Hannah Arendt

First published Thu Jul 27, 2006; substantive revision Mon Feb 12, 2024

Hannah Arendt (1906–1975) was one of the most influential political philosophers of the twentieth century. Born into a German-Jewish family, she was forced to leave Germany in 1933 and lived in Paris for the next eight years, working for a number of Jewish refugee organizations. In 1941 she immigrated to the United States and soon became part of a lively intellectual circle in New York. She held a number of academic positions at various American universities until her death in 1975. She is best known for three works that had a major impact both within and outside the academic community. The first, The Origins of Totalitarianism, published in 1951, was a study of the Nazi and Stalinist regimes that generated a wide-ranging debate on the nature and historical antecedents of the totalitarian phenomenon. The second, The Human Condition, published in 1958, was an original philosophical study that investigated the fundamental categories of the vita activa (labor, work, action). The third, Eichmann in Jerusalem, reported on the trial of a major Nazi perpetrator and coined the controversial term “banality of evil”. In addition to these important works, Arendt published a number of influential essays on topics such as the nature of revolution, freedom, authority, tradition and the modern age. At the time of her death in 1975, she had completed the first two volumes of her last major philosophical work, The Life of the Mind, which examined the three fundamental faculties of the vita contemplativa (thinking, willing, judging).

1. Biographical Sketch

Hannah Arendt, one of the leading political thinkers of the twentieth century, was born in 1906 in Hannover and died in New York in 1975. In 1924, after having completed her high school studies, she went to Marburg University to study with Martin Heidegger. The encounter with Heidegger, with whom she had a brief but intense love-affair, had a lasting influence on her thought. After a year of study in Marburg, she moved to Freiburg University where she spent one semester attending the lectures of Edmund Husserl. In the spring of 1926 she went to Heidelberg University to study with Karl Jaspers, a philosopher with whom she established a long-lasting intellectual and personal friendship. She completed her doctoral dissertation, entitled Der Liebesbegriff bei Augustin (hereafter LA) under Jaspers’s supervision in 1929. She was forced to flee Germany in 1933 as a result of Hitler’s rise to power, and after a brief stay in Prague and Geneva she moved to Paris where for six years (1933–39) she worked for a number of Jewish refugee organisations. In 1936 she separated from her first husband, Günther Stern, and started to live with Heinrich Blücher, whom she married in 1940. During her stay in Paris she continued to work on her biography of Rahel Varnhagen, which was not published until 1957 (hereafter RV). In 1941 she was forced to leave France and moved to New York with her husband and mother. In New York she soon became part of an influential circle of writers and intellectuals gathered around the journal Partisan Review. During the post-war period she lectured at a number of American universities, including Princeton, Berkeley and Chicago, but was most closely associated with the New School for Social Research, where she was a professor of political philosophy until her death in 1975. In 1951 she published The Origins of Totalitarianism (hereafter OT), a major study of the Nazi and Stalinist regimes that soon became a classic, followed by The Human Condition in 1958 (hereafter HC), her most important philosophical work. In 1961 she attended the trial of Adolf Eichmann in Jerusalem as a reporter for The New Yorker magazine, and two years later published Eichmann in Jerusalem (hereafter EJ), which caused a deep controversy in Jewish circles. The same year saw the publication of On Revolution (hereafter OR), a comparative analysis of the American and French revolutions. A number of important essays were also published during the 1960s and early 1970s: a first collection was entitled Between Past and Future (hereafter BPF), a second Men in Dark Times (hereafter MDT), and a third Crises of the Republic (hereafter CR). At the time of her death in 1975, she had completed the first two volumes on Thinking and Willing of her last major philosophical work, The Life of the Mind, which was published posthumously in 1978 (hereafter LM). The third volume, on Judging, was left unfinished, but some background material and lecture notes were published in 1982 under the title Lectures on Kant’s Political Philosophy (hereafter LKPP).

2. Introduction

Hannah Arendt was one of the seminal political thinkers of the twentieth century. From the very beginning, her interest was not in the human being in the singular, but in human beings in the plural and in the conditions and forms of their shared lives. Even though Arendt only became politically interested after her dissertation, in this first work she already asks about the conditions of the possibility of a human community (Stark/Scott 1996, 116). By analyzing the Augustinian concept of love, she criticizes the worldlessness of the philosophical tradition (LA, 112). The question of how the world can be transformed from a natural kosmos, in which people are initially strangers, into a polis shared by all, has pervaded Arendt’s writings since her dissertation. Thus, the leitmotif of her work is the question of how people can live together in a common world (Tömmel 2013).

