Culture and Cognitive Science
Human behavior and thought often exhibit a familiar pattern of within group similarity and between group difference. Many of these patterns are attributed to cultural differences. For much of the history of its investigation into behavior and thought, however, cognitive science has been disproportionately focused on uncovering and explaining the more universal features of human minds—or the universal features of minds in general.
This entry charts out the ways in which this has changed over recent decades. It sketches the motivation behind the cultural turn in cognitive science, and situates some of its central findings with respect to the questions that animate it and the debates that it has inspired. Woven throughout the entry are examples of how the cognitive science of culture, and especially its elevated concern with different forms of diversity and variation, continues to influence and be influenced by philosophers.
One cluster of philosophical work falls within the traditional subject matter of philosophy of science, in this case of the cognitive and social sciences. Philosophers have analyzed and assessed the methods and evidence central to the scientific study of cognition and culture, and have offered conceptual scrutiny, clarification, and synthesis. Research in a second vein sees philosophers themselves contributing more directly to cognitive scientific projects, (co)constructing theories, helping build computational models, even gathering empirical data. A third kind of work is naturalistic philosophy or philosophy of nature, wherein philosophers seek to use results from the cognitive science of culture to inform or transform debates over long-standing philosophical questions, including questions about the nature of philosophy and philosophical methodology itself.
- 1. A First Pass at the Subject Matter
- 2. Culture and Variation
- 3. The Cognitive Science of Cultural Capacities
- 4. Influence on Philosophical Debates
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. A First Pass at the Subject Matter
Each of the conjoined expressions in the title of this entry marks out enormous terrain, and neither has a single, strict, canonical, or uncontroversial definition. Philosophically interesting issues and local debates relevant to each will be discussed in more detail throughout the entry, but those discussions will be easier to grasp with some initial, rough but orienting characterizations in hand.
1.1 What is Cognitive Science?
Cognitive science is an interdisciplinary approach to studying minds, mental organization, and intelligent behavior (Thagard 1997 ). The field has developed over the last 70 years, incorporating research from across more traditional disciplines like psychology, philosophy, linguistics, logic, computer science, anthropology, economics, evolutionary theory, and neuroscience (though see Núñez et al. 2019 for doubts about the extent to which these have succeeded in uniting into a distinctive field; cf. Stanford 2020). As these disciplines converged on the same types of questions from different directions, a loose cluster of shared concepts, methodological assumptions, experimental paradigms, and theoretical goals emerged. Together, the elements of this cluster have served as a productive framework for constructing theories and guiding ongoing research about behavior, minds, and mentality (Pylyshyn 1984; Lycan & Prinz 2008; Brook 2009; Samuels, Margolis, & Stich 2012).
At the heart of the framework is the idea that minds and mental activity can be understood not as any particular kind of substance, but rather as some form of information processing. The currently most intuitive and probably still dominant version of the idea is expressed with the computer analogy, though some have argued that antecedents and earlier versions of the core insight can be found as far back as Aristotle’s doctrine of hylomorphism and its distinction between matter and form (Shields 1991; Nussbaum & Putnam 1992; cf. Nelson 1990; Olshewsky 1992). The computer analogy holds that the relation between the physical and mental aspects of a person, between bodies and minds, between the physical and the mental more generally, can be understood on the model of the relation between hardware and software (Putnam 1967). On this view, mental states are functional states identified by the role they play in the “program” that channels information through and guides the control system of a physical body. Mental processes, then, are understood as computational processes performed on mental representations, symbols that have both syntactic and semantic properties, and that are usually but not necessarily realized in brains. Mental processes and representations can be modeled using the formal resources of computation theory, with syntactic relations between the mental representations encoding patterns of causal relations that hold between the physical states that realize them (Fodor 1975; Stich 1983; Rescorla 2015 ). In the last several decades, aspects of this orthodoxy have been challenged, especially regarding the existence and character of mental representations (Pitt 2000 ). Several alternatives to and extensions of this “classical computationalist” way of understanding information processing have made inroads into cognitive science, and have been discussed by philosophers under the headings of connectionism (Buckner & Garson 2019), embodied cognition (Clark 1997a; Shapiro 2011; R. Wilson & Foglia 2011 ), enactivism (Hutto & Myin 2013; Di Paolo & Thompson 2014), dynamic systems approaches (Chemero 2009; M. Anderson 2014), complexity science (Favela 2020), and predictive processing (Hohwy 2013; Clark 2016).
Still, the core idea of mental activity as information processing of some sort remains compelling, in part because the differences between the classical computationalist approach and these newer alternatives may not be very deep (Cao 2020), but also due to the clear research agenda it suggests. The general aim of cognitive science can be cast as the attempt to understand minds and cognition by trying to understand the nature and limits of computation and other forms of information processing, and by trying to determine the character and provenance of the programs our brains, and the brains of non-human animals, typically run. It also suggests a suite of more specific questions: How malleable are the different programs? How much of the information and processing structure is innately specified? How much and which elements are acquired via various forms of learning over the course of development, and throughout different stages of a lifetime? What is the character of the information processing that underlies different psychological capacities such as vision and visual consciousness, language acquisition and comprehension, individual and social learning, emotion and affect, memory and imagination, skilled behavior and deliberation, decision-making and moral judgment, and so forth?
These broad questions and the general conceptual framework that is common to them give the different disciplines that make up cognitive science a base camp and a lingua franca with which to pursue different hypotheses about minds, mental organization, and intelligent behavior. Together they aim to provide a coherent way to bring together and compare different kinds of theoretical, formal, and empirical work to bear on a core set of questions.
1.2 What is Culture?
While ‘cognitive science’ refers to an approach to studying a particular set of phenomena, ‘culture’ would appear to refer directly to a type of phenomenon, rather than a way of investigating it. This much may seem uncontroversial, but little else about culture (or ‘culture’) is (Risjord 2012; Lenard 2020). Before it became central to the social sciences and humanities, the term had a life of its own outside of academia, where it was primarily used to refer to the training of mental capacities in humans. In this sense, ‘culture’ was roughly synonymous with ‘education’: a cultured individual was an educated person, and the qualities of educated people, and the things that educated people produced and consumed, were construed as cultural (Jahoda 2012). Vernacular usage has retained many of these connotations, and some of the more technical uses of ‘culture’ remain indebted to these folk origins. Still, most contemporary academic understandings of the subject matter have been greatly influenced by the work of eighteenth-century philosopher Johann Gottfried Herder, whose approach to culture emphasized how human thinking and behavior are extremely flexible, and steered by environmental variation and social learning (Denby 2005).
During the first half of the twentieth century, historical influences like these informed numerous conceptions of culture, with differences between them often reflecting the different theoretical work the notion was being asked to do. By the middle of the century, Kroeber and Kluckhohn were able to identify more than 150 definitions, making explicit numerous views about what was required of the concept, and the demands placed on the it by different fields and theorists (Kroeber & Kluckhorn 1952). A more recent overview (Baldwin et al. 2006) argues that definitions of ‘culture’ currently in use can be placed into one of seven genres based on what they take as their central theme: structure/pattern, function, process, product, refinement, power/ideology, or group membership. The fact that cognitive scientists are mostly concerned with patterns, processes, and functions is reflected in this entry, but it is worth noting that the other themes tend to attract more attention from adjacent academic disciplines. For example, political philosophers and critical theorists examining postmodernism and postcolonialism often analyze power relations in terms of ‘dominant cultures’ (Gemignani & Peña 2007), while those doing aesthetics often concentrate on material artifacts that count as ‘cultural products’ and part of a ‘cultural heritage’ (Hammersley 2019). In sociology and much of cultural anthropology, the emphasis is often on non-material cultural products such as beliefs, values, and norms, and on how these serve to structure human social arrangements (Sewell 2005). Edward Tylor, the founding father of cultural anthropology, famously articulated a holistic variation on this theme, describing culture as
that complex whole which includes knowledge, belief, art, morals, law, custom, and any other capacities acquired by man as a member of society. (Tylor 1871: 1)
The diversity of the theoretical aims and approaches across academic disciplines interested in culture, along with the inherent complexity of those phenomena identified as cultural, have also inspired pessimistic conclusions. Some have argued against the possibility of a unified conception of culture, suggesting no single definition could satisfy all of the demands placed on the term and still be coherent or theoretically useful (Byrne, Barnard, et al. 2004; Segall 1984). Others have argued that the lack of such a single univocal definition would be no hinderance to scientific research, since no single idealization of the idea of culture will be equally useful for all explanatory purposes (Sperber & Claidière 2008). That said, many contend that in order to clarify what culture does and does not do, refined conceptual tools are needed to think clearly about its different manifestations and facets, and especially to distinguish it from related but importantly distinct phenomena such as ecological inheritance (Odling-Smee & Laland 2011) and epigenetics (Jahoda 1984; Jablonka & Lamb 2005). In light of this, Ramsey’s recent explication (2013) of a conception of culture that is both currently influential and that has a venerable history (Cavalli-Sforza & Feldman 1981; R. Boyd & Richerson 1985) is well-suited to serve as a touchstone for this entry:
Culture is information transmitted between individuals or groups, where this information flows through and brings about the reproduction of, and a lasting change in, the behavioral trait. (Ramsey 2013: 466)
Cognitive science research using alternative conceptions of culture will be noted below (see especially Section 2.2).
2. Culture and Variation
Information counts as cultural not by virtue of its content but rather by where it comes from, how it travels, and what it does. Culture is transmitted via behavior, and produces durable, non-ephemeral effects on behavior. Although it is not explicitly mentioned in Ramsey’s explication, variation in behavior, between individuals but especially between groups, has been diagnostically important for those seeking to integrate culture and cultural explanations into cognitive science. Many have sought to document patterns of behavioral diversity, and more recently patterns of psychological diversity, and show that they cannot be accounted for by genetic or ecological differences, but rather are the result of cultural diversity.
