knowledge of the topics, which are the universal premises whose particulars (juz’iyyāt) are used as major premises in a syllogism and in each separate art.

If “particulars” means what it usually means in such a context, namely existentially quantified statements, then this is just wrong: existentially quantified statements are hardly ever major premises in syllogisms. But as Mallet points out, the passage makes sense if the “universal premises” are statements like (**) and their “particulars” are corresponding statements of the form (*). Al-Fārābī is then saying that natural language syllogisms are validated through being instances of universal rules stating that all arguments of a certain form are valid. If this is a correct reading, it makes al-Fārābī a formal logician in a strong sense. And indeed some writers have written about al-Fārābī’s “formalism” (Zimmermann 1981: xl).

However, there are reasons for caution. As Mallet’s paper shows, al-Fārābī in his further discussion of topics, both in [Analysis] and in [Debate], heads off in completely different directions (which are too complex to pursue here, but see Hasnawi 2009 and Karimullah 2014). Moreover al-Fārābī has a habit of justifying inferences by reference to real-world information about their terms (i.e., their matter) that is not contained in the premises. He does this with the syllogistic mood Baroco ([Syllogism] 27.8–12, [Short Syllogism] 79.5–12), and there is a one-premise example at [Commentary on De Interpretatione] 136.10.[23] Elsewhere he plays fast and loose with the “forms” of arguments, for example reducing a many-premise version of induction to a two-premise categorical syllogism without giving any indication of how a string of premises are reduced to a single one ([Syllogism] 35.14–18).

Al-Fārābī often refers to “universal rules”. But they need not be laws that can be shown to hold without exceptions. Take for example his essay [Canons], which closes (272.16) with a statement that the work has presented “universal rules” of poetry. The work consists mostly of classifications of different types of poetry, together with definitions of terms used in analyzing poetry, and a broad comparison with decorative arts. These “rules” are at best things that a person who aspires to work on the theory of poetry ought to know.

In any case the only kind of justification that al-Fārābī offers for logical rules is that they have been found useful for certain purposes in the community that uses them (cf. Section 3 above). All in all, al-Fārābī treats the formal rules of logic as heuristics rather than as laws of a scientific theory. A case can be made for viewing al-Fārābī as one of the creators of what is now known as “informal logic”, as in the texts of Hitchcock (2017) and Walton (1989). The pivotal role that he gives to dialogue places him in the same world as Walton’s book.

8. Truth and Falsehood

Al-Fārābī defines a concept to be “true” (ṣādiq) if it is the same (bi-‘aynihi) in the external world as it is in the soul ([Letters] (88) 116.3f) For this definition to make sense, the concept need not be propositional. For example ([Letters] 118.5f), the concept “vacuum” is not true, because it exists only in the mind and not in the external world (Abed (1991: 111–115) discusses the relationship between existence and truth in al-Fārābī).

Al-Fārābī quite often uses the derived causative noun taṣdīq, which has a range of meanings between “verification” (i.e., gaining certainty that a thing is true) and “assent” (i.e., treating a thing as true). Al-Fārābī expounds this distinction at [Demonstration] 20.4–21.12. He also points to the range of meanings of taṣdīq at [Attainment] 90.6f: it can occur “either through certain demonstration or through persuasion”. Presumably the certain demonstration brings about verification and the persuasion brings about assent.

At [Expressions] 86.17–87.4 al-Fārābī tells us that teaching has three steps: “conceptualization” (taṣawwur), where we understand what the concept is and what our teacher is telling us about it; taṣdīq; and “committing to memory” (hifẓ).[24] [Demonstration] 80.22, in another passage on teaching, adds that “We can seek taṣdīq either of simple things or of compound”. For al-Fārābī a proposition is always compound, so he is telling us that non-propositional concepts can be assented to.

