Empirical Approaches to Altruism

First published Mon Jan 6, 2020

Many philosophers have maintained that altruism is a crucial component of morality, and that people often do behave altruistically. Other philosophers, along with many biologists and social scientists, have claimed that facts about human psychology, or about the evolutionary processes that have shaped human psychology, indicate that no human behavior is genuinely altruistic. Part of this disagreement can be traced to the fact that both philosophers and scientists use the term “altruism” with many quite different meanings. Sections 2, 3 and 4, set out a number of widely used accounts of altruism. One of these, “the standard account”, has been the focus of most of the debate in philosophy over the existence of altruism. Sections 5 and 6, review some of the most important empirical work aimed at determining whether humans can indeed behave altruistically, on the standard account.

1. Some Philosophical Background

People often behave in ways that benefit others, and they sometimes do this knowing that it will be costly, unpleasant or dangerous. But at least since Plato’s classic discussion in the second Book of the Republic, debate has raged over why people behave in this way. Are their motives really altruistic, or is their behavior ultimately motivated by self-interest? Famously, Hobbes gave this answer:

No man giveth but with intention of good to himself, because gift is voluntary; and of all voluntary acts, the object is to every man his own good; of which, if men see they shall be frustrated, there will be no beginning of benevolence or trust, nor consequently of mutual help. (1651 [1981]: Ch. 15)

Views like Hobbes’ have come to be called egoism,[1] and this rather depressing conception of human motivation has apparently been favored, in one form or another, by a number of eminent philosophical advocates, including Bentham, J.S. Mill and Nietzsche.[2] Egoism was also arguably the dominant view about human motivation in the social sciences for much of the twentieth century (Piliavin & Charng 1990: 28; Grant 1997). Dissenting voices, though perhaps fewer in number, have been no less eminent. Butler, Hume, Rousseau, and Adam Smith have all argued that, sometimes at least, human motivation is genuinely altruistic.

Though the issue dividing egoistic and altruistic accounts of human motivation is largely empirical, it is easy to see why philosophers have thought that the competing answers will have important consequences for moral theory. For example, Kant famously argued that a person should act “not from inclination but from duty, and by this would his conduct first acquire true moral worth” (1785 [1949]: Sec. 1, parag. 12). But egoism maintains that all human motivation is ultimately self-interested, and thus people can’t act “from duty” in the way that Kant urged. Thus if egoism is true, Kant’s account would entail that no conduct has “true moral worth”. Additionally, if egoism is true, it would appear to impose a strong constraint on how a moral theory can answer the venerable question “Why should I be moral?” since, as Hobbes clearly saw, the answer will have to ground the motivation to be moral in the agent’s self-interest.

There are related implications for political philosophy. If the egoists are right, then the only way to motivate prosocial behavior is to give people a selfish reason for engaging in such behavior, and this constrains the design of political institutions intended to encourage civic-minded behavior. John Stuart Mill, who was both a utilitarian and an egoist, advocated a variety of manipulative social interventions to engender conformity with utilitarian moral standards from egoistic moral agents.[3]

It is easy to find philosophers suggesting that altruism is required for morality or that egoism is incompatible with morality—and easier still to find philosophers who claim that other philosophers think this. Here are a few examples culled from a standard reference work that happened to be close at hand:

Moral behavior is, at the most general level, altruistic behavior, motivated by the desire to promote not only our own welfare but the welfare of others. (Rachels 2000: 81)

[O]ne central assumption motivating ethical theory in the Analytic tradition is that the function of ethics is to combat the inherent egoism or selfishness of individuals. Indeed, many thinkers define the basic goal of morality as “selflessness” or “altruism”. (W. Schroeder 2000: 396)

Philosophers since Socrates worried that humans might be capable of acting only to promote their own self-interest. But if that is all we can do, then it seems morality is impossible. (LaFollette 2000a: 5) [4]

While the egoism/altruism debate has historically been of great philosophical interest, the issue centrally concerns psychological questions about the nature of human motivation, so it’s no surprise that psychologists have done a great deal of empirical research aimed at determining which view is correct. The psychological literature will be center-stage in section 5, the longest section in this entry, and in section 6. But before considering the empirical literature, it is important to be clear on what the debate is about.

2. Defining “Egoism” and “Altruism”—The Standard Account

Providing definitions for “egoism” and “altruism” is a contentious matter, since these terms have been understood in radically different ways both in philosophy and in the biological and social sciences. In this entry the focus will be on the most widespread interpretation of “egoism” and “altruism”, understood as descriptive claims about human psychology, within philosophy. We’ll call it “the standard account”, versions of which have been offered by numerous authors including Broad (1950), Feinberg (1965 [1999]), Sober and Wilson (1998: Chs. 6 & 7), Rachels (2003: Ch. 6), Joyce (2006: Ch. 1), Kitcher (2010, 2011: Ch. 1), May (2011a), and many others. Not surprisingly, there are minor differences among the accounts provided by these authors, and those differences occasionally provoke disagreement in the literature. But all of them bear a strong family resemblance to the one we’re about to sketch.[5]

At the end of this section, a different account of altruism proposed in philosophy is briefly discussed. Biological accounts of altruism will be considered in section 3, and accounts proposed by social scientists will be discussed in section 4. But our present focus is the standard philosophical account.

As already intimated, while advocates of altruism and of egoism agree that people often help others, they disagree about why they do this. On the standard account, defenders of altruism insist that, sometimes at least, people are motivated by an ultimate desire for the well-being of another person, while defenders of egoism maintain that all ultimate desires are self-interested. This formulation invites questions about (1) what it is for a behavior to be motivated by an ultimate desire, and (2) the distinction between desires that are self-interested and desires for the well-being of others.

The first question, regarding ultimate desires, can be usefully explicated with the help of a familiar account of practical reasoning.[6] On this account, practical reasoning is a causal process via which a desire and a belief give rise to or sustain another desire. For example, a desire to drink an espresso and a belief that the best place to get an espresso is at the espresso bar on Main Street may cause a desire to go to the espresso bar on Main Street. This desire can then join forces with another belief to generate a third desire, and so on. Sometimes this process will lead to a desire to perform a relatively simple or “basic” action, and that desire, in turn, will cause the agent to perform the basic action without the intervention of any further desires. Desires produced or sustained by this process of practical reasoning are instrumental desires—the agent has them because she thinks that satisfying them will lead to something else that she desires. But not all desires can be instrumental desires. If we are to avoid circularity or an infinite regress there must be some desires that are not produced because the agent thinks that satisfying them will facilitate satisfying some other desire. These desires that are not produced or sustained by practical reasoning are the agent’s ultimate desires, and the objects of ultimate desires—the states of affairs desired—are often said to be desired “for their own sake”. A behavior is motivated by a specific ultimate desire when that desire is part of the practical reasoning process that leads to the behavior.

