Arabic and Islamic Metaphysics
Among the philosophical disciplines transmitted to the Arabic and Islamic world from the Greeks, metaphysics was of paramount importance, as its pivotal role in the overall history of the transmission of Greek thought into Arabic makes evident. The beginnings of Arabic philosophy coincide with the production of the first extensive translation of Aristotle’s Metaphysics, within the circle of translators associated with the founder of Arabic philosophy, al-Kindī. The so-called “early” or “classical” phase of falsafa ends with the largest commentary on the Metaphysics available in Western philosophy, by Ibn Rushd (Averroes). The following “golden” age of Arabic thought continues to be primarily concerned with metaphysics, turning from the effort of interpreting the intricacies of Aristotle’s canonical text towards the process of assimilating the model of metaphysical science first outlined by al-Fārābī and then implemented by Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna).
In the incipit of the Metaphysics according to the Arabic way of ordering the books of this work (book Alpha Elatton, chapter 1), Arabic philosophers could even find the justification of their Greek pedigree and their raison d’être in a predominantly religious society: philosophy is said there to be constitutively a “search” and to be directed towards a goal—truth—that surpasses human individual capacities both objectively, for its extremely wide scope, and subjectively, for the weakness of man’s cognitive faculties, thus obliging its followers to join their efforts with all previous and present investigators of truth. This explains the large fortune of this proemium, and of the similitude accompanying it (the human intellect, with respect to the most knowable things, is like bats’ eyes with respect to daylight), not only in philosophy, but also in theology and literature, to such an extent that its different versions can be taken as specimens of the various understandings of the nature and possibilities of falsafa, and of the degree of its dependence on Greek thought, in the history of Arabic-Islamic philosophy.
This impression of centrality is confirmed by the large number and great variety of works pertaining to metaphysics written in Arabic—translations of the basic Greek texts, different kinds of commentaries on the translated material, original works with various degrees of comprehensiveness and doctrinal depth, etc.—all of which provide clear evidence of the intellectual vivacity and the productive energy of this philosophical area. Such an intensive reflection on metaphysics leads to what represents the specific Arabic contribution to the history of this discipline, namely the progressive devising of a new standard of metaphysics, in which this discipline assumes the form of a comprehensive and articulated synthesis of the Greek heritage, undergoes a process of epistemological refinement—in terms of definition of scope, coherence of structure, rigorousness of arguments, etc.—and ascends to the role of cornerstone of philosophy. This process brings forth a real “second beginning” of metaphysics in the history of philosophy, whose model eventually prevailed in philosophical circles, despite occasional criticisms motivated by an anachronistic desire to defend the Greek legacy in its uncontaminated form. Non-philosophical forms of knowledge—above all revealed theology—also had to confront the challenge posed by metaphysics. The vigorous and long-lasting impact of this metaphysical paradigm in non-Arabic and non-Muslim cultural areas, like the Latin-Christian and the Hebrew-Jewish, attests to its great doctrinal and epistemological attractiveness.
- 1. The Fundamental Texts, the Approaches, the Issues
- 2. The Arabic Translations of the Metaphysics
- 3. Al-Kindī and His School
- 4. Ṯābit ibn Qurra
- 5. Al-Fārābī
- 6. The Baghdad Aristotelians
- 7. Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna)
- 8. Post-Avicennian Period
- 9. Conclusion
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1. The Fundamental Texts, the Approaches, the Issues
The above considerations show that the fate of metaphysics as a branch of philosophy in the Arabic speaking world and in Muslim societies coincides, by and large, with the reception, transmission and transformation of Aristotle’s Metaphysics. The anti-Aristotelian tendencies of the early phase of Arabic philosophy, marked by the adoption of a decidedly Platonic stance in metaphysics and the consequent rejection of Aristotle’s teaching, evident in the views of Abū Bakr Muḥammad Ibn Zakariyāʾ al-Rāzī (d. ca. 925), remained a local and short-lived phenomenon. In mainstream Arabic philosophy, the Metaphysics represented for centuries the centerpiece of the corresponding discipline. Aristotle’s work is the only Greek work mentioned in connection with metaphysics in the Arabic classifications of the sciences. No other Greek metaphysical work was translated and commented upon in the same continuous, widespread and multiform manner, or quoted so often and extensively in original treatises. Other vehicles of Greek metaphysical thought, like the Theologia Aristotelis, whose avowed aim was to make Aristotle’s work compatible with Islamic creationism by means of the Neoplatonic doctrine of emanation, stress from the outset the primacy of the Metaphysics as the fundamental text of metaphysics, and fictively portray Aristotle as the author of the adaptation of the Plotinian material by means of which the desired completion of the Metaphysics is performed. If the Metaphysics—as well as the entire Aristotelian corpus—underwent a gradual eclipse in post-Avicennian Arabic philosophy, this was not due to a decline of its prestige, but to the success of Avicenna’s incorporation of the text and the doctrine of Aristotle’s work in his new encyclopedia of the philosophical sciences, The Cure or Healing (Al-Šifāʾ) where he constantly stresses his reliance on the teaching of the “First Master” (Aristotle) and his disciples.
Schematically, Arab authors adopted three main ways of approaching the text of Aristotle’s Metaphysics, corresponding to three different literary genres. The first approach, which can be called “taxonomical”, is found in classificatory essays whose goal is to outline the content of the Metaphysics and to clarify its place in the Aristotelian corpus, and to indicate the position of the discipline of metaphysics in the system of knowledge. The “exegetical” approach is represented by commentaries that aim at explaining, with different degrees of literalness and comprehensiveness, the content of the Metaphysics. The tendency to adaptation, finally, is visible in metaphysical treatises that reformulate the doctrine of Aristotle’s work and are intended as original elaborations, regardless of the degree of dependence on their Greek model. All main authors who considered metaphysics approached Aristotle’s Metaphysics, to different extents and degrees, from these various perspectives.
From the doctrinal point of view, Arabic interpreters of the Metaphysics debated three basic theoretical issues. First of all, they reflected on the scientific configuration of the discipline presented by Aristotle in his work, with special focus on fundamental aspects such as its subject-matter (namely the issue of whether metaphysics is a philosophical theology, or an ontology, or both), structure, method, and position in the system of knowledge. This consideration of the epistemic status of metaphysics took into account an enlarged Aristotelian corpus, which included within theoretical philosophy a mathematics based on Euclid and Ptolemy (since Aristotle himself wrote no treatise on mathematics), and complemented the Metaphysics with pseudo-Aristotelian Neoplatonic metaphysical works (the Plotinian Theologia Aristotelis and the Proclean Liber de causis). The second concern is the investigation of specific doctrines related to the distinct issues within the Metaphysics. The prominent topics within the study of being qua being, or ontology, are the various aspects of the theory of essence, like the clarification of its relationship with form and substance, the discussion of the epistemological and ontological status of universals, etc. Of central importance in cosmology is the debate about the eternity vs. the origination of the world, and the mode of the universe’s production by the First Principle, whether by way of emanation from Its own essence or creation ex nihilo. In philosophical theology, finally, the features that Aristotle ascribes to the divine Unmoved Mover, with particular regard to Its unity, necessity and intellectual nature, provide the starting-points for far-reaching developments. The third concern is the discussion of the relationship of the philosophical theology contained in Aristotle’s Metaphysics with Islam, namely the assessment of the degree of compatibility between the rational conception of the divinity transmitted by Greek philosophy, on the one hand, and the image of God conveyed by Islamic prophetic revelation, on the other. The assumption of the oneness of truth, common among Arabic philosophers, allows the metaphysical part of philosophy to provide a rational and coherent account of the same divine realm disclosed by revelation, thereby putting it in competition with Islamic theology. The results of these three doctrinal concerns are interconnected, since a certain view of metaphysics as a science, and a certain stand on specific doctrinal points, can enhance or reduce the affinity of metaphysics with Islamic religion and the possibility of its integration into Muslim culture. A conception of metaphysics that limits the scope of this science to philosophical theology and minimizes the relevance of the general doctrine of being is particularly apt to underscore its compatibility with Islam. By contrast, a view of metaphysics in which the ontological dimension, in addition to the theological, plays a prominent role, and in which the First Principle’s properties are discordant, rather than congruent, with the Islamic divine attributes, goes in the opposite direction.
The different textual approaches and theoretical solutions to the aforementioned problems are assumed here as guidelines for the articulation of the history of the Arabic reception of the Metaphysics. On this basis, seven main chronological periods can be roughly distinguished. The first five phases culminate in the sixth, i.e., in Avicenna, who emerges, at the present stage of research, as the turning point of the history of Arabic metaphysics.
2. The Arabic Translations of the Metaphysics
The translation activity regarding the Metaphysics continued uninterruptedly for three centuries (the ninth to the eleventh), with the production of several Arabic versions of Aristotle’s text, some of which might have depended on Syriac intermediaries, and the involvement of a number of different translators, belonging to the main schools of Arabic philosophy. These translations display different degrees of inclusiveness (from integral versions of Aristotle’s work to translations of its single books) and literalness (from strict word for word procedures to styles more akin to paraphrase). Cumulatively, the Arabic translations of the Metaphysics evidence the intention of making the entire text of Aristotle’s work accessible to Arabic readers, extending the translation activity from the main bulk of the work towards more peripheral books, like Alpha Meizon (I) and Nu (XIV). Equally clear is the effort to provide an Arabic version increasingly faithful to the Greek original and more respondent to philosophical clarity, and a special focus on the repeatedly translated book Lambda (XII). Also remarkable is the inclusion in the translation activity of the main available Greek commentaries on the Metaphysics, namely those of Alexander of Aphrodisias and Themistius (less certain is the case of Syrianus’ commentary), whose explanations of book Lambda (and, in the case of Syrianus, Beta (III)) were translated together with the corresponding books of Aristotle’s work. Since other Greek works intimately related to Aristotle’s Metaphysics were also translated into Arabic—like Theophrastus’s On First Principles, the metaphysical section of Nicholas of Damascus’s On the Philosophy of Aristotle, Alexander of Aphrodisias’s On the Principles of the Universe, the De aeternitate mundi contra Aristotelem and other cosmological writings of Philoponus—the entire Greek exegetical tradition of the Metaphysics, from Aristotle’s first disciples (Theophrastus) to his last interpreters/reformers (Philoponus), was available to Arabic-speaking scholars.
On account of its long duration, the high rank of the scholars it engaged, and the breadth of its scope this area of the overall translation movement from Greek into Arabic cannot be reduced to a mere preliminary phase of the Arabic reception of the Metaphysics, but rather provides a specimen of the main trends that characterized the first centuries of its history.