The view that both propositions and non-propositional concepts can be true runs fairly deep in al-Fārābī’s thinking, although he recognizes that not everybody agrees with it ([Commentary on De Interpretatione] 52.13f). For example, this view allows him to think of definition of non-propositional concepts and demonstration of propositions as overlapping procedures; there can be definitions that are identical with demonstrations except in the order of their parts ([Demonstration] 47.11).[25] Avicenna a hundred years later found it essential to distinguish between non-propositional and propositional concepts. Provocatively he used al-Fārābī’s own terminology of taṣawwur and taṣdīq to fix the distinction; for Avicenna any concept can be conceptualized, but only propositions can go on to be verified.[26]

A sentence can be switched between true and false by adding a negative particle, for example, “It is not the case that” (laysa). But it matters where the negative particle is put; al-Fārābī discusses a number of cases, ad hoc with no clear overall pattern. One case that he discusses in detail is where the negation is attached to a noun, as when we form the noun “not-just” from the noun “just”. (Adjectives are counted as nouns.) Following Theophrastus (Fortenbaugh et al. 1992: 148–153) he identifies this kind of negation as “metathetic” (‘udūlī); he takes the resulting metathetic sentence to be an affirmation, not a denial. Nothing can be both just and not-just, but there are things that are neither, for example infants. So an infant is not just, but it is also not not-just. For a similar reason the infant is not unjust. Also it is false that the infant is just, and false that it is not-just. Likewise it is false (rather than meaningless) that every heat is curvilinear ([Categories] 125.8). (Thom 2008 steers a clear path through these notions.)

Before al-Fārābī, metathesis seems to have played little or no role in rules of inference. So an example in al-Fārābī with a metathetic subject term is worth noting:

If every human is an animal, then every non-animal is a non-human.

This appears in his ([Analysis] 114.11f), where he introduces it as a topic. (Fallahi 2019 discusses this example.)

Al-Fārābī holds that “Come here” is neither true nor false, but “You must come here”, which can be used in place of it (yaqūmu maqāma(hu)), is true or false ([Short De Interpretatione] 47.3–48.1). The reason is that the first sentence, unlike the second, has the wrong shape to be true or false. He could be read as saying that every command has the same meaning as some indicative sentence, but truth and falsehood depend on the form of words used, not just on the meaning. But closer inspection shows that he uses the phrase yaqūmu maqāma for some quite weak equivalences where the two sentences in question definitely mean different things. For example, he uses the phrase when a questioner in a debate asks a question with a metathetic affirmation in place of a denial ([Commentary on De Interpretatione] 136.6). His words for different kinds of equivalence (for example, bi-manzila, “in the same role as”, which will be familiar to readers of Classical Arabic linguistics) deserve closer study. Having written [Expressions] and [Letters], he certainly deserves to have his prepositional phrases taken seriously.

At [Commentary on De Interpretatione] 89.12–100.25 Al-Fārābī presents a distinctive view of statements about the future (cf. Adamson 2006, Knuuttila 2020). In connection with a future battle, the disjunction “The battle either will or will not take place” is a necessary proposition and hence true. But since the future is indeterminate, neither of the sentences “The battle will take place” and “The battle will not take place” is true; moreover the lapse of truth value is something intrinsic in the world, it is not just our ignorance. Granted, if Allah knows that Zayd will leave home tomorrow, then it is true now that Zayd will leave home tomorrow, and this implication is a necessary truth. But the necessary truth of this implication doesn’t entail the necessary truth of its conclusion, and hence Zayd still has the freedom to choose. Al-Fārābī doesn’t make clear whether he is doubting the modal inference

Necessarily if p then q. Necessarily p. Therefore necessarily q

or whether he is allowing that there may be restrictions on what Allah necessarily knows. (Hasnawi [1985: 28f] relates this passage to Muslim debates about Allah’s foreknowledge.)

9. Foundations of Arabic

In several works al-Fārābī analyses features of Arabic as a language. Some of these works contain comparisons between Arabic and other languages: Greek, Syriac, Persian, and Sogdian in [Letters], Greek and Persian in [Commentary on De Interpretatione], and Greek in [Expressions]. Al-Fārābī’s comments on Greek include several mistranslations and dubious grammatical remarks, making it clear that he didn’t read Greek (for al-Fārābī’s knowledge of languages see Zimmermann 1981: xlviif). Also al-Fārābī has a strong tendency to classify languages as (1) Arabic and (2) “other languages”. So these comparisons are far from being a serious contribution to comparative linguistics, and one asks why he includes them.

On reading the comparisons, a pattern emerges. Al-Fārābī starts from a theory of the regime of concepts (cf. Section 2 above), and his chief concern is how well Arabic reflects this regime. The role of “other languages” is always to illustrate how other languages reflect the regime of concepts where Arabic fails to do so. As Menn puts it, “in practice, his reconstructed Greek serves as an ideal logical language, i.e. a language in which grammatical form always tracks logical form” (2008: 68).

