al-Farabi’s Psychology and Epistemology

First published Thu Feb 11, 2016; substantive revision Sun Apr 26, 2020

Abū Naṣr al-Fārābī (c. 870–950), known in the Arabic philosophical tradition as the “Second Master” (al-mu‘allim al-thānī) after Aristotle, and Alpharabius/Alfarabi in the Latin West tradition, is one of the major thinkers in the history of Islamic philosophy. He wrote extensively on logic, philosophy of language, metaphysics, natural philosophy, ethics, political philosophy, philosophical psychology and epistemology. His teachings had a strong Aristotelian background and at the same time a significant Neoplatonic bent. One of the greatest Islamic thinkers, Avicenna (d. 1037), explicitly admits in his autobiography his intellectual debt to al-Fārābī through whom he was able to understand the Metaphysics of Aristotle. Overall, al-Fārābī became an important reference within the Islamic intellectual milieu as a source of both influence and contention.

The precise chronology of al-Fārābī’s works is difficult to establish. He wrote treatises devoted to the explanation of Plato and Aristotle, commentaries and paraphrases of Aristotle’s works, and other treatises where he develops his own philosophical thought unifying his metaphysical and cosmological views with his psychology, and even with his political philosophy. His views concerning psychological and epistemological matters appear in several places within his treatises. Hence, it is necessary to consider several works where he clarifies and completes his thoughts on the matter. The Principles of Existing Things, also known as The Political Regime (Kitāb al-siyāsa al-madaniyya), and The Principles and Opinions of the People of the Virtuous City (Mabādi’ ārā’ ahl al-madīnah al-fāḍilah), are some of al-Fārābī’s major works where he deals with psychological topics such as the nature of the soul, its cognitive capacities, and the doctrine of the intellect. Furthermore, there is another important treatise where al-Fārābī directly deals with the intellective faculty, namely, The Treatise on the Intellect (Risālah fi’l-‘aql). This work shows signs of the influence of Aristotle’s doctrine of the soul and its interpretation by Alexander of Aphrodisias. In fact, M. Geoffroy (2002: 191–231) contends that al-Fārābī probably never read a complete translation of Aristotle’s On the Soul but knew it through Alexander’s treatises, mainly the On the Intellect. Al-Fārābī addresses epistemological topics such as the understanding of scientific knowledge and the nature of demonstration and certitude mainly in the Book of Demonstration (Kitāb al-burhān) and the Book on the Conditions of Certitude (Kitāb Šara’iṭ al-yaqīn). In order to cover the diversity of psychological and epistemological matters in al-Fārābī’s works, this article is divided as follows:

1. The Origin and Nature of the Soul

In one of his best-known introductory works, Enumeration of the Sciences (Iḥṣā’ al-Ulūm), al-Fārābī (ES: 87) explains that the eighth part of the science of physics is devoted to what is common to the different kinds of animals, namely, the soul, and is studied in Aristotle’s Book of Animals and in On the Soul. Al-Fārābī describes the soul as Aristotle did in On the Soul 2.1, 412a19, that is, as the form or actualization (ἐντελέχεια / antalāshiyā or at-tamām) of a natural organic body that potentially has life.[1] Living beings have different faculties: the nutritive, sensitive, appetitive, and rational faculties. The presence of these capacities in living beings is due to the different kinds of soul. The origin of these souls and their capacities is explained by al-Fārābī from a metaphysical, cosmological, and biological perspective.

In fact, al-Fārābī’s entire philosophy, including his psychological and epistemological views, must be understood in light of his ontological and cosmological worldview, a matter that has been a source of considerable debate. In The Political Regime and The Virtuous City, al-Fārābī provides a metaphysical and ontological explanation of the structure of the universe, combining Neoplatonic emanationism and Aristotelian views on the celestial spheres (M. Mahdi 2001: 6–11; 121–124). Others have argued that al-Fārābī’s account concerning these matters in both treatises should not be taken literally, but as a political metaphor of the kind of regimes that can be conceived in political philosophy. In contrast, P. Vallat and D. Janos have rejected this view and have shown that far from a mere rhetorical strategy, al-Fārābī’s cosmology constitutes the foundation of his political thought. Though these different approaches have motivated controversial interpretations of al-Fārābī’s philosophy, this article concurs with the interpretation of Vallat (2004: 85–128) and Janos (2012: 38–43). To take al-Fārābī’s cosmology as a true component of his philosophy has serious implications for the understanding of his philosophical psychology: al-Fārābī’s conception of the soul and intellect cannot be understood without taking into account his cosmological model. In this way it becomes clear that his psychology and cosmology taken together motivate his political philosophy.

As D. Janos (2010: 19–44) has shown in depth, al-Fārābī’s cosmology draws on the Proclus Arabus (mainly the Maḥd al-khayr [Elements of Theology]), late ancient commentators such as Alexander, Simplicius, Themistius, and in general from the Neoplatonica Arabica, including the Plotinus Arabus (Janos 2012: 4–6; 11–37; D’Ancona 2014). Both The Political Regime and The Virtuous City are key sources for the reconstruction of al-Fārābī’s cosmology which consists in a hierarchical emanationist model constituted by six principles: (1) the First Existent or First Cause, (2) the second intellects, (3) the active (or agent) intellect, (4) the soul, (5) form, and (6) matter (al-Fārābī KS: 31; PR: 29). The First Cause is one and unique, precluding any multiplicity, whereas all other principles are multiple. The first three principles are not bodies, nor are in a body; they are immaterial and separate, whereas the three last principles are not bodies but are connected to the bodies. Notice that the soul is one of the principles that will be originated through the emanative process and is described as a principle that is not a body in itself but is in a body. Al-Fārābī explains that the universe contains six kinds of body. In decreasing order of perfection, there are: (1) celestial bodies, (2) rational animals, (3) non-rational animals, (4) plants, (5) minerals, and (6) the four elements (al-Fārābī KS: 31; PR: 29).