3. Al-Kindī and His School
Al-Kindī (d. after 870) engaged in a taxonomic approach to Aristotle’s corpus, on the basis of a number of unidentified Greek sources of Neoplatonic heritage (Treatise on the Quantity of Aristotle’s Books and What is Required to Attain Philosophy, Risāla fī kammiyyat kutub Arisṭāṭālīs wa-mā yuḥtaǧu ilayhi fī taḥṣīl al-falsafa). In this treatise, he expresses an ambivalent view of the place of the Metaphysics in the corpus, by presenting Aristotle’s work as the culmination of a four-fold division of philosophy into mathematics, logic, physics, and metaphysics, but also as preliminary to the knowledge of ethics. The description of the content of the Metaphysics is limited to the part of this work dealing with philosophical theology (the study of immaterial things), and contains explicit references to Islamic tenets such as God’s oneness, the divine names, and providence.
Due to the loss of what might have been a specific commentary on the Metaphysics (attested under the title of Inclusive Philosophy, Falsafa dāḫila), the exegetical tendencies of al-Kindī can only be guessed. His extant works on metaphysics indicate the adoption of the paraphrase as explanatory technique, and a special attention to book Alpha Elatton (II, the first book of the Metaphysics in the Arab tradition), intended as introductory to the theological themes of book Lambda.
Al-Kindī’s main metaphysical treatise (Book on First Philosophy, Kitāb fī l-falsafa al-ūlā, only partially extant) displays monotheistic concerns (the insistence on the theme of God’s unity, with recourse to a model of the God-world relationship reminiscent of the Neoplatonic metaphysics of Theologia Aristotelis and Liber de causis), and the adoption of the doctrine of the creation of the universe in time (derived from Philoponus). The explicit encomiastic references to Aristotle occurring at the beginning (with extensive paraphrastic excerpts of Metaphysics Alpha Elatton) and the abrupt switch to the themes of Book Lambda (albeit treated in an un-Aristotelian vein) confirm that the one-sided theologizing approach to the Metaphysics is directed at showing the compatibility of Greek metaphysics with Islamic religion. Thus, al-Kindī often portrays philosophy in general, and metaphysics in particular, as the discipline deputed to give full articulation and rational explanation to the miraculous conciseness of the prophetic message (besides the central section of On the Quantity of Aristotle’s Books, see also the Epistle on the Explanation of the Prosternation of the Extreme Body and its Obedience to God, Risāla fī l-Ibāna ʿan suǧūd al-ǧirm al-aqṣā wa-ṭāʿatihī li-llāhi).
The view of metaphysics as essentially a science of the divine being, rather than of being in general, and the intent of underscoring its affinity, once assimilated with philosophical theology, with Islam, was also characteristic of al-Kindī’s direct disciples and the “school” of authors inspired by his teaching or dependent on his same sources. This is evident both in classifications of the sciences (Qusṭā ibn Lūqā, d. 912; Ibn Farīġūn, 10th century, the Rasāʾil of the Iḫwān al-Ṣafāʾ, written around 961–986; Miskawayh, d. 1030), and in independent treatises related to metaphysics (see Abū Sulaymān al-Manṭiqī al-Siǧistānī, d. ca. 985, and his school; Abū l-Ḥasan Muḥammad ibn Yūsuf al-ʿĀmirī, d. 992).
4. Ṯābit ibn Qurra
According to historical sources, Ṯābit ibn Qurra (d. 901) might have revised the translation into Arabic of Themistius’ paraphrase of Metaphysics Lambda. More importantly, this author wrote the first known extant Arabic commentary on the Metaphysics, still glossed by Ibn Taymiyya (d. 1328) four centuries later, according to the method of concise exposition (talḫīṣ), i.e., isolating the most relevant points of the commented text. This commentary shares with al-Kindī’s works a special regard for the place of philosophical theology within metaphysics, since it focuses on book Lambda of Aristotle’s Metaphysics. Also Kindian is the effort to accommodate Islamic monotheism, by insisting on the oneness and willful action of God, and by adopting the Porphyrian theme of the harmony between Aristotle’s and Plato’s teaching. At variance with al-Kindī, by contrast, is Ṯābit’s endorsing of the doctrine of the eternity of the world, rather than its creation in time, against Philoponus, and the minimal reliance on Neoplatonic writings. The background of the commentary is decidedly Aristotelian, with some possible influence of the Peripatetic commentators (most notably Themistius, who however is never mentioned); nonetheless, Ṯābit revises some crucial tenets of Aristotle’s philosophical theology, by understanding, for example, the First Mover as the first cause not only of the motion of the universe, but also of its existence.
Besides more traditional overviews of the works of Aristotle and the place of the Metaphysics among them (What Ought to be Premised to the Learning of Aristotle’s Philosophy, Mā yanbaġī an yuqaddama qabla taʿallum falsafat Ariṣṭū; Aristotle’s Philosophy and Its Parts, Falsafat Arisṭūṭālīs wa-aǧzāʾ falsafatihī), al-Fārābī (d. 950) also provided taxonomic accounts in which the Metaphysics is related to the system of the philosophical and Islamic sciences, rather than to the Aristotelian corpus of writings. In the most important and influential essay of this type, the Enumeration of the Sciences (Iḥṣāʾ al-ʿulūm), he portrays metaphysics as a discipline having a precise method (demonstration) and an articulated structure, in which a full-fledged ontology (the study of being qua being) in its different aspects precedes, first, a part dealing with the foundation of the other sciences and, second, a philosophical theology concerned, among other things, with Islamic issues such as God’s attributes, divine names and actions. In all these classificatory treatises, the position of the Metaphysics with respect to the other works of Aristotle, or of metaphysics with respect to the other philosophical disciplines, is not stable, but varies according to the particular perspective that al-Fārābī adopts: significantly, in some of them metaphysics is presented as the culmination of the entire system of knowledge, for example, in The Philosophy of Aristotle.
The consideration of the entire Metaphysics, and the view of metaphysics as universal science, are the pivotal elements of the short introduction to the Metaphysics written by al-Fārābī, following the model of the Prolegomena of Greek Late Antiquity and the teaching of Ammonius Son of Hermeias and his Aristotelian school in Alexandria. This essay, On the Goals of the Sage [= Aristotle] in Each Treatise of the Book Marked by Means of Letters [= Metaphysics] (Maqāla … fī Aġrāḍ al-ḥakīm fī kull maqāla min al-kitāb al-mawsūm bi-l-ḥurūf), represents the first integral exegesis of the Metaphysics extant in Arabic and reveals al-Fārābī’s dependence on the epistemology of the newly translated Posterior Analytics. Fārābī’s use of a style of exegesis stemming from the Peripatetic tradition is a manifestation of his affiliation with the coeval school of Baghdad Aristotelians. The main point of the work is that metaphysics is more encompassing than, and not reducible to, the philosophical theology of book Lambda. Following this aim, al-Fārābī first rejects the attempts to interpret Aristotle’s work along Neoplatonic and monotheistic lines (in this he has probably in mind al-Kindī’s theologizing conception of metaphysics), and advocates a type of explanation akin to that of the Greek commentators (Alexander of Aphrodisias and Themistius). Then he derives from the universal nature of metaphysics, understood as the science having being qua being as its subject-matter, indications regarding its scope (it incorporates a part on philosophical theology, namely on the doctrine of the first causes of being), as well as on its oneness as an universal science (there cannot be more than one universal science), its name (by being more general than physics it is also “after” physics) and its overall content. Finally, he concludes with a brief description of each of the books of Aristotle’s work known to him, in which the content of book Lambda is summarized with no religious overtones. In this way, al-Fārābī extracts from Aristotle’s work a coherent and all-encompassing outline of an “ideal” science of metaphysics; this project will guide the following generations of Arabic metaphysicians, in particular Avicenna, to build a new science of metaphysics according to Farabian parameters.
In al-Fārābī’s main works on political philosophy, philosophical theology is the only part of metaphysics that functions as preliminary—together with human noetics, man’s destiny in the after-life, and prophecy—to the account of the organization of the ideal state (Principles of the Opinions of the Inhabitants of the Virtuous City, Mabādiʾ Ārāʾ Ahl al-Madīna al-Fāḍila). Other works of his, on the other hand, deal specifically with ontological themes. Among them, the Book of Letters (Kitāb al-Ḥurūf, which is not, properly speaking, a commentary on the Metaphysics, despite the title echoing one of the Arabic names of Aristotle’s work) follows a pattern analogous to that of Book Delta (V) of the Metaphysics; the treatise On One and Unity (Fī l-wāḥid wa-l-waḥda) is thematically linked to Book Iota (X); the refutation of Philoponus’ criticism of Aristotle is a reassessment of the thesis of the eternity of the world. Scattered references to the Metaphysics, with regard to distinct topics, surface also in the famous Book on the Agreement of the Opinions of the Two Sages, the Divine Plato and Aristotle (Kitāb al-Ǧamʿ bayna raʾyay al-ḥakīmayn Aflāṭūn al-ilāhī wa-Arisṭūṭālīs), which resumes the Porphyrian theme of the harmony between Aristotle’s and Plato’s views, that had been taken up by al-Kindī and Ṯābit ibn Qurra, but seems alien to Fārābī’s conception of the history of philosophy. For this and other reasons, the Farabian authorship of this treatise, despite the manuscript evidence, has been repeatedly questioned in recent scholarship.
The view that metaphysics is the universal science of being qua being, and thus exceeds the boundaries of philosophical theology by including it as one of its parts, functions in al-Fārābī to underscore the irreducibility of metaphysics to Islamic religion: at the level of content, metaphysics ranges over a thematic spectrum wider than the Muslim creed; on epistemic grounds, the demonstrative method of metaphysics (and of philosophy in general) is superior not only to the rhetorical and poetical character of prophetic discourse, but also to the dialectical procedures of Islamic theology (kalām). This helps to explain why al-Fārābī does not indulge in the philosophical explanation of the Qurʾān, and why in the political works does he treat topics pertinent to religion from a strictly philosophical point of view, with no concession to religious terminology or theological motives.