Al-Fārābī’s starting point is the concepts required for sentences that appear in categorical syllogisms, such as

Zayd is human. Every horse is animal. Some horse is not stone.

Here “Zayd” , “horse”, “animal”, “stone” signify simple primary concepts; the proper name “Zayd” signifies a particular (juz’), and the other three words signify universals (kullī). “Every” and “some” are quantifiers (sūr), and “is” is a copula (rābiṭ) signifying the connection between two primary concepts so as to form an affirmation or a denial ([Commentary on De Interpretatione] 102.17) Al-Fārābī groups all these words into two classes: noun (ism) for those signifying primary concepts, and particle (ḥarf) for the remainder. (Adjectives count as nouns.) He makes clear that the particles are a disparate group and need further classification ([Expressions] 42.8–12).

Al-Fārābī introduces a distinction between concepts that apply to a thing permanently and those (called accident, ‘araḍ) that apply only temporarily. As a result, concepts have a temporal regime, and language should reflect this. Al-Fārābī is at his most a priori here, claiming that the temporal regime of concepts should be represented by a system of three tenses: past, present, and future. We don’t know whether he simply failed to notice other ways in which time is represented in Arabic grammar (for example, continuous tenses and pluperfect constructions), or for some reason he dismissed these features as marginal.

Broadly following Aristotle, al-Fārābī adds to noun and particle a third class, namely verb (kalima). A verb simultaneously expresses three pieces of meaning: a simple primary concept, a copular linking, and a tense (and hence a time). Thus in “Zayd walked”, the verb “walked” expresses (i) the primary concept “walking”, (ii) a linking of this concept to the concept of Zayd, and (iii) a past tense.

In spite of his blind spot about tenses, al-Fārābī’s comments on verbs in Arabic contain some of his best linguistic insights. For example, he notes that since tenses are needed only for talking about accidents, one should not expect to find a verb whose primary concept is a permanent notion such as “human” (insān). He tests this by constructing a verb from “human”, namely ta’annasa. By the rules of Arabic, one would understand it to signify something with a temporal feature, namely “becoming a human” ([Commentary on De Interpretatione] 34.4–9). Al-Fārābī also uses a quite subtle linguistic argument to show that Arabic has a word that can express pure tense without copula or primary concept. This is the word kāna, as in “Zayd was walking”, zaydun kāna yamshī. We can see that there is no copula in kāna, he tells us, because “Zayd is walking”, zaydun yamshī, already contains a copula in the verb yamshī ([Commentary on De Interpretatione] 42.6–18). We even find the beginnings of an analysis of the structure of events in al-Fārābī’s discussion of how the present tense can signify either a point of time or an interval ([Commentary on De Interpretatione] 40.3–41.18).

10. Poetry and Music

For al-Fārābī, music theory sits on the very edge of being a syllogistic art along with rhetoric and poetry:

… it becomes clear that [the theoretical art of music] has much in common with that of the scholars in the linguistic arts from the people of each tongue, and has much in common with the art of rhetoric and the art of poetry, both of which are parts of the art of logic in many things. ([Music] 173)

The link to poetry is clear, he tells us, given that poetry is perfected by being set to music. Besides this there are formal similarities: poetry is formed by concatenating letters from a finite alphabet, and music is formed by concatenating sounds from a finite palette. Al-Fārābī grants that in the case of music the palette is dictated by nature, whereas the letters of a national alphabet are adopted by convention in that nation ([Music] 120f). But he notes that in some cultures the music accompanying a poem is counted as a part of the poem, and that this can be justified by the fact that sometimes the poetic metre is sustained by the music rather than the words ([Poetry] 91.15–17).[27]

Al-Fārābī never considers music on its own as a syllogistic art. There is an obvious reason for this, namely that music is not built of words, and syllogisms (by Aristotle’s definition which al-Fārābī cites at [Syllogism] 19.8) are a form of verbal discourse (qawl). But this requires only that the premises are verbal; the conclusion, on both Aristotle’s definition and al-Fārābī’s own quoted in Section 7 above, is simply a “thing”. Already in Aristotle the conclusion of a practical syllogism is an action, not a proposition. (Thus Aristotle, De Motu Animalium 7, 701a11: “The two propositions result in a conclusion which is an action”.)