The power and originality of her thinking is evident in works such as The Origins of Totalitarianism, The Human Condition and The Life of the Mind. In these books and numerous essays she grappled with the most crucial political events of her time, trying to grasp their meaning and historical import, and showing how they affected our categories of moral and political judgment. In her political writings, and especially in The Origins of Totalitarianism, Arendt claimed that the phenomenon of totalitarianism has broken the continuity of Occidental history, and has rendered meaningless most of our moral and political categories. Faced with the events of the Holocaust and the Gulag, we can no longer go back to traditional concepts and values, so as to explain the unprecedented by means of precedents, or to understand the monstrous by means of the familiar. The burden of our time must be faced without the aid of tradition, or as Arendt once put it, “without a bannister” (RPW, 336). What was required, in her view, was a new framework that could enable us to come to terms with the twin horrors of the twentieth century, Nazism and Stalinism. She provided such framework in her book on totalitarianism, and went on to develop a new set of philosophical categories that could illuminate the human condition and provide a fresh perspective on the nature of political life.

The assumption that the thread of tradition is irrevocably broken influenced Arendt’s method: The hermeneutic strategy she employed to re-establish a link with the past is indebted to both Walter Benjamin and Martin Heidegger. From Benjamin she took the idea of a fragmentary historiography, one that seeks to identify the moments of rupture, displacement and dislocation in history. Such fragmentary historiography enables one to recover the lost potentials of the past in the hope that they may find actualization in the present. From Heidegger she took the idea of a deconstructive reading of the Western philosophical tradition, one that seeks to uncover the original meaning of our categories and to liberate them from the distorting incrustations of tradition. Such deconstructive hermeneutics enables one to recover those primordial experiences (Urphänomene) which have been occluded or forgotten by the philosophical tradition, and thereby to recover the lost origins of our philosophical concepts and categories.

By relying on these two hermeneutic strategies Arendt hopes to redeem from the past its lost or “forgotten treasure,” that is, those fragments from the past that might still be of significance to us. In her view it is no longer possible, after the collapse of tradition, to save the past as a whole; the task, rather, is to redeem from oblivion those elements of the past that are still able to illuminate our situation. Only by means of this critical reappropriation can we discover the past anew, endow it with relevance and meaning for the present, and make it a source of inspiration for the future. The breakdown of tradition may in fact provide the great chance to look upon the past “with eyes undistorted by any tradition, with a directness which has disappeared from Occidental reading and hearing ever since Roman civilization submitted to the authority of Greek thought” (BPF, 28–9). Arendt’s return to the original experience of the Greek polis represents, in this sense, an attempt to break the fetters of a worn-out tradition and to rediscover a past over which tradition has no longer a claim.

How can Arendt’s philosophy be classified? Although some of Arendt’s works now belong to the classics of the Western tradition of political thought, she has always remained difficult to classify. Her political philosophy cannot be characterized in terms of the traditional categories of conservatism, liberalism, and socialism. Nor can her thinking be assimilated to the recent revival of communitarian political thought, to be found, for example, in the writings of A. MacIntyre, M. Sandel, C. Taylor and M. Walzer. Her name has been invoked by a number of critics of the liberal tradition, on the grounds that she presented a vision of politics that stood in opposition some key liberal principles. There are many strands of Arendt’s thought that could justify such a claim, in particular, her critique of representative democracy, her stress on civic engagement and political deliberation, her separation of morality from politics, and her praise of the revolutionary tradition. However, it would be a mistake to view Arendt as an anti-liberal thinker. Arendt was in fact a stern defender of constitutionalism and the rule of law, an advocate of fundamental human rights (among which she included not only the right to life, liberty, and freedom of expression, but also the right to action and to opinion), and a critic of all forms of political community based on traditional ties and customs, as well as those based on religious, ethnic, or racial identity.