6. The Baghdad Aristotelians
The Metaphysics held an undisputable importance for the school of Christian Aristotelians that flourished in Baghdad during the X–XI centuries, who took over from the Aristotelian scholars of Alexandria the project of providing a systematic commentary on Aristotle’s works. Many members of this school—starting from its founder, Abū Bišr Mattā ibn Yūnus (d. 940), through to its later leader, Abū Zakariyāʾ Yaḥyā Ibn ʿAdī (d. 974), and to one of its last representatives, ʿĪsā ibn Zurʿa (d. 1008)—contributed decisively to the translation of the Metaphysics into Arabic. Moreover, some of these authors are credited with the translation into Arabic of parts of the main Greek commentaries on the Metaphysics (Alexander of Aphrodisias and Themistius on book Lambda, by Abū Bišr Mattā), or they were reported to be familiar with the Arabic translation of further Greek commentaries on Aristotle’s work, as well as with treatises on metaphysics by some of Aristotle’s immediate disciples (for example, Yaḥyā Ibn ʿAdī was said to be familiar with the commentary on book Beta by Syrianus and the original treatise on metaphysics by Theophrastus of Eresus). Finally, numerous literal commentaries on the Metaphysics, following in the footsteps of Alexander of Aphrodisias’ exegetical style, were produced within the school. Thus, later sources inform us that Abū Bišr Mattā commented on books Alpha Elatton, Βeta (III) and Theta (VIII) of the Metaphysics; he is also quoted in Avicenna’s exegesis of book Lambda (XII). Yaḥyā Ibn ʿAdī’s commentary on book Alpha Elatton is extant. Abū l-Faraǧ ibn al-Ṭayyib’s (d. 1043) commentary on the Metaphysics, preserved in fragments in Hebrew translation, is famous for its length and its extremely detailed character, an exegetical style decidedly resented by Avicenna.
The literal style of exegesis allowed Yaḥyā Ibn ʿAdī to introduce religious concerns into his Metaphysics commentary. The broadly speaking “Platonic” theories of some of his treatises devoted to ontological issues, like the postulation of divine forms within the discussion of the mode of existence of universals, can be seen as Platonizing solutions to Aristotelian problems, rather than signs of affiliation to non-Aristotelian philosophical traditions.
7. Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna)
Outlines of metaphysics, of various lengths, can be found in Avicenna’s treatises on the classifications of the sciences, as well as in the surveys of the different branches of philosophy interspersed in many of his other works. These epistemological sketches are substantiated in his summae, a literary genre of which he can be considered the inventor. In all these “encyclopedias” of philosophy—addressed to different audiences and displaying various formats, methodologies and styles—metaphysics constitutes, together with logic and natural philosophy, a permanent and pivotal part of philosophy. In those written in Arabic, after the propaedeutic treatment of logic, the sequence of theoretical disciplines is given—along traditional lines—as natural philosophy, mathematics, and metaphysics, or simply as natural philosophy and metaphysics, with mathematics frequently omitted. By contrast, in the Persian summa, Philosophy for ʿAlāʾ al-Dawla (Dānišnāmah-yi ʿAlāʾī), and possibly also in the incompletely extant Eastern Philosophy (Al-Ḥikma al-mašriqiyya), the order is reversed and, as Avicenna himself avows, much more original: metaphysics constitutes the beginning, rather than the end, of theoretical philosophy. These two opposite arrangements are in fact compatible and underscore complementary aspects of the primacy of metaphysics within theoretical philosophy: metaphysics is last in the order of learning as the pinnacle of philosophical instruction, while it is first in the order of reality on account of the supreme rank of the things it deals with.
In Avicenna’s literal commentaries on the philosophical corpus, most of which are lost, metaphysics represents the section about which we are best informed by either Avicenna himself or his disciples (e.g., The Available and the Valid, Al-Ḥāṣil wa-l-maḥṣūl), or by the surviving portions (e.g., Book of the Fair Judgment, Kitāb al-Inṣāf). Judging from the extant fragments, conciseness and selectiveness appear to have been the stylistic and methodological hallmarks of Avicenna’s exegesis of the Metaphysics.
Avicenna’s original adaptation of the Metaphysics can be best appreciated in the metaphysical sections of his summae of philosophy, which combine the taxonomical and exegetical approaches to Aristotle’s work (see section 1), with the main intent of updating and upgrading Aristotle’s metaphysical model. On the one hand, in so far as they are collections of the different branches of philosophy, and expound metaphysics together with logic, natural philosophy, and mathematics, these works give metaphysics a precise position in the system of the philosophical disciplines. On the other hand, they provide an explanation of Aristotle’s text by incorporating it into Avicenna’s own discourse by means of a report which modifies the formulation of the original text and changes the arrangement of its parts. More importantly, they adapt the scientific profile and the specific content of the Metaphysics to new epistemological requirements, to the doctrinal progress of post-Aristotelian philosophy, and to the Islamic setting with which metaphysics is now called to interact. Specifically, they adjust the tentative scientific configuration assigned to Metaphysics by Aristotle himself to higher epistemological standards; they refine the doctrine of the Metaphysics and mold it with theories taken from other authors and works within the Aristotelian tradition, or from the fruits of Avicenna’s own mind; and they make the final treatment of philosophical theology in metaphysics compliant with religious concerns and the theological agenda of the Islamic milieu in which Avicenna’s summae are produced.
Among Avicenna’s summae, the most extensive, influential, and, by the author’s own admission, the most dependent upon Aristotelian sources is the Book of the Cure/Healing (Kitāb al-Šifāʾ). The “traditional” character of the work, however, far from preventing originality, allows the reader to observe more keenly the author’s subtle and wide-ranging adaptation of the Aristotelian model and his free disposal of the received material. This applies to metaphysics in an eminent way. The metaphysical section of the Cure/Healing, The Science of Divine Things (Ilāhiyyāt), comes at the end of a massive work consisting in a collection of twenty-two volumes, which is unique among Avicenna’s summae not only with regard to length (more than 5000 pages in the current printing of the Arabic text, one of the longest works ever written in the history of philosophy) but also because it is the only summa that contains both a full-fledged mathematics before metaphysics, and an extensive treatment of practical philosophy as an appendix to metaphysics. In this way, only in The Science of Divine Things, metaphysics figures as a real cornerstone of the entire philosophical curriculum, both with respect to what precedes (logic and the other two parts of theoretical philosophy), and with respect to what follows (practical philosophy).
As to the text of the Metaphysics, Avicenna uses several Arabic translations of Aristotle’s work, and adopts various techniques for quoting it: his way of referring to the Metaphysics is usually very selective in content and free in style, although in a few cases his quotations become continuous and resemble a real paraphrase. This latter case happens with Metaphysics α, 2, which Avicenna cites in its entirety, with explicative expansions, in the eighth treatise, introducing into the paraphrase frequent references to the Metaphysics (“First Teaching”) and its author (“First Teacher”), as well as an explicit mention of book Alpha Elatton itself, and defending the doctrines at stake by offering solutions to a series of possible objections. Within the ninth treatise, the same special treatment is given, to a lesser degree, to Metaph. Λ, 6–10.
The liberty with which Avicenna reports the text of the Metaphysics is paramount to his effort of adapting it to a new context. With respect to Aristoteles’ work, The Science of Divine Things exhibits three radical aspects of modification. Avicenna changes, first of all, the “form”, i.e., the scientific profile, of Aristotle’s work. Accordingly, he also modifies its “content”, namely the disposition and doctrinal purport of the individual treatises of the work. These two modifications are concomitant with a third, more general, change, regarding the position and role of the science of metaphysics in the system of the sciences. The change regarding the “form” affects all the fundamental aspects of a science singled out by Aristotle in the Posterior Analytics: the theme of metaphysics, its structure, and its method. The content of the Metaphysics, on the other hand, is reworked by means of a different arrangement of its parts, the integration of Aristotle’s thought with subsequent metaphysical speculation, both Greek and Arabic, the introduction of some original key doctrines, and a treatment of the divine realm very attentive to the concerns of Islamic religion and theology. The change regarding the systemic function of metaphysics, finally, involves a precise view of its relationship with the other sciences as both foundational and crowning discipline, thus overcoming Aristotle’s veto in the Posterior Analytics on the subalternation under a single science of all other disciplines. Cumulatively, in these three ways one observes on Avicenna’s part a thorough and radical revision of the authoritative text on metaphysics, which can be rightly regarded as a sort of second “edition” of the Metaphysics, or second “beginning” of the Western metaphysical speculation.
In the context of the epistemological reshaping of the metaphysics, Avicenna shows first that the subject-matter of this science conforms to all the different characteristics that Aristotle assigns to it in the Metaphysics. Thus, metaphysics is a study of the First Causes and God (cf. Metaph. Α, 1, 981b28–29; Α, 2, 982b9–10), since the First Causes and God are its “goal”. But it is also a study of “the existent” (cf. Metaph. Γ, 1, 1003a20–26), since “the existent qua existent” is its subject-matter. Finally, metaphysics is a study of immaterial and unmoved things (cf. Metaph. Ε, 1, 1026a13–23), since both the First Causes and God, and “the existent qua existent” are realities of this kind. This harmonization of Aristotle’s different points of view is undertaken with the intent of conforming metaphysics to the epistemological canons of the Posterior Analytics, which posit the subject-matter as the fundamental element of every science. Avicenna is the first thinker in the history of philosophy to have devoted a distinct and articulated treatment to the issue of the subject-matter of metaphysics, whose later impact on Arabic and Latin philosophy has been enormous, insofar as it settled the issue of how metaphysics can be both an ontology and a philosophical theology. The other aspects of the scientific reform of metaphysics introduced by Avicenna are also the result of applying the epistemological requirements of the Posterior Analytics to this discipline. In this way, Avicenna bestows on metaphysics an articulated and coherent structure, based on the main elements that the Posterior Analytics spell out as fundamental to every science: the parts, properties, and principles of its subject-matter, and a method that is, as much as possible, demonstrative, in keeping with the Posterior Analytics’ claim that demonstration is the most perfect type of proof.
As to the recasting of the content of the Metaphysics in The Science of Divine Things, Avicenna quotes all the fourteen books into which the Metaphysics is traditionally divided (apart, perhaps, from book Κ), but according to an order that is strikingly different from that of Aristotle’s work. In The Science of Divine Things, however, Avicenna not only modifies the content of the Metaphysics; he also integrates themes taken from other sources, either from other Aristotelian writings; or from texts belonging to the Greek and Arabic Peripatetic tradition, in which Aristotle’s Metaphysics was commented, elaborated, and expanded; or from his own cultural context. In this last respect, the philosophical theology of The Science of Divine Things includes a series of themes familiar to the Muslim audience of the work (the existence of God, His attributes, providence, theodicy, man’s destiny in the afterlife, prophecy etc.), which are treated on a strictly philosophical basis, but with occasional recourse to examples, terminology, and scriptural quotations of clear Islamic provenance, used to confirm the rational conclusions reached. This, together with the theological views debated throughout the work, indicates Avicenna’s intention to show that the philosophical world-view expressed in metaphysics is not contrary or alien to the Islamic one, and that it can provide rational access to some of the tenets of the Muslim creed. The Science of Divine Things, however, is not the mere sum of its many sources. Within the framework of metaphysics, Avicenna introduces original doctrines, some of which are narrower in scope and occur in localized parts of the work, while others are recurrent and serve to connect and unify its various themes. Most notorious among this latter category are—besides the already mentioned account of the subject-matter of metaphysics—the distinction between essence and existence in created beings, which is the theoretical leitmotif of the work, and the metaphysical proof of God’s existence, grounded in Avicenna’s view of the subject-matter of metaphysics and of causation, and placed at the beginning of the section on philosophical theology (chapters 1–3 of treatise VIII). The distinction between essence and existence is the most famous among Avicenna’s own doctrines and underlies many themes of Avicenna’s metaphysics: it justifies, for instance, the difference between the primary concepts “thing” (i.e., “that which has an essence”) and “existent” at the beginning of the work; it grounds the theory of universals (universality is an attribute that belongs to an essence not as such, but when this latter exists in the human mind, abstracted from the extra-mental things in which it is instantiated); and it leads to the fundamental characterization of God as the only being that has no essence apart from existence, or whose essence is totally identical to its existence. Equally important in The Science of Divine Things is the proof of God’s existence, which is announced at the beginning of the work (I.6) and completed towards its end (VIII.1–3). It involves a precise view of the relationship between metaphysics and natural philosophy, being properly metaphysical and independent from the conclusions reached in physics; it turns out to be original with regard to the other metaphysical writings of Avicenna, because it is based not only on a precise doctrine of the Metaphysics (the finiteness of causal chains in Metaph. α, 2), but also on the text itself of this chapter of Aristotle’s work, as we have seen.