Although the second question, about the distinction between self-interested desires and desires for the well-being of others, would require an extended discussion in any comprehensive treatment of the debate between egoists and altruists, some rough and ready examples of the distinction will suffice here.[7] The desires that another person’s life be saved, that another person’s suffering be alleviated, or that another person be happy are paradigm cases of desires for the well-being of others, while desires to experience pleasure, get rich, and become famous are typical examples of self-interested desires. The self-interested desires to experience pleasure and to avoid pain have played an especially prominent role in the debate, since one version of egoism, often called hedonism, maintains that these are our only ultimate desires. Stich et al. (2010) maintain that some desires, like the desire that I myself be the one to alleviate my friend’s suffering, are hard to classify, and conclude that both egoism and altruism are best viewed as somewhat vague.[8]

Whether or not this is correct, it is clear that there are many desires that are neither self-interested nor desires for the well-being of others. One of the earliest examples was provided by Bishop Joseph Butler (1726 [1887]) who noted that revenge often engenders malevolent desires, like the desire that another person be harmed, which are obviously not desires for the well-being of the that person, and are not self-interested either.[9] Other examples include the desire that great works of art be preserved and the desire that space exploration be pursued. More interesting for moral theory are the desire to do one’s moral duty, and the desire to obey God’s commandments. If people have ultimate desires like these, then egoism is false. But, of course, the existence of ultimate desires like these would not show that altruism is true. The take-away from such cases is that on the standard account, egoism and altruism might both be mistaken.

Though interpretations of “altruism” in the standard account family predominate in the philosophical literature, some philosophers use the term in a very different way. A paper by Thomas Schramme (2017) provides a clear example.

[A]ltruism need not be reduced to its opposition to egoism. In this chapter, altruism is discussed as a psychological basis for moral conduct more generally, not just in terms of motivations to benefit others. Here altruism stands for the capacity to take the moral point of view and be disposed to act accordingly…. Seen in this way, altruism is a short word for the psychological phenomenon of the internalized pull of morality… (2017: 203–204).

Altruism is then basically identical with taking the moral point of view, i.e., an individual appreciation of the normative force of morality. (2017: 209). [10]

Schramme is, of course, aware that many authors reject “such a close connection of general moral motivation and altruistic motivation” but he maintains that this account of altruism “can certainly be found in the philosophical debate” (2017: 209). Much the same claim is made by Badhwar (1993: 90):

In the moral philosophy of the last two centuries, altruism of one kind or another has typically been regarded as identical with moral concern.

Schramme is surely right that

[t]he fact that we can understand altruism both as referring to moral behavior quite generally and as restricted to a more specific set of helping behaviors may lead to confusion. (2017: 204)

Though some philosophers may believe there is a substantive dispute about which account of altruism is correct, others think that the issue is purely terminological. As noted earlier, the primary concern in this entry is with what this entry dubs the “standard account” of altruism. But in the next two sections a number of accounts are considered that differ both from the standard account and from the account discussed by Schramme and Badhwar.

3. Altruism and Evolution

Readers familiar with some of the popular literature on the evolution of morality that has appeared in the last few decades might suspect that recent work in evolutionary biology has resolved the debate between egoists and altruists. For some readers—and some writers—seem to interpret evolutionary theory as showing that altruism is biologically impossible. If altruistic organisms were somehow to emerge, this literature sometimes suggests, they would lose the competition for survival and reproduction to their selfish conspecifics, and they would quickly become extinct. On this view, any appearance of altruism is simply an illusion. In the memorable words of biologist Michael Ghiselin (1974: 247) “Scratch an ‘altruist’ and watch a ‘hypocrite’ bleed”.

But as Sober and Wilson (1998) have argued with great clarity, there is no simple connection between evolutionary theory and the philosophical debate between egoism and altruism. This is because the concept of altruism that is important in evolutionary theory is quite different from the standard concept of altruism invoked in the philosophical debate. For biologists, an organism behaves altruistically if and only if the behavior in question reduces its own fitness while increasing the fitness of one or more other organisms. Roughly speaking, an organism’s fitness is a measure of how many descendants it will have.[11] As Sober and Wilson note, on this evolutionary account of altruism, an organism can be altruistic even if it does not have a mind capable of having beliefs and desires. Thus there can be no easy inference from biological altruism to psychological altruism. Nor does the inference go in the opposite direction. To make the point, Sober and Wilson (Ch. 10) note that natural selection might well equip humans or other psychologically sophisticated organisms with ultimate desires to foster the welfare of their offspring under certain circumstances. Organisms with these ultimate desires would be psychological altruists, though the behavior that the desires gave rise to would typically not be evolutionarily altruistic, since by helping their offspring organisms typically are increasing their own fitness. So, contrary to the presumption that evolutionary biology has resolved the debate between egoists and altruists in favor of egoism, it appears that evolutionary theory little to offer that will support that conclusion.[12]

4. Altruism in the Social Sciences

In recent decades there has been an enormous amount of discussion of altruism in psychology, sociology, economics, anthropology and primatology. Much of the work in psychology, including all of the work recounted in section 5, has adopted the “standard account” of altruism. But some psychologists, and many researchers in other disciplines, have something very different in mind. In a useful review of recent discussions of altruism, Clavien and Chapuisat lament the fact that

[t]he notion of altruism has become so plastic that it is often hard to understand what is really meant by the authors using the term, and even harder to evaluate the degree to which results from one research field—e.g., experimental economics—may facilitate the resolution of debates in another research field—e.g., evolutionary biology or philosophy. (2013: 134)

One of the notions that Clavien and Chapuisat find playing a role in evolutionary anthropology, evolutionary game theory and experimental economics is what they call “preference altruism”. “An action is altruistic”, in this sense, “if it results from preferences for improving others’ interests and welfare at some cost to oneself” (2013: 131). Though the agent’s psychology is relevant, on this account of altruism, there is no mention of the agent’s ultimate desires. Thus an action can be preference altruistic even if the agent’s preference for improving someone else’s welfare is an instrumental preference engendered by the belief that improving the recipient’s welfare will contribute to the agent’s own pleasure or treasure.