2.1 The WEIRD Challenge
A landmark paper published in 2010 consolidated and raised the visibility of a cluster of issues surrounding the relationship between culture and cognitive science (J. Henrich, Heine, & Norenzayan 2010). It laid out the case that the vast majority of research in psychology used subjects who came from a very specific demographic; most participants in psychological studies had been WEIRD, drawn from societies that are Western, Educated, Industrialized, Rich, Democratic. Other premises of the argument pointed out that not only was this a very narrowly circumscribed sample population, it was also (a) an exotic outlier group, especially from an historical perspective, that was nevertheless (b) typically treated by researchers as representative of the species as a whole. Results from studies done with WEIRD participants (and typically by WEIRD cognitive scientists) were commonly extrapolated, taken to be true of human beings in general, and thus to be illuminating universal features of human psychological nature. The negative conclusion was that this practice, widespread though it may be, is unjustified, and that distressingly little was known about the range of variation in human cognition, motivation, and behavior, or about the mechanisms that create and support it. This conclusion also implied that as far as was known, culture may have a much deeper and more profound role in shaping human mentality than cognitive science had yet appreciated.
The paper was not the first to recognize many of the problems and challenges it raised, but the acronym it introduced gave a recognizable name to a movement that had been coalescing for some time (Shweder 1990, 2003; Markus & Kitayama 1991; Nisbett & Cohen 1996; Rozin 2001; Nisbett 2003; Arnett 2008; also see Broesch et al. 2020 for reflections about the entanglement of methodological and ethical factors in cross-cultural research, and misgivings that the acronym WEIRD invites misleading binary thinking about cultural variation). The importance of culture for understanding human minds and behaviors had long been central to some disciplines now contributing to cognitive science, especially anthropology and cross-cultural psychology (Tylor 1871; Malinowksi 1931; Levi-Strauss 1958; Triandis & Brislin 1984; Hofstede 1980; Greenfield 2000). Culture had also become integral to the application of biological thought to humans and human social behavior (Dawkins 1976, 1982; Tooby & Cosmides 1992; Laland, Odling-Smee, & Feldman 2000; Griffiths 2007) and had been central to the field of cultural evolution from its inception (Cavalli-Sforza & Feldman 1981; R. Boyd & Richerson 1985; even Darwin 1871).
The paper helped consolidate and focus attention on a host of shortcomings that contemporary cognitive science is still coming to terms with (Apicella, Norenzayan, & Henrich 2020). Many are methodological. Cognitive scientists concerned about culture and WEIRD sampling bias continue to debate the ideal role of theory in formulating hypotheses, interpreting results, and investigating the interaction between minds and cultural influence in a number of other ways (Muthukrishna & Henrich 2019; Muthukrishna, Bell, et al. 2020; Barrett 2020; Rozin 2020; Sear 2020). Others seek to better integrate historical evidence into the study of psychology (Turchin 2015, 2018; J. Henrich 2020; Muthukrishna, Henrich, & Slingerland 2021) and to clarify the best way to study the ontogenetic sources of variation in development (Stotz 2010; Heyes 2018a; Amir & McAuliffe 2020). Still others connect the discussion of WEIRD sampling bias to psychology’s recent difficulties with replication (Fidler & Wilcox 2018), arguing that while having more experimental participants and increased statistical power is, all else equal, a virtue, it is not a panacea, especially if those participants are all WEIRD. Rather, they urge that some questions about behavioral and psychological diversity can be more thoroughly addressed by using ethnographic methods from anthropology alongside psychological experiments. In some cases, important insights about human variation can be won by using these combined methods to study a small but carefully chosen cultural group (N. Henrich & J. Henrich 2007; K. Smith & Apicella 2020; Zefferman & Mathew 2020). In other cases, however, experimental approaches common to mainstream cognitive science may be unsuitable for such work, because the definition and operationalization of central constructs used to investigate phenomena associated with, e.g., intelligence or self-esteem may be difficult to apply, inhibiting rather than facilitating genuine cross-cultural insight (Greenfield 1997; Joe 2014; J. Henrich 2020).
Appreciation of the blind spots and questionable inferences highlighted by the WEIRD challenge has contributed to substantive theorizing about minds as well. It has informed work focused on establishing the existence and character of psychological variation, but also made urgent the need to develop a more sophisticated range of theoretical resources to explain that variation. Questions here have often been framed using contemporary versions of the distinction between innate and acquired traits (Carruthers et al. 2005, 2006, 2007). While theses about the presence and significance of innate mental characteristics have loomed large in the history of Western thought (Samet 2008 ; Markie & Folescu 2021), the distinction and its attendant concepts are not philosophically unproblematic (Griffiths 2002; Mallon & Weinberg 2006; Griffiths & Machery 2008; Gross & Rey 2012). Nevertheless, much research has sought to illuminate which aspects of mental structure and content (and even personality, see Gurven et al. 2013; Smaldino, Lukaszewski, et al. 2019) might be part of a genetically shared, (quasi-)universal human psychological nature, and which aspects can vary between groups, and how much (Roughley 2021). Further efforts have been directed at discovering, of those aspects that are acquired and that do exhibit variation, which are obtained via individual learning, and which are culturally ‘inherited’, acquired via (a particular type of) social learning. This framing has in turn brought increased scrutiny to the psychology of learning itself, and especially the structure and provenance of those cognitive mechanisms that underlie different forms of social transmission. Research on this front will be the focus of Section 3.2 and Section 3.3.
2.2 Alternatives and Objections to Cultural Explanations of Intergroup Variation
Many attempts to establish the influence of culture in shaping behavioral and psychological diversity take the form of arguments from exclusion, aimed at ruling out other candidate explanations that might account for the specific pattern of intergroup variation in question. Competing explanations can take numerous forms. For example, until the 1950s many instances of behavioral variation were thought to be attributable to genetic differences between human groups (Barkan 1992). Research in the life sciences over the last 70 years, however, failed to produce evidence to support such explanations, finding instead that biological differences between human populations are minor and superficial (Hirschman 2004). The loss of confidence in purely genetic explanations inspired researchers to continue exploring alternatives.
Alternatively, many social sciences deal in “structuralist” explanations that account for behavior by appeal to factors exogenous to individuals, such as norms, laws, institutions, economic policies, and government types. These would explain patterns of intergroup variation in behavior by appeal to differences between the structures that organize each group. Since structural factors of this sort are passed along socially rather than genetically, however, they fall comfortably under the broad working definition of ‘culture’ provided above, and so can be counted as a genre of cultural explanation (Haslanger 2016; Davidson & Kelly 2020; Soon 2021).
Most of the alternative explanations that are not cultural in the sense at issue here—and so which do not give a central role to social transmission—attempt to explain intergroup variation by stressing the importance of differences in the external physical or ecological environments inhabited by different groups, or by appeal to the operation of psychological mechanisms like causal reasoning or individual trial-and-error learning (Richerson & Boyd 2005). The range of options can be elucidated by examining evolutionary approaches to human behavior, and comparing the distinct way each approach appeals to such factors in their proprietary modes of explanation (E. Smith 2000). For example, human behavioral ecology remains largely agnostic, or at least assigns little significance to, the character of the internal psychological mechanisms that might lead to group level behavioral diversity. Instead, behavioral ecologists appear to simply assume (perhaps unrealistically, see Driscoll 2009) that humans are able to produce behavior that optimizes fitness across a wide range of environments, and by implication also assume that individual human minds are generally flexible enough to calibrate behavioral strategies to best fit whatever ecological circumstances they find themselves in (Grafen 1984). On this view, patterns of behavior within a group typically reflect commonalities in the ecological circumstances faced by most members of the group, and differences in the patterns found between groups reflect, fairly directly, differences in the ecological circumstances those groups inhabit. Such explanations make little mention of mental structure and no mention of culture or cultural inheritance.
By contrast, practitioners of the research program that has become known as Evolutionary Psychology are much more concerned with mental structure and evolved psychological mechanisms, and readily discuss some forms of cultural variation (Barkow, Cosmides, & Tooby 1992; also see Hagen 2015). Evolutionary Psychologist’s approach to explaining human behavioral variation builds on the more general notion of phenotypic plasticity. The approach emphasizes that phenotypic plasticity (of the behavioral phenotype, but also of morphological, physiological, and other dimensions of phenotypic expression) is found not just in humans, but in almost all organisms. Mechanisms that underlie such plasticity allow individuals with similar genotypes to express different phenotypes, and thus to flexibly adapt to different environments in a variety of ways. For instance, researchers have appealed to this kind of interaction between environmental differences, on the one hand, and mechanisms underlying phenotypic plasticity, on the other, to explain systematic patterns of variation in the clutch sizes of members of the same species of bird found in different geographical regions (Tooby & Cosmides 1992). Evolutionary Psychologists offer explanations with a similar form for many instances of human variation, such as regional differences in the distribution of values. One such account holds that the prevalence in some groups of certain kinds of values and norms—collectivist or exclusivist—can be explained as an adaptive response evoked by the salience of cues indicating high pathogen threat in the group’s environment. Alternatively, the prevalence in other groups of contrasting values and norms—individualistic or inclusivist—are explained by the absence of such cues, and thus an environment that allows the expression of a different adaptive phenotype (Schaller & Park 2011; also see Buchanan & Powell 2016; cf. Gelfand et al. 2011; House et al. 2020).