In what sense is it true that poetry contains words that compel assent to something that one didn’t previously know? Al-Fārābī discusses this question in three essays: [Canons], [Poetry], and [Proportion]. In all of them, part of his answer is that poetry excites our imagination and thereby persuades us to adopt certain attitudes.

This takes “syllogism” in a very weak sense. But in all three works al-Fārābī also indicates that poetry contains text that is “potentially” a syllogism. His only examples, in [Proportion] 505.22f, yield invalid categorical syllogisms in second figure, as follows (see Aouad & Schoeler 2002):

  1. The person is beautiful. The sun is beautiful. Therefore the person is a sun.[28]
  2. Fire acts quickly. The sword acts quickly, viz. to kill. Therefore the sword is a fire.

His point can be teased out in several different ways; the reader may have better suggestions than ours. But here at least is a reading that matches al-Fārābī’s text. Consider the following line of Abū Tammām, in a poem written in 838 to celebrate a military victory:

Knowledge lies in the bright spears gleaming between two armies. (translated in Stetkevych 2002: 156)

Reading this in context, we realize that the poet is telling us that the weapons gave certainty through a decisive victory. Knowledge is what gives certainty. So we can expand the text by what it brings to mind:

The spears give certainty. Knowledge gives certainty. Therefore the spears are knowledge.

This is not deductive reasoning. It’s a verbalizing of thoughts that the poem brings to our minds. Spelling it out, we are drawn to appreciate the fact that the battle resolved the situation. The text is an invalid syllogism in just the same way as al-Fārābī’s two examples above, but the fact that it is in second figure is really neither here nor there.

Note that in this case the poem provides the conclusion, not the premises. So it fits Black’s (1990: 226) description that “What appears in the finished product is not a poetic syllogism … but only its conclusion”. Are the hearers supposed to reconstruct the poet’s premises by telepathy? Black leaves the problem open, but in fact it’s a problem we have met before. In [Syllogism] 19.10f al-Fārābī tells us that

A syllogism is just composed to reach a quaesitum which was previously defined; the quaesitum was assumed first and one seeks to verify it by a syllogism.

This applies in various contexts, for example, when the questioner in a debate has the task of finding a syllogism to refute the responder’s claim; “the enquiry is always about a quaesitum whose syllogism has not yet been found” ([Debate] 45.6). In the poetical case the hearers have the task of finding a middle term that generates a poetic syllogism; in our example the middle term is “giving certainty”. And again, the premises yield the conclusion by imaginative suggestion, not by deduction.

There remain some problems with al-Fārābī’s account of poetic syllogisms. First, he never says that only the conclusion appears in the poem. Black (1990: 235–8) suggests that the practical syllogism might be a key to understanding other cases.

Second, why does al-Fārābī say in [Canons] 268.15 that “poetic discourse is in all cases absolutely false”? This is a gross exaggeration, and it raises the question whether a poet can really expect the audience to assent to a pack of lies. It seems we can handle this problem. Al-Fārābī’s statement in [Canons] is a typical Neoplatonist soundbite, witness the Alexandrian Elias (In Categorias Prooemium 117.2–5):

Either all the premises [of the syllogism] are true, making it demonstrative, or they are all false and they make it poetic and mythic, or some are true and some are false ….

Al-Fārābī’s own more mature view, in [Proportion] 506.3f, is that

Poetry doesn’t aim either to tell lies or not to tell them; its aim and purpose is to arouse the imagination and the passion of the soul.

And even if some blatant lies do occur, we would surely admit (though al-Fārābī himself never quite says it in the texts that we have) that a false statement may still contain poetic truth.