As to the role of metaphysics among the sciences, this discipline for Avicenna holds a position of eminence with respect to all other branches of philosophy. The series of disciplines constituting the Šifāʾ amounts to a concrete classification of the sciences: in it, metaphysics functions as the “queen of the sciences” that ascertains the principles taken for granted by all the other sciences, and interconnects and orders hierarchically the system. Metaphysics is foundational insofar as it is the universal science of the existent qua existent (ontology). The scientific principles assessed by metaphysics are, on the one hand, the logical laws common to all the sciences (the axioms), and the universal concepts that every science uses without examining them (the primary concepts like “existent”, “thing”, “necessary”, “one”). On the other hand, metaphysics clarifies the principles that are proper to each of the particular sciences, i.e., their specific assumptions or hypotheses. Thus, metaphysics proves the very existence and the mode of existence of the subject-matters of the other sciences (for example, the existence of universals and categories in logic, of matter and form in natural philosophy, and of discrete and continuous quantity in mathematics).
In Avicenna, all the previous trends of the Arabic tradition of the Metaphysics converge and find their synthesis. This is particularly manifest in the philosophical theology that invariably concludes his accounts of metaphysics in the summae and that finds its most lucid expression in The Science of Divine Things. In this section, Avicenna reiterates the connection between Metaph. α, 2 and Λ, 6–10 that is typical of al-Kindī’s selective way of approaching the Metaphysics, while also incorporating procedures of explanation ad litteram and by way of questions (per modum quaestionis) of Metaph. α, 2 that are reminiscent of the Baghdad Aristotelians’ exegetical method, and discussing a sequence of themes that mirrors the structure of the theological philosophy of al-Fārābī’s political treatises. The Aristotelian core of this section is then expanded by means of accretions taken from Alexander of Aphrodisias’ and Themistius’ works on metaphysics (the Aristotelian commentators mentioned by al-Fārābī and translated into Arabic by the Baghdad Aristotelians), and from the pseudo-Aristotelian, Neoplatonic works that were commonly appended to the Metaphysics in Arabic philosophy, i.e., the Plotinian Theologia Aristotelis and the Proclean Liber de Causis, produced within al-Kindī’s circle. As a result, Avicenna’s metaphysics harmonizes al-Kindī’s emphasis on the theological component of the Metaphysics with al-Fārābī’s vindication of the foundational role of ontology; by the same token, Avicenna reconciles al-Fārābī’s view of metaphysics as a science modeled on the epistemology of the Posterior Analytics with the Baghdad Aristotelians’ project of an integral explanation of Aristotle’s text. In this way, the congruence of metaphysics with Islamic theology is not realized in a “Kindian” way, i.e., by limiting the scope of this discipline to a part of the Metaphysics, but depends, in a more “Farabian” vein, upon the entire work of Aristotle once its inner structure has been properly underscored. Likewise, the task of conforming metaphysics to the methodological standards of the Posterior Analytics is accomplished at the same time as the goal of elucidating the textual obscurities and the interpretative problems of the Metaphysics.
The other metaphysical summae by Avicenna single out and emphasize particular aspects of the overarching architecture of metaphysics displayed in The Science of Divine Things. Thus, The Book of Pointers and Reminders (Kitāb al-Išārāt wa-l-Tanbīhāt) underscores the importance of philosophical theology within metaphysics by expanding it with respect to a much thinner ontology; the Persian The Book of Science for ʿAlāʾ-al-Dawla (Dānešnāme-ye ʿAlāʾī) places metaphysics as first theoretical discipline (before natural philosophy and mathematics), after the preliminary logic, in order to signal its priority in the system of the sciences; the lost metaphysics of The Easterners (Al-Mašriqiyyūn) or The Eastern Philosophy (Al-Ḥikma al-mašriqiyya) might have assigned a clear-cut epistemological role to the divide between ontology and philosophical theology within metaphysics by splitting metaphysics into two distinct sciences corresponding to these two parts. The metaphysics of The Book of Salvation (Kitāb al-Naǧāt), finally, though structurally similar to The Science of Divine Things, differs from it in specific points and formulations, in so far as it incorporates doctrines from Avicenna’s previous metaphysical works.
Besides the overall treatment of metaphysics in the summae, Avicenna investigates particular metaphysical areas in specific treatises, such as the Book of Provenance and Destination (Kitāb al-Mabdaʾ wa-l-maʿād), which focuses, within metaphysics, on philosophical theology, or the Epistle of Immolation about Destination (Al-Risāla al-aḍḥawiyya fī amr al-maʿād), which concentrates on a specific topic of philosophical theology, or in allegorical writings, such as the Ḥayy Ibn Yaqẓān or the Epistle of the Bird (Risālat al-Ṭayr). Various issues pertaining to metaphysics are extensively debated in works that contain his reflections on key philosophical themes, such as the Notes (Taʿlīqāt), or that derive from the teaching activity and the dialectical practices performed within his circle, i.e., the Discussions (Mubāḥaṯāt). Related to metaphysics are the specific essays ascribed to Avicenna and devoted to the philosophical and allegorical interpretation of some Qur’anic verses, whose authenticity however remains to be assessed.
8. Post-Avicennian Period
The pivotal position of Avicenna in the history of Islamic philosophy emerges in all clarity if we consider that the three approaches to Aristotle’s Metaphysics considered here (classification, commentary, adaptation), as well as the main schools of thought of the formative period (the Kindian, on the one hand, and the Farabian-Baghdadian, on the other), ended or began to wither with the rise of Avicenna’s metaphysics. Although the text of Aristotle’s Metaphysics continued to circulate in Arabic after the eleventh century, the metaphysical works of Avicenna gradually superseded the Metaphysics as the text to be copied, commented upon, and evaluated (either favorably or critically), until Avicennism replaced Aristotelianism by incorporating it. Likewise, in the post-Avicennian tradition, issues regarding Avicenna’s distinction between essence and existence, and the primacy of the former over the latter, are widely debated, and the prerogatives of an Avicennian philosophical theology over Islamic dialectical theology, or kalām, to be the discipline more properly entitled to speak about God, hold pivotal importance.
The reception of Avicenna’s metaphysics in subsequent Arabic thought is multifaceted, and detailed work in this immense area has only begun in recent decades. Previous scholarship has established the following landmarks:
First, a clear distinction between the direct vs. the indirect influence of Avicenna’s metaphysics, i.e., between those who actually consulted his works, and those whose knowledge depended on earlier readers of Avicenna. A case of the latter are the two very influential text-books of Coranic schools (madrasas), Aṯīr al-Dīn al-Abharī’s (d. 660H/1262 or 663H/1265), Hidāyat al-ḥikma, and Naǧm al-Dīn al-Kātibī al-Qazwīnī (d. 1276), Ḥikmat al-ʿayn, whose metaphysical sections are largely dependent on Avicenna.
Second, three main attitudes towards Avicenna’s metaphysics in post-Avicennian Arabic philosophy can tentatively be outlined: acceptance; revision; and rejection of Avicenna’s standpoint. A decidedly pro-Avicennian camp is represented by a network of scholars encompassing at least three generations of school members who explicitly connected themselves with Avicenna’s teaching. Significantly, some of these direct disciples of Avicenna, like Abū l-ʿAbbās Faḍl Ibn Muḥammad al-Lawkarī (V-VI/XI-XII c.), are the models to which later heirs of Avicenna’s metaphysics ideally refer (see, for instance, Ġiyāṯ al-Dīn Manṣūr ibn Muḥammad Ḥusaynī Daštakī Šīrāzī, d. 948H/1542).
On the opposite side, a “conservative” reaction to Avicenna’s metaphysics (and to Avicenna’s philosophy in general) was represented by the efforts of reinstating the pre-Avicennian status of this discipline. This goal was pursued in various ways. Some, like Šihābaddīn al-Suhrawardī (d. 1191) and the fabricators of Arabic Pseudo-Platonica in the twelfth century, took Pythagoras’ and Plato’s thought as true philosophy, thus supplanting the Aristotelian tradition to which Avicenna belonged. Others, like Ibn Rushd/Averroes (d. 1198), whose three commentaries on the Metaphysics contain recurrent criticisms of Avicenna, redirected attention to the Aristotelian Metaphysics itself, with the aim of restoring the original purport of Aristotle’s foundational text against Avicenna’s innovations. Still others, such as ʿAbd al-Laṭīf al-Baġdādī (d. 1231), conceived metaphysics as a mere juxtaposition of the Kindian and Farabian perspectives on metaphysics, where Aristotle’s Metaphysics inaugurates a curriculum of works that includes the Liber de causis and the Theologia Aristotelis, as in al-Kindī, but also has an ontological dimension, as in al-Fārābī, so that the Avicennian synthesis is reduced to its constituents. In addition to these anachronistic attempts that surface both in the East and in the West of the Muslim world and are advanced by philosophers in the strict sense, there were also the attacks launched against philosophy in general, and metaphysics in particular, by Muslim theologians, most famously by Abū Ḥāmid al-Ġazālī (d. 1111) in The Incoherence of the Philosophers (Tahāfut al-Falāsifa). Significantly, however, all the critics of Avicenna, regardless whether philosophers or theologians, are also indebted to his thought, and in their eyes Avicenna’s metaphysics represents metaphysics tout court.