Arendt’s political thought cannot, in this sense, be identified either with the liberal tradition or with the claims advanced by a number of its critics. Arendt did not conceive of politics as a means for the satisfaction of individual preferences, nor as a way to integrate individuals around a shared conception of the good. Her conception of politics is based instead on the idea of active citizenship, that is, on the value and importance of civic engagement and collective deliberation about all matters affecting the political community. If there is a tradition of thought with which Arendt can be identified, it is the classical tradition of civic republicanism originating in Aristotle and embodied in the writings of Machiavelli, Montesquieu, Jefferson, and Tocqueville. According to this tradition politics finds its authentic expression whenever citizens gather together in a public space to deliberate and decide about matters of collective concern. Political activity is valued not because it may lead to agreement or to a shared conception of the good, but because it enables each citizen to exercise his or her powers of agency, to develop the capacities for judgment and to attain by concerted action some measure of political efficacy.

In what follows, we reconstruct Arendt’s philosophy along five major themes: (1) her concept of totalitarianism, (2) her conception of modernity, (3) her theory of action, (4) her conception of citizenship, (5) her theory of thinking and judgment and how it concerns the problems of evil and autonomy.

3. Arendt’s Concept of Totalitarianism

The Origins of Totalitarianism, first published in 1951, established Hannah Arendt’s reputation as a political thinker. In it, Arendt examines the historical development and the shared political characteristics of National Socialism and Stalinism. Faced with the horrors of the extermination camps and what is now termed the Gulag, Arendt strove to understand these phenomena in their own terms, neither deducing them from precedents nor placing them in some overarching scheme of historical necessity. The work is one of the earliest standard works of totalitarianism research.

The book contains three volumes in one: Antisemitism, Imperialism, and Totalitarianism. In the first part, she traces the development of anti-Semitism in the 18th and 19th century. The second part covers the emergence of racism and imperialism in the 19th and 20th century up to National Socialism. Here she argues that imperialism prepared the ground for totalitarianism and provided the preconditions and precedents for its perpetrators (cf. Canovan 2000, 30). The third part is devoted to the two historical manifestations of total domination. In analyzing antisemitism, imperialism, and racism, Arendt did not want to provide a causal explanation for totalitarianism, but rather a historical investigation of the elements that “crystallized into totalitarianism” (Canovan 2000, 27).

What does Arendt understand by the term? Emphasizing its “horrible originality” (UP in EU, 309), Arendt understood totalitarianism to be an entirely new political phenomenon that differed “essentially from other forms of political oppression known to us such as despotism, tyranny and dictatorship” (OT, 460) and thus broke with all political and legal tradition. In the 14 chapters of the third part, Arendt analyzes the conditions and features of this “novel form of government” (OT, 460). According to her, important factors that made totalitarianism possible included collapsed political structures and masses of uprooted people who had lost their orientation and sense of reality in a world marked by socio-economic transformation, revolution and war. While the leaders of the movements belonged to the “mob” (OT, 326), their many supporters were recruited from these rootless and lonely “masses” (OT, 311) through propaganda (OT, 341): “The ideal subject of totalitarian rule is not the convinced Nazi or the convinced Communist, but people for whom the distinction between fact and fiction (i.e., the reality of experience) and the distinction between true and false (i.e., the standards of thought) no longer exist.” (OT, 474).

Thus, totalitarianism is based on a secular, pseudo-scientific ideology that reduces the complexity of reality to the logic of one idea pretending to be able to explain everything. In its self-understanding, the movement is merely carrying out the alleged laws of nature or history outlined by the ideology. It is quintessential, however, that this “central fiction” a totalitarian system rests upon, is translated into a “functioning reality” (OT, 364) by a “completely new” form of “totalitarian organization” (OT, 364): Characteristically, the state is not a monolithic, strictly ordered system, but has a deliberately chaotic, fluid and shapeless structure with competing institutions and a “fluctuating hierarchy” (OT, 369), which makes predictability, trust and accountability impossible. Above this “maze”, however, “lies the power nucleus of the country, the superefficient and supercompetent services of the secret police” (OT, 420). Thus, the organization combines deliberate chaos with the “iron band” (OT, 466) of total control through extreme coercion and terror.