According to the emanation (fayḍ) process described by al-Fārābī, the existence of every being proceeds from the First Existent (mawjūd al-awwal), which is perfect, eternal, everlasting, uncaused, free of matter and without form, with no purpose or aim external to itself, with no partner or opposite, and indivisible (al-Fārābī VC: 56–89). The First Existent is distinguished from all other beings due to its oneness, which is its essence. This description seems very close to the Neoplatonic conception of the One, but it is not exactly the same. Al-Fārābī instead argues that, given that this First Existent is not in matter and has no matter, it should be an actual intellect (‘aql bi’l fi‘l). The First Existent is also intelligible (ma‘qūl) through its substance, and its identity consists in simultaneously being the act, the subject, and the object of its own intellection (al-Fārābī VC: 70–71). This description is based on Aristotle’s characterization of the unmoved mover in Metaphysics Lambda as thought thinking itself.

Every existent comes to be, according to al-Fārābī, by the First Existent. This takes place through a sort of expansion or emanation through which the First Existent necessarily gives existence to every being in the universe. Yet this does not imply any addition to its own perfection. In the initial emanation, from the First Existent proceed the second intellects. These intellects themselves, through the apprehension of themselves and the First Existent, are in turn the cause of the celestial bodies. In The Political Regime al-Fārābī mentions that the number of second intellects or second causes is identical to the number of celestial spheres from the highest, the first heaven, to the last, namely, the sphere of the moon (al-Fārābī KS: 32; PR: 29). In The Virtuous City he explicitly enumerates nine spheres starting with the first heaven, and then the fixed stars, Saturn, Jupiter, Mars, the sun, Venus, Mercury, and the moon (al-Fārābī VC: 100–105). There is a tenth intellect, namely, the active intellect (‘aql al-fa ‘‘āl), whose activity is very relevant mainly for two reasons: (1) this intellect governs together with the celestial spheres the sublunary world, and is even involved in the processes of generation and corruption (al-Fārābī LI: 29–30; OI: 75);[2] (2) furthermore, as will be explained in the fourth section, this intellect also provides the first principles of understanding through which human beings can attain happiness (al-Fārābī VC: 204–205).

Thus far we have explained the first three principles in al-Fārābī’s emanationist model (the First Cause, the second intellects, and the active intellect). The other three principles (the soul, the matter and the form) have in common their connection to the different bodies that comprise the universe. In The Political Regime al-Fārābī explains these principles following a particular order: first the soul, then the matter, and finally the form; in The Virtuous City, however, he first explains what matter and form are and subsequently gives a precise account of the soul and its faculties (al-Fārābī VC: 134–163). This latter approach is clearer for two main reasons: (1) the long explanation that al-Fārābī provides concerning the origin of matter from the most imperfect, that is, prime matter, to the most excellent, namely, rational animals, sets forth a precise framework for the understanding of the rational human soul; (2) the explanation concerning the relation between matter and form gives us a better understanding of the relation between body and soul. Matter is the substratum of the form and, hence, the form does not have subsistence by itself since it needs matter; however, matter only exists due to the form (al-Fārābī VC: 108–109).

Concerning the origin and composition of matter, al-Fārābī explains that the circular motion of the celestial spheres generates prime matter (al-madda al-ūlā), which is common to all bodies in the sublunary world. The four elements proceed from prime matter and, when these elements combine and mix in different ways and undergo the influence of the heavenly bodies, they generate numerous kinds of bodies: minerals, plants, non-rational animals, and rational animals (al-Fārābī VC: 112–115).[3] Given that matter is the substratum of form, the different forms appear when the combination of the elements takes place, giving rise to different kinds of bodies. As there are different kinds of bodies, there are also different kinds of forms, some of them of lower perfection, as the form of minerals or plants, and others more perfect, as the form of rational animals. This perfection is given by the faculties that each body has according to its natural disposition: while plants have basic faculties such as nutrition or reproduction, rational animals have a higher faculty, the intellect, which enables human beings to attain intelligibles in act.

In The Political Regime al-Fārābī deals with the relation between matter and form, and explains that form is the actualization of matter in the sense that form is more excellent than matter; however, matter is the substratum of form and without matter there is no form (al-Fārābī KS: 39; PR: 36). As can be seen, al-Fārābī is a partisan of Aristotelian hylomorphism. This relates to his understanding of the soul as the form or actualization of the body and thus perishable with the body. For al-Fārābī, as for Aristotle, the soul is responsible for the capacities or operations of the human body. When referring to the human soul, al-Fārābī holds that the rational part can come to realize itself to such a degree of perfection that it no longer has need of the body, and can come very close to reaching the status of a separate being (al-Fārābī KS: 42; PR: 38). In other words, the rational part is able to separate itself from its other faculties—sensitive, appetitive, and imaginative—in order to attain perfection by transforming itself into an eternal imperishable intellect. As can be seen, al-Fārābī renders an account on the origin of the soul and its faculties by means of a rather complex ontological and cosmological process, through which the human soul progressively attains greater perfection. Nevertheless, before explaining what this perfection consists in, I shall discuss al-Fārābī’s understanding of the faculties of the soul and their function.