A second, quite different, concept of altruism invoked in these disciplines is what Clavien and Chapuisat call “behavioral altruism”. On this interpretation of altruism, an agent’s psychology plays no role in determining whether her action is altruistic.

A behavior is altruistic if it brings any kind of benefit to other individuals at some cost for the agent, and if there is no foreseeable way for the agent to reap compensatory benefits from her behavior. (2013: 131)

Ramsey (2016) makes a plausible case that some eminent primatologists and psychologists (including de Waal (2008) and Warneken and Tomasello (2008)) invoke an even less demanding account of altruism, one that requires that the recipient benefit but drops the requirement that altruistic behavior must involve some cost to the agent. Ramsey labels this notion “helping altruism”.

Combining accounts from philosophy, biology and the social sciences, Piccinini and Schulz (2019) offer a multidimensional taxonomy for different accounts of altruism, and argue that the distinctions they draw are essential for assessing the moral status of different kinds of altruism.

In reviewing the many different ways in which the term “altruism” has been used in the empirical and philosophical literature, it is hard to resist allusions to the biblical Tower of Babel. But for the remainder of this entry, these interpretations of “altruism” will be left behind. From here on, the focus will be on altruism as it is understood in the standard account.

5. The Egoism vs. Altruism Debate in Psychology

The psychological literature relevant to the egoism vs. altruism debate is vast;[13] in the interests of a tolerable brevity, the entry will focus on the work of Daniel Batson and his associates, who have done some of the most influential and philosophically sophisticated work in this area.

Batson, along with many other researchers, begins by borrowing an idea that has deep roots in philosophical discussions of altruism. Though the details and the terminology differ significantly from author to author, the core idea is that altruism is often the product of an emotional response to the distress of another person. Aquinas (1270 [1917]: II–II, 30, 3), for example, maintains that

mercy is the heartfelt sympathy for another’s distress, impelling us to succour him if we can.

And Adam Smith (1759 [1853]: I, I, 1. 1) tells us that

pity or compassion [is] the emotion we feel for the misery of others, when we either see it, or are made to conceive it in a very lively manner

and these emotions

interest [man] in the fortunes of others, and render their happiness necessary to him, though he derives nothing from it except the pleasure of seeing it.

Batson (1991: 58) labels this response “empathy” which he characterizes as “an other-oriented emotional reaction to seeing someone suffer”, and calls the traditional idea that empathy leads to altruism the empathy-altruism hypothesis. On Batson’s account (1991: 86), empathy

includes feeling sympathetic, compassionate, warm, softhearted, tender, and the like, and according to the empathy-altruism hypothesis, it evokes altruistic motivation

though that motivation does not always lead to behavior. Batson (1991: 117) contrasts empathy with a cluster of affective responses he calls “personal distress” which is “made up of more self-oriented feelings such as upset, alarm, anxiety, and distress”.[14]

If the philosophical tradition that suggests the empathy-altruism hypothesis is on the right track, and Batson believes it is, one would predict that when people feel empathy they will desire to help those who evoke the emotion, and thus be more inclined to engage in helping behavior than people who do not feel empathy. This does not mean that people will always engage in helping behavior when they feel empathy, since people may often have conflicting desires, and not all conflicts are resolved in favor of empathy’s urgings. Nor does it mean that when people feel little or no empathy they will not engage in helping behavior, since the desire to help can also be produced by a variety of processes in which empathy plays no role. But we should expect that typically people feeling empathy will be more likely to help than people who aren’t feeling empathy, and the stronger their feelings of empathy the more likely it is that they will engage in helping behavior.

In order to put this claim to empirical test, it is important to have ways of inducing empathy in the laboratory, and there is a substantial body of literature suggesting how this can be done. For example, Stotland (1969) showed that subjects who were instructed to imagine how a specified person (often called “the target”) felt when undergoing what subjects believed to be a painful medical procedure reported stronger feelings of empathy and showed greater physiological arousal than subjects who were instructed to watch the target person’s movements.[15] Relatedly, Krebs (1975) demonstrated that subjects who observe someone similar to themselves undergo painful experiences show more physiological arousal, report identifying with the target more strongly, and report feeling worse while waiting for the painful stimulus to begin than do subjects who observe the same painful experiences administered to someone who is not similar to themselves. Krebs also showed that subjects are more willing to help at some personal cost when the sufferer is similar to themselves. Batson (1991: 82–87) interprets these findings as indicating that people are more inclined to feel empathy for those they believe to be similar to themselves, and thus that empathy can often be induced by providing a person with evidence that she and a target person are similar.

To make the case that empathy leads to helping behavior, Batson relies in part on work by others, including the just-cited Krebs (1975) study and a study by Dovidio et al. (1990). In that latter study, Stotland’s technique for manipulating empathy by instructing subjects to take the perspective of the person in distress was used to induce empathy for a young woman. Subjects focused on one of two quite different problems that the young woman faced. When given an opportunity to help the young woman, subjects in whom empathy had been evoked were more likely to help than subjects in a low empathy condition, and the increase in helping was specific to the problem that had evoked the empathy.

Many of Batson’s own experiments, some of which are described below, also support the contention that both spontaneously evoked empathy and empathy engendering experimental manipulations increase the likelihood of helping behavior. Another important source of support for the link between empathy and helping behavior is a meta-analysis of a large body of experimental literature by Eisenberg and Miller (1987) which found positive correlations between empathy and prosocial behavior in studies using a variety of techniques to assess empathy. On the basis of these and other findings, Batson (1991: 95) argues that

there is indeed an empathy-helping relationship; feeling empathy for a person in need increases the likelihood of helping to relieve that need.

It might be thought that establishing a causal link between empathy and helping behavior would be bad news for egoism. But, as Batson makes clear, the fact that empathy leads to helping behavior does not resolve the dispute between egoism and altruism, since it does not address the nature of the motivation for the helping behavior that empathy evokes. One possibility is that empathy does indeed cause a genuinely altruistic desire to help—an ultimate desire for the well-being of the sufferer. But there are also a variety of egoistic routes by which empathy might lead to helping behavior. Perhaps the most obvious of these is that empathy might simply be (or cause) an unpleasant experience, and that people are motivated to help because they believe this is the best way to stop the unpleasant experience that is caused by someone else’s distress.