While the regime openly claims unlimited power and aims at world domination, their “real secret” (OT, 436) are the concentration and extermination camps as their “true central institution” (OT, 438). According to Arendt, the camps “serve as laboratories in which the fundamental belief of totalitarianism that everything is possible is being verified.” (OT, 437). The total terror in the camps is the “essence of totalitarian government” (OT, 466), because here total domination reaches its abysmal goal: To reduce “the infinite plurality” of human beings into one interchangeable “bundle of reactions” and thus eliminate “spontaneity itself” (OT, 438). It seemed as if the real mission of the totalitarian apparatus was to “to make men superfluous” (OT, 445). Therefore, the “hurricane of nihilism” (Canovan 2000, 30) unleashed by the totalitarian regime cannot create an new world order, but ultimately leads to nothing but unprecedented destruction: It even “bears the germ of its own destruction.” (OT, 478).

What makes totalitarianism difficult to understand is not only the gigantic scale of atrocities committed by it, but its senselessness. Arendt maintained that totalitarianism defy common sense understanding, because their crimes cannot be explained by self-interested or utilitarian motives or ends (cf. OT, 440).The camps did not serve evil, but useful purposes like forced labor or slavery, but showed that an “absolute” (OT, viii-ix) and “radical evil” is possible (OT, 443; cf. section 6).

Understanding totalitarianism despite this, is of the utmost political importance, because insight into its structures and mode of operation provides “the politically most important yardstick for judging events in our time, namely: whether they serve totalitarian domination or not.” (OT, 442)

4. The Human Condition

Arendt’s analysis of totalitarianism “throws into relief […] the political condition itself.” (Canovan (2000, 35). In other words, it sheds light on the basic conditions of politics, Arendt turned to in her major philosophical work, The Human Condition. Published in 1958, the book contains her critical conception of the modern age, the tripartite division of the vita activa in labor, work and action, and thus Arendt’s political theory, which examines the basic conditions of political agency.

Arendt’s theory of action and her revival of the ancient notion of praxis represent one of the most original contributions to twentieth century political thought. By distinguishing action (praxis) from fabrication (poiesis), by linking it to freedom and plurality, and by showing its connection to speech and remembrance, Arendt is able to articulate a conception of politics in which questions of meaning and identity can be addressed in a fresh and original manner. Moreover, by viewing action as a mode of human togetherness, Arendt is able to develop a conception of participatory democracy which stands in direct contrast to the bureaucratized and elitist forms of politics so characteristic of the modern epoch.

4.1 Arendt’s Conception of Modernity

Shaped by her experience of totalitarianism in the twentieth century, Arendt articulated a fairly negative conception of modernity in The Human Condition, and in some of the essays collected in Between Past and Future. In these writings Arendt is primarily concerned with the losses incurred as a result of the eclipse of tradition, religion, and authority, but she offers a number of illuminating suggestions with respect to the resources that the modern age can still provide to address questions of meaning, identity, and value.

For Arendt modernity is characterized by the loss of the world, by which she means the restriction or elimination of the public sphere of action and speech in favor of the private world of introspection and the private pursuit of economic interests. Modernity is the age of mass society, of the rise of the social out of a previous distinction between the public and the private, and of the victory of animal laborans over homo faber and the classical conception of man as zoon politikon. Modernity is the age of bureaucratic administration and anonymous labor, rather than politics and action, of elite domination and the manipulation of public opinion. It is the age when totalitarian forms of government, such as Nazism and Stalinism, have emerged as a result of the institutionalization of terror and violence. It is the age where history as a “natural process” has replaced history as a fabric of actions and events, where homogeneity and conformity have replaced plurality and freedom, and where isolation and loneliness have eroded human solidarity and all spontaneous forms of living together. Modernity is the age where the past no longer carries any certainty of evaluation, where individuals, having lost their traditional standards and values, must search for new grounds of human community as such.

Arendt articulates her conception of modernity around a number of key features: these are world alienation, earth alienation, the rise of the social, and the victory of animal laborans. World alienation refers to the loss of an intersubjectively constituted world of experience and action by means of which we establish our self-identity and an adequate sense of reality. Earth alienation refers to the attempt to escape from the confines of the earth; spurred by modern science and technology, we have searched for ways to overcome our earth-bound condition by setting out on the exploration of space, by attempting to recreate life under laboratory conditions, and by trying to extend our given life-span. The rise of the social refers to the expansion of the market economy from the early modern period and the ever increasing accumulation of capital and social wealth. With the rise of the social everything has become an object of production and consumption, of acquisition and exchange; moreover, its constant expansion has resulted in the blurring of the distinction between the private and the public. The victory of animal laborans refers to the triumph of the values of labor over those of homo faber and of man as zoon politikon. All the values characteristic of the world of fabrication — permanence, stability, durability — as well as those characteristic of the world of action and speech — freedom, plurality, solidarity — are sacrificed in favor of the values of life, productivity and abundance.