With respect to the psychological sources of human behavioral plasticity and cultural diversity, Evolutionary Psychologists tend to construe human minds as “massively modular” (though the conception of a “module” involved in this kind of claim is typically more liberal than the one made famous by Fodor 1983; see Samuels 1998, 2000; Sperber 2001; Barrett & Kurzban 2006; Carruthers 2006; Robbins 2009 ). Human minds share a number of distinct, genetically inherited dispositions, each shaped by the selective pressures generated by the adaptive problem it evolved to handle. Each disposition can produce a circumscribed range of behaviors to deal with its associated adaptive challenge, but not all the behaviors made possible by those dispositions are manifested by every human or every group. Rather, patterns of behavior are shaped and constrained by the character of mental modules, but are also explained in part by appeal to external circumstances, with different environments acting to select or evoke different subsets of behaviors from the range already “contained in” and made available by these universally shared psychological dispositions (compare Plato Meno). Proponents point out that on this view, evoked behaviors can persist even as the environment that originally evoked them changes or disappears. For example, once a behavioral phenotype is initially expressed it can be effectively locked in by a process of developmental canalization (D. Wilson 2009; Witherington & Lickliter 2016). Proponents also stress that the view does not imply that all behaviors and differences between groups are adaptive. For example, the claim that the comparatively higher incidence of teen pregnancies in lower income groups is an adaptive response evoked by conditions of poverty remains a matter of controversy and empirical investigation (Johns, Dickins, & Clegg 2011).
These “evoked culture” explanations associated with Evolutionary Psychology are often contrasted with the “transmitted culture” explanations associated with dual inheritance theory (Norenzayan 2006). While both are designed to account for patterns of behavioral variation between groups, the former do not involve the kind of information conveyed between individuals central to the explication given in Section 1.2. For this reason, the psychological modules from which behaviors are evoked in the explanations given by Evolutionary Psychologists have been classified by other theorists as “non-cultural mechanisms” (Mathew & Perreault 2015). Alternatively, transmitted culture explanations point to a different source of phenotypic plasticity, namely cultural inheritance and the psychological mechanisms that underpin social transmission. A third approach can be seen as combining elements of both of these (Sperber 1996; Morin 2011 ). Advocates of cultural epidemiology, which is often presented as being distinct from both dual inheritance theory and Evolutionary Psychology, typically attempt to explain instances of cultural diversity and stability in terms of how different evolved, domain-specific modules influence the acquisition, transmission, reconstruction, and retention of specific mental representations.
These three forms of explanation are distinct in many ways, but are not necessarily in competition with each other (Sterelny 2017). In many cases advocates of the different approaches are concerned with different kinds of behavior: few Evolutionary Psychologists have attempted to account for the accumulation of material technology or scientific knowledge. Dual inheritance theorists tend to focus on forms of cooperation, social organization, and culturally complex adaptions while eschewing topics like sexual behavior, mate preferences, and phobias (although there are exceptions; see Dugatkin 1996; Faucher & Blanchette 2011; Adriaens & De Block 2006). Neither pay as much attention to the character and dynamics of non-adaptive traditions centered on, e.g., recipes, songs, or folk tales as cultural epidemiologists typically do (Acerbi, Kendal, & Tehrani 2017). Advocates of the three types of explanation typically accept that each is able to account for some instances of behavioral variation but not others. Moreover, the boundaries between these approaches are vague and overlapping at best, and much good work on evolution and culture combines ideas from more than one. Nevertheless, advocates of different approaches occasionally disagree about the best way to conceptualize culture (Sperber & Claidière 2008), about the relative importance of social learning and transmitted culture in general (Richerson & Boyd 2008), about whether and how culture should enter into ultimate explanations of behavior (Scott-Phillips, Dickins, & West 2011), and about the best explanation of specific cases, such as different features of prosocial religions (Bulbulia 2004; Norenzayan et al. 2016) and morality (Sripada & Stich 2007; Buchanan & Powell 2018; Brownstein & Kelly 2019).
Philosophers have joined these debates. Many have challenged Evolutionary Psychology’s evoked culture explanations by attempting to show that alternative explanations better capture various target phenomena, or by arguing that the kinds of behaviors that Evolutionary Psychologists focus on lead them to underestimate the variation exhibited by our species and the plasticity required to account for it (Dupré 2001; Buller 2005; Richardson 2007; Downes 2015). By contrast, philosophers have tended to think more ‘with the science’ of cultural epidemiology (Nichols 2002; De Cruz & De Smedt 2015) and dual inheritance theory (Skyrms 2010; Sterelny 2012; Davis & Kelly 2018). Philosophical advocates of these approaches see them as more promising in virtue of the conceptual and methodological sophistication they find in them, together with the models they have developed to clarify the kinds of interactions that might hold between genes, transmitted culture, and cognition (R. Boyd & Richerson 2005; Gualaderex 2012; also see Paul 2015). As a result, philosophical discussions of cultural epidemiology and dual inheritance theory are often less straightforwardly critical. Instead, many aim at drawing out interesting philosophical implications (Boudry, Blancke, & Pigliucci 2015; Kelly & Hoburg 2017), shoring up conceptual foundations by offering refinements and amendments (Lewens 2015; Buskell 2019); or emphasizing the need for more elaborated methods to empirically test their hypotheses (Sterelny 2020).
3. The Cognitive Science of Cultural Capacities
Humans, and some non-human animals, are natural social learners. A crucial form of social learning is enabled by their cultural capacities, typically understood as capacities that allow them to acquire and transmit cultural information. The number, character, and contribution of the different psychological mechanisms that underlie these cultural capacities remain a matter of much debate within cognitive science, as does the issue of which ones are required to produce and sustain not just culture but complex cultural traits and cumulative culture. This section describes research that investigates these capacities, the methodological and evidential reasoning involved, and some of the conceptual issues that it raises.
Important caveat: for the purposes of this section, capacities and mechanisms are classified as “cultural” in virtue of their functionality, what they do. Broadly speaking, they count as cultural if they support the spread of cultural information. This is importantly distinct from saying they are cultural in virtue of their provenance. Some of the psychological mechanisms that enable the acquisition and transmission of cultural information—such as those that underpin mindreading or normative cognition—may themselves be the products of cultural rather than biological evolution, and thus be mostly culturally inherited, e.g., cognitive ‘gadgets’ in Heyes’ terminology (Heyes 2018a; Birch & Heyes 2021; also see Section 3.3). Other mechanisms that enable the acquisition and transmission of cultural information may be genetically inherited, e.g., cognitive “instincts.” Both would count as contributing to cultural capacities in the sense at issue here.
3.1 Culture, Cumulative Culture, and Cultural Complexity
Theorists of culture see great significance in a distinction between mere culture, on one hand, and cumulative culture, on the other. The latter involves not just the spread of information between individuals via social transmission, but the wherewithal of later generations to retain, refine, add to, and innovate on the cultural repertoire they inherit from previous generations. Some have claimed that cumulative culture is distinctly human and evolutionarily unique (Sterelny 2009, Tomasello 2009) while others have suggested that rudimentary instances of cumulative culture can also be found in some non-human animals like whales (Whitehead & Rendell 2015), Japanese monkeys (Schofield et al. 2018), and chimpanzees (Marshall-Pescini & Whiten 2008). There is little controversy, however, about the claim that the scale and complexity of human culture outstrips anything found in other animals (Dean et al. 2014). While some have expressed doubts about whether the current evidence suffices to establish that most human cultural traits result from the accumulation of modifications over time (Vaesen & Houkes 2021), most researchers hold that understanding our capacities for cumulative culture, perhaps more so than those that underlie individual intelligence, creativity, or problem solving, is crucial to understanding the distinctive character and success of the human species (Richerson & Boyd 2005; Sterelny 2009, 2012; J. Henrich 2016; Derex & Boyd 2015; R. Boyd 2017; cf. Pinker 2010).
There remains disagreement on how to characterize the relevant notion of complexity, however. As Querbes, Vaesen, and Houkes (2014) note, increase in cultural complexity has been characterized in several ways, including as an increase in a trait’s fitness, as an increase in the number of elements that make up a trait, and as an increase in the difficulty of transmitting the trait faithfully (see also Mesoudi & Thornton 2018) or how difficult it is to learn (J. Henrich 2004). These characterizations are not theoretically or empirically equivalent, and each suffers from its own shortcomings. Specifying complexity in terms of fitness, for instance, seems to require an agreed upon metric for cultural fitness, but no such metric has been widely accepted (Ramsey & De Block 2017). Relatedly, while it is relatively easy to recognize episodes of technological change that are instances of progress, it is far less clear how to evaluate changes in other kinds of cultural traits, and so it remains difficult to know when transformations in, say, a religious or linguistic system should be classified as improvements or degradations (Miton & Charbonneau 2018).
Attempts to characterize cultural complexity by appeal to number of elements confront an individuation problem, and it remains unclear how to determine what counts either as a distinct element or a single trait. A similar individuation problem emerged in the debate over cultural replication. Dawkins famously coined the term ‘meme’ to refer to discrete bits of culture that play a role in cultural evolution similar to that played by genes in biological evolution, arguing that memes are independent replicators whose propagation serves their own interests (Dawkins 1976). Subsequent research revealed, however, that it is very difficult to determine how a bit of cultural information might qualify as single meme (Chvaja 2020), and many scholars are skeptical that cultural variants are usefully thought of as being discrete or primarily serving their own interests (Hull 1982, 1988; Heyes & Plotkin 1989; R. Boyd & Richerson 2000; Claidière & André 2012; De Block & Ramsey 2016). Consequently, memetics has largely disappeared from academic discussion (though see Sterelny 2006 and Dennett 2017 for exceptions).