Works of Al-Fārābī

  • [Analysis] Kitāb al-taḥlīl (Analysis), in [Logic] 2: 95–129.
  • [Aristotle] “The philosophy of Aristotle, the parts of his philosophy, the ranks of order of its parts, the position from which he started and the one he reached.” Translated by Mohsin Mahdi from an Arabic manuscript in Istanbul. Mahdi’s translation is Part III of his book Mahdi 2001 (below).
  • [Attainment] Kitāb taḥṣīl al-saʻāda, Jaʻfar Āl Yāsīn (ed.), Beirut: Dār al-Andalus, 1981; translated as “The Attainment of Happiness” in Mahdi 2001: 13–50.
  • [Canons] “Fārābī’s Canons of Poetry”, A. J. Arberry (ed./trans.), 1938, Rivista degli Studi Orientali, 17(2): 266–278. (Arabic and translation.)
  • [Catalogue] Iḥṣā al-‘ulūm (Catalogue of the sciences), ‘Uthmān Amīn (ed.), Paris: Dar Bibliyun, 2005. Latin translations (1) by Gundisalvi in Jakob Schneider, De Scientiis: secundum versionem Dominici Gundisalvi, Herder, Freiburg 2006 (includes German translation); (2) by Gerard of Cremona in Alain Galonnier, Le De Scientiis Alfarabii de Gérard de Crémone: Contribution aux problèmes de l’acculturation au XIIe siècle (édition et traduction du texte), Turnhout: Brepols, 2017 (includes English translation).
  • [Categories] Kitāb al-qāṭāghūrīyās ayy al-maqūlāt, in [Logic] 1: 89–131; translated in D. M. Dunlop, 1958/1959, in “Al-Fārābī’s paraphrase of the Categories of Aristotle”, Islamic Quarterly, 4: 168–197 and 5(1): 21–54.
  • [Certainty] Sharā’iṭ al-yaqīn (Conditions of certainty), in Kitāb al-burhān wa-kitāb al-sharā’iṭ al-yaqīn (Book of demonstration and book of conditions of certainty), Majid Fakhry (ed.), Beirut: Dar el-Machreq, 1986, pp. 97–104.
  • [Commentary on Categories] “Al-Fārābī’s Long Commentary on Aristotle’s Categoriae in Hebrew and Arabic: A critical edition and English translation of the newly found extant fragments”, Mauro Zonta (ed./trans.), Studies in Arabic and Islamic Culture II, Binyamin Abrahamov (ed.), Ramat-Gan: Bar-Ilan University Press, 2006, pp. 185–253.
  • [Commentary on De Interpretatione] Sharḥ ‘ibāra, W. Kutsch and S. Marrow (eds.), Beirut: Dar el-Machreq, 1986; translated in Zimmermann 1981: 1–219. We cite the page and line numbers in the Kutsch and Marrow edition; Zimmermann’s translation gives these too.
  • [Commentary on Prior Analytics] Kitāb sharḥ al-qiyās, surviving part in Almanṭiqīyāt lil-Fārābī (The logical works of al-Fārābī), M. T. Daneshpazhuh (ed.), Qum: Maktabat Ayat Allah, 1988, vol. 2, pp. 263–553.
  • [Debate] Kitāb al-jadal (Debate), in [Logic] 3: 13–107. A fuller text is translated in David M. DiPasquale, Alfarabi’s Book of Dialectic (Kitab al-Jadal): On the Starting Point of Islamic Philosophy, Cambridge: CUP, 2019. (DiPasquale’s references to the Arabic text are to an edition not generally available.)
  • [Demonstration] Kitāb al-burhān (Demonstration), in Kitāb al-burhān wa-kitāb al-sharā’iṭ al-yaqīn (Book of demonstration and book of conditions of certainty), Majid Fakhry (ed.), Beirut: Dar el-Machreq, 1986, pp. 19–96.
  • [Eisagoge] Kitāb al-īsāḡūjī, in [Logic] 1: 75–87; translated in D. M. Dunlop, 1956, “AlFārābī’s Eisagoge”, Islamic Quarterly, 3(2): 117–138.
  • [Expressions] Kitāb al-alfāẓ al-musta‘mala fī al-manṭiq (Expressions used in logic), Muhsin Mahdi (ed.), Beirut: Dar el-Machreq, 1968.