Arendt’s interpretation of modernity can be criticized on a number of grounds. We focus here on her assessment of the social: Arendt identifies the social with all those activities formerly restricted to the private sphere of the household and having to do with the necessities of life. Her claim is that, with the tremendous expansion of the economy from the end of the eighteenth century, all such activities have taken over the public realm and transformed it into a sphere for the satisfaction of our material needs. Society has thus invaded and conquered the public realm, turning it into a function of what previously were private needs and concerns, and has thereby destroyed the boundary separating the public and the private. Arendt also claims that with the expansion of the social realm the tripartite division of human activities has been undermined to the point of becoming meaningless. In her view, once the social realm has established its monopoly, the distinction between labor, work and action is lost, since every effort is now expended on reproducing our material conditions of existence. Obsessed with life, productivity, and consumption, we have turned into a society of laborers and jobholders who no longer appreciate the values associated with work, nor those associated with action.

From this brief account it is clear that Arendt’s concept of the social plays a crucial role in her assessment of modernity. However some have argued that this may have led her to a series of questionable judgments:

  • In the first place, Arendt’s characterization of the social is overly restricted. She claims that the social is the realm of labor, of biological and material necessity, of the reproduction of our condition of existence. She also claims that the rise of the social coincides with the expansion of the economy from the end of the eighteenth century. However, having identified the social with the growth of the economy in the past two centuries, Arendt cannot characterize it in terms of a subsistence model of simple reproduction. (See Benhabib 2003, Ch. 6; Bernstein 1986, Ch. 9; Hansen 1993, Ch. 3; Parekh 1981, Ch. 8.)
  • Secondly, Arendt’s identification of the social with the activities of the household is responsible for a major shortcoming in her analysis of the economy. She is, in fact, unable to acknowledge that a modern capitalist economy constitutes a structure of power with a highly asymmetric distribution of costs and rewards. By relying on the misleading analogy of the household, she maintains that all questions pertaining to the economy are pre-political, and thus ignores the crucial question of economic power and exploitation. (See Bernstein 1986, Ch. 9; Hansen 1993, Ch. 3; Parekh 1981, Ch. 8; Pitkin 1998; Pitkin 1994, Ch. 10, Hinchman and Hinchman; Wolin 1994, Ch. 11, Hinchman and Hinchman.)
  • Finally, by insisting on a strict separation between the private and the public, and between the social and the political, she is unable to account for the essential connection between these spheres and the struggles to redraw their boundaries. Today many so-called private issues have become public concerns, and the struggle for justice and equal rights has extended into many spheres. By insulating the political sphere from the concerns of the social, and by maintaining a strict distinction between the public and the private, Arendt is unable to account for some of the most important achievements of modernity — the extension of justice and equal rights, and the redrawing of the boundaries between the public and the private. (See Benhabib 2003, Ch. 6; Bernstein 1986, Ch. 9; Dietz 2002, Ch. 5; Pitkin 1998; Pitkin 1995, Ch. 3, Honig; Zaretsky 1997, Ch. 8, Calhoun and McGowan.)

4.2 The Vita Activa: Labor, Work and Action

Arendt analyzes the vita activa via three categories which correspond to the three fundamental activities of our being-in-the-world: labor, work, and action. Labor is the activity which is tied to the human condition of life, work the activity which is tied to the condition of worldliness, and action the activity tied to the condition of plurality. For Arendt each activity is autonomous, in the sense of having its own distinctive principles and of being judged by different criteria. Labor is judged by its ability to sustain human life, to cater to our biological needs of consumption and reproduction, work is judged by its ability to build and maintain a world fit for human use, and action is judged by its ability to disclose the identity of the agent, to affirm the reality of the world, and to actualize our capacity for freedom. Although Arendt considers the three activities of labor, work and action equally necessary to a complete human life, in the sense that each contributes in its distinctive way to the realization of our human capacities, it is clear from her writings that she takes action to be the differentia specifica of human beings, that which distinguishes them from both the life of animals (who are similar to us insofar as they need to labor to sustain and reproduce themselves) and the life of the gods (with whom we share, intermittently, the activity of contemplation). In this respect the categories of labor and work, while significant in themselves, must be seen as counterpoints to the category of action, helping to differentiate and highlight the place of action within the order of the vita activa.