A further intermediate line of influence, which is the one that ultimately prevails, is the fruitful and positive “contamination” of Avicenna’s metaphysics with systems of thought originally foreign to it. This trend towards combining approaches and developing in new directions takes place, for example, with regard to the theory of illumination (Muḥammad Ibn Maḥmūd al-Šahrazūrī, 2nd half of the VII/XIIIc.), or to sufism (Muḥyīʾ al-Dīn Ibn ʿArabī, d. 1240; Ibn Sabʿīn of Murcia, c. 1217–1270; Ṣadr al-Dīn al Qūnawī, 1207–1274). But the most noteworthy aspect of this tendency—which possibly starts in the cultural environment where al-Ġazālī was formed—is the adoption of Avicenna’s metaphysics by Muslim theologians or mutakallimūn. In general, the tendency to integrate Avicenna’s metaphysics into new doctrinal settings represents the most interesting area of the reception of Avicenna’s thought, since it requires a thorough revision of Avicenna’s original stance to adapt it to an illuminationist, mystical, or theological context. Together with the trends towards acceptance or rejection, this tendency to revise stretches over a period which is much longer than the pre-Avicennian phase of falsafa.
Third, in a diachronic perspective, within the vast scenario of the reception of Avicenna’s philosophy, after the first main period of impact already singled out in scholarship (from Avicenna’s death until the middle of the VIII/XIV c.), further later significant phases of influence in different areas of the Islamic world (Persia, India, Ottoman empire) are emerging. Of course, this temporal progression and this geographical expansion also involve metaphysics.
A key factor in the evaluation of the later impact of Avicenna’s metaphysics is the assessment of those of his works which mainly influenced later reflections on metaphysics, their ways of transmission, and their audience, since each of them, as we have seen, conveys a particular version and format of metaphysics. Among them, the metaphysical section of the Book of Pointers and Reminders has been singled out in scholarship because of the proliferation of independent commentaries on this work from the late XII until the early XVIII century by leading figures of Arabic-Islamic philosophy like Faḫr al-Dīn al-Rāzī (d. 1209) and Naṣīr al-Dīn al-Ṭūsī (d. 1274). Scholars attribute the success of Avicenna’s Pointers and Reminders to doctrinal, stylistic, and chronological factors. Doctrinally, Avicenna’s use of the essence-existence distinction to support the distinction between what is intrinsically necessary in something (like its essence) and what is extrinsically necessary in it (like its existence) was particularly obvious in the Pointers and Reminders. Stylistically, the work’s abbreviated and allusive style invites elaboration and commentary. Chronologically, this was Avicenna’s final comprehensive work and therefore could be presented as the definitive expression of his views. For these reasons, the Pointers and Reminders are currently considered to be the work of Avicenna privileged by subsequent Muslim philosophers (including the mutakallimūn).
The Science of Divine Things also played an important role in spreading Avicenna’s metaphysics among later advocates of this discipline. This is evident from its extensive manuscript tradition, the vast exegetical activity devoted to The Cure/Healing, and the frequent and widespread quotations of The Science of Divine Things among post-Avicennian authors. Transmitted by a huge number of manuscripts (more numerous and older than the ones of the Pointers and Reminders currently known), The Science of Divine Thing and the other parts of the Cure/Healing were copied uninterruptedly for nine centuries, from the end of V/XI century, a few decades after Avicenna’s death, until the XIV/XX century. Its exegetical tradition is first attested in the form of marginalia, which never circulated independently from manuscripts before the X/XVI c. The earliest extant “commentaries” on the text are in fact collections of marginal glosses of this kind, which gained independent circulation in self-standing book format at the time of a new-born interest in The Cure/Healing, and of an apparent loss of interest in the Pointers and Reminders, whose commentatorial activity starts decreasing then: the taʿlīqāt of Ġiyāṯ al-Dīn Daštakī Šīrāzī and of Ṣadrā al-Dīn (Mullā Ṣadrā) al-Šīrāzī (d. 1640) are noteworthy instances of this trend. Later lemmatic commentaries, like the one by Muḥammad Mahdī ibn Abī Ḏarr al-Narāqī (d. 1794/5), cover only parts of The Science of Divine Things, since the work in its entirety—455 pages in the current printing—was too huge to be commented upon in this way, and no one has ever commented integrally on even one of the twenty-two books of The Cure/Healing, let alone the summa in its entirety. Finally, The Science of Divine Things is abundantly quoted by a wide array of scholars and writings, and even the commentators on the Pointers and Reminders cite it—as they do with The Cure/Healing in general—as the reference work to be consulted in case of theoretical uncertainties or for doctrinal integrations and developments.
In this context, the metaphysical sections of The Book of Science for ʿAlāʾ-al-Dawla and of The Book of Salvation should also be taken into account. The former work obtained wide resonance since it was taken as model and incorporated by al-Ġazālī in his exposition of philosophy (The Aims/Doctrines of the philosophers, Maqāṣid al-Falāsifa), a conduit for Avicenna’s metaphysics in the West as well. The latter work was copied in manuscripts at a very ancient stage, and it was commented upon by important scholars like Ẓāhir al-Din Ibn Funduq al-Bayhaqī (d. 1169–1170) and Faḫr al-Dīn al-Isfarāʾinī al-Nīsābūrī (fl. VI/XII c.).
At the present stage of research, we can tentatively conclude that no single work of Avicenna conveyed his metaphysical thought to later centuries, although it is premature to assess how, when, and where these different writings interacted and competed in transmitting Avicenna’s view of metaphysics, and which of them enjoyed the status of Avicenna’s most influential metaphysical work. Among them, the manuscript diffusion, the commentatorial activity, and the consideration and esteem of The Science of Divine Things deserve special attention, since they cross the centuries and represent an uninterrupted trail of post-Avicennian philosophy, from Avicenna’s first disciples until today. Such a continuity looks unattested in the case of the other metaphysical works by Avicenna. In the continuum represented by the circulation of The Science of Divine Things, one may discern a peak: this is the Safavid era in Iran (XVI-XVIII c.), which—if we decide to call “golden” the period 1100–1350—can be labelled the “platinum” age of the reception of Avicenna’s metaphysics through The Science of Divine Things. But this peak has firm roots in previous centuries, especially in the key-figure of Naṣīr al-Dīn al-Ṭūsī and his school, and extends both backwards and forwards, according to a comprehensive view of post-Avicennian falsafa.
The study of Arabic metaphysics can be approached from a variety of interconnected perspectives. On the one hand, a group of historical issues emerges, such as the ways according to which the Metaphysics was transmitted into Arabic and integrated in the culture of its new environment, the synergy of its transmission with the Arabic reception of other fundamental works of Aristotle (above all the Posterior Analytics, but also the Categories), and the continuation in Arabic philosophy of the main Greek paradigms of interpretation of the Aristotelian corpus, such as the Athenian background of al-Kindī’s philosophy vs. the Alexandrian heritage of the Aristotelians of Baghdad, or the purer Peripatetism of al-Fārābī vs. the Platonizing Aristotelianism of Yaḥyā Ibn ʿAdī and his followers. On the other hand, the epistemological reflection on metaphysics as a science undertaken by Arabic philosophers, in the effort to transform Aristotle’s still imperfect discipline into a full-fledged and rigorous scientific discourse, discloses a theoretical area of investigation that produces a progressive switch of attention from the Metaphysics (with capital “M”) to metaphysics (with lower-case “m”). Outside the narrower scope of philosophy and its history, it is interesting to note how the introduction of a foreign pagan discipline, like metaphysics, into a monotheistic social context, like the Islamic one, determines either the accordance or the antagonism between philosophical theology and revealed theology, or, in other words, between the quintessence of falsafa, on the one hand, and the speculation of kalām, on the other. The study of the ways in which this confrontation took place in the Islamic culture of the Middle Ages may shed light on the contemporary debate on the relationship between reason and faith and contribute to the promotion of dialogue among different cultures.
A. Texts and Translations
A.1 Arabic translations of the Metaphysics and related works
- Averroès, Tafsīr mā baʿd aṭ-ṭabīʾat, Texte arabe inédit établi par M. Bouyges, Imprimerie Catholique, Beirut 1938–1948.
- Bauloye, Laurence, Averroès, “Grand Commentaire” (Tafsīr) de la “Métaphysique”. Livre Bêta, Vrin, Paris 2002.
- Martin, Aubert, Averroès. Grand Commentaire de la Métaphysique d’Aristote, livre lām-lambda traduit de l’arabe et annoté, Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 1984.
- Genequand, Charles F., Ibn Rushd’s Metaphysics: a translation with introduction of Ibn Rushd’s Commentary on Aristotle’s “Metaphysics”, Book Lam, Leiden: Brill 1984.
- Aristotle, Maqāla al-Lām min Kitāb Mā baʿda al-ṭabīʿa li-Arisṭū, in Arisṭū ʿinda l-ʿArab, ʿA. Badawī (ed.), Cairo: Maktabat al-nahḍa al-miṣriyya, 1947, pp. 1–11.
- Theophrastus, “On First Principles” (known as his “Metaphysics”), Greek Text and Medieval Arabic Translation, edited and translated with Introduction, Commentaries and Glossaries, as Well as the Medieval Latin Translation, and with an Excursus on Graeco-Arabic Editorial Technique by Dimitri Gutas, Leiden-Boston: Brill, 2010.
- Nicholas of Damascus, Nicolaus Damascenus on the philosophy of Aristotle: Fragments from the first five books translated from the Syriac with an introduction and commentary, H.J. Drossaart Lulofs (ed.), Leiden: Brill, 1965; reprinted 1969.
- Freudenthal, Jacob, Die durch Averroes erhaltenen Fragmente Alexanders zur Metaphysik des Aristoteles untersucht und übersetzt. Mit Beiträgen zur Erläuterung des arabischen Textes von S. Fränkel, Berlin: Verlag der Königlichen Akademie der Wissenschaften, 1885.
- Alexander of Aphrodisias, Alexander of Aphrodisias on the Cosmos: Arabic text with English Translation, Introduction and Commentary, (Islamic philosophy, theology, and science, 44), by Charles F. Genequand, Leiden-Boston-Köln: Brill, 2000.
- Endress, Gerhard, “Alexander Arabus on the First Cause. Aristotle’s First Mover in an Arabic Treatise attributed to Alexander of Aphrodisias”, in Aristotele e Alessandro di Afrodisia nella tradizione araba. Atti del colloquio La ricezione araba ed ebraica della filosofia e della scienza greche, Padova, 14–15 maggio 1999, Cristina D’Ancona and G. Serra (eds), Padova: Il Poligrafo, 2002, pp. 19–74.
- Themistius, Min šarḥ Ṯāmisṭyūs li-ḥarf al-lām, Šarḥ Ṯāmisṭyūs ʿalā maqālat al-lām (al-faṣl al-awwal wa-šaṭr min al-ṯānī), in Arisṭū ʿinda l-ʿArab, ʿA. Badawī (ed.), Cairo: Maktabat al-nahḍa al-miṣriyya, 1947, pp. 12–21, 329–333.