  • [Harmony] Al-Fārābī(?), L’armonia delle opinioni dei due sapienti: il divino Platone e Aristotele (Al-jam‘ bayna ra’yay al-ḥakīmayn aflaṭūn al-ilāhī wa-arisṭūṭālīs), Cecilia Martini Bonadeo (ed.), Pisa: Plus, 2009; English translation in Charles E. Butterworth, Alfārābī, The Political Writings, ‘Selected Aphorisms’ and other texts, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 2001, pp. 117–167.
  • [Indication] Risālat al-tanbīh ‘alā sabīl al-sa‘āda (Indication of the way to happiness), S. Khālīfāt (ed.), Amman: Jami‘at al-urdunīya, 1987; translated in Jon McGinnis and David C. Reisman, Classical Arabic Philosophy: An Anthology of Sources, Indianapolis: Hackett, 2007, pp. 104–120.
  • [Interpretation] Kitāb pārī armīniyās ayy al-‘ibāra, in [Logic] 1: 133–163; translated in Zimmermann 1981: 220–247.
  • [Introductory] Al-tawṭi’a aw al-risāla ṣuddira bihā al-manṭiq (Preparation, or essay introducing logic), in [Logic] 1: 55–62; translated in D. M. Dunlop, 1957, “Al-Fārābī’s Introductory Risālah on logic”, Islamic Quarterly, 3: 224–235.
  • [Letters] Kitāb al-ḥurūf (Book of letters), Muhsin Mahdi (ed.), Beirut: Dar al-Machreq, 1990. Paragraphs (108) to (157) are translated in Khalidi 2005, pp. 1–26. A new edition with full translation by Charles E. Butterworth is near publication. We cite this work in the style (m) n.p, where m is the paragraph number, n the page number and p the line number, all as in Mahdi’s edition; Khalidi gives the paragraph numbers.
  • [Logic] Al-manṭiq ‘inda al-Fārābī (The Logic of al-Fārābī), Rafiq al-‘Ajam (ed.), Beirut: Dar al-Machreq, vol. 1 1985, vols. 2 and 3 1986.
  • [Music] Kitāb al-Mūsīqā al-kabīr (Great Book of Music), Ghattas ‘Abd-al-Malik Khashaba (ed.), Cairo: Dār al-Kātib al-‘arabī li-al-ṭibā‘a wa-al-nashr, 1967; French translation in Rudolphe D’Erlanger, 1930, La Musique Arabe, vols 1, 2 (of six), Paris: Librairie Orientaliste Paul Geuthner.
  • [Poetry] “Kitāb al-shi‘r”, M. Mahdi (ed.), Shi‘r, 1959: 90–95; English translation in Geert Jan van Gelder and Marlé Hammond, 2008, Takhyīl: The Imaginary in Classical Arabic Poetics, Warminster: Gibb Memorial Trust: 15–18; French translation in Benmakhlouf et al. 2007: 112–118.
  • [Proportion] Qawl al-Fārābī fī al-tanāsub wa-al-ta’līf (About proportion and composition), in M. T. Daneshpazhuh (ed.), Al-manṭiqīyāt lil-Fārābī (The logical works of alFārābī), Qum: Maktabat Ayat Allah, Qum, 1988, vol. 1, pp. 504.1–506.6; French translation in Benmakhlouf et al. 2007: 107–111.
  • [Rhetoric] Kitāb al-Ḫaṭāba, in J. Langhade and M. Grignaschi (eds.), Al-Fārābī, deux ouvrages inédits sur la rhétorique, Beirut: Dar el-Machreq, 1971, pp. 30–121.
  • [Sections] Al-fuṣūl al-khamsa (The five sections), in [Logic] 1: 63–73; translated in D. M. Dunlop, 1955, “Al-Fārābī’s Introductory Sections on Logic”, Islamic Quarterly, 2: 264–282.
  • [Short Syllogism] Kitāb al-qiyās al-ṣaḡīr (Also known as Logic of the Theologians) in Al-manṭiq ‘inda al-Fārābī (The Logic of al-Fārābī), R. al-‘Ajam (ed.), Beirut: Dar al-Mashreq, 1986, vol 2, pp. 65–93; translated in Nicholas Rescher, “Al-Fārābī’s short commentary on Aristotle’s Prior Analytics”, Pittsburgh, PA: University of Pittsburgh Press, 1963.
  • [Sophistry] Kitāb al-amkinati al-muḡliṭa (Situations of sophistry), in [Logic] 2: 131–164.
  • [Syllogism] Kitāb al-qiyās (Syllogism), in [Logic] 2: 11–64; translated in Saloua Chatti and Wilfrid Hodges, 2020, Al-Fārābī, Syllogism, (Ancient Commentators on Aristotle), London: Bloomsbury Academic.