2. The Soul and its Faculties

In The Virtuous City al-Fārābī devotes an entire chapter to the faculties of the human soul, from the most basic and lowest, namely nutrition, to the most perfect and highest, that is, the rational or intellective faculty (al-Fārābī VC: 164–175). Nutrition is shared among plants, animals and human beings; next there is a group of faculties, the external senses (touch, taste, smell, hearing, and sight). Animals and human being share these senses. Along with these sensitive faculties there is also the appetitive faculty through which humans and animals experience desire or aversion towards the objects they perceive through the senses. Then, proceeding with the internal senses, there is the imaginative faculty whose function is to retain the sensible impressions when these are no longer present to the external senses. This faculty also has the capacity to combine sensibles with each other, to connect and disconnect them in different compositions and divisions, some of them being false, and some true (al-Fārābī VC: 168–169). The imaginative faculty is also linked to the appetitive faculty given that it is possible to desire imaginative representations. The role of this faculty in human cognition is particularly relevant and is given separate attention in the next section. Last and highest in al-Fārābī’s account is the rational or intellective faculty (‘aql).

Al-Fārābī gives a complete explanation of the way in which all the faculties of the soul work together. Each faculty has a ruling organ and others that are auxiliaries and subordinates (al-Fārābī VC: 174–187). He holds that the ruling organ in the human body is the heart; the brain is a secondary ruling organ subordinated to the heart; however, all the other organs and limbs are subordinated to the brain. The heart rules every faculty through subordinate organs and limbs. Thus, the ruling organ of nutrition is the heart and the subordinates are the other organs that intervene in the process of nutrition, that is, the stomach, the liver, the spleen, etc. The faculty of sensation is explained following the same model: the heart rules sensation, and its subordinates or auxiliaries are the five senses whose function is to apprehend sensibles. The imaginative faculty is located in the heart and has no auxiliaries distributed in other organs, but it controls what is provided by the five senses. According to al-Fārābī, the imaginative faculty is able to separate and connect what is provided by the five senses in different ways, sometimes attaining an image in agreement with what has been perceived, sometimes something different (al-Fārābī VC: 168–169). Concerning the rational faculty, al-Fārābī explains that it is also located in the heart and has neither auxiliaries nor subordinates, but rules the other faculties, namely, the imaginative, the sensitive, and the nutritive (al-Fārābī VC: 169–171).

The appetitive faculty makes the will (irāda) arise once the sensitive, the imaginative, or the rational faculties have apprehended something. Appetite, according to al-Fārābī, may be towards knowing or doing a thing, either with the whole body or with some limb or organ. The auxiliaries and subordinates of this faculty are, therefore, all the organs involved in the motion of the body. In other words, the limbs, nerves, and muscles spread throughout the body serve as instruments and subordinates of the appetitive faculty (al-Fārābī VC: 170–171).

Notice that al-Fārābī is following Aristotle according to whom the heart is the center of the biological and even perceptive capacities of animals and human beings. The heart is relevant because it is the source of innate heat or the vital innate spirit, which spreads through the blood vessels sustaining and preserving all the parts of the body. The second major organ, the brain, regulates the heat disseminated by the heart (al-Fārābī VC: 176–177). This innate heat is the principle of life. This biological account helps explain the origin and nature of the soul. In the previous section I explained al-Fārābī’s understanding of the origin and composition of matter and its relation to the form. When referring specifically to the conformity of the human body and the origin of the rational soul, al-Fārābī holds that the conformity of this kind of body with its corresponding set of faculties is only possible when the heat of the heart reaches a certain temperature.

Following Aristotle, al-Fārābī explains the role of the reproductive faculty (al-Fārābī VC: 186–197) in the origin of the body and the soul. He holds that the female prepares the matter while the male prepares the form. Once again, he insists on the centrality of the heart, which provides the matter of the living being through the womb and the form through the organ that generates the semen. The semen, once entering the womb, finds inside of it the blood that had been previously prepared by the womb in order to receive the human form contained in the semen. The semen in turn endows this blood with a capacity that enables the blood to move and start forming the different organs that make up the human body. Hence, the blood from the womb serves as the matter that receives the human form contained in the semen, which is to say that the semen serves as the rennet by which the milk is curdled. Just as the rennet is that by virtue of which fresh milk curdles, while not being part of the curdled milk nor of its matter, so it happens with the semen, which is not part of the clogged blood or of its matter. Hence, the embryo is constituted in the same way that fresh milk is curdled by the action of the curdling principle, that is, the rennet.

When the blood in the womb receives the form from the semen, the first thing that arises is precisely the heart (al-Fārābī VC: 186–187). The other organs in the body emerge only once the rest of the faculties, beginning with the nutritive faculty, are present in the heart. The developing organs include those that are endowed with specifically female or male procreative faculties. Therefore, male and female individuals share all organs but those with reproductive functions and, similarly, both share all the faculties of the soul, that is, the sensitive, the imaginative, and the rational faculties (al-Fārābī VC: 196–197).