What has not entirely waned, however, are debates over the nature of cultural acquisition, whether and when the spread of culture is usefully thought of in terms of replication, and if not why not. Some proponents of replication hold that most stable cultural traditions are primarily the result of imitation, and that imitation drives a kind of faithful, high fidelity copying of cultural variants that should qualify as replication (Tomasello 1999). Dual inheritance theorists argue that the type of high fidelity copying suggested by the term ‘replication’ may or may not be rare, but it is not required for complex cultural adaptations to evolve. Rather, cumulative cultural evolution can be sustained by low fidelity imitation because the influence of many teachers and models can compensate for noise and copying errors (J. Henrich & Boyd 2002). Cultural epidemiologists also reject the need for replication, arguing instead that many traditions are mainly the result of ‘guided variation’. This is a phenomenon whereby learners do not simply copy what they are exposed to, but rather creatively reconstruct representations from what they observe, slightly but significantly altering the cultural variants they acquire in the process of acquiring them. In these cases, the recipient of the cultural signal is not a passive vessel, but actively filters or even transforms the representations that they adopt. Moreover, cultural epidemiologists hold that these processes of reconstructive learning are systematically influenced by stable features of human cognitive architecture, which can be represented as ‘attractors’ in the abstract possibility space of cultural evolutionary models (Sperber 1996; Claidière & Sperber 2007; Claidière, Scott-Phillips, & Sperber 2014; Lewens 2015; Morin 2011 ; Buskell 2017; Scott-Phillips 2017). For example, a proponent of ‘pure’ replication might hold that the pronunciation of words remains relatively stable because individuals tend to copy with high fidelity the pronunciation of their peers and parents. A proponent of the cultural epidemiology approach could offer a different explanation, claiming rather that the pronunciation of words evolves in the direction of better fit with the mechanisms of verbalization, comprehension, and retention, and then stabilizes around these attractors (for similarly competing accounts of some of the common features of religion, see Boyer 2001; Atran 2002; Norenzayan et al. 2016).
As just noted, this debate about cultural transmission and the complexity and character of cultural variants is entangled with debates about different kinds of human universals, how common or rare they are, and how they should be explained (Brown 1991, 2004; Singh et al 2021; also see J. Henrich, Blasi, et al. forthcoming). For example, if features of a shared human psychological nature are implicated in reconstructive social learning, and those features, in turn, help stabilize certain types of group level behavioral regularities by funneling social transmission towards cultural attractors, then those types of group level behavioral regularities are likely to be common to many cultures (Sperber 1996; De Cruz 2006). If, on the contrary, high-fidelity copying is the rule in social learning, then small modifications in initial conditions, minor copying errors, and slight perturbations in the flow of cultural information have a better chance of being propagated, and to develop into more and more dramatic differences between cultures (Acerbi & Mesoudi 2015; but see Tchernichovski, Eisenberg-Edidin, & Jarvis 2021 for how imitation can sustain high ingroup variability).
To a large extent, many of these are empirical issues that turn on the relative importance of the respective transmission processes in different episodes of social learning, as well as the relative effect of each process on cultural stability. However, there may be conceptual issues involved as well (Lewens 2015), concerning whether or not the type of cognitive reconstruction of cultural variants posited to occur in guided variation is necessarily at odds with replication, or is perhaps a process that sometimes produces high-fidelity copies, but other times does not (Boudry 2018). Such local discussions are part of the larger debate over how to best conceptualize, study, and understand the significance of cumulative culture, cultural complexity, and the psychology and population structure (e.g., Derex & Mesoudi 2020) required to create and sustain it.
3.2 Culture and Individual Learning
While social learning is a central concern to those focused on culture, other forms of learning are also important for understanding the range of interactions between cognition, culture and its accumulation, and perhaps the evolution of cultural capacities themselves. For instance, while social learning appears to be suited to contribute to the rapid spread of new behaviors and beliefs in a population, individual learning may be better suited to contribute to the initial generation of new behaviors, novel beliefs, and to the production of innovations on existing cultural variants. Theorists have carved out different positions on how the distinction between individual and social learning should be conceived, and how these two facets of cultural capacities might interact.
Cognitive scientists have traditionally been interested in learning, broadly defined as the acquisition by individuals of new information, knowledge, and skills. There is also an established history of research on related cognitive phenomena such as attention, perception and memory, much of which focuses on identifying functions and causal mechanisms, and on developing methods to optimize learning and memory (De Houwer & Hughes 2020). Historically speaking, the distinction between social and individual learning does not seem to have been given much theoretical significance. Those participating in cognitive science’s recent cultural turn accord it greater importance.
Efforts to articulate a precise and theoretically useful version of that distinction have run into complications, however, and have not always yielded intuitive results. For example, an episode of learning can be plausibly classified as social if a conspecific facilitates the acquisition of new information (Heyes 1994, 2012). Individual learning, on the other hand, is often construed as acquiring new information directly from the environment. But these specifications are not mutually exclusive, and together they entail that many episodes of human learning qualify as both individual and social. The environments that our species inhabits are often themselves engineered, and are thus to a large extent shaped by other humans, often in ways specifically designed to facilitate learning (Sterelny 2012; J. Henrich 2016; Lewens 2017). As many have noted, this is an important form of (epistemic) niche construction and ecological inheritance. It bears important similarities to behaviors found in a range of other species whose members live in environments that are deeply shaped by other members (and sometimes previous generations) of their own species (Laland, Odling-Smee, & Feldman 2000; Kendal, Tehrani, & Odling-Smee 2011; Aaby & Ramsey forthcoming). In response to such difficulties, others have urged that individual learning should be distinguished from social learning in that only episodes of the latter involve social transmission, understood as happening when “the behaviour of an individual [comes] to resemble the behaviour of others through social interaction” (Heyes 2021: 228; also see R. Boyd, Richerson, & Henrich 2011).
Aside from the question of how specific episodes of learning should be classified, there seems to be something close to consensus about functionality. Broadly construed, the primary adaptive function of individual learning is to generate information that is useful for dealing with (often novel features of) one’s environment. The adaptive value of social learning, on the other hand, comes from avoiding the costs of individual learning, allowing an individual to acquire useful information from others without having to go through the trouble of figuring it out on their own. This consensus, however, gives rise to a puzzle whose solution remains a matter of controversy (Rogers 1988). What has become known as Rogers’ paradox centers on the question of how capacities for social learning could have evolved. The difficulty arises from the thought that pure social learners would be unable to help increase the mean fitness of the populations they invade or in which they live, because they would be unable to contribute any innovations or useful new information. They would just imitate others, copying what is already there. From this perspective, social learners are free-riders, exploiting the knowledge and skills created by the epistemic work of individual learners while providing nothing novel or beneficial in return (Laland 2004).
Nevertheless, social learning is undeniably found in a range of species, with humans exhibiting especially sophisticated forms of social transmission. Some proposed solutions to Rogers’ paradox have emphasized that capacities for social learning can be adaptive (and thus evolve and spread) if social learning is selective. Individuals can use mixed strategies, strategically switching between individual and social learning in different circumstances (Enquist, Eriksson, & Ghirlanda 2007). They can also be selective about who they learn from, when, and in what domains of knowledge (J. Henrich & McElreath 2003; Buttelman et al. 2013; Koenig & Sabbagh 2013). Others hold that capacities for social learning likely evolved from capacities for individual learning, in a process of descent with modification that was driven by gene-culture coevolutionary processes and the kind of epistemic niche construction mentioned above (Sterelny 2021: chapter 1; Kendal, Boogert, et al. 2018; also see Heyes 2018a and Taylor, et al 2021).
3.3 Culture and Social Transmission
Some researchers have expressed surprise that social learning is thought to be so crucial for understanding what is distinctive about humans, especially in light of its apparent ubiquity in the animal (and even botanical) world (Hill 2010). Similar concerns have led some theorists to distinguish what they call ‘cultural learning’, holding it to be a form of social learning that essentially involves fairly sophisticated forms of cognition like perspective-taking or intersubjectivity (Tomasello, Kruger, & Ratner 1993, also see Hoppit & Laland 2013; Legare & Nielsen 2015; J. Henrich 2016). The term “social transmission” remains useful, however, as it is neutral on this score. It is also intuitively inclusive of psychological capacities for learning but also for teaching, both of which support the flow of cultural information between individuals and generations (also see Heyes & Moore forthcoming).
Some of the most fruitful research into the psychology of social transmission has been comparative, investigating the similarities in and differences between the cultural capacities of humans and those found a wide range of other animals (Andrews 2020b: chapter 8). Much of this research is structured by efforts to isolate and understand “difference makers” (Buskell forthcoming; Charbonneau 2020), those ecological, social, and especially psychological factors that are distinctive of humans and responsible for our unique cultural sophistication. Here too a central debate involves the issue of cumulative culture and the kind of psychological machinery required not just to socially acquire and transmit information, but for it to accumulate over time, enabling each generation to innovate and build on the advances inherited from previous generations (Dean et al. 2014; Mesoudi & Thorton 2018; cf. Querbes, Vaesen, & Houkes 2014; Haidle & Schlaudt 2020; Vale et al. 2021). It has been known for some time that other animals have the wherewithal to sustain group-specific behavioral traditions (Buxton 1948; Imanishi 1957; Whiten, Goodall, et al. 1999; Laland & Galef 2009; for overviews of more recent work see Whitehead & Rendell 2015; Aplin 2019; Whiten 2019). However, it remains unclear whether any of those traditions accrue complexity and adaptive functionality in the same way their human counterparts do, or what additional cultural capacities would be necessary or sufficient to enable groups of non-human animals to collectively achieve this “rachet effect” of accumulation (Tomasello 2009, 2014; Tennie , Call, & Tomasello 2009).