- Thémistius, Paraphrase de la Métaphysique d’Aristote (livre Lambda), traduit de l’hébreu et de l’arabe, introduction, notes et indices par R. Brague, Paris: Vrin, 1999.
- Mahdi, Muhsin, “Alfarabi against Philoponus”, Journal of Near Eastern Studies, 1967, 26(4): 233–260. doi:10.1086/371918
- Pseudo-Aristotle, Die sogenannte Theologie des Aristoteles aus arabischen Handschriften zum ersten Mal herausgegeben, Friedrich Dieterici (ed.), Leipzig: J. C. Hinrichs’sche Buchhandlung, 1882; reprinted Georg Olms Verlag, Hildesheim 1969. [Pseudo-Aristotle (Dieterici) available online]
- Pseudo-Aristotle, Uṯūlūǧiyā Arisṭāṭālīs, in Aflūṭīn ʿinda l-ʿarab, ʿA. Badawī (ed.), Cairo: Maktaba al-nahḍa al-miṣriyya, 1955, pp. 1–164.
- Pseudo-Aristotle, Plotiniana Arabica, ad codicum fidem anglice vertit G. Lewis, in Plotini Opera. Tomus II: Enneades IV–V, Paul Henry and Hans-Rudolf Schwyzer (eds), Paris-Bruxelles: Desclée de Brouwer-L’Édition Universelle, 1959.
- Plotino, La discesa dell’anima nei corpi (Enn. IV 8 ). Plotiniana Arabica (Pseudo-Teologia di Aristotele, Capitoli 1 e 7; “Detti del sapiente greco”), a cura di Cristina D’Ancona, Padova: Il Poligrafo, 2003.
- Plotino, L’immortalità dell’anima IV 7 . Plotiniana Arabica (pseudo-Teologia di Aristotele, capitoli I, III, IX). Introduzione, testo greco, traduzione e commento, testo arabo, traduzione e commento di Cristina D’Ancona, Pisa: Pisa University Press, 2017.
- Bardenhewer, Otto, 1882, Die pseudo-aristotelische Schrift ueber das reine Gute bekannt unter dem Namen Liber de causis. Freiburg im Breisgau 1882 (reprinted Frankfurt a.M. 1961). Bardenhewer 1882 available online]
- Pseudo-Aristotle, Al-Aflāṭūniyya al-muḥdaṯa ʿinda l-ʿArab, ʿA. Badawī (ed.), Cairo: Wakālat al-Maṭbūʿāt, 1955, 1977, third edition, pp. 1–33.
A.2 Al-Kindī and his school
- Abū-Rīda, M. ‘A. (ed.), 1950, Rasāʾil al-Kindī al-falsafiyya (vol. I), Cairo: Dār al-Fikr al-‘Arabī.
- Al-Kindī, Risāla fī kammiyyat kutub Arisṭāṭālīs wa-mā yuḥtaǧu ilayhi fī taḥṣīl al-falsafa, in Abū-Rīda 1950: 363–384. [Treatise on the Quantity of Aristotle’s Books and What is Required to Attain Philosophy]
- Guidi, Michelangelo and Richard Walzer, Studi su al-Kindi I: Uno scritto introduttivo allo studio di Aristotele («Memorie della R. Accademia Nazionale dei Lincei, Classe di Scienze Morali, Storiche e Filosofiche», ser. VI, vol. VI, fasc. V), Roma 1940, pp. 375–419.
- Al-Kindī, Kitāb al-Kindī ilā l-Mu‘taṣim bi-llāh fī l-falsafa al-ūlā, in Abū-Rīda 1950: 97–162.
- Ivry, A. L., Al-Kindī’s Metaphysics. A Translation of Ya‘qūb al-Kindī’s Treatise “On First Philosophy” (fī al-Falsafah al-ūlā), Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1974.
- Al-Kindī, Oeuvres philosophique et scientifiques d’Al-Kindī. Volume II. Métaphysique et Cosmologie, (Islamic Philosophy, Theology and Science. Texts and Studies, 29/2), par Rushdī Rashed et Jean Jolivet, Leiden-Boston-Köln: Brill, 1998, pp. 1–117.
- Akasoy, Anna (trans.), Al-Kindi: Die erste Philosophie, Freiburg: Herder, 2011.
- Al-Kindī, Fī l-Ibāna ʿan suǧūd al-ǧirm al-aqṣā wa-ṭāʿatihī li-llāhi, Abū-Rīda 1950: 244–261. [Epistle on the Explanation of the Prosternation of the Extreme Body and its Obedience to God]
- Ramón Guerrero, Rafael and Emilio Tornero Poveda, Obras filosoficas de al-Kindī, Madrid: Editorial Colloquio, 1986.
- Adamson, Peter and Peter E. Pormann (trans.), The Philosophical Works of al-Kindi, (Studies in Islamic philosophy), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2012.
A.3 Ṯābit ibn Qurra
- Reisman, Davidf C. and Amos Bertolacci, “Thābit Ibn Qurra’s Concise Exposition of Aristotle’s Metaphysics: Text, Translation and Commentary”, in Thābit Ibn Qurra: Sciences and Philosophy in 9th Century Baghdad, (Scientia Graeco-Arabica, 4), Roshdi Rashed (eds), Berlin-New York: De Gruyter, 2009, pp. 715–776.
A.4 Al-Fārābī and the Baghdad Aristotelians
- Dieterici, Friedrich (ed.), 1890, Alfārābī’s Philosophische Abhandlungen, Leiden: Brill. (texts in Arabic) [Dieterici 1890 available online]
- ––– (ed.), 1892, Alfārābī’s Philosophische Abhandlungen, Leiden: Brill. (German translation with annotations of the Arabic in Dieterici 1890) [Dieterici 1892 available online]
- Al-Fārābī, Mā yanbaġī an yuqaddama qabla taʿallum falsafat Ariṣṭū, Dieterici 1890: 49–55. [What Ought to be Premised to the Learning of Aristotle’s Philosophy]
- Al-Fārābī, “Abhandlung des Abū Naṣr über die notwendigen Vorstudien der Philosophie”, Dieterici 1892: 82–91.
- Al-Fārābī, Al-Fārābī’s Philosophy of Aristotle (Falsafat Arisṭūṭālīs), Arabic Text, Edited with and Introduction and Notes by M. Mahdi, Beirut: Dār Majallat Shi’r, 1961.
- Al-Fārābī, Alfarabi’s Philosophy of Plato and Aristotle, translated with an introduction by M. Mahdi, The Free Press of Glencoe, New York 1962.
- Al-Fārābī, Iḥṣāʾ al-ʿulūm, ʿU. Amīn (ed.), Cairo: Librairie Anglo-Egyptienne, 1931, 1949 (second edition), 1968 (third edition); rist. Institute for the History of Arabic-Islamic Science in the J. W. Goethe University, Frankfurt a. Main 1999.
- Al-Fārābī, Catálogo de las ciencias, A. González Palencia (ed. and transl.), Madrid: Maestre, 1932, 1953, 2 edition.
- Al-Fārābī, Maqāla […] fī aġrāḍ al-ḥakīm fī kulli maqāla min al-Kitāb al-mawsūm bi-l-ḥurūf, Dieterici 1890: 34–38. [On the Goals of the Sage in Each Treatise of the Book Marked by Means of Letters]
- Al-Fārābī, “Die Abhandlung von den Tendenzen der aristotelischen Metaphysik von dem Zweiten Meister” in Dieterici 1892: 54–60.
- Druart, Thérèse-Anne, “Le traité d’al-Fārābī sur les buts de la Métaphysique d’Aristote”, Bulletin de Philosophie Médiévale, 1982, 24: 38–43. doi:10.1484/J.BPM.3.286
- Ramón Guerrero, Rafael, “Al-Fārābī y la «Metafísica» de Aristóteles”, La Ciudad de Dios, 1983, 196: 211–240.
- Al-Fārābī, Al-Farabi on the Perfect State. Abū Naṣr al-Fārābī’s Mabādiʾ Ārāʾ Ahl al-Madīna al-Fāḍila. A revised Text with Introduction, Translation and Commentary by Richard Walzer, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1985.
- Al-Fārābī, Book of Letters (Kitāb al-Ḥurūf). Commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics, M. Mahdi (ed.), Beirut: Dar el-Mashreq, 1969.
- Alfarabi’s On One and Unity. Arabic Text Edited with Introduction and Notes by M. Mahdi, Casablanca: Les Editions Toubkal, 1989.
- Abū Naṣr al-Fārābī, L’harmonie entre les opinions de Platon et d’Aristote, texte arabe et traduction Fawzi Mitri Najjar, Dominique Mallet, Damascus: Institut français de Damas, 1999.
- Al-Fārābī, L’armonia delle opinioni dei due sapienti, il divino Platone e Aristotele, Cecilia Martini Bonadeo (ed.), Pisa: Edizioni Plus—Pisa University Press, 2008.
- Yaḥyā Ibn ʿAdī, Tafsīr li-l-maqāla al-ūlā min Kitāb Mā baʿd al-ṭabīʿa li-Arisṭāṭālīs al-mawsūma bi-l-alif al-ṣuġrā, in Rasāʾil falsafiyya li-l-Kindī wa-l-Fārābī wa-Ibn Bāǧǧa wa-Ibn ʿAdī, ʿA. Badawi, Bengasi (ed.), 1973, reprinted Beirut, 1980, pp. 168–203.
- Menn, Stephen and Robert Wisnovsky, 2017, “Yaḥyā ibn ʿAdī and Ibrāhīm ibn ʿAdī: On Whether Body is a Substance or a Quantity. Introduction, Editio Princeps and Translation”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 27(1): 1–74. doi:10.1017/S0957423916000096
A.5 Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna)
- Ibn Sīnā, Risāla fī Aqsām al-ʿulūm al-ʿaqliyya, in Tisʿ rasāʾil fī l-ḥikma wa-l-ṭabīʿiyyāt, Ḥ. ʿAṣī (ed.), Damascus: Dār Qābis, 1986.
- Michot, Jean, “Les sciences physiques et métaphysiques selon la Risālah fī aqsām al-ʿulūm d’Avicenne. Essai de traduction critique”, Bulletin de Philosophie médiévale, 1980, 22: 62–73. doi:10.1484/J.BPM.3.257
- Ibn Sīnā, Dānišnāmah-yi ʿAlāʾī, M. Muʿīn, M. Meškāt (ed.), Tehran: Dānišgāh-yi Tihrān 1331H/1953.
- Avicenne, Le Livre de science, traduit par M. Achena, H. Massé, Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 1955–1958; Les Belles Lettres/Unesco 1986, second edition.