All of this detailed biological discussion helps explain the emergence of the perceptive faculties in animals and human beings. Both have sensation so that they can receive the impressions produced by external objects and, through the imaginative faculty, they can retain sensibles while no longer being in contact with the exterior world. Animals are able to react to the external world because they possess sensation and imagination, so they can experience pleasure and pain, or detect those situations that are damaging or dangerous for them. In the case of human beings, in addition to the imaginative faculty, the rational faculty is essential for cognition: human cognition is characterized not by the mere attainment of sensible forms but, rather, by the attainment of intelligibles. Furthermore, it is the faculty through which human beings attain the sciences and the arts, and through which they are able to discern between good habits and good deeds from those that are bad. By this faculty humans are able to reflect on whether something should be done and they can recognize what is useful, pleasant, and harmful (al-Fārābī VC: 165).

The rational faculty is both theoretical and practical (al-Fārābī KS: 32–33; PR: 29–31). In its theoretical aspect, the rational faculty allows humans to attain the knowledge of things that are in a certain way and cannot be otherwise; that is, humans are not able to act upon them or alter them. For example, we cannot do anything to alter the fact that three is an odd number and four an even number (al-Fārābī SA: §7, 15–16). In contrast, in its practical aspect, the rational faculty deals with those things humans can act upon and alter. In this practical dimension, the rational faculty involves skills and calculation. Skills refer to acquired abilities for practicing activities such as carpentry, farming, medicine, or sailing, while calculation is related to those situations where we need to deliberate about something we want to do, when we want to do it, whether it is possible to do it and, if possible, how it should be done (al-Fārābī VC: 208–209; SA: §7, 15–16).

As can be seen, the rational faculty is responsible for human cognition in all its aspects. However, though al-Fārābī gives much importance to this faculty, he also devotes much attention to the imaginative faculty in itself and its interactions with the rational faculty. The two following sections review in more detail the role of the imaginative and the rational or intellective faculties in human cognition, respectively.

3. The Relevance of the Imaginative Faculty

According to al-Fārābī the imaginative faculty is very active in human cognitive acts. As outlined above, its function is to retain sense impressions when they are no longer perceived as external stimuli, and also to combine, compose, and even reproduce, those impressions. Following the Aristotelian account, al-Fārābī thinks that the imaginative faculty is intermediate between the sensitive and rational faculties. In fact, in the case of human beings, its function is to provide reason with the impressions attained through the senses, but it also serves the rational faculty in other ways, as will be shown.

In the waking state the imaginative faculty is permanently engaged with the rational, appetitive, and sensible faculties. In such a state the sensible faculty is actively working in interaction with sensibles and sense impressions. Likewise, as mentioned, the imaginative faculty provides both the rational and appetitive faculties with these sense impressions. Nevertheless, when in the sleeping state, the sensitive, appetitive, and rational faculties cease their activities, and this is when the imaginative faculty performs a distinctive action of its own. Given that the sensitive faculty is at ease and no longer receiving fresh sense impressions, the imaginative faculty turns now to the impressions preserved in itself, and acts upon them by means of composition and division. Hence, the imaginative faculty has the power to preserve and manipulate sense impressions through composition or division, both in the case of those freshly offered by the senses while in the waking state and those that have been stored in it (al-Fārābī VC: 210–227).

In addition to the powers described above, the imaginative faculty has a distinctive capacity, that is, “reproductive imitation” or mimesis (muhākāt). Reproductive imitation refers to the capacity displayed by the imaginative faculty to imitate a series of elements by means of the sensibles stored in it. Through these sensibles, the imaginative faculty can imitate impressions that pertain to the sensitive faculty, intelligibles that pertain to the rational faculty, desires that pertain to the appetitive faculty, and also aspects proper to the nutritive faculty and even the temperament of the body (al-Fārābī VC: 210–213). This is why the imagination has the capacity to stimulate particular emotions, humors, desires, and temperaments that move the body and put it into action (al-Fārābī VC: 216–219).

Regarding the relation between the imaginative and rational faculties, since the imaginative faculty only deals with sensibles, in order to relate to the intelligibles it must imitate them by means of sensibles. For this reason, when providing his theory of prophecy and divination, al-Fārābī argues that while the active intellect usually enables the actualization of the potential intelligibles in the material intellect, in some special cases the active intellect directly provides intelligibles that are accessible to the imaginative faculty in the form of particular sensibles. These events can take place both in the waking and sleeping states, but are rather rare while waking and restricted to a few people (al-Fārābī VC: 220–223).

When an individual has a very powerful imaginative faculty, to such a degree that it is no longer restricted to the supply of images to the other faculties, it is thus free to experience sensibles of extreme beauty and perfection by means of imitation. The highest rank of perfection that the imaginative faculty can achieve is precisely when an individual attains prophecy or awareness of present or future events, as well as the capacity to see glorious or divine beings. This can be achieved by means of present and future particulars and the transcendent intelligibles of divine beings, both granted by the active intellect. However, al-Fārābī also expounds a series of inferior ranks below this most perfect attainment of vision, each progressively more imperfect than the precedent in terms of whether the vision takes place during waking or sleeping states, and whether the individual has access to particulars or intelligibles. According to al-Fārābī, the most common kind of vision is that of individuals who receive particulars while in the sleeping state.