Much of this comparative work is also guided by hypotheses about the kinds of evolutionary pressures that selected for uniquely human cultural capacities and drove the dramatic expansion of relative brain size in the human lineage. For instance, one framing (Baimel et al. 2021; also see Muthukrishna, Doebeli, et al. 2018) pits this family of “cultural brain” hypotheses that focus on the adaptive challenges associated with social learning and handling cultural information against “Machiavellian intelligence” hypotheses (Byrne & Whiten 1988 and Whiten & Byrne 1997). These latter hypotheses see key selective pressures as stemming not from culture but from more competitive social dynamics that arise from antagonistic scheming among conspecifics (cf. Downes 2008 ; Lewens 2008 ). Another view holds that many of our particular cultural capacities are the product of cultural rather than biological evolution, cognitive gadgets that are assembled and passed along as part of a cultural inheritance rather than a genetic one (Heyes 2018a). On this account, what is unique about human brains is that they are innately equipped with a set of cognitive mechanisms for associative learning that are hypertrophied compared to other species, but are not genetically specialized for any particular domain or content. These general learning mechanisms, together with some number of attentional biases, are often used to acquire all manner of culturally inherited, domain-specific packages of skills, e.g., to play chess, to drive a car, to read and write, etc. These may also include skills that allow individuals to imitate others more adeptly, thus allowing them to learn to become better and more selective social learners (also see Dennett 2017).
As this and above discussions suggest, much effort has been directed at distinguishing different grades of social learning and the kinds of cognitive sophistication required to engage in each. The disagreements between the participants seem to be mainly about the number and nature of genetically transmitted learning mechanisms, and how canalized the development of different types of social learning is. Of the different mechanisms, imitation, understood as the ability of an individual to observe and then copy another’s body movements, has attracted the most attention (Zentall 2006; Whiten et al. 2009). A key debate concerns whether imitation in particular is underpinned by genetically inherited, domain specific psychological mechanisms, or whether it is subserved by domain general associative learning mechanisms that are themselves further sculpted by cultural influences (Heyes 2016a, 2021; cf. Fessler & Machery 2012). A related debate concerns the significance of over-imitation, the tendency of humans to copy all of the steps in the arc of a model’s behavior, even those that are superfluous to the perceived goal (Lyons et al. 2011; Keupp, Behne, & Rakoczy 2013; Clay & Tennie 2018; Hoehl et al. 2019). Researchers disagree about whether over-imitation is a mistake, produced by a generally adaptive capacity for social learning merely overreaching and exhibiting predictable false positives in certain circumstances, or whether it is a key to the human capacity to support not just culture but cumulative culture. An influential hypothesis about how it might do this is by driving the reproduction and spread of cultural traditions that are so complex that the adaptive benefits they provide are causally opaque to and unappreciated by their users (J. Henrich 2016).
Another debate is over the importance of imitation relative to other forms of social learning, both to the transmission and accumulation of culture (Caldwell & Millen 2009; Singh et al. 2021) and to the more creative forms of acquisition of interest to cultural epidemiologists (Sperber 1996; Boyer 2001; Nichols 2004; Morin 2011 ). This issue has attracted the attention of philosophers in part because it intersects with those conceptual issues about fidelity and replication mentioned in Section 3.1. Thus, empirical findings in the cognitive science of imitation stand to shed light on conceptual questions about if and when the cultural variants that spread via social transmission can serve as units of selection in cultural evolution, in something analogous to the way that genes serve as units of selection in genetic evolution, in virtue of the fact that they can be replicated with high levels of fidelity (R. Boyd & Richerson 2000; J. Henrich & Boyd 2002; Claidière, Scott-Phillips, & Sperber 2014; Acerbi & Mesoudi 2015; Boudry 2018; Charbonneau 2020; Charbonneau & Bourrat 2021; also see Lloyd 2005 ; Wilkins & Bourrat 2018 ).
A related line of research explores the ways in which imitation and social learning are selective, guided by strategies and heuristics that dispose individuals to acquire some the behaviors, skills, and ideas they are exposed to rather than others (Laland 2004; Chudek, Brosseau-Liard, et al. 2013; Koenig & Sabbagh 2013; Heyes 2016b; Kendal, Boogert, et al. 2018). Many different strategies have been explored, and those have been taxonomized in a variety of ways (see J. Henrich & McElreath 2007). Some of the most discussed types of strategies include a conformity heuristic that induces individuals to copy behaviors and ideas that are already common in their community (Muthukrishna, Morgan, & Henrich 2016); sensitivities to status and success that make one more likely to copy prestigious, dominant, successful, or otherwise high-ranking individuals (J. Henrich & Gil-White 2001; Cheng, Tracy, et al. 2013; Cheng & Tracy 2014; Maner 2017, Jiménez & Mesoudi 2019, 2021), and sensitivities to the similarities or differences between oneself and those one might learn from, sometimes discussed in terms of my-side bias (Mercier & Sperber 2017) or tribal social instincts (Richerson & Boyd 2001; Richerson & Henrich 2012). Though they are often called “biases” and lead to what can appear to be reasoning errors when evaluated in isolated episodes of learning, modeling work suggests that when such heuristics are prevalent in a population they can collectively produce results that are beneficial, both for the individuals whose social learning they are guiding and for the cultural repertoire of the group those individuals belong to (Richerson & Boyd 2005; see also Skyrms 2014). Recent philosophical work has taken up the question of whether or not these kinds of selective social learning heuristics can be assimilated to traditional perspectives on rationality and epistemic virtue (N. Levy & Alfano 2020; Fadda 2021). Other philosophical research has critically examined the explanatory work done by appeal to such heuristics, and looked at how these biases relate to different forms of social influence (Padalia 2014; Chellappoo 2021).
When social learning is important for the members of a species, it is not unreasonable to expect there to be complementary psychological mechanisms that guide and facilitate teaching. In humans, researchers have investigated the propensity to engage in what has been called ‘natural pedagogy’ (Csibra & Gergely 2006; Gergely, Egyed, & Király 2007, but see Little, Carver, & Legare 2016). For example, some of this work looks at complementary patterns of attention and eye contact that emerge in pedagogical settings, and the psychological mechanisms that support a complex interaction between the ostensive signals that teachers provide for their students and the referential expectations that learners have of their teachers (Csibra & Gergely 2009; cf. Heyes 2018b). Other researchers who focus on human mentalizing capacities approach their subject matter from a broadly pedagogy-centered perspective, developing a general reinterpretation of those capacities’ basic functions. On this mindshaping view, the mechanisms that underpin human folk psychological practices are not designed to merely passively interpret others’ behavior; rather, they primarily evolved to help (co)construct and regulate the minds of others. They thus guide many pedagogical tasks involved in actively helping to structure and influence the minds of learners (Mameli 2001; McGeer 2007, 2015; Zawidzki 2013). Others have argued that human pedagogy is both active and deeply facilitated not just by internal psychological mechanisms, but by meticulously structured learning environments—the cumulative epistemic niches—that are a crucial part of the non-biological inheritance that one generation uses to educate the next. These include engineered physical environments (Clark 1997a), but also norms that govern relationships between apprentices and their mentors (Sterelny 2012) which can scale up into larger informal and formal institutions of education (Gillett 2018). Others have explored ways in which the psychological machinery of learning and teaching contributes to the generation, intentional or otherwise, of innovations in cultural variants, and thus to the production of variation on which cultural evolution operates (Claidière, Scott-Phillips, & Sperber 2014; Legare & Nielsen 2015; Mesoudi 2016; Laland 2017; Leibo et al. 2019; Gopnik 2020; Miu et al. 2020; Rule, Tenenbaum, & Piantadosi 2020).
While the psychological mechanisms underlying social transmission are widely thought to play a foundational role, other cognitive abilities have been put forward as additional candidates for being key difference makers that allow human minds to produce and sustain unique forms of complex cumulative culture. Though the exact character of their respective contributions remains unclear, some prominent candidates include: novel and more powerful forms of memory (Donald 1991, 2007; Carruthers 2015), especially for particular sequences of actions (Ghirlanda, Lind, & Enquist 2017; Milne, Wilson, & Christiansen 2018; Petkov & Cate 2020); imagination and mental time travel (Suddendorf & Corballis 2007; Dor 2015, 2017; Fuentes 2017); analogical thinking (Brand, Mesoudi, & Hewlett 2021); metacognition (Heyes 2016b; Dunstone & Caldwell 2018; also see Heyes, Bang, et al. 2020); mindreading (Carruthers 2013; Heyes & Frith 2014; Moore 2021; cf. McGeer 2007; Zawidzki 2013); social tolerance brought about by self-domestication (J. Henrich 2016; Hare 2017; Wrangham 2019); shared intentionality (Tomasello, Carpenter, et al. 2005; Tomasello & Moll 2010); norm psychology (Chudek & Henrich 2011; R. Boyd 2017; Davis & Kelly 2018; cf. Andrews 2020a; Fitzpatrick 2020; also see Kelly & Setman 2020); resolve (Ainslie 2021; Setman & Kelly 2021); natural language (Ross 2007; Tamariz & Kirby 2016; Dennett 2017: chapter 9; Sterelny 2020); narrative (Scalise Sugiyama 2001, 2017; B. Boyd 2009; Sterelny 2012); reasoning (Pinker 2010; Mercier & Sperber 2011, 2017); and various tool and technological proficiencies (Vaesen 2012; A. Schulz forthcoming; Birch 2021; cf. Osiurak & Reynaud 2020).
Faced with this proliferation of options, several theorists have espoused “no magic bullet” positions, holding that there is unlikely to be any single, crucial psychological advance that will turn out to be the pivotal cognitive ingredient needed for cumulative culture. Rather, they argue, the gap between human and non-human capacities for culture will likely flow from small changes and minor increases in the functionality of several psychological mechanisms that are shared between species, along with new interactions that emerge between those and with other ecological and social factors (Sterelny 2012; J. Henrich 2016; Laland & Seed 2021; also see Ross 2019).