- Morewedge, Parviz, The ‘Metaphysica’ of Avicenna. A critical translation-commentary and analysis of the fundamental arguments in Avicenna’s ‘Metaphysica’ in the ‘Dānish Nāma-i ʿalāʿī’ [The Book of Scientific Knowledge], London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1973.
- Ibn Sīnā, Manṭiq al-Mašriqiyyīn, M. al-Ḫaṭīb and ʿA. al-Qatlā (eds), Cairo: Al-Maktaba al-Salafiyya, 1328H/1910, p. 8, 9–10).
- Avicenne, Commentaire sur le livre Lambda de la Métaphysique d’Aristote, M. Geoffroy, J. Janssens and M. Sebti (eds), Collection « Études musulmanes », Paris: Vrin, 2014.
- Ibn Sīnā, Al-Šifāʾ, al-Ilāhiyyāt (1), Ǧ. Š. Qanawatī and S. Zāyid (eds), Cairo: al-Hayʾa al-ʿāmma li-šuʾūn al-maṭābiʿ al-amīriyya, 1960; Al-Šifāʾ, al-Ilāhiyyāt (2), M. Y. Mūsā, S. Dunyā, and S. Zāyid (eds), Cairo: al-Hayʾa al-ʿāmma li-šuʾūn al-maṭābiʿ al-amīriyya, 1960.
- Ibn Sīnā, Al-Šifāʾ (al-Ilāhiyyāt), with Marginal Notes by Mullā Ṣadrā, Mīrdāmāḍ, Khunsarī, Sabzavārī and others, Ḥ. Nāǧī Iṣfahānī (ed.), Society for the Appreciation of Cultural Works and Dignitaries, Institute of Islamic Studies of Tehran, McGill University, Tehran 1383HŠ/2004 [Edition of Ilāhiyyāt I-II]
- Avicenna (Ibn Sīnā), Metafisica. La Scienza delle cose divine (al-Ilāhiyyāt) dal Libro della Guarigione (Kitāb al-Šifāʾ), a cura di O. Lizzini e P. Porro, Bompiani, Milano 2002; second edition 2006.
- Avicenna, The Metaphysics of ‘The Healing’. A parallel English-Arabic text, translated, introduced, and annotated by M. E. Marmura, Provo, UT: Brigham Young University Press, 2005.
- Avicenna (Ibn Sīnā), Libro della Guarigione, Le Cose Divine di Avicenna (Ibn Sīnā), a cura di A. Bertolacci, UTET, Turin 2007.
- Ibn Sīnā, Al-Mabda’ wa al-Maʾād (The Beginning And The End) By Ibn i Sīnā, A. Nūrānī (ed.), Institute of Islamic Studies, McGill University, in collaboration with Tehran University, Tehran 1984.
- Ibn Sīnā, Mubāḥaṯāt, M. Bīdārfar (ed.), Qom: Maṭbaʿat-i Amīr, 1413H/1992.
- Ibn Sīnā, K. al-Taʿlīqāt, edited with Introduction and notes by S.H. Mousavian, Iranian Institute of Philosophy, Tehran 2013.
- Ibn Sīnā, Lettre au vizir Abû Sa‘d. Editio princeps d’après le manuscrit de Bursa, traduction de l’arabe, introduction, notes et lexique par Y. Michot, Al-Bouraq, Beirut 2000.
- Inati, Shams C., Ibn Sina’s Remarks and Admonitions: ‘Physics’ and ‘Metaphysics’: An Analysis and Annotated Translation, New York: Columbia University Press, 2014.
A.6 Post-Avicennian period
- Averroes, Compendio de Metafísica. Texto árabe con traducción y notas por C. Q. Rodriguez, Maestre, Madrid 1919.
- Horten, M., Die Metaphysik des Averroes (1198†). Nach dem Arabischen überstzt und erläutert, Niemeyer, Halle an der Saale 1912; reprinted Minerva, Frankfurt am Main 1960.
- Van den Bergh, Simon, Die Epitome der Metaphysik des Averroes übersetzt und mit einer Einleitung und Erläuterung versehen, Leiden: Brill, 1924, reprinted 1970.
- Averroes, On Aristotle’s Metaphysics. An annotated translation of the so-called “Epitome”, (Scientia Graeco-Arabica, 5), Rüdiger Arnzen (ed.), Berlin: De Gruyter, 2010.
- Zonta, Mauro, Il ‘Commento medio’ di Averroè alla ‘Metafisica’ di Aristotele nella tradizione ebraica. Le versioni ebraiche di Zerahyah ben Ishaq Hen e di Qalonymos ben Qalonymos. Edizione e introduzione storica e filologica, 2 vols., Pavia: Pavia University Press, 2011.
- Neuwirth, Angelika, ʿAbd al-Laṭīf al-Baġdādī’s Bearbeitung von Buch Lambda der aristotelischen Metaphysik, (Veröffentlichungen der Orientalischen Kommission, 27), Wiesbaden: Steiner, 1976
- Al-Ġazālī, Tahāfot al-Falāsifat ou «Incohérence des Philosophes», M. Bouyges (ed.), Beirut: Imprimerie Catholique, 1927.
- Al-Ġazālī, The Incoherence of the Philosophers. A Parallel English-Arabic text translated, introduced, and annotated by M. E. Marmura, Provo UT: Brigham Young University Press, 2000.
- Faḫr al-Dīn al-Rāzī, Šarḥ al-Išārāt, Istanbul 1290H/1873.
- Faḫr al-Dīn al-Rāzī, Lubāb al-Išārāt wa-l-tanbīhāt, Cairo 1326H/1908; 1355H/1936.
- Ibn Sīnā, Al-Išārāt wa-l-tanbīhāt maʿa šarḥ Naṣīr al-Dīn al-Ṭūsī, S. Dunya (ed.), 4 vols. Cairo 1957–1960; reprinted Cairo 1968–1971.
- Shihadeh, Ayman, Doubts on Avicenna: A Study and Edition of Sharaf al-Dīn al-Masʿūdī’s Commentary on the Ishārāt, ( Islamic Philosophy, Theology and Science. Texts and Studies, 95), Leiden-Boston: Brill, 2015.
- Ġiyāṯ al-Dīn Manṣūr ibn Muḥammad Ḥusaynī Daštakī Šīrāzī (d. 948H/1542), Šifāʾ al-qulūb wa-Taǧawhur al-aǧsām, ʻAlī Awǧābī (ed.), Kitābḫāna, Mūza wa Markaz-i Asnād-i Maǧlis-i Šūrā-i Islāmī, Tehran 1390Hš/2012.
- Ṣadr al-Dīn Muḥammad Shīrāzī (Mullā Ṣadrā, 979–1050Hq), Šarḥ va-Taʿlīqat Ṣadr al-mutaʾallihīna bar Ilāhiyyāt-e Šifāʾ-e Šayḫ al-raʾīs Abū ʿAlī ibn Sīnā, 2 vols, edited and annoted by Najafqulī Ḥabībī, under the direction of Muḥammad Khamaneʾī, Intishārāt-e Bunyād Ḥikmat Islāmī Ṣadrā, Tehran 1382Hš/2003.
- Ṣadr al-Dīn al-Širāzī, Al-Taʿlīqāt li-Ṣadr al-Dīn al-Širāzī ʿalā l-Šifāʾ, in the lithographic edition of the Ilāhiyyāt of the Šifāʾ, Tehran 1885, vol. II, pp. 2–264.
- Mahdī ibn Ḏarr al-Narāqī, Šarḥ al-Ilāhiyyāt min Kitāb al-Šifāʾ, M. Mohaghegh (ed.), Tehran 1365Hš/1986.
- Acar, Rahim, 2005, Talking about God and Talking about Creation. Avicenna’s and Thomas Aquinas’ Positions, Leiden-Boston: Brill.
- –––, 2010, “Creation. Avicenna’s Metaphysical Account”, in Creation and the God of Abraham, David B. Burrell, Carlo Cogliati, Janet Martin Soskice, and William R. Stoeger (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 77–90. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511778063.008
- Adamson, Peter, “Before Essence and Existence: Al-Kindi’s Conception of Being”, The Journal of the History of Philosophy, 40(3): 297–312. doi:10.1353/hph.2002.0043
- –––, 2007a, Al-Kindī, Oxford-New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780195181425.001.0001
- –––, 2007b, “The Kindian Tradition. The Structure of Philosophy in Arabic Neoplatonism”, in D’Ancona 2007: 351–370.
- –––, 2007c, “Knowledge of Universals and Particulars in the Baghdad School”, Documenti e Studi sulla Tradizione Filosofica Medievale, 18: 141–164.
- –––, 2010, “Yaḥyá ibn ʿAdī and Averroes on Metaphysics Alpha Elatton”, Documenti e Studi sulla Tradizione Filosofica Medievale, 21: 343–374.
- –––, (ed.), 2013a, Interpreting Avicenna: Critical Essays, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139047890
- –––, 2013b, “From the Necessary Existent to God”, in Adamson 2013a: 170–189. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139047890.010
- Aertsen, Jan A., 2008, “Avicenna’s Doctrine of the Primary Notions and Its Impact on Medieval Philosophy”, in Islamic Thought in the Middle Ages: Studies in Text, Transmission and Translation, in Honour of Hans Daiber, (Islamic Philosophy, Theology and Science. Texts and Studies, 75), Anna Akasoy and Wim Raven (eds.), Leiden-Boston: Brill, pp. 21–42.
- Alper, Ömer Mahir, 2004, “Avicenna’s Argument for the Existence of God. Was He Really Influenced by the Mutakallimun?” in McGinnis 2004: 129–141.
- Arnzen, Rüdiger, 2009, “On the Contents, Sources and Composition of Two Arabic Pseudo-Platonica: Multaqaṭāt Aflāṭūn al-ilāhī and Fiqar ultuqiṭat wa-jumiʿat ʿan Aflāṭūn”, Oriens, 37: 7–52. doi:10.1163/007865209X12555048403295
- –––, 2011, Platonische Ideen in der arabischen Philosophie: Texte und Materialien zur Begriffsgeschichte von ṣuwar aflāṭūniyya und muthul aflāṭūniyya, Berlin-Boston: Walter de Gruyter.
- Belo, Catarina Carriço Marques de Moura, 2012, Existence, Cause, Essence: Essays in Islamic Philosophy and Theology; Existência, Causa, Essência: Estudos sobre Filosofía e Teologia Islâmicas, Lisbon: Centro de Filosofia da Universidade de Lisboa.
- Bertolacci, Amos, 2005, “On the Arabic Translations of Aristotle’s Metaphysics”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 15(2): 241–275. doi:10.1017/S0957423905000196
- –––, 2006, The Reception of Aristotle’s “Metaphysics” in Avicenna’s “Kitāb al-Šifāʾ”: A Milestone of Western Metaphysical Thought, (Islamic philosophy, theology, and science, 63), Leiden-Boston: Brill.