Quite a different family of egoistic possibilities focus on the rewards to be expected for helping and/or the punishments to be expected for withholding assistance. If people believe that others will reward or sanction them for helping or failing to help in certain circumstances, and that the feeling of empathy marks those cases in which social sanctions or rewards are most likely, then we would expect people to be more helpful when they feel empathy, even if their ultimate motivation is purely egoistic. A variation on this theme focuses on rewards or punishments that are self-administered. If people believe that helping may make them feel good, or that failing to help may make them feel bad, and that these feelings will be most likely to occur in cases where they feel empathy, then once again we would expect people who empathize to be more helpful, though their motives may be not at all altruistic.

During the last four decades, Batson and his collaborators have systematically explored these egoistic hypotheses and many others. Their strategy is to design experiments in which the altruistic explanation of the link between empathy and helping can be compared to one or another specific egoistic explanation. Reviewing all of these experiments would require a far longer entry.[16] Instead the focus will be on two clusters of experiments that illustrate the potential philosophical rewards of designing and interpreting experiments in this area, as well as some difficulties with the project.

5.1 The Social Punishment Hypothesis

One of the more popular egoist alternatives to the empathy-altruism hypothesis is the idea that people engage in helping behavior because they fear that other people will punish them if they do not. If I don’t help, the actor is supposed to worry, people will be angry or they will think badly of me, and this may have negative effects on how they treat me in the future. As it stands, this egoist hypothesis can’t explain the fact that empathy increases the likelihood of helping, but a more sophisticated version is easy to construct by adding the assumption that people think social sanctions for not helping are more likely when the target engenders empathy.

To test this hypothesis—which Batson calls the socially administered empathy-specific punishment hypothesis—against the empathy-altruism hypothesis, Batson and his associates (Fultz et al. 1986) designed an experiment in which they manipulated both the level of empathy that subjects felt for the target and the likelihood that anyone would know whether or not the subject had opted to help a person in need. Others can form a negative evaluation of your decision not to help only if they know the choice you are facing and the decision you have made; if your decision is secret, you need have no fear of social sanctions. Thus the socially administered empathy-specific punishment hypothesis predicts that subjects who exhibit high empathy on a given occasion will be more likely to help when they believe others will know if they fail to do so. On the empathy-altruism hypothesis, by contrast, high empathy subjects are motivated by an ultimate desire to help, and thus their helping levels should be high whether or not others would know if they decided not to help. In the low empathy condition, both hypotheses predict that levels of helping will be low. These predictions are summarized in Tables 1 and 2.

Potential for Negative Social Evaluation Empathy
Low High
High Low High
Low Low Low
Level of Empathy
Level of Helping

Table 1. Predictions About the Amount of Helping (Low or High) on the Socially Administered Empathy-Specific Punishment Hypothesis.

Potential for Negative Social Evaluation Empathy
Low High
High Low High
Low Low High
Level of Empathy
Level of Helping

Table 2. Predictions About the Amount of Helping (Low or High) on the Empathy-Altruism Hypothesis.

Subjects in the experiment were told that they were participating in an impression formation study, and that they had been randomly assigned to the role of “listener” in which they would read confidential notes from another student participant, the “communicator”. They were given two notes from Janet Arnold, an out-of-state freshman who reveals that she is very lonely and hoping to find a friend. After completing a form on which subjects indicated their impressions of Janet and their emotional responses to her note, they were presented with an unexpected opportunity to befriend Janet by volunteering to take part in a study of long-term relationships involving an initial meeting with Janet and periodic phone interviews about the development of their friendship. Participants who were willing to help were asked how much time they were willing to spend with Janet during the next month.

To manipulate empathy, Batson and his associates used the Stotland technique. Subjects assigned to the low-empathy condition were instructed to

Read the information in the communicator’s notes carefully, trying to be as objective as possible. Try to focus on the techniques used to get the communicator’s message across.

Subjects assigned to the high-empathy condition were instructed to

Read the information in the communicator’s notes carefully, trying to take the perspective of the individual writing the notes. Try to imagine how this individual feels about what he or she writes. (1991: 132)

Four steps were taken to manipulate the perceived potential for negative social evaluation. In the low-potential condition (1991: 132):

  1. Subjects were told that they would be the only person ever to read the communicator’s notes, and the notes were delivered in a sealed envelope.
  2. Subjects were assured that the questionnaires reporting their reactions to Janet’s note would be anonymous.
  3. Subjects’ responses to the invitation to participate in the long-term relationship study were returned to the professor in a sealed envelope, so no one would know if they did not want to help Janet. (Since they believed the professor had not read Janet’s note, they could be expected to surmise that he would not know that Janet needed a friend.)
  4. In the letter inviting them to participate in the relationship study, subjects were told that Janet would be contacted “only if you want a meeting; if you do not, then we will not contact the communicator and he or she will not know that you were ever asked about actually meeting”.

In the high-potential condition (1991: 133):

  1. Subjects were told that the experimenter would read the communicator’s notes. Also, the experimenter would collect the questionnaire when the subject completed it and would compare the content of the notes with the impressions the subject formed.
  2. No envelope was provided for their response to the invitation to participate in the long-term relationship study, so subjects could infer that the experimenter would know about Janet’s need for a friend, about their emotional reaction to Janet, and would also know whether or not they had agreed to help Janet.
  3. Subjects were told that Janet would know if they decided not to help.

As Batson notes, procedures in the high-potential condition

were designed to highlight the possibility of negative social evaluation if the participant decided not to volunteer to spend time with Janet.

Potential for Negative Social Evaluation Empathy
Low High
High 0.67 1.71
Low 1.29 2.44
Level of Empathy
Level of Helping

Table 3. Amount of Help Offered Janet, given as the mean amount of time participants offered to spend with Janet (Fultz et al. 1986, Study 2)

The results, given in Table 3, indicate that the socially administered empathy-specific punishment hypothesis did not fare well. On the basis of this experiment and a similar experiment in which empathy for Janet was not manipulated but was measured by self-report, Batson concludes that the socially administered empathy-specific punishment hypothesis is not consistent with the experimental facts.