In The Human Condition Arendt stresses repeatedly that action is primarily symbolic in character and that the web of human relationships is sustained by communicative interaction (HC, 178–9, 184–6, 199–200). Thus, action entails speech: by means of language we are able to articulate the meaning of our actions and to coordinate the actions of a plurality of agents. Conversely, speech entails action, not only in the sense that speech itself is a form of action, or that most acts are performed in the manner of speech, but in the sense that action is often the means whereby we check the sincerity of the speaker. Thus, just as action without speech runs the risk of being meaningless and would be impossible to coordinate with the actions of others, so speech without action would lack one of the means by which we may confirm the veracity of the speaker. As we shall see, this link between action and speech is central to Arendt’s characterization of power, that potential which springs up between people when they act “in concert,” and which is actualized “only where word and deed have not parted company, where words are not empty and deeds not brutal, where words are not used to veil intentions but to disclose realities, and deeds are not used to violate and destroy but to establish relations and create new realities ” (HC, 200).

For Arendt, action constitutes the highest realization of the vita activa. In the opening section of the chapter on action in The Human Condition Arendt discusses one of its central functions, namely, the disclosure of the identity of the agent. In action and speech, she maintains, individuals reveal themselves as the unique individuals they are, disclose to the world their distinct personalities. In terms of Arendt’s distinction, they reveal “who” they are as distinct to “what” they are — the latter referring to individual abilities and talents, as well as deficiencies and shortcomings, which are traits all human beings share. Neither labor nor work enable individuals to disclose their identities, to reveal “who” they are as distinct from “what” they are. In labor the individuality of each person is submerged by being bound to a chain of natural necessities, to the constraints imposed by biological survival. When we engage in labor we can only show our sameness, the fact that we all belong to the human species and must attend to the needs of our bodies. In this sphere we do indeed “behave,” “perform roles,” and “fulfill functions,” since we all obey the same imperatives. In work there is more scope for individuality, in that each work of art or production bears the mark of its maker; but the maker is still subordinate to the end product, both in the sense of being guided by a model, and in the sense that the product will generally outlast the maker. Moreover, the end product reveals little about the maker except the fact that he or she was able to make it. It does not tell us who the creator was, only that he or she had certain abilities and talents. It is thus only in action and speech, in interacting with others through words and deeds, that individuals reveal who they personally are and can affirm their unique identities. Action and speech are in this sense very closely related because both contain the answer to the question asked of every newcomer: “Who are you?” This disclosure of the “who” is made possible by both deeds and words, but of the two it is speech that has the closest affinity to revelation. Without the accompaniment of speech, action would lose its revelatory quality and could no longer be identified with an agent. It would lack, as it were, the conditions of ascription of agency.

4.3 Freedom, Natality and Plurality

The two central features of action are freedom and plurality. By freedom Arendt does not mean the ability to choose among a set of possible alternatives, but spontaneity, i.e. the capacity to begin, to start something new, to do the unexpected, with which all human beings are endowed by virtue of being born. Action as the realization of freedom is therefore rooted in natality, in the fact that each birth represents a new beginning and the introduction of novelty in the world. “It is in the nature of beginning” — she claims — “that something new is started which cannot be expected from whatever may have happened before. This character of startling unexpectedness is inherent in all beginnings … The fact that man is capable of action means that the unexpected can be expected from him, that he is able to perform what is infinitely improbable. And this again is possible only because each man is unique, so that with each birth something uniquely new comes into the world ” (HC, 177–8). To act means to be able to do the unanticipated; and it is entirely in keeping with this conception that most of the concrete examples of action in the modern age that Arendt discusses are cases of revolutions and popular uprisings. Her claim is that “revolutions are the only political events which confront us directly and inevitably with the problem of beginning,” (OR, 21) since they represent the attempt to found a new political space, a space where freedom can appear as a worldly reality. The favorite example for Arendt is the American Revolution, because there the act of foundation took the form of a constitution of liberty. Her other examples are the revolutionary clubs of the French Revolution, the Paris Commune of 1871, the creation of Soviets during the Russian Revolution, the French Resistance to Hitler in the Second World War, and the Hungarian revolt of 1956. In all these cases individual men and women had the courage to interrupt their routine activities, to step forward from their private lives in order to create a public space where freedom could appear, and to act in such a way that the memory of their deeds could become a source of inspiration for the future.