4. Influence on Philosophical Debates
As illustrated throughout the previous sections, philosophers have not been mere consumers of research on the cognitive science of culture, but also active contributors to various projects. This section shifts gears, highlighting several areas in which philosophers have worked to clarify the implications of this research for more conceptual debates and to draw out its consequences for discussions that have traditionally been seen as philosophical.
Indeed, philosophers are more and more frequently weaving insights and evidence about culture and cognition into discussions across a number of areas of philosophical inquiry. This entry does not pretend to provide an exhaustive overview of such work. Thus, it is worth explicitly noting that scholars in nearly every philosophical subfield have used findings from the cognitive science of culture and cultural diversity to enrich their understanding of their subject matter and support their arguments. For example, in the philosophy of religion and philosophy of language, recent insights into the cognitive foundations and dynamics of culture have been used to argue that human capacities for religion and language are not as universal and/or innate as many philosophers have taken them to be (Cloud 2014; Davis 2020). In aesthetics, philosophers have used work on culture and cognition to explore more specific questions about phenomena that were already taken to exhibit significant culturally variation, such as artistic form and aesthetic taste (Jan 2007; Verpooten & Dewitte 2017). In what follows, the focus will be on philosophical subdisciplines were the influence of work on the cognitive science of culture and cultural diversity seems to have been most pervasive: philosophy of mind, philosophy of psychiatry, ethics, epistemology, and philosophical methodology.
4.1 Culture and Extended Cognition
The cognitive science of culture has become relevant to one of the most provocative and productive ideas put forward in the philosophy of mind in recent decades, namely the extended mind thesis (Clark & Chalmers 1998). This is the claim that minds (human minds, anyway, though perhaps others as well; see Japyassú & Laland 2017) can and frequently do extend beyond brains and out into the world. The thesis can be understood as a particular expression of a broader set of ideas that also includes embodied, embedded, and enactivist approaches to cognition, and which are often discussed in terms of externalism about the mind (Rowlands, Lau, & Deutsch 2020). The common thread running through positions characterized as externalist is the thought that the boundary between a biological organism and its environment is less psychologically important than it may pretheoretically seem. Rather, insists the externalist, many interesting and important mental phenomena span that physical border, and what is external to an individual’s skull and skin can be determinative and even constitutive of their mind and its contents (R. Wilson 2004).
This core idea has been developed in several ways. Initial versions of externalism focused on semantics and mental content, holding that what some intentional mental states are about is at least in part determined by factors outside the body, including social arrangements, cultural patterns of expertise and deference, and norms that structure the division of linguistic labor (McGinn 1977; Burge 1979; Fodor 1987, 1994; cf. Putnam 1975a). Later and more contentious forms of externalism focused on the vehicles of content, holding that some cognitive processes and mental states are themselves located outside the head and body. According to this more “active” version of externalism, when a part of the environment or piece of technology becomes sufficiently integrated with an individual’s other mental processes, that bit of the world external to the skull is, strictly speaking, just as much a part of her mind as what’s going on in her brain. Her cognition extends into the world beyond her head.
The extended mind thesis is controversial (Rupert 2004; Gertler 2007, 2012; Adams & Aizawa 2008) and portions of the debates it has sparked are informed by an array of views about how to understand the relationship between cognition and different aspects of culture. For instance, Sterelny (2003, 2012) develops the conceptual resources of niche construction theory to show how humans actively engineer the cultural niches in which they live, learn, and raise children. He accepts that the accumulated structure and adaptive information found in human environments are key factors for explaining human intelligence and behavior, but he stops short of fully embracing the extended mind thesis. He holds that human cognitive functioning is greatly enhanced and amplified—scaffolded—by social, epistemic, and technological resources that are culturally transmitted and located outside the head. But he argues that genuinely extended mentality is rare, and should be understood as an extreme, limiting case of the more common and theoretically important phenomena of cognitive scaffolding (Sterelny 2010).
Others have explored more specific ideas about how the hallmarks of extended cognition are related to human culture and cultural cognition. Many have examined aspects and implications of our ability to smoothly ‘couple’ our minds with our technology (Clark 2007; Palermos 2014; Carter & Palermos 2016) as well as with our physically and socially constructed environments (Hutchins 2008, 2011; Davidson & Kelly 2020). Others have explored the idea that culture was part of the design problem that selected for minds that are cultural—porous, technologically extendable, deeply socially permeable—in exactly these ways (Tomasello 1999; R. Boyd, Richerson, & Henrich 2011; Dennett 2017; Kelly & Hoburg 2017; Muthukrishna, Doebeli, et al. 2018). Some of this work focuses on material culture and technology (Jeffares 2010; Malafouris 2013; Sterelny 2018), including how artifacts might scaffold or extend specific psychological faculties like memory (Clark 2005; Heersmink forthcoming), mathematical cognition (Menary 2015), or economic reasoning (Clark 1997b). Other work focuses on sociality and social organization (Gallagher 2013; Sterelny 2016, 2021; Carter, Clark, & Palermos 2018b; Gallagher, Mastrogiorgio, & Petracca 2019). Contributors to this strand of research have also explored the ways in which investigations into the nature of culture and extended cognition can dovetail with and help inform investigations into the nature of distributed cognition, collective mental states, and group agency (Hutchins 1995; Tollefsen 2006; Donald 2007; Huebner 2008; Smaldino & Richerson 2013; Jablonka 2017). This line of thought has even inspired hypotheses about the evolution of human brain size, linking increases in collective intelligence, the division of cognitive labor, and the externalization of knowledge with the decrease in the size of individual human brains that appears to have occurred around 3000 years ago (DeSilva et al. 2021).
4.2 Culture, Mental Disorder, and the Philosophy of Psychiatry
While the experience and recognition of cognitive dysfunction is by no means unique to any one culture, academic psychiatry was long focused on and practiced mainly by WEIRD individuals. Nonetheless, the beginning of Western ethnopsychiatry and cross-cultural psychology—the study of the cultural aspects of mental health and illness (Jovanovski 1995)—predates the recent cultural turn in cognitive science. Early pioneers were iconoclasts of Western psychiatry, rejecting its ethnocentrism and setting out to discover what they could learn from non-Western approaches to mental suffering (Ellenberger 1959; Torrey 1972). Their research agendas were driven by questions about the kinds of practices other cultures had developed to treat individuals with behavioral or mental problems, and how culture is crucial to understand how individuals give meaning to their symptoms (Good 1993). They were also concerned with how cultures differed in their conceptions of such problems, especially in how and where they drew the distinction between normal and abnormal mental conditions (Kleinman 1988; Fabrega 1991). What attracted the most attention, however, were inquiries into the nature and significance of so-called culture bound syndromes, those ways of being mentally unwell that are confined to, or are only recognized as diseases within, a particular culture. Well-studied examples of non-Western culture bound syndromes include amok (an episode of rage that often ends in killing, thought to be typical for the Indonesian Archipelago, see Griffiths 1997 for illuminating philosophical discussion) koro (a genital-shrinkage anxiety, most common in China and Southwest Asia, Crozier 2012), and latah (a condition associated with a disordered startle response that can lead to abnormal and extreme behavior, found in southeast Asia, Simons 1996). Other candidates that might fit the description (or that may have fit it at one time) include old hag (Ness 1978), fugue (Hacking 1998), multiple personality disorder (Hacking 1995a), anorexia nervosa (Banks 1991), and the Truman Show delusion (Gold & Gold 2012, 2014).
The significance of this range of syndromes lies not in their strangeness, but in the striking evidence they provide about the ways in which culture shapes mental illness. Indeed, it suggests that culture has a profound influence on several key dimensions of psychological dysfunction, affecting not just how it is diagnosed and treated, but also how it is expressed and assigned social significance. For example, schizophrenics from different cultures experience different kinds of auditory hallucinations, which they and the members of their community interpret in different ways (Luhrmann et al. 2015). The very existence of culture bound syndromes also suggests the possibility that the forms of mental disorder common in Western societies may be no exceptions to the rule. Certain eating disorders, for instance, may be culturally transmitted, spreading contagiously through social learning and media consumption (Vandereycken 2011). Evidence also suggests that while some cross culturally shared elements of PTSD flow from an innate human response to danger, others symptoms exhibit variation. For example, the depressive symptoms associated with PTSD in American war veterans may be the result of sufferers understanding themselves to have violated their own culture’s moral norms (Zefferman & Mathew 2021; also see Munch-Jurisic forthcoming).
The mounting evidence that mental disorder is so dramatically shaped by culture seemed to be unsettling. Mainstream psychiatry had long accepted the general claim that cultural factors can play a role in mental health and the etiology of disorders, by creating conditions that trigger unhealthy levels of anxiety or stress, or by stabilizing other circumstances that elicit more extreme and pathological forms of discontent with civilization (Freud 1930). Nonetheless, cultural variation in symptoms was given relatively little attention compared to what were thought to be the core, pan-cultural indicators of universal forms of dysfunction. Indeed, until recently, the Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders (DSM) treated disorders commonly found in WEIRD cultures, along with the way they presented in symptoms, as (quasi-) universal, while classifying those only found in other cultures as ‘culture-bound syndromes’ and treating them as exotic outliers. Hence one extreme and slightly tongue-in-cheek description of the perspective adopted by the DSM: “American mental illness is universal, and other cultures have specific conditions” (Murphy 2015).