Contrary to what the social-evaluation version of the empathy-specific punishment hypothesis predicted, eliminating anticipated negative social evaluation in these two studies did not eliminate the empathy-helping relationship. Rather than high empathy leading to more help only under high social evaluation, it led to more helping under both low and high social evaluation. This pattern of results is not consistent with what would be expected if empathically aroused individuals are egoistically motivated to avoid looking bad in the eyes of others; it is quite consistent with what would be expected if empathy evokes altruistic motivation to reduce the victim’s need (Batson 1991: 134).

Though two experiments hardly make a conclusive case, these studies make the socially administered empathy-specific punishment hypothesis look significantly less plausible than the empathy-altruism hypothesis. So one popular egoist hypothesis has been dealt a serious blow: high empathy subjects were more likely to help whether or not they could expect their behavior to be socially scrutinized. At least in some circumstances, empathy appears to facilitate helping independently of the threat of social sanction.

5.2 The Aversive-Arousal Reduction Hypothesis

Another popular egoistic strategy for explaining the link between empathy and helping behavior is the aversive-arousal reduction hypothesis, which maintains that witnessing someone in need, and the empathy it evokes, is an unpleasant or aversive experience, and that helping is motivated by the desire to diminish that aversive experience.[17] If this is right, Batson maintains, people in a high empathy condition will sometimes have two quite different ways of reducing the aversive experience—they can help the person in need or they can simply leave. Which strategy a person adopts will depend, in part, on how difficult or costly it is to depart the scene. If escape is easy, people will be more likely to take that option, while if leaving is more difficult people will be more likely to help, since that is a less costly way of ending the aversive experience. If, on the other hand, the empathy-altruism hypothesis is correct and empathy leads to genuinely altruistic motivation, one would expect people in a high empathy condition to help whether escape is easy or hard, since only helping will satisfy an altruistic desire.

Altruism and egoism both allow that even in the absence of empathy, an emotionally disturbing need situation will produce feelings of personal distress, thus they would both predict that people in a low empathy condition will be more inclined to help when escape is difficult, and less inclined when escape is easy. Batson summarizes these predictions in Tables 4 and 5 (Batson 1991: 111).

Escape Empathy
Low High
Easy Low Low
Difficult High High/Very High
Level of Empathy
Level of Helping

Table 4. Predictions from the Aversive-Arousal Reduction Hypothesis for the Rate of Helping in an Escape X Empathy Design

Escape Empathy
Low High
Easy Low High
Difficult High High
Level of Empathy
Level of Helping

Table 5. Predictions from the Empathy-Altruism Hypothesis for the Rate of Helping in an Escape X Empathy Design

To test these predictions, Batson and his associates conducted a total of six experiments. In one of these (experiment 1 in Batson, Duncan, et al. 1981), student subjects were required to watch, via what they believed to be closed circuit TV transmission—actually a scripted video recording—as another student subject, Elaine—actually a confederate—attempted to perform a task while receiving electric shocks at random intervals. Observer subjects were told that their task would be to form and report an impression of how Elaine performs under aversive conditions. On the tape, Elaine is clearly finding the shocks very uncomfortable, and after her second trial at doing the task, she explains to Martha, the assistant administering the shocks, that she is unusually sensitive to mild electric shocks because of a childhood trauma. Martha then suggests that perhaps the observer subject might be willing to help Elaine by taking her place, and the experimenter asks whether the subject is willing to do that. To manipulate ease of escape, some subjects were told that if they decide not to take Elaine’s place, they will be required to watch eight additional trials, while other subjects were told that if they decide not to take Elaine’s place they are free to go. To manipulate the level of empathy that subjects feel for Elaine, subjects were given a copy of a personal values and interests questionnaire, allegedly filled out by Elaine, in order to help them form an impression of her performance. In the high empathy condition, Elaine’s values and interests were very similar to the subject’s (which had been determined in a screening session several weeks before), while in the low empathy condition, they were very different.

The results, given in Table 6, clearly exhibit the pattern predicted by the empathy-altruism hypothesis, not the pattern predicted by the aversive-arousal reduction hypothesis.

Escape Empathy
Low High
Easy 0.18 0.91
Difficult 0.64 0.82
Level of Empathy
Level of Helping

Table 6. Proportion of Subjects Agreeing to Take Shocks for Elaine (Batson, Duncan, et al. 1981, Experiment 1)

In additional experiments, Batson and his associates used four different techniques to create the low- and high-empathy conditions, two techniques for manipulating ease of escape, and two different need situations (Batson, Duncan, et al. 1981; Toi and Batson 1982; Batson, O’Quin et al. 1983). The results in all of these experiments exhibited the same pattern. Intriguingly, in another experiment, Batson and colleagues attempted to break the pattern by telling the subjects that the shock level they would have to endure was the highest of four options, “clearly painful but not harmful”. They reasoned that, under these circumstances, even if high empathy subjects had an ultimate desire to help, this desire might well be overridden by the desire to avoid a series of very painful shocks. As expected, the pattern of results in this experiment fit the pattern in Table 4.

These are impressive findings. Over and over again, in well designed and carefully conducted experiments, Batson and his associates have produced results which are clearly compatible with the predictions of the empathy-altruism hypothesis, as set out in Table 5, and clearly incompatible with the predictions of the aversive-arousal reduction hypothesis, as set out in Table 4. Even the “clearly painful shock” experiment, which produced results in the pattern of Table 4, are comfortably compatible with the empathy-altruism hypothesis; as noted earlier, the empathy-altruism hypothesis allows that high empathy subjects may have desires that are stronger than their ultimate desire to help the target, and the desire to avoid a painful electric shock is a very plausible candidate.

There is, however, a problem to be overcome before one concludes that the aversive-arousal reduction hypothesis cannot explain the findings that Batson and his associates have reported. In arguing that Table 4 reflects the predictions made by the aversive-arousal reduction hypothesis, Batson must assume that escape will alleviate the aversive affect in both low & high empathy situations, and that subjects believe this (although the belief may not be readily available to introspection). One might call this the out of sight, out of mind assumption. Elaborating on an idea suggested by Hoffman (1991) and Hornstein (1991), an advocate of egoism might propose that although subjects do believe this when they have little empathy for the target, they do not believe it when they have high empathy for the target. Perhaps high empathy subjects believe that if they escape they will continue to be troubled by the thought or memory of the distressed target and thus that physical escape will not lead to psychological escape. Indeed, in cases where empathy is strong and is evoked by attachment, this is just what common sense would lead us to expect. Do you really believe that if your mother was in grave distress and you left without helping her you would not continue to be troubled by the knowledge that she was still in distress? We’re guessing that you don’t. But if the high-empathy subjects in Batson’s experiments believe that they will continue to be plagued by distressing thoughts about the target even after they depart, then the egoistic aversive-arousal reduction hypothesis predicts that these subjects will be inclined to help in both the easy physical escape and the difficult physical escape conditions, since helping is the only strategy they believe will be effective for reducing the aversive arousal. So neither the results reported in Table 6 nor the results of any of Batson’s other experiments would give us a reason to prefer the empathy-altruism hypothesis over the aversive-arousal reduction hypothesis, because both hypotheses make the same prediction.