Works of Other Authors

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  • Alon, Ilai and Shukri Abed, 2007, Al-Fārābī’s Philosophical Lexicon, two volumes, Cambridge: E. J. W. Gibb Memorial Trust.
  • Aouad, Maroun, 1992, “Les Fondements de la Rhétorique d’Aristote Reconsidérés Par Fārābi, Ou Le Concept de Point de Vue Immédiat et Commun”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 2(1): 133–180. doi:10.1017/S0957423900001582
  • Aouad, Maroun and Gregor Schoeler, 2002, “The Poetic Syllogism According to Al-Farabi: An Incorrect Syllogism of the Second Figure”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 12(2): 185–196. doi:10.1017/S0957423902002096
  • Benmakhlouf, Ali, Stéphane Diebler, and Pauline Koetscher (eds.), 2007, Al-Fārābī, Philosopher à Bagdad au Xe siècle, Paris: Seuil.
  • Black, Deborah L., 1989, “The ‘Imaginative Syllogism’ in Arabic Philosophy: A Medieval Contribution to the Philosophical Study of Metaphor”, Mediaeval Studies, 51: 242–267. doi:10.1484/J.MS.2.306851
  • –––, 1990, Logic and Aristotle’s Rhetoric and Poetics in Medieval Arabic Philosophy, (Islamic philosophy and theology, 7), Leiden: Brill.
  • –––, 2006, “Knowledge (‘Ilm) and Certitude (yaqin) in al-Farabi’s Epistemology”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 16(1): 11–45. doi:10.1017/S0957423906000221
  • Boethius [c. 477–524 CE], 1969, De Hypotheticis Syllogismis, Luca Obertello (ed.), Brescia: Paideia.
  • Chase, Michael, 2007, “Did Porphyry Write a Commentary on Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics? Albertus Magnus, al-Fārābī, and Porphyry on per se predication”, in Classical Arabic Philosophy: Sources and Reception, Peter Adamson (ed.), London: Warburg Institute, pp. 21–38.
  • Chatti, Saloua, 2017, “The semantics and pragmatics of the conditional in al-Fārābī’s and Avicenna’s theories”, Studia Humana, 6(1): 5–17.
  • –––, 2019, Arabic Logic from Al-Fārābī to Averroes: A Study of the Early Arabic Categorical, Modal, and Hypothetical Syllogistics, Cham, Switzerland: Birkhäuser.
  • Cross, Charles and Floris Roelofsen, 2018, “Questions”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2018 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • D’Ancona, Cristina, 2022, “Greek Sources in Arabic and Islamic Philosophy”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2022 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • D’Arcy, Guillaume de Vaulx, 2010, “La Naqla, Étude du Concept de Transfert dans L’œuvre d’al-Fārābī”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 20(1): 125–176. doi:10.1017/S0957423909990129
  • Diebler, Stéphane, 2005, “Catégories, conversation et philosophie chez al-Fārābī”, in Les Catégories et leur Histoire, Ole Bruun and Lorenzo Corti (eds.), Paris: Vrin, pp. 275–305.
  • Druart, Thérèse-Anne, 2007, “Al-Fārābī, the categories, metaphysics, and the Book of Letters”, Medioevo, Rivista di storia della filosofia medievale, 32: 15–37.
  • –––, 2011, “Al-Fārābī: an Arabic account of the Origin of Language and of Philosophical Vocabulary”, Proceedings of the American Catholic Philosophical Association, 84: 1–17. doi:10.5840/acpaproc2010841
  • –––, 2015/6, “Why music matters for language and interpretation: al-Fārābī”, Mélanges de l’Université Saint-Joseph, 66: 167–179.
  • –––, 2021, “Al-Fārābī”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2021 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>
  • –––, 2022, “Al-Fārābī: The happy marriage between logic and music”, Ishraq, 10: 72–88.
  • Elamrani-Jamal, Abdelali, 1983, Logique Aristotélicienne et Grammaire Arabe, (Études musulmanes, 26 ), Paris: Vrin.
  • Elias [attr., 6th century CE], 1890, In Categorias Prooemium, in Adolph Busse (ed.), Eliae in Porphyrii Isagogen et Aristotelis Categorias Commentaria, (Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca 18.1), Berlin: Reimer, pp. 107–134. [In Categorias Prooemium available online] See also entry on Elias.