Plurality, to which we may now turn, is the other central feature of action. For Arendt, plurality is the necessary condition of all political life (HC, 7). For if to act means to take the initiative, to introduce the novum and the unexpected into the world, it also means that it is not something that can be done in isolation from others, that is, independently of the presence of a plurality of actors who from their different perspectives can judge the quality of what is being enacted. In this respect action needs plurality in the same way that performance artists need an audience; without the presence and acknowledgment of others, action would cease to be a meaningful activity. Action, to the extent that it requires appearing in public, making oneself known through words and deeds, and eliciting the consent of others, can only exist in a context defined by plurality.

Arendt establishes the connection between action and plurality by means of an anthropological argument. In her view just as life is the condition that corresponds to the activity of labor and worldliness the condition that corresponds to the activity of work, so plurality is the condition that corresponds to action. She defines plurality as “the fact that men, not Man, live on the earth and inhabit the world,” and says that it is the condition of human action “because we are all the same, that is, human, in such a way that nobody is ever the same as anyone else who ever lived, lives, or will live ” (HC, 7–8). Plurality thus refers both to equality and distinction, to the fact that all human beings belong to the same species and are sufficiently alike to understand one another, but yet no two of them are ever interchangeable, since each of them is an individual endowed with a unique biography and perspective on the world. It is by virtue of plurality that each of us is capable of acting and relating to others in ways that are unique and distinctive, and in so doing of contributing to a network of actions and relationships that is infinitely complex and unpredictable.

4.4 Action, Narrative, and Remembrance

One of the principal drawbacks of action, Arendt maintains, is to be extremely fragile, to be subject to the erosion of time and to forgetfulness; unlike the products of the activity of work, which acquire a measure of permanence by virtue of their sheer facticity, deeds and words do not survive their enactment unless they are remembered. Remembrance alone, the retelling of deeds as stories, can save the lives and deeds of actors from oblivion and futility. And it is precisely for this reason, Arendt points out, that the Greeks valued poetry and history so highly, because they rescued the glorious (as well as the less glorious) deeds of the past for the benefit of future generations (HC, 192 ff; BPF, 63–75). Through their narratives the fragility and perishability of human action was overcome and made to outlast the lives of their doers and the limited life-span of their contemporaries. They preserve the memory of deeds through time, and in so doing, they enable these deeds to become sources of inspiration for the future, that is, models to be imitated, and, if possible, surpassed.

The function of the storyteller is thus crucial not only for the preservation of the doings and sayings of actors, but also for the full disclosure of the identity of the actor. The narratives of a storyteller, Arendt claims, “tell us more about their subjects, the ‘hero’ in the center of each story, than any product of human hands ever tells us about the master who produced it” (HC, 184). Indeed, it is one of Arendt’s most important claims that the meaning of action itself is dependent upon the articulation retrospectively given to it by historians and narrators. Narratives can thus provide a measure of truthfulness and a greater degree of significance to the actions of individuals.

However, to be preserved, such narratives needed in turn an audience, that is, a community of hearers who became the transmitters of the deeds that had been immortalized. As Sheldon Wolin has aptly put it, “audience is a metaphor for the political community whose nature is to be a community of remembrance” (Wolin 1977, 97). In other words, behind the actor stands the storyteller, but behind the storyteller stands a community of memory. It was one of the primary functions of the Greek polis to be precisely such a community, to preserve the words and deeds of its citizens from oblivion and the ravages of time, and thereby to leave a testament for future generations.