Although al-Fārābī’s conception of the imaginative faculty departs from Aristotle’s view, it combines some elements coming from the Hellenistic and the Middle Platonist traditions that, as Walzer (1957: 142–148) points out, may have been taken from Porphyry and Proclus. The result is a psychological explanation of prophecy and divination. In recent years, scholars working on the Arabic version of Aristotle’s treatise On Divination in Sleep (Hansberger 2008: 73–74; 2010: 158) have suggested that this work is a relevant source for the understanding of the Islamic philosophical conception of prophecy, including that of al-Fārābī. The Arabic On Divination in Sleep is an adulterated version of Aristotle’s text and provides a different explanation of veridical dreams within a Neoplatonic metaphysical framework, where a universal intellect distributes veridical dreams and some people with outstanding psychological capacities are able to receive them and interpret them.[4] Even though no explicit references are made to On Divination in Sleep in al-Fārābī’s The Virtuous City, there are noticeable similarities between the two treatises.

4. Doctrine on the Intellect

It has been mentioned that it is through the intellect that human beings know intelligibles, attain the sciences and the arts, and discern and reflect on practical matters. In The Treatise on the Intellect, known in Latin as De intellectu, al-Fārābī provides a complete account of the different senses of the term ‘aql (νοῦς, intellect or reason) starting with (1) the use that most people have given to the term, then (2) the way in which Islamic theologians have used it and, (3) finally, the different senses it has in Aristotle’s works, concretely, in Posterior Analytics, Nicomachean Ethics, On the Soul, and Metaphysics (al-Fārābī LI: 3–4; OI: 68).

Most people use the term ‘aql to describe the capacity that enables a person to discern which deeds are virtuous and which are not by means of deliberation. This first sense is very close to Aristotle’s conception of prudence. Similarly, Islamic theologians use this term to refer to those actions that are accepted or repudiated in general or by the majority. More important for our purposes in this article are the different senses of the term in the Aristotelian corpus. According to al-Fārābī, in Posterior Analytics 2.19, ‘aql is understood as a faculty of the soul by means of which certainty about necessary, true, and universal premises is attained. Premises of this kind are not arrived at by means of syllogisms, but are present in the subject in a prior way, either by nature or without one being aware of how these premises were acquired. Hence, this faculty is some part of the soul by which humans have access to the first principles of the theoretical sciences. I shall refer to this use of the term in detail in the final section of this article (al-Fārābī LI: 5–9; OI: 69–70).

In Nicomachean Ethics 6.6, Aristotle uses the term νοῦς to refer to a part of the soul, namely prudence (φρονησις / ta‘aqqul), the ability to apprehend through experience the principles of practical matters. Certainly, just as Aristotle refers to the first principles of the theoretical sciences, he holds—and al-Fārābī after him—that there are also first principles of the practical sciences.[5] Another sense is found in On the Soul 3.4 where, according to al-Fārābī, Aristotle divides the intellect into (1) potential (also known as material or passive) (‘aql bi-l-quwah), (2) actual or intellect in actuality (‘aql bi’l-fi‘l), (3) acquired intellect (‘aql al-mustafāḍ), and (4) active or agent intellect (‘aql al-fa ‘‘āl) (al-Fārābī LI: 9–11; LC: 215; OI: 70–71). Notice that these stages are not present in Aristotle’s On the Soul, but in Alexander’s On the Intellect. This is one of the aspects that show evidence that al-Fārābī draws extensively upon Alexander, as several scholars have noticed (Davidson 1992: 48–63 & 65–70; Geoffroy 2002: 191–231; Vallat 2004: 33–42). Finally, in Metaphysics Lambda, according to al-Fārābī’s account, Aristotle refers to the First Principle of existing things as the First Intellect (al-Fārābī LI: 35–36; OI: 78).

Given the purpose of this article, the account of the intellect as used in the psychological context of the On the Soul deserves deeper consideration (al-Fārābī LI: 12–35; LC: 215–221; OI: 71–78). This approach is exhaustively examined both in The Treatise on the Intellect and in The Virtuous City. In the latter there is a complete account of the way in which the rational or intellectual faculty acts (al-Fārābī VC: 196–211). Once al-Fārābī has explained the role of the imaginative faculty as that which provides the intellect with impressions attained through the senses, he next explains the process whereby they become intelligibles in act. Following Aristotle and the Aristotelian tradition, al-Fārābī describes the intellect as being itself potential or, using Alexander’s terminology, an innate “natural disposition” (ἐπιτηδειότης / isti‘dād) (al-Fārābī VC: 198–199; Geoffroy 2002: 204). This kind of intellect is frequently called “potential”, “material”, or “passive”, and is simply the rational faculty with which all human beings are endowed.

In The Treatise on the Intellect al-Fārābī refers to the material intellect (νοῦς ὑλικὸς, a Greek term coined by Alexander) as a soul or part of the soul, or one of the faculties of the soul, or something that is in potency to abstract the forms from their matter and turning these into forms for itself (al-Fārābī LI: 12–16; LC: 215; OI: 71–72).[6] When these forms are abstracted, they become intelligibles or forms for the material intellect. It can be rightly said that for al-Fārābī the material intellect is like the matter where the abstracted forms come to be, where the material intellect itself becomes the abstracted forms, just as the imprinted object leaves its mark on a piece of wax.

Before a form of the objects outside the soul has been abstracted, the material intellect is just in potency to receive those forms or potential intelligibles; but when these latter come to be in the material intellect, the material intellect becomes an actual intellect, and the potential intelligibles are actualized. Now, the existence of actual intelligibles is different from their existence as potential intelligibles or forms in matter. When external to the soul and linked to matter, forms are affected by place, time, position, quantity, and the like. But when forms are actualized in the soul, many of these qualities are removed and their existence thus becomes different from their former existence as forms of bodies outside the soul (al-Fārābī LI: 16–17; LC: 216; OI: 72).