Is it the case that high empathy subjects in experiments like Batson’s believe that unless they help they will continue to think about the target and thus continue to feel distress, and that this belief leads to helping because it generates an egoistic instrumental desire to help? This is, of course, an empirical question, and a cleverly designed experiment by Stocks and his associates (Stocks et al. 2009) suggests that, in situations like those used in Batson’s experiments, a belief that they will continue to think about the target does not play a significant role in causing the helping behavior in high empathy subjects.

Batson’s work on the aversive-arousal reduction hypothesis, buttressed by the Stocks et al. finding, is a major advance in the egoism vs. altruism debate. The aversive-arousal reduction hypothesis has been one of the most popular egoistic strategies for explaining helping behavior. But the experimental findings strongly suggest that in situations like those that Batson and his associates have studied, the empathy-altruism hypothesis offers a much better explanation of the subjects’ behavior than the aversive-arousal reduction hypothesis.

As noted earlier, Batson and his colleagues have also designed experiments pitting the empathy-altruism hypothesis against a substantial list of other egoistic explanations for the link between empathy and helping behavior. In each case, the evidence appears to challenge the egoistic alternative, though as is almost always the case in empirical work of this sort, some researchers remain unconvinced.[18] There is however, an influential critique of Batson’s work that challenges all of his experimental work on the empathy-altruism hypothesis. It argues that empathy and its precursors alter people’s self-concept in a way that undermines the claim that their helping behavior is genuinely altruistic.

5.3 The Challenge Posed by “Self-Other Merging”

During the last three decades, psychologists have devoted a great deal of effort to exploring how people think of the self. One major theme in this literature is that people’s conception of themselves varies across cultures, and that in many non-western cultures one’s social roles and one’s relation to other people play a much more central role in people’s self-concepts than they do in the individualistic West (Markus & Kitayama 1991; Baumeister 1998). One very simple way of studying these differences is to ask people to respond to the question “Who am I?” fifteen times. Non-westerners will typically mention social groups, group roles and relationships: “I am Maasai”, “I am a person who brings fruit to the temple”, “I am my father’s youngest son”. Westerners, by contrast, will typically mention personal attributes, aspirations and achievements: “I am intelligent”, “I am a pre-med student”, “I am the fastest swimmer in my school” (Ma & Schoeneman 1997). Another theme is that people’s conception of themselves is situationally malleable—it changes depending on who we are with, where we are and what we are doing (Kihlstrom & Cantor 1984; Markus & Wurf 1987).

While this sort of situational malleability may not be surprising, a number of psychologists have suggested a much more radical situational malleability. Under certain circumstances, notably when we have a close personal relationship with another person, when we are trying to take the perspective of another person, or when we feel empathy for another person, the conceptual boundary between the self and the other person disappears; the self and the other merge. According to Arthur Aron and colleagues,

Much of our cognition about the other in a close relationship is cognition in which the other is treated as self or confused with self—the underlying reason being a self-other merging. (Aron et al. 1980: 242)

If this is true, then it poses a fundamental challenge to the claim that helping behavior directed at someone for whom we feel empathy is really altruistic. For, as Melvin Lerner memorably observed:

It seems that we respond sympathetically, with compassion and a sense of concern, when we feel a sense of identity with the victim. In effect, we are reacting to the thought of ourselves in that situation. And, of course, we are filled with the “milk of human kindness” for our own sweet, innocent selves. (Lerner 1980: 77)

A bit less colorfully, Batson notes that for “the contrast between altruism and egoism to be meaningful”, an individual providing help “must perceive self and other to be distinct individuals” (2011: 145–146). And

if the distinction between self and other vanishes then so does the distinction between altruism and egoism, at least as these terms are used in the empathy-altruism hypothesis. (2011: 148)

Psychologists who have debated the rather astonishing claim that people who provide help to others often lose track of the distinction between themselves and the person being helped have proposed several different ways of determining whether this sort of “self-other merging” has occurred. Before considering these, however, we should remind ourselves of an important philosophical distinction that will be crucial in assessing tests for self-other merging.[19] The distinction is often made using the labels “qualitative identity” and “numerical identity”. Qualitative identity is the relation that often obtains between two TV sets manufactured by the same company. They share most of their important properties. Numerical identity is a relationship that obtains between a person at one time in his life and that same person at another time in his life. If the time gap is substantial, the person at the earlier time may differ in many ways from the person at the later time. When you were a baby, you weighed less than 10 kg, spoke no language, and couldn’t walk. But you now are numerically the same person as the baby. Numerical identity can be of enormous legal and moral importance, a point nicely illustrated by the trial of John Demjanuk, the Ukrainian-born auto worker who was accused of being the sadistic Nazi concentration camp guard whose victims called him “Ivan the Terrible”. The man on trial, in 1988, differed in many ways from the concentration camp guard: he was much older, heavier, bald, and spoke English. He was obviously not even close to being qualitatively identical with perpetrator of Ivan’s crimes. What the court had to determine was not whether Ivan and Demjanuk were qualitatively identical but whether they were numerically identical.[20] What makes this distinction important for present purposes is that the sort of identity that is relevant to the debate between egoists and altruists is numerical identity, not qualitative identity. If Sophia, at age 30, sets aside a large sum of money that will be paid to Sophia at age 70, young Sophia is not being altruistic. If her ultimate goal is to ensure that old Sophia has the means to live a comfortable life, then young Sophia’s action is straightforwardly egoistic. The take-home message here is that if a test used to determine whether person A takes herself to be identical to person B is to be relevant to the egoism versus altruism debate, the test must provide evidence that person A takes herself to be numerically identical to person B, not that she takes herself to be qualitatively identical to person B.