This entrenched orthodoxy has drawn more critical scrutiny as cultural approaches to psychiatry have gained more traction. For instance, an influential ‘network theory’ of mental disorder shows that network models can provide important new insights into the patterns of causal interactions among symptoms, and how these patterns serve to structure (certain) mental disorders (Borsboom, Cramer, & Kalis 2019). A virtue of these models is that they allow for straightforwardly cultural factors to be involved in the relevant patterns of causal interaction (also see Kendler, Zachar, & Craver 2011). These models are thus able to capture, for example, the kinds of ‘labelling effects’ that have been posited to account for the way that naming and talking about certain deviant forms of behavior can stigmatize them, feeding back and influencing the psychological states of those who are so labelled, often producing further negative impacts on their mental health (see Hacking 1995b; Tekin 2014; also see Mallon 2016 for more general discussion of ‘looping effects’ and their interaction with cognition; cf. Goffman 1961 for a sociological perspective on similar phenomena).
Further evidence of the unsettling of the orthodoxy is that the latest edition of the DSM explicitly dropped the terminology of ‘culture bound syndromes’, replacing it with ‘cultural concepts of disease’. The rationale for this modification was that it “acknowledges that all forms of distress are locally shaped, including the DSM disorders” (American Psychiatric Association 2013, italics in original). Nevertheless, there is reason to think the changes may be merely cosmetic and peripheral rather than indicative of a deeper structural reorientation of Western psychiatric institutions. Philosophical critics have argued that at its heart the DSM remains committed to a biomedical model of disease, still conceptualizing mental disorder via an analogy with somatic disease. This conception remains inadequate, they argue, in no small part because it is unable to capture the deep influence of culture on minds and mental health (Tekin 2011; Tekin, Flanagan, & Graham 2017).
Nevertheless, philosophers of psychiatry continue to reflect on how the growing appreciation of cultural diversity should inform issues in the conceptual foundations of the field (Washington 2016; Radden 2019; Murphy ;2010 ; also see Adriaens & De Block 2011). Some have addressed questions about whether psychopathologies and categories of mental disorder are best understood as natural kinds, or whether some alternative—socially-constructed kinds, pragmatic kinds, conventional kinds, interactive kinds, normative kinds—provides a better model (Tsou 2007; Cooper 2004, 2007; Khalidi 2010; Kendler, Zachar, & Craver 2011; Tekin 2016; Stegenga 2018). Given the subject matter, these debates have immediate practical and ethical implications as well. For example, according to proponents of the normative model, a culture’s conception and categories of mental disorder are mainly a reflection of what it values rather than any objective mental or physiological facts. This would raise familiar challenges concerning relativism and disagreements about mental disorder between cultures: behaviors and states of mind that are unusual (or even normal) but considered normatively acceptable in one culture may be pathologized in another, and there would be no further fact of the matter that would make correct or incorrect either way of separating genuinely pathological and disordered behavior from behavior that is merely unusual or socially unacceptable behavior (Feit 2020; but see Wakefield 2006). Others have explored different ethical aspects of psychiatric diversity and cognitive dysfunction. For example, the widespread exportation of Western practice and thought about mental illness to the rest of the world may have resulted in a global transformation of human mental life (Watters 2010), leading some philosophers to call for a postcolonial psychiatry (Kamens 2020).
4.3 Culture, Moral Psychology, and Moral Theory
Empirical approaches to moral psychology have risen dramatically in influence and visibility in the last few decades (Nichols 2004; Prinz 2007; Sinnott-Armstrong 2008a,b,c; Doris and the Moral Psychology Group 2010; Doris, Stich, & Walmsley 2020; Doris, Stich, et al. 2020; Alfano, Loeb, & Plakias 2018; Kelly & Setman 2020), but, as in other areas of cognitive science, practitioners continue to wrestle with the WEIRD challenge. Moral psychologists concerned with cultural and cognitive variation have added to the case that Westerners are outliers, and along many of the dimensions that appear directly relevant to moral theory (Graham et al. 2013, 2018). Comparatively speaking, WEIRD people appear to be more individualistic, guilt-ridden, impersonally prosocial, and accepting of impartial fairness norms, but less nepotistic, less loyal to friends, and less likely to exhibit ingroup favoritism (J. Schulz et al. 2019; J. Henrich 2020; also see Davis & Kelly forthcoming for a cultural perspective on the psychology of ingroup/outgroup biases). Their moral judgments also appear to be more sensitive to the intentions and mental states of those whose behavior they are evaluating (Barrett, Bolyanatz, et al. 2016; McNamara et al. 2019; Curtin et al. 2020; Barrett & Saxe 2021; also see Willard & McNamara 2019). This has led some philosophers to argue that the explicit moral theories produced by Western moral philosophers, especially those who rely mainly on their own intuitions, may be worrisomely parochial rather than expressions of panhuman or transcendent moral truth (Flanagan 2016; Van Norden 2017; see also section 4.5 below). Others have explored the ways in which research on the biological and cultural origins of human moral psychology can help inform our understanding of the nature of morality itself (Joyce 2007; Machery & Mallon 2010; Stanford 2018). This perspective has led some to argue that the category of morality, understood as a special subdomain of normativity in general, is itself culturally parochial, an historically recent creation of Western philosophers (Machery 2018; also see Stich 2018; Davis & Kelly 2018).
Others have drawn on empirically-oriented work on culture and cognition to inform more specific debates within moral theory, broadly construed. A wealth of empirical evidence has demonstrated cultural differences in behaviors, norms, and judgments concerned with reciprocity, fairness, and altruism (Sober & Wilson 1998; J. Henrich, Boyd, et al. 2004, 2005; Mathew, Boyd, & Van Veelen 2013; Baumard, André, & Sperber 2013; Sterelny 2016). Naturalistic philosophers, in turn, have attempted to clarify the significance of the revealed variation, spelling out what it might mean for metaethical theorizing (Machery, Kelly, & Stich 2005; Doris & Plakias 2008) or how it might reflect on the range and moral status of different forms of altruism and cooperation (Binmore 2006; Zollman 2008; Clavien & Chapuisat 2013; Sterelny, Joyce, et al. 2013, Sterelny 2021; Curry 2016; Curry et al. forthcoming; Piccinini & Schulz 2019; Doris, Stich, & Walmsley 2020). Several philosophers have argued that there is non-trivial cultural variation in the most basic components of morality, and as such that there are unlikely to be many moral universals (Prinz 2008; A. Levy & Levy 2020; cf. Mikhail 2007, 2011).
Philosophers have long been interested in the genealogy of morals (Nietzsche 1887), and the subsequent rise of the fields of cognitive science, Evolutionary Psychology, and empirical moral psychology has brought with it a surge of interest in evolutionary debunking arguments of morality. These have sparked a great deal of philosophical debate, but it has been slow to seriously integrated cultural evolution or the contemporary cognitive science of culture into the discussion (Kelly 2017). Critics have pointed out that debunkers have rarely paid close attention to the details of scientific accounts of the evolution of morality, even though some of the premises of their debunking arguments seem to rely on such details, including details about the cultural roots of many components of our moral minds (Cline 2015; Braddock 2021). Others have similarly traced out how empirical inaccuracies in the premises of debunking arguments undermine their conclusions (Machery & Mallon 2010; Sterelny & Fraser 2017; A. Levy & Levy 2020).
Unsurprisingly, moral realists who take a genealogical perspective see things differently than the debunkers (Huemer 2016). Many philosophers have been attracted to the idea that human cultures are in the midst of a significant historical trend in the direction of moral progress, as the last several centuries have witnessed a putative triumph of the open society, a proliferation of broadly inclusive norms and values across the globe (Jamieson 2002; Singer 1981 ; Buchanan & Powell 2018; Gaus 2021; also see Pinker 2011, 2018). This wide and relatively rapid spread of inclusivity is difficult for evolutionarily-inspired moral skeptics and anti-realists to account for, the realist argues, because the extension of moral concern beyond members of a cultural ingroup seems to be maladaptive from an evolutionary perspective. Thus, realism seems better able to account for the trend, explaining why inclusivist norms and values spread so quickly, and of why it only happened so recently.
Critics have responded by arguing that there are viable alternative accounts for the trend, explanations that appeal to the interplay between cultural capacities and cultural dynamics rather than to the discovery and tracking of mind independent moral facts (Hopster 2020, also see Cofnas 2020). They also point out that it has been known since the establishment of the field of cultural evolution that cultural evolutionary processes can and not infrequently do lead to biologically non-adaptive outcomes (R. Boyd & Richerson 1985), and that explanations that can account for the spread of packages of norms and values, but do not require a commitment to moral realism, have since grown in sophistication and empirical support (Richerson, Baldini, et al. 2016). Other critics have argued further that whether or not the realist’s preferred explanation of the historical trend is, indeed, the best explanation depends not only in the empirical details about the evolution and character of our moral and cultural capacities, but also on the details of history and how the spread of inclusivity actually occurred. They conclude the realist argument also requires deeper empirical engagement on a number of fronts to be convincing (Hassan 2019).
4.4 Culture and Epistemology
The improved understanding of the impact of culture on cognition, and especially of the importance of social learning and the extent and depth of cognitive diversity (J. Henrich, Blasi, et al. forthcoming), has also attracted the attention of epistemologists (Machery, Stich, et al. 2017; Mizumoto et al. 2018; also see Figueroa & Harding 2003, especially Wylie 2003; Feest & Sturm 2011). Western epistemology has traditionally focused on questions about what it is for individuals to have knowledge, but the last several decades have seen a growing interest in socially-oriented approaches to epistemic phenomena and to knowers themselves. These social approaches, in turn, are better positioned to capture and account for the ways in which aspects of culture are epistemologically significant (Carter, Clark et al. 2018a; Grasswick 2006 ; Goldman & O’Connor 2019 ).