Since the actual intellect becomes itself the actual intelligibles, then they are one and the same thing: what is understood is not different from the intellect itself, since the actual intelligible has become the form of the actual intellect. If other intelligibles come to be in the actual intellect, they will also be actualized. As a consequence, the actual intellect will be able to understand on its own and not by means of forms in matter outside from itself. When this stage of intellection is attained, the actual intellect becomes the so-called “acquired” intellect (al-Fārābī LI: 19–21; LC: 216–217; OI: 72–73).

Whereas forms linked to matter have to be abstracted in order to become actual intelligibles in the actual intellect, the process of abstraction is not required in the case of forms separate from matter, that is, the separate entities that belong to the supralunar realm. These separate forms are grasped by the intellect not as actual intellect but as the acquired intellect, and thus become forms for it. Moreover, the acquired intellect is a perfection of the human intellect because it has no need to perform the activity of abstraction in order to grasp forms existing separately from matter. In other words, it is the acquired intellect that enables the grasping of separate forms through the assistance of the active intellect. Evidently, this view differs from Aristotle’s original stance, since al-Fārābī, once again following Alexander, links psychology and cosmology, that is, the acquired intellect and the active intellect.

Regarding the active intellect, as mentioned in the first section, this intellect is a separate form, which is not linked to matter, and has never been and never will be. According to al-Fārābī, in its species the active intellect is an actual intellect quite similar to the acquired intellect. The active intellect is what turns the material intellect into an actual intellect and what turns the potential intelligibles into actual intelligibles. To describe the assistance of the active intellect in this process, al-Fārābī resorts to the well-known analogy of light, used by Aristotle in On the Soul 3, which raised a great deal of discussion among late ancient and medieval commentators of Aristotle.

The way al-Fārābī builds the referred analogy echoes Alexander and Themistius (Davidson 1992: 50). Al-Fārābī describes the relationship of the active intellect and the material intellect as that held between the sun and sight (al-Fārābī LI: 24–27; LC: 218–219; OI: 74–75). As H. A. Davidson (1992: 50–51) states, the analogy is built upon Aristotle’s theory of vision, but al-Fārābī stresses the sun as the source of the light.[7] Therefore, al-Fārābī equates the sun as the source of light with the active intellect, and not with the light itself. In this sense, following Davidson’s description, the light from the sun does four things: (1) it enters the eye and turns its potential vision into actual vision; (2) it enables potentially visible colors to become visible in actuality; (3) it itself becomes visible to the eye; and (4) it renders the sun, its source, visible to the eye. The analogy works as follows: (1) the active intellect turns the material or passive intellect into intellect in actuality; (2) it transforms potential intelligibles (sense impressions stored in the imaginative faculty) into actual intelligibles; (3) it itself becomes an intelligible object for the human intellect; and (4) it renders the active intellect as an intelligible object for the human intellect. With this analogy al-Fārābī suggests that the active intellect provides some sort of illumination or flow of light by which the human intellect is actualized enabling it to grasp the forms by abstraction.

Through the intellective process described, the active intellect makes the forms that are in matter progressively more immaterial and brings about the acquired intellect. Since the acquired intellect is of the same sort as the active intellect, the human intellect thus becomes progressively closer to the active intellect. In the view of al-Fārābī, this is precisely the ultimate goal and happiness (sa‘ādah) of human beings, and constitutes the way in which they attain definitive perfection: through the intellectual process the acquired intellect gradually becomes a substance that performs the action by virtue of which it realizes itself fully as substance and, in this way, remains in existence in the afterlife (hayāh al-ākhīrah) (al-Fārābī LI: 27; 31–32; LC: 219–220; OI: 75–76). Through this gradual process of perfection, the acquired intellect ends up acting only within itself, equating its own action with its own existence. When this stage is reached, the body is no longer needed as its matter in order to subsist, whereas it was initially needed for actions such as sensation and imagination to take place. Hence, the most perfect state the intellect can achieve is when it can subsist independently from the body. Nevertheless, the way in which al-Fārābī understood the relation between the acquired and agent intellects, was harshly criticized by Averroes who judged it impossible to conceive the transformation of the material intellect within the perishable human being into an immaterial and eternal substance at the level of the agent intellect (Averroes LCD: 387–388).

5. Theory of Scientific Knowledge

As mentioned in the previous section, the term ‘aql (intellect) is used in different ways. We have dealt with the way in which al-Fārābī uses it in the psychological context of Aristotle’s treatise On the Soul. However, in his account of the different senses of the term, al-Fārābī also refers to its use in Posterior Analytics 2.19, where Aristotle uses the term νοῦς in an epistemological context when he talks about a faculty of the soul by means of which certainty about necessary, true, and universal premises is attained. In his Aphorisms al-Fārābī describes the theoretical intellect in the same terms when he says that this intellect

is the faculty by which we attain by nature, and not by examination or syllogistic reasoning, certain knowledge concerning the necessary, universal premises that are principles of the sciences. (al-Fārābī SA: §34, 28–29)