Now let’s consider how psychologists have attempted to assess whether experimental participants feel a sense of identity with someone they might be called on to help. In one of the most influential studies claiming to show that helping is often the product of a feeling of oneness, Cialdini et al. (1997) used a pair of tests.

[P]articipants rated the extent of oneness they felt with the [person they might help] by responding to two items that were combined in all analyses to form a oneness index. The first item incorporated the Inclusion of Other in Self (IOS) Scale used by Aron et al. (1992) to measure self-other boundary overlap. It consisted of a set of seven pairs of increasingly overlapping circles. Participants selected the pair of circles that they believed best characterized their relationship with the [person they might help]. The second item asked participants to indicate on a 7-point scale the extent to which they would use the term we to describe their relationship with the [person they might help]. (1997: 484)

In a critique of the Cialdini et al. paper, Batson, Sager, et al. (1997) used three measures of self-other merging. One was the IOS Scale used by Cialdini et al. The second was a “perceived similarity” task in which “[p]articipants were asked, ‘How similar to you do you think the person …is?’ (1 = somewhat, 9 = extremely)” (1997: 500). In the third, participants rated both themselves and the target on a series of personal attributes. The “measure of merging was the mean absolute difference between ratings of self and other” (1997: 498).

It does not seem that any of these four tests of self-other merging provide a reason to believe that the participant views herself as numerically identical with another person. Indeed, both the perceived similarity test and the personal attribute rating test seem to be assessing qualitative identity rather than numerical identity. And it is far from clear what, if anything, the other two tests are measuring. So it seems that there is really no evidence at all that people in close relationships lose track of the distinction between themselves and another person. Indeed, as May notes, if someone really did believe that he exists in two obviously distinct bodies, the most natural conclusion to draw would be that he is delusional (May 2011b: 32).

While the literature on self-other merging provides little reason to believe that normal people take themselves to be numerically identical with another person, it does provide a different kind of challenge to the empathy-altruism hypothesis defended by Batson and his colleagues. That hypothesis, it will be recalled, is that empathy often causes an ultimate desire to help another person. But in the Cialdini et al. (1977) paper cited earlier, they report three studies indicating that empathy, though it does occur, is not playing any causal role in the process that leads to helping. Rather, they maintain, it is “merging”—which is used here as a label for whatever the IOS scale and the use-of-we test measure—that is actually leading participants to help. Though the Cialdini et al. paper is quite sophisticated, Batson et al. (1997) pointed out a number of methodological problems. When they conducted a pair of experiments that avoided these methodological problems, the role of empathy in producing helping behavior was clearly evident. However, most experiments exploring the link between empathy and helping behavior, including this one, use a relatively small number of participants. And the “replication crisis” that has emerged in recent years has led many to worry about the robustness of the effects reported in experiments like these (Chambers 2017). McAuliffe et al. (2018) have addressed these concerns. Their high powered, pre-registered study, run on the internet, analyzed data from 680 participants. Their findings were “unambiguously supportive” (2018: 504) of the link between empathy and helping behavior.

5.4 Have Batson’s Studies Made a Convincing Case for the Existence of Altruism in Humans?

Batson’s answer to this question is clear.

Having reviewed the evidence from research designed to test the empathy-altruism hypothesis against the six egoistic alternatives …, it is time to come to a conclusion—albeit tentative—about the status of this hypothesis. The idea that empathy produces altruistic motivation may seem improbable given the dominance of Western thought by the doctrine of universal egoism. Yet, in the words of Sherlock Holmes, “When you have eliminated the impossible, whatever remains, however improbable, must be the truth”. It seems impossible for any known egoistic explanation of the empathy-helping relationship—or any combination of them—to account for the research evidence we have reviewed. So what remains? The empathy-altruism hypothesis. Pending new evidence or a plausible new egoistic explanation of the existing evidence, we seem forced to accept this improbable hypothesis as true. (Batson 2011: 160)[21]

Batson’s research program is compelling, and he certainly has shown that the empathy-altruism hypothesis is “in the hunt”, but his findings are not conclusive. There are a number of reasonable challenges to the methodology and the conclusions in some of Batson’s studies. Setting these out in detail is a substantial project (see Stich, Doris, & Roedder 2010). But there is also a plausible egoistic hypothesis that has not been systematically explored.

In recent years, a number of authors have made an impressive case for the hypothesis that belief in a “Big God”—a supernatural being who is omniscient, morally concerned, and acts as a policing agent in human affairs—played a crucial role in the transition from face-to-face “band level” human groups made up of at most a few hundred individuals to much larger tribal groups, and ultimately to chiefdoms and nation states (Norenzayan et al. 2016). These are provocative and controversial ideas. Much less controversial is the claim that many people believe that even when no other human can observe them, a supernatural being of some sort is aware of what they are doing and thinking, and that this being may punish thoughts and behavior it disapproves of and reward thoughts and behavior it approves of, with the punishments and rewards delivered either during the agent’s lifetime or after she dies.[22] In the experiments, described in section 5.1, designed to test the empathy-altruism hypothesis against the social punishment hypothesis, Batson and his colleagues went to great lengths to insure that participants in the “low potential for negative social evaluation” condition would think that no one knew of their decisions, and thus that no one would think badly of them or sanction them if they decided not to help. But, of course, none of the steps taken to insure secrecy would be effective in keeping an omniscient God from knowing what these participants had decided. So if we assume that many people believe an omniscient God wants them to help others in need, and that they believe Divine sanctions for not helping are more likely when the target engenders empathy,[23] the experiments do nothing to rule out a variation of the social punishment hypothesis which maintains that participants are motivated by a desire to avoid punishments administered by God.

The egoistic alternative just sketched, which might be called “the divine punishment hypothesis”, also leads to the pattern of predictions derived from the empathy-altruism hypothesis sketched in Table 5, and the results reported in Table 6. The bottom line is that using the Sherlock Holmes standard that Batson favors, there is still a lot of work to do. There is a family of egoistic hypotheses invoking beliefs in supernatural punishments—or supernatural rewards—that still needs to be ruled out before we accept the “improbable hypothesis” as true.[24]

6. Beyond Egoism vs. Altruism

In the colorful passage quoted at the beginning of section 5.4, Batson seems to suggest that in the debate between egoists and altruists there are only two possible outcomes. If all human behavior is ultimately motivated by self-interested desires, then the egoist wins; if some human behavior is motivated by ultimate desires for the well-being of other people, then the altruist wins. However, as noted in section 2, the dialectical landscape is more complex, for there are many desires that are neither self-interested nor desires for the well-being of other people. If any of these are ultimate desires that lead to behavior, then the egoist is mistaken. But, as Batson clearly recognizes, this would not vindicate altruism; both egoism and altruism might be mistaken.