  • Eskenasy, Pauline E., 1988, “Al-Fārābī’s Classification of the Parts of Speech”, Jerusalem Studies in Arabic and Islam, 11: 55–82.
  • Fakhry, Majid, 2002, Al-Fārābī: Founder of Islamic Neoplatonism, His Life, Works and Influence, London: Oneworld.
  • Fallahi, Asadollah, 2019, “Fārābī and Avicenna on contraposition”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 40(1): 22–41.
  • Farmer, Henry George, 1957, “The Music of Islam”, in Egon Wellesz (ed.), Ancient and Oriental Music, London: Oxford University Press, pp. 421–477.
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  • García Cuadrado, José Angel, 2003, “La distinción nombre-verbo en los comentarios al Perihermeneias de Al-Fārābī y Averroes”, Revista Española de Filosofía Medieval, 10: 157–169.
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  • –––, 2015/6, “Imitation—ambiguity—discourse: some remarks on al-Fārābī’s philosophy of language”, Mélanges de l’Université Saint-Joseph, 66: 135–166.
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  • Giolfo, Manuela E. B. and Wilfrid Hodges, 2018, “Syntax, Semantics, and Pragmatics in al-Sīrãfī and Ibn Sīnã”, in Georgine Ayoub and Kees Versteegh (eds.), Foundations of Arabic Linguistics III, Leiden: Brill. doi:10.1163/9789004365216_007
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  • Günther, Sebastian, 2010, “The principles of instruction are the grounds of our knowledge; Al-Fārābī’s philosophical and al-Ghazālī’s spiritual approaches to learning”, in Osama Abi-Mershed (ed.), Trajectories of Education in the Arab World: Legacies and Challenges, London: Routledge, pp. 15–35.
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  • Haddad, Fuad S., 1969, “Alfārābī’s Views on Logic and Its Relation to Grammar”, Islamic Quarterly, 13: 192–207.
  • –––, 1989, Alfarabi’s Theory of Communication, Beirut, Lebanon: American University of Beirut.
  • Hasnawi, Ahmad, 1985, “Fārābī et la pratique de l’exégèse philosophique (remarques sur son Commentaire au De Interpretatione d’Aristote)”, Revue de Synthèse (Paris), 106 (117): 27–59.
  • –––, 1992, “Fārābī al-”, in Encyclopédie Philosophique Universelle, vol. 3, Les oeuvres philosophiques: dictionnaire dir. par Jean-François Nattei sous la direction de André Jacob, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
  • –––, 2009, “Topique et syllogistique: la tradition arabe (Al-Fārābī et Averroès)”, in Les lieux de l’argumentation: Histoire du syllogisme topique d’Aristote à Leibniz (Studia Aristarum, 22), Joël Biard and Fosca Mariani Zini (eds.), Turnhout: Brepols Publishers, pp. 191–226. doi:10.1484/M.SA-EB.4.00075
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  • –––, 2020, “Medieval Arabic notions of algorithm: some further raw evidence”, in Fields of Logic and Computation III, Essays Dedicated to Yuri Gurevich on the Occasion of his 80th Birthday, ed. Andreas Blass, Patrick Cegielski, Nachum Dershowitz, Manfred Droste and Bernd Finkbeiner, Lecture Notes in Computer Science 12180: Springer, pp. 133–146.
  • Hodges, Wilfrid and Manuela E. B. Giolfo, 2022, “Al-Fārābī against the grammarians??”, in Manuel Sartori and Francesco Binaghi (eds)., The Foundations of Arab Linguistics V: Kitab Sibawayhi, The Critical Theory, Leiden: Brill, pp. 157–178.
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  • –––, 2023, “Al-Farabi on what is known prior to the syllogistic arts in his Introductory Letter, the Five Aphorisms, and the Book of Dialectic”, in Katja Krause et al. (eds.), Contextualising Premodern Philosophy: Explorations of the Greek, Hebrew, Arabic, and Latin traditions, New York/London: Routledge, pp. 276–292.
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The first author takes responsibility for the text of this entry but couldn’t possibly have written it without the unfailing encouragement, advice and wisdom of the second author.

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Therese-Anne Druart

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