By “principles of the sciences”, al-Fārābī refers to principles such as ‘the whole is greater than the part,’ ‘amounts equal to a single amount are mutually equal,’ and premises of this kind, following Aristotle explicitly once again. These premises are the first point from which a thing is known or comes to be known (Aristotle Metaphysics 5, 1013a18). As explained earlier, the human intellect passes from potency to act through the assistance of the active intellect, and when the intellect in act becomes acquired intellect and reaches the capacity to understand on its own, this means that it already has the actual disposition to infer and reason by itself. In other words, the intellect has attained the habit of knowledge, and therefore is able to attain scientific knowledge (‘ilm). Al-Fārābī’s understanding of “scientific knowledge”, has nothing to do with the modern notion of “science”; rather he is using Aristotle’s notion of apodeixis, that is, a type of knowledge that guarantees certainty, and is confined to mathematics and metaphysics. In this respect, Aristotle and the Aristotelian tradition after him are far from modern experimental science, since the main concern of the former is the attainment of absolute certainty. According to al-Fārābī, scientific knowledge is a virtue of the theoretical intellect that enables the rational soul to attain certainty about those beings whose existence and constitution do not depend on human artifice, as well as what those beings are and how they are,

from demonstrations composed of accurate, necessary, and primary premises of which the intellect becomes certain and attains knowledge by nature. (al-Fārābī SA: §35, 29)

This language resembles that found in Posterior Analytics 2.19, and also in Nicomachean Ethics 6.3.

Following al-Fārābī’s explanation of ‘ilm in his Aphorisms, there are two types of scientific knowledge: (1) becoming certain of the existence and the reason of the existence of a thing, and why it cannot possibly be otherwise; and (2) becoming certain of the existence of a thing and why it cannot be something else, but without considering the reason for its existence.

Al-Fārābī goes on to define scientific knowledge as being accurate, certain, and steadfast in any given moment, which means it does not change through time and does not go in and out of existence. Certainty cannot contain doubt and falsehood, since what can in any way be false cannot be considered certain or be said to be knowledge. For this very reason, al-Fārābī points out that the ancients did not consider sensation of what can change as knowledge; rather, scientific knowledge is confined to the “certainty” about the existence of things that cannot possibly change. In order to explain this al-Fārābī offers the example of the number three being always an odd number, and how it cannot be otherwise.

The notion of “certainty” (yaqīn) has a relevant place in al-Fārābī’s epistemology and is linked also to his conception of the logical arts. In fact, he understands logic (manṭiq) as a tool (ālah) that leads to certainty when used correctly. He conceives five logical arts: demonstration, dialectic, sophistry, rhetoric, and poetics (al-Fārābī ES: 37–45). Dialectic engenders belief (ẓann) through arguments built upon generally-accepted opinions; sophistry is a logical art that makes general opinions appear true; rhetoric persuades by means of appealing elocutions; poetics persuades by means of alluring or repulsive images; finally, demonstration, the highest of the logical arts, leads to certainty by means of universal and necessary premises.[8] The non-demonstrative logical arts—dialectic, sophistry, rhetoric, and poetics—engender opinion in different degrees whereas, in contrast, demonstration engenders certainty. However, in some places al-Fārābī admits that it could be the case that these non-demonstrative arts would lead to assent to beliefs in a way very close to certainty (al-Fārābī KB: 20–21; BD: 64–65). For this reason, as D. Black (2006: 11–45) has pointed out, it is important to distinguish in al-Fārābī between “certainty” (yaqīn) and “absolute certainty” (al-yaqīn ‘alā al-iṭlāq).

There are two works where al-Fārābī treats the notion of absolute certainty in detail. The first is his Book of Demonstration (Kitāb al-burhān) and the second is the Book on the Conditions of Certitude (Kitāb Šara’iṭ al-yaqīn). In both treatises al-Fārābī provides some conditions for absolute certainty. The second treatise contains an exhaustive account of these conditions, six in number: (1) to believe that something is in some way and not another, (2) to agree that this belief corresponds and is not opposed to the external existence of the thing, (3) to know the correspondence between the belief of the existence and the existence of the thing in reality, (4) to know that it is not possible for this correspondence to happen and there to be opposition, (5) to know that opposition between belief and reality cannot happen at any time, and (6) to know that all this is not accidental, but essential (al-Fārābī KY: 98). According to D. Black (2006: 16), these conditions can be understood as follows:

  • S believes that p (the belief condition);
  • p is true (the truth condition);
  • S knows that p is true (the knowledge condition);
  • it is impossible that p not be true (the necessity condition);
  • there is no time at which p can be false (the eternity condition); and,
  • conditions 1–5 hold essentially, not accidentally (the non-accidentality condition).

D. Black realizes that al-Fārābī’s first three conditions for certainty seem to evoke the traditional tripartite definition of knowledge as “justified true belief”, an essential and debated notion in contemporary epistemology. However, as D. Black herself notices, in al-Fārābī the justification condition, that is, ‘having good reasons or sufficient evidence to believe something,’ is replaced by the knowledge condition and, in this sense, knowledge itself becomes a necessary ingredient within certainty, and therefore is insufficient for raising a belief to the status of absolute certainty. For this reason, certainty for al-Fārābī requires two conditions from the knower: (1) to know that a proposition x is true, and (2) to know that she knows. This is very close, as D. Black notices, to what contemporary epistemology calls “second order-knowledge” (Black 2006: 19–21).