- –––, 2007, “Avicenna and Averroes on the Proof of God’s Existence and the Subject-Matter of Metaphysics”, Medioevo, 32: 61–97.
- –––, 2009, “Different attitudes to Aristotle’s authority in the Arabic Medieval commentaries on the Metaphysics”, Antiquorum Philosophia, 3: 145–163.
- –––, 2011, “The ‘Ontologization’ of Logic. Metaphysical Themes in Avicenna’s Reworking of the Organon”, in Cameron and Marenbon 2011: 27–51.
- –––, 2012a, “The Distinction of Essence and Existence in Avicenna’s Metaphysics: The Text and Its Context”, in Opwis and Reisman 2012: 257–288.
- –––, 2012b, “How Many Recensions of Avicenna’s Kitāb al-Šifāʾ?”, Oriens, 40(2): 275–303. doi:10.1163/18778372-00402005
- –––, 2012c, “A Hidden Hapax Legomenon in Avicenna’s Metaphysics: Considerations on the Use of Anniyya and Ayyiyya in the Ilāhiyyāt of the Kitāb al-Šifāʾ”, in The Letter before the Spirit. The Importance of Text Editions for the Study of the Reception of Aristotle, (Aristoteles Semitico-Latinus, 22), Aafke M. I. van Oppenraay, with the collaboration of Resianne Fontaine, Leiden-Boston: Brill, pp. 289–309.
- –––, 2013, “Averroes against Avicenna on Human Spontaneous Generation: The Starting-Point of a Lasting Debate”, in Renaissance Averroism and its Aftermath. Arabic Philosophy in Early Modern Europe, Anna Akasoy and Guido Giglioni (eds), Dordrecht: Springer, pp. 37–54. doi:10.1007/978-94-007-5240-5_2
- Black, Deborah L., 1997, “Avicenna on the Ontological and Epistemic Status of Fictional Beings” Documenti e studi sulla tradizione filosofica medievale, 8: 425–453.
- –––, 1999, “Mental Existence in Thomas Aquinas and Avicenna”, Mediaeval Studies, 61: 45–79. doi:10.1484/J.MS.2.306458
- –––, 2014, “Cognoscere Per Impressionem: Aquinas and the Avicennian Account of Knowing Separate Substances”, American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly, 88(2): 213–236. doi:10.5840/acpq201452212
- Boulnois, Olivier, 2013, Métaphysiques rebelles: genèse et structures d’une science au Moyen Âge, Paris: PUF, (part I, chapter 2)
- Cameron, Margaret and John Marenbon (eds), 2011, Methods and Methodologies. Aristotelian Logic East and West 500–1500, (Investigating Medieval Philosophy, 2), , Leiden-Boston: Brill.
- Cerami, Cristina, 2015, Génération et substance. Aristote et Averroès entre physique et métaphysique, (Scientia Graeco-Arabica, 18), Boston-Berlin: De Gruyter.
- Chase, Michael, 2012, “Philoponus Cosmology in the Arabic Tradition”, Recherches de Théologie et Philosophie Médiévales, 79(2): 271–306. doi:10.2143/RTPM.79.2.2959637
- D’Ancona, Cristina, 1995, Recherches sur le Liber de causis, Paris: Vrin.
- –––, 1998, “Al-Kindī on the Subject-matter of the First Philosophy. Direct and Indirect Sources of Falsafa-l-ūlā, Chapter One”, in Was ist Philosophie im Mittelalter, (Miscellanea Mediaevalia, 26) , Jan A. Aertsen and Andreas Speer (eds), Berlin-New York: Walter de Gruyter, pp. 841–855.
- –––, 2000, “Avicenna and the Liber de Causis: A Contribution to the Dossier”, Revista Española de Filosofía Medieval, 7: 95–114.
- –––, 2007, The Libraries of the Neoplatonists: Proceedings of the Meeting of the European Science Foundation Network “Late Antiquity and Arabic Thought : Patterns in the Constitution of European Culture”, Held in Strasbourg, March 12–14, 2004, (Philosophia Antiqua, Volume 107), Leiden: Brill.
- –––, 2016, “The Theology attributed to Aristotle. Sources, structure, influence”, in El-Rouayheb and Schmidtke 2016: 8–29.
- D’Ancona, Cristina and Richard Charles Taylor, 2003, “Liber de Causis”, in Dictionnaire des Philosophes antiques, dir. par R. Goulet, Supplement, CNRS Editions, Paris, pp. 599–647.
- Davidson, Herbert A., 1987, Proofs for Eternity, Creation and the Existence of God in Medieval Islamic and Jewish Philosophy, New York-Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Di Giovanni, Matteo, 2011, “Averroes and the Logical Status of Metaphysics”, in Cameron and Marenbon 2011: 53–74.
- –––, 2014, “The Commentator: Averroes’s Reading of the Metaphysics”, in A Companion to the Latin Medieval Commentaries on Aristotle’s “Metaphysics”, (Brill’s companions to the Christian tradition, 43), Fabrizio Amerini and Gabriele Galluzzo (eds), Leiden: Brill, pp. 59–94.
- Di Giovanni, Matteo and Oliver Primavesi, 2016, “Who Wrote Alexander’s Commentary on Metaphysics Λ? New Light on the Syro-Arabic Tradition”, in Aristotle’s Metaphysics Lambda—New Essays: Proceedings of the 13th Conference of the Karl and Gertrud-Abel Foundation, Bonn, November, 28th–December 1st, 2010, Christoph Horn (ed.), Berlin-Boston: Walter de Gruyter, pp. 11–66. doi:10.1515/9781501503443-004
- Druart, Thérèse-Anne, 1992, “Al-Fārābī. Emanation and Metaphysics”, in Neoplatonism and Islamic Thought, Parviz Morewedge (ed.), Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, pp. 127–148.
- –––, 1999, “Fārābī. Metaphysics”, in Encyclopaedia Iranica, Ehsan Yarshater (ed.), vol. IX, New York: 216–219. [Druart 1999 available online]
- –––, 2005, “Metaphysics”, in The Cambridge Companion to Arabic Philosophy, Peter Adamson and Richard C. Taylor (eds), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 327–348. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521817439.016
- –––, 2007, “Al-Fārābī, the Categories, Metaphysics, and the Book of Letters”, Medioevo, 32: 15–37.
- –––, 2014, “Ibn Sina and the Ambiguity of Being’s Univocity”, in Views on the Philosophy of Ibn Sina & Mulla Sadra Shirazi, Mokdad Arfa Mensia (ed.), Carthage: The Tunisian Academy of Sciences, Letters and Arts Beit al-Hikma, pp. 15–24.
- El Fekkak, Badr, 2010, “Alexander’s ‘Ināya Transformed: Justice as Divine Providence in Al-Fārābī”, Documenti e Studi sulla Tradizione Filosofica Medievale, 21: pp. 1–17.
- Endress, Gerhard, 1997, “The Circle of al-Kindī. Early Arabic Translations from the Greek ad the Rise of Islamic Philosophy”, in The Ancient Tradition in Christian and Islamic Hellenism: Studies on the Transmission of Greek Philosophy and Sciences Dedicated to H. J. Drossaart Lulofs on His Ninetieth Birthday, Gerhard Endress and Remke Kruk (eds), Leiden: Research School CNWS, pp. 43–76.
- –––, 2006, “Reading Avicenna in the Madrasa. Intellectual Genealogies and Chains of Transmission of Philosophy and the Sciences in the Islamic East”, in Montgomery 2006: 371–423.
- –––, 2007, “Building the Library of Arabic Philosophy. Platonism and Aristotelianism in the Source of al-Kindī”, in D’Ancona 2007: 319–350.
- Galluzzo, Gabriele, 2009, “Averroes and Aquinas on Aristotle’s Criterion of Substantiality”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 19(2): 157–187. doi:10.1017/S0957423909990014
- Gannagé, Emma, 2016, “The Rise of Falsafa: Al-Kindi (d.873), On First Philosophy”, in El-Rouayheb and Schmidtke 2016: 30–62.
- Griffel, Frank, 2009, Al-Ghazālī’s Philosophical Theology, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780195331622.001.0001
- –––, 2016a, “Al-Ghazali’s (d.1111) Incoherence of the Philosophers”, in El-Rouayheb and Schmidtke 2016: 191–209.
- –––, 2016b, “Isma’ilite Critique of Ibn Sina: Al-Shahrastani’s (d.1153) Wrestling-Match with the Philosophers”, in El-Rouayheb and Schmidtke 2016: 210–232.
- Gutas, Dimitri, 1983, “Paul the Persian on the Classification of the Parts of Aristotle’s Philosophy: A Milestone Between Alexandria and Baghdad”, Der Islam, 60(2): 231–267. Reprinted in his Greek Philosophers in the Arabic Tradition, London & New York: Routledge, 2000.
- –––, 2000, “Avicenna’s Eastern [‘Oriental’] Philosophy. Nature, Contents, Transmission”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 10(2): 159–180. doi:10.1017/S0957423900000072
- –––, 2002, “The Heritage of Avicenna: The Golden Age of Arabic Philosophy, 1000–ca. 1350”, in Avicenna and His Heritage: Acts of the International Colloquium, Leuven-Louvain-la-Neuve, 8–11 September 1999, Jules Jannsens and Daniël De Smet (eds), Leuven: Leuven University Press, pp. 81–97.
- –––, 2003, “Essay-Review: Suhrawardī and Greek Philosophy”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 13(2): 303–309. doi:10.1017/S0957423903003138
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Other Internet Resources
- Islamic Philosophy Online
- Brief Bibliographical Guide in Medieval Islamic Philosophy and Theology 2010–2011, Thérèse Anne Druart, and previous installments.
- Islamic Manuscripts, Jan J. Witkam.
- Philosophy in Context: Arabic and Syriac manuscripts in the Mediterranean (PhiC), Maroun Aouad.
- Oslo Arabic Seminar Greek-Arabic (OsAr GRAR)
- Greek into Arabic. Philosophical Concepts and Linguistic Bridges
- Philosophy on the Border of Civilizations and Intellectual Endeavours: Towards a Critical Edition of the Metaphysics (Ilâhiyyât of Kitâb al-Šifâʾ) of Avicenna (Ibn Sînâ), Amos Bertolacci.
- The Heirs of Avicenna: Philosophy in the Islamic East from the 12th to the 13th Century, Peter Adamson.
- Digital Averroes Research Environment, Thomas-Institute of the University of Cologne
- Online Arabic and Latin Glossary, Dag Nikolaus Hasse
- Philosophia Medii Aevi, Loris Sturlese and Irene Zavattero