For example, this social turn in epistemology has sparked research into cognitive mechanisms for epistemic vigilance, especially those that monitor and regulate communication (Sperber, Clément, et al. 2010; Mercier 2020). It has also directed attention towards many different aspects of epistemic norms, those informal rules of conduct that regulate how people handle information, assess evidence of various kinds, make public assertions (Kneer 2021), etc. Epistemic norms also underpin social trust, prescribing how one ought to assign credence to testimony given by people who bear different social identities, belong to different groups, and are associated with different institutions and forms of expertise (Lackey 2008; Goldberg 2010; Littlejohn & Turri 2014; Henderson 2020). An especially fruitful strand of this research has examined variation in such norms, and in the ways in which they can be unfair to members of marginalized cultural groups, and thus contribute to a myriad of forms of epistemic injustice (Fricker 2007; Medina 2013; Dotson 2014). Other research at the intersection of social epistemology and political philosophy (Edenberg & Hannon 2021) has looked at the way certain configurations of epistemic norms, together with the operation of selective learning heuristics like the my-side bias and tribal social instincts mentioned in Section 3.3, can create filter bubbles and echo chambers (E. Anderson 2021; Nguyen 2020), contribute to the spread of misinformation (O’Connor & Weatherall 2019), and sustain extreme forms of polarization and partisanship (Rini 2017, also see Raymond, Kelly, & Hennes forthcoming). Work on the character of scientific inquiry has also looked at the role of epistemic norms in the production of knowledge by scientific communities (Kuhn 1962; Barnes et al. 1996; Vaesen 2021), including norms that specify what counts as acceptable evidence (Longino 1990) and norms that prescribe that empirical evidence be accorded a unique significance in the construction and evaluation of scientific argumentation (Strevens 2020).
Another strand in this research examines familiar tensions between individual and collective levels of analysis as they emerge in epistemological contexts. For example, psychological tendencies that look like biases or failures of rationality from the point of view of individual reasoning may be the very same tendencies that, when widely shared, allow for the accumulation over time of group beneficial cultural traits and adaptive wherewithal. The tendency of humans to over-imitate, for example, may lead them to occasionally expend extra time and energy mimicking unnecessary steps in a sequence of behaviors. Considered individually, episodes of copying “too much” can look like a mistake, and the underlying propensity like a source of irrationality and inefficiency. From a collective perspective, however, such a tendency, distributed across members of the population, may be a key factor in the group’s ability to create, sustain, and faithfully transmit cumulative culture and knowledge over the span of generations (Hoehl et al. 2019, also see J. Henrich 2016). Similarly, others have argued that what look like reasoning mistakes when examined in isolation are driven by heuristics like a my-side bias that make important contributions to a group’s ability reap the benefits of dividing cognitive labor (Mercier & Sperber 2011, 2017; also see Peters forthcoming on confirmation bias). A similar perspective has been used to recast questions about epistemic accountability, suggesting that while many ‘biases’ may facilitate collective reasoning and the group level production of knowledge, individuals who employ those biases fail to qualify as epistemically virtuous. Those individuals, that is, do not deserve any epistemic credit for the knowledge their biases help produce (N. Levy & Alfano 2020; also see Palermos 2016 and Alfano 2021; cf. Rini 2017 for an argument that inverts the evaluation, holding that in some contexts partisanship in acceptance of testimony can be individually virtuous but lead to epistemic outcomes—like the widespread circulation of fake news—that are clearly vicious at collective levels).
4.5 Culture, Intuition, and Philosophical Methodology
Contemporary philosophy that is considered Western is recognized as such in virtue of tracing its origins back to a particular geographical region, centered especially in Athens and Rome, but also in virtue of a shared body of topics and methods. Appreciation of human cultural and cognitive diversity can fuel the suspicion that many topics worthy of philosophical consideration have been given less attention than they deserve by the Western tradition. This, in turn, can be used to support the case that more Western philosophers should branch out, exploring comparative projects and studying other traditions (Van Norden 2017, also see Coseru 2009 ; Outlaw 2010 ; Vargas 2007; Kasulis 2019; Wong 2001 ; Møllgaard 2021).
Within the Western tradition, arguments from cultural and cognitive diversity have come to loom large in debates about philosophical methodology. Some have pointed out that many traditions use approaches that seem alien to contemporary Western philosophy, such as meditation or syncretism (McLeod 2016, also see Struck 2016 for a case that divination was taken seriously by ancient Greek philosophers, and Jones 2001 for an argument that philosophical methods are universal). Most discussions in this area, however, have centered on intuitions, and their character, distribution across populations, and proper role in philosophical theorizing (also see Pust 2012 )
Since the early 2000s, experimental philosophers have gathered their own data and used it to support a variety of projects (Sytsma & Livengood 2016; Knobe & Nichols 2017). One of the most prominent has tried to develop arguments showing how diversity—in culture, in cognition, and especially in philosophical intuition—presents challenges to philosophers who rely too heavily on appeals to their own intuitions, or solely on the intuitions of a select few (Egler forthcoming). Intuitions about philosophical issues may vary in ways that raise doubts about the significance of projects that fail to take account of such variation. As an early manifesto put it:
Since it’s in some sense an accident that I had the cultural upbringing that I did, I am forced to wonder whether my intuitions are superior at tracking the nature of the world, the mind, and the good. (Knobe & Nichols 2008, 11; also see DiPaolo & Simpson 2016; Andow 2016)
Conclusions reached mainly on the basis of ‘close to home’ intuitions may be relative and limited in scope, the argument goes, as philosophers in other cultures and with other intuitions may rationally arrive at different or even contrasting conclusions.
The empirical situation as revealed by experimental philosophy, however, is far from simple or straightforward. Initial efforts presented evidence of diversity in the intuitive judgments people from different groups made about the moral, epistemic, and semantic features of a range of scenarios. For example, one of the first experimental philosophy studies found that East Asian participants exhibited markedly different responses than Westerner participants to the kinds of Gettier cases commonly used by analytic epistemologists (Weinberg, Nichols, & Stich 2001). Similarly, the first cross-cultural study of semantic intuitions about reference, which used scenarios based on Kripke’s famous Gödel-case, again found evidence of interesting differences between East Asian and Western participants (Machery, Mallon, et al. 2004).
Some, but not all, of these results have replicated (Cova, Strickland, et al. 2021). While later studies seemed to confirm that semantic intuitions differ cross-culturally (Beebe & Undercoffer 2016; van Dongen et al. 2021), subsequent research has indicated there may be cross-cultural convergence on Gettier-cases and other epistemic intuitions (Kim & Yuan 2015; Machery, Stich, et al. 2017; Yuan & Kim forthcoming; but see Waterman et al., 2018; Sękowski et al. forthcoming). Empirical research on intuitions about free will has revealed another messy picture, with some work suggesting that many young Americans have compatibilist intuitions (Nahmias et al. 2006), while other studies find evidence of convergence, with participants from different cultures embracing incompatibilism and rejecting determinism (Sarkissian et al. 2010). Other research suggests that people in Asia tend to make judgments about free will that systematically differ from the judgments in the rest of the world (Hannikainen et al. 2019). Investigation into aesthetic intuitions found that participants across cultures broadly agree that aesthetic judgments are subjective and not universally valid, though there is evidence of patterns of differences in detail (Cova, Garcia, & Liao 2015).
Philosophers continue to debate the implications of this complicated and evolving empirical picture. Some have explored how such evidence may be put to use by experimental philosophers engaged in positive substantive projects of explication and conceptual engineering (Shepherd & Justus 2015; Schupbach 2017; Nado 2021). Even when intuitions about philosophical cases do not significantly vary, systematic investigation of them may still yield important evidence in the analysis of concepts (Stich & Tobia 2016, also see Knobe 2016 and Machery 2017).
The empirical picture has been interpreted by advocates of more traditional (Western) methods to support those methods. Some have given a close analysis of the nature and use of intuitions, and defended the perhaps surprisingly view that even if they do exhibit patterns of cross-cultural variation, it would be irrelevant to philosophical methodology because intuitions play only a minor role in philosophical argumentation (Cappelen 2012, also see Ichikawa, Maitra, & Weatherson 2012). Others have accepted that intuitions are important to philosophical methodology, but argued that the empirical record does not reflect enough variation, or the right kind of variation, to be philosophically troubling (Knobe 2019; cf. Stich & Machery forthcoming). Some have been most impressed with the discovered uniformity, arguing that it deflates experimental philosophy’s diversity-based methodological challenge (Ichikawa 2012).
Another line of response to the challenge focuses on the details in the patterns of variation, arguing that the revealed diversity is often superficial or philosophically toothless (Sosa 2009), or that disagreement suggested by the presence of conflicting intuitions would usually disappear if the individuals from different cultures could discuss cases or provide justifications for their intuitions (Deutsch 2010). Debates about one such response, which has become known as the expertise defense, consider in detail the possibility that some instances of variation are innocuous. Some people’s intuitions, specifically those people with special expertise or training, are more sensitive to philosophical issues. Thus, not only should differences between lay people and experts to be expected, but, continues the argument, the intuitions of the experts deserve more evidential weight in philosophizing (Devitt 2011; Williamson 2011; also see Horvath & Koch 2021). This defense, claim its critics, relies on what appear to be questionable empirical assumptions about experts and their intuitions (Weinberg, Gonnerman, et al. 2010; Schwitzgebel & Cushman 2015; Wiegmann, Horvath, & Meyer 2020; Horvath & Wiegmann forthcoming). One response that is particularly intriguing for those interested in cognition and cultural variation is that the intuitions of experts—trained philosophers—seem to vary quite dramatically according to their linguistic background (Vaesen, Peterson, & Van Bezooijen 2013). These debates continue. No one, however, has argued against the idea that reflection on cultural diversity in worldviews, values, conceptualizations, cognition, or intuition can be philosophically valuable in ways that go far beyond their relevance to debates about methodology.
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- Prinz, Jesse, “Culture and Cognitive Science”, Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2022 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/spr2022/entries/culture-cogsci/>. [This was the previous entry on this topic in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy – see the version history.]