In the Book of Demonstration al-Fārābī states that the goal of scientific demonstration is precisely absolute or necessary certainty (al-Fārābī KB: 26; BD: 68). In a very short treatise entitled Introductory Letter on Logic (Risālah sudira bihā al-kitāb) al-Fārābī writes:

Philosophical discourse is called demonstrative. It seeks to teach and make clear the truth in the things which are such that they afford certain knowledge. (al-Fārābī IR: 231)

It seems, therefore, that al-Fārābī has a strict conception of demonstrative science inspired by Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics. Nevertheless, although al-Fārābī gives demonstration and absolute certainty a relevant place in his conception of philosophy, he also considers that our knowledge is not limited to absolute certainty. He also takes into consideration other forms of knowledge that can lead us to what should be called non-necessary certainty, as is the case with the different kinds of knowledge we attain by means of the non-demonstrative logical arts. In this regard, al-Fārābī considers that from the different kinds of arguments we can conceive different degrees of certainty and therefore, different kinds of beliefs (from absolute certainty to non-necessary certainty or strong belief).


Primary Sources

Texts by al-Farabi

  • [LI] Risalat fī’l-‘aql (Letter on the Intellect), M. Bouyges (ed.), Beirut: Imprimerie Catholique, 1938.
  • [ES] Iḥṣā’ al-Ulūm (Enumeration of the Sciences), González Palencia (ed.), Madrid/Granada: CSIC, 1953.
  • [IR] “Introductory Risalah on Logic”, D. M. Dunlop (trans.), The Islamic Quarterly, 3 (1956–57): 224–235.
  • [KS] Kitāb al-siyāsa al-madaniyya (also Known as the Treatise on the Principles of Beings) [or Political Regime], F. M. Najjar (ed.), Beirut: Imprimerie Catholique, 1964.
  • [LC] “The Letter Concerning the Intellect”, A. Hyman (trans.), in Philosophy in the Middle Ages. The Christian, Islamic, and Jewish Traditions, Indianapolis & Cambridge: Hackett Publishing Company, 1973, pp. 215–221.
  • [VC] Mabādi’ ārā’ ahl al-madīnah al-fāḍilah (al-Farabi on the Perfect State) [also known as The Virtuous City], R. Walzer (trans.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1985.
  • [KB & KY] Kitāb al-Burhān wa Kitāb Šarā’iṭ al-yaqīn (Book of Demonstration and Book on the Conditions of Certitude), M. Fakhry (ed.), Beirut: Dar el-Machreq, 1986–1987.
  • [SA] “Fusūl al-Madanī (Selected Aphorisms)”, C. E. Butterworth (trans.), in The Political Writings. Selected Aphorisms and Other Texts, Ithaca/London: Cornell University Press, 2001, pp. 11–67.
  • [PA] “The Philosophy of Aristotle”, C. E. Butterworth (trans.), in Philosophy of Plato and Aristotle, Ithaca, New York: Cornell University Press, 2001, pp. 71–130.
  • [BD] “Selections from Book of Demonstration”, J. McGinnis & D. C. Reisman (trans.), in Classical Arabic Philosophy. An Anthology of Sources, Indianapolis/Cambridge: Hackett Publishing Company, Inc., 2007, pp. 63–68.
  • [OI] “On the Intellect”, J. McGinnis & D. C. Reisman (trans.), in Classical Arabic Philosophy. An Anthology of Sources, Indianapolis/Cambridge: Hackett Publishing Company, Inc., 2007, pp. 68–78.
  • [PR] “Political Regime”, C. E. Butterworth (trans.), in The Political Writings II. “Political Regime” and “Summary of Plato’s Laws”, Ithaca, New York: Cornell University Press, 2015, pp. 27–94.

Other Primary Texts

  • Aristotle, The Complete Works of Aristotle, J. Barnes (ed.), Princeton: Bollingen, 1995.
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Secondary Sources

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  • Eastwood, B., 1979, “Al-Farabi on Extramission, Intromission, and the Use of Platonic Visual Theory”, Isis, 70: 423–425.
  • Freudenthal, G., 2003, “La quiddité de l’âme, traité populaire néoplatonisant faussement attribute à al-Fārābī: traduction annotée et commentée”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 13: 173–237.
  • Galston, M., 1981, “Al-Farabi on Aristotle’s Theory of Demonstration”, P. Morewedge (ed.), in Islamic Philosophy and Mysticism, New York: Caravan Books, pp. 23–34.
  • Geoffroy, M., 2002, “La tradition arabe du Περἰ νοῦ d’Alexandre d’Aphrodise et les origines de la théorie farabienne des quatre degrés de l’intellect”, C. D’Ancona & G. Serra (eds.), in Aristotele e Alessandro di Afrodisia nella Tradizione Araba, Padova: Il Poligrafo, pp. 191–231.
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  • –––, 2010, “Kitāb al-Ḥiss wa-l-maḥsūs: Aristotle’s Parva Naturalia in Arabic Guise”, C. Grellard & P.-M. Morel (eds.), in Les Parva naturalia d’Aristote: Fortune Antique et médiévale, Paris, Publications de la Sorbonne, pp. 143–162.
  • Janos, D., 2010, “The Greek and Arabic Proclus and al-Fārābī’s Theory of Celestial Intellection and its Relation to Creation”, Documenti e Studi sulla tradizione filosofica medievale, 19: 19–44.
  • –––, 2012, Method, Structure, and Development in al-Fārābī’s Cosmology, Leiden/Boston: Brill.
  • Mahdi, M., 2001, Alfarabi and the Foundation of Islamic Political Philosophy, Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Streetman, W. C., 2008, “‘If it were God who sent them…’: Aristotle and al-Fārābī on Prophetic Vision”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 18: 211–246.
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