Batson has used the term principlism for one family of ultimate desires that would support neither egoism nor altruism.

Principlism is motivation with the ultimate goal of upholding some moral principle—for example, a principle of fairness or justice, or the utilitarian principle of greatest good for the greatest number. (Batson 2011: 220)

Under some circumstances, one or another of these principles might require helping behavior, though that helping behavior would not be altruistic, since the ultimate desire motivating the behavior is to uphold the principle. On Batson’s view, we really don’t know much about principlism.

To the best of my knowledge, there is no clear empirical evidence that upholding justice (or any other moral principle) functions as an ultimate goal.[25] Nor is there clear empirical evidence that rules this possibility out. (Batson 2011: 224)

But if that’s right, then Batson’s conclusion that the empathy-altruism hypothesis is true and that people are sometimes altruistic is premature. For even if it were conceded that all the plausible egoistic alternatives to empathy-altruism have been excluded, the job of testing empathy-altruism against principalist alternatives has hardly begun. Moreover, the scope of that project may be much larger than Batson imagines.

One way to see this is to ask which action guiding principles are moral principles.[26] There is ongoing debate about this question in both philosophy and psychology (Stich 2018). Though Batson does not address that debate, the examples he offers (“fairness or justice or the utilitarian principle”) suggest that when he talks about moral principles he has a rather limited set of principles in mind. But if principlism is limited to a relatively small set of moral principles familiar from the philosophical literature, then principlism hardly exhausts the non-egoistic alternatives that defenders of psychological altruism must rule out. In recent years, there has been a growing body of work on the role of norms in human life, where norms are understood as action guiding rules that can govern just about any human activity. Researchers from a variety of disciplines have argued that norms, and a robust innate psychology for acquiring, storing and acting on norms, have played a fundamental role in shaping human culture and making humans the most successful large animal on the planet (Henrich 2015; Boyd 2018; Kelly & Davis 2018). Others have proposed accounts of norm psychology on which people have ultimate desires to comply with culturally acquired norms (Sripada & Stich 2006) and accounts of how a psychological system generating such ultimate desires might be favored by natural selection (Sripada 2008). The sorts of behavioral rules that count as norms in this literature might well include the sorts of moral principles that Batson had in mind when he characterized principlism. But these are only a small subset of the norms that these researchers have in mind. What makes all of this relevant to our current topic is that any culturally acquired norm might generate an ultimate desire to comply, and most of those ultimate desires are neither egoistic nor altruistic. Thus to make a plausible case that an episode of helping behavior is altruistic, it is not enough to rule out egoistic explanations and explanations that appeal to principlism. The defender of psychological altruism must also rule out explanations that trace the helping behavior to an ultimate desire to comply with any of the vast collection of norms that prevail in human cultures. And that’s a job that defenders of altruism have not even begun.

Another possibility is that some helping behavior might not be motivated by ultimate desires at all. Gęsiarz and Crockett (2015) argue that, in addition to the goal-directed system, behavior, including helping behavior, is sometimes produced by what they call the habitual and Pavlovian systems. The habitual system leads to actions that have the highest expected value based on previous life experiences rather than possible consequences indicated by features of the current situation. As a result, helping behavior may be repeated in the future and in circumstances in which motivating factors like the promise of rewards are absent if the behavior has been rewarded in the past. Like the habitual system, the Pavlovian system produces behavior with the highest expected value based on the past. Unlike the habitual system, however, the Pavlovian system produces behavior that has been successful in the evolutionary past, rather than in an individual’s past. This means that behavioral dispositions that have led to reproductive success in a individual’s evolutionary past may have become innate or “hard-wired” through natural selection. If it is indeed the case that some helping behavior is produced by the habitual or Pavlovian systems, then egoism is false. And if some helping behavior is egoistically motivated and the rest is produced by the habitual and Pavlovian systems, then altruism is also false.

7. The Bottom Line

Batson and his collaborators have accomplished a great deal. They have formulated a sophisticated altruist hypothesis, the empathy-altruism hypothesis, that can be tested against competing egoist hypotheses, and they have designed experiments making a strong case that many of those egoist hypotheses are false. But to show that altruism is true, it is not enough to show that specific egoist hypotheses can’t explain specific episodes of helping behavior. Nor would it be enough to show that all plausible versions of egoism are false. It must also be shown that episodes of helping behavior that can’t be explained egoistically can’t be explained by another process, such as principalistic ultimate motivation or ultimate motivation by a non-moral norm. In addition, the defender of altruism must show that non-egoistic episodes of helping behavior are not the product of the habitual or Pavlovian systems. None of Batson’s experiments were designed to rule out these non-egoistic options or others that might be suggested. So there is still much work to be done.

On a more positive note, it seems that Batson and his associates have shown quite conclusively that the methods of experimental psychology can move the debate forward. Indeed, one might argue that Batson has made more progress in this area during the last four decades than philosophers using the traditional philosophical methodology of a priori arguments buttressed by anecdote and intuition have made in the previous two millennia. Their work powerfully demonstrates the utility of empirical methods in moral psychology; philosophical moral psychologists debating the altruism-egoism question have always made empirical claim, and it is now evident that the human sciences possess resources to help us empirically assess those empirical claims.


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This entry expands and updates the “Egoism and Altruism” section in Doris, Stich, Phillips and Walmsley, “Moral Psychology: Empirical Approaches”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2017 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/win2017/entries/moral-psych-emp/>. Some material in this entry is borrowed from Stich, Doris and Roedder (2010).

For helpful suggestions, we are grateful to Mark Alfano, C. Daniel Batson, William J. FitzPatrick, Adam Lerner, Joshua May, Samir Okasha, Gualtiero Piccinini, Alejandro Rosas, Thomas Schramme, Armin Schulz, Elliott Sober, Kim Sterelny, Valerie Tiberius and David Sloan Wilson. Our thanks to Zhao Wang who helped assemble and check the references.

Copyright © 2020 by
John Doris <jmd378@cornell.edu>
Stephen Stich <stich.steve@gmail.com>
Lachlan Walmsley <lachlan.walmsley@anu.edu.au>

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