4.5 Action and the Space of Appearance

For Arendt the polis stands for the space of appearance, for that space “where I appear to others as others appear to me, where men exist not merely like other living or inanimate things, but to make their appearance explicitly.” Such public space of appearance can be always recreated anew wherever individuals gather together politically, that is, “wherever men are together in the manner of speech and action” (HC, 198–9). However, since it is a creation of action, this space of appearance is highly fragile and exists only when actualized through the performance of deeds or the utterance of words. The space of appearance must be continually recreated by action; its existence is secured whenever actors gather together for the purpose of discussing and deliberating about matters of public concern, and it disappears the moment these activities cease. It is always a potential space that finds its actualization in the actions and speeches of individuals who have come together to undertake some common project. It may arise suddenly, as in the case of revolutions, or it may develop slowly out of the efforts to change some specific piece of legislation or policy. Historically, it has been recreated whenever public spaces of action and deliberation have been set up, from town hall meetings to workers’ councils, from demonstrations and sit-ins to struggles for justice and equal rights.

4.6 Action and Power

The capacity to act in concert for a public-political purpose is what Arendt calls power. Power needs to be distinguished from strength, force, and violence (CR, 143–55). Unlike strength, it is not the property of an individual, but of a plurality of actors joining together for some common political purpose. Unlike force, it is not a natural phenomenon but a human creation, the outcome of collective engagement. And unlike violence, it is based not on coercion but on consent and rational persuasion.

For Arendt, power is a sui generis phenomenon, since it is a product of action and rests entirely on persuasion. It is a product of action because it arises out of the concerted activities of a plurality of agents, and it rests on persuasion because it consists in the ability to secure the consent of others through unconstrained discussion and debate. Its only limitation is the existence of other people, but this limitation, she notes, “is not accidental, because human power corresponds to the condition of plurality to begin with” (HC, 201). It is actualized in all those cases where action is undertaken for communicative (rather than strategic or instrumental) purposes, and where speech is employed to disclose our intentions and to articulate our motives to others.

Arendt maintains that the legitimacy of power is derived from the initial getting together of people, that is, from the original pact of association that establishes a political community, and is reaffirmed whenever individuals act in concert through the medium of speech and persuasion. For her “power needs no justification, being inherent in the very existence of political communities; what it does need is legitimacy … Power springs up whenever people get together and act in concert, but it derives its legitimacy from the initial getting together rather than from any action that then may follow” (CR, 151).

Beyond appealing to the past, power also relies for its continued legitimacy on the rationally binding commitments that arise out of a process of free and undistorted communication. Because of this, power is highly independent of material factors: it is sustained not by economic, bureaucratic or military means, but by the power of common convictions that result from a process of fair and unconstrained deliberation.

Power is also not something that can be relied upon at all times or accumulated and stored for future use. Rather, it exists only as a potential which is actualized when actors gather together for political action and public deliberation. It is thus closely connected to the space of appearance, that public space which arises out of the actions and speeches of individuals. Indeed, for Arendt, “power is what keeps the public realm, the potential space of appearance between acting and speaking men, in existence.” (HC, 200).

Power, then, lies at the basis of every political community and is the expression of a potential that is always available to actors. It is also the source of legitimacy of political and governmental institutions, the means whereby they are transformed and adapted to new circumstances and made to respond to the opinions and needs of the citizens. “It is the people’s support that lends power to the institutions of a country, and this support is but the continuation of the consent that brought the laws into existence to begin with … All political institutions are manifestations and materializations of power; they petrify and decay as soon as the living power of the people ceases to uphold them” (CR, 140).

The legitimacy of political institutions is dependent on the power, that is, the active consent of the people; and insofar as governments may be viewed as attempts to preserve power for future generations by institutionalizing it, they require for their vitality the continuing support and active involvement of all citizens.

4.7 The Unpredictability and Irreversibility of Action

In this section, we examine the unpredictability and irreversibility of action, and their respective remedies, the power of promise and the power to forgive. Action is unpredictable because it is a manifestation of freedom, of the capacity to innovate and to alter situations by engaging in them; but also, and primarily, because it takes place within the web of human relationships, within a context defined by plurality, so that no actor can control its final outcome. Each actor sets off processes and enters into the inextricable web of actions and events to which all other actors also contribute, with the result that the outcome can never be predicted from the intentions of any particular actor. The open and unpredictable nature of action is a consequence of human freedom and plurality: by acting we are free to start processes and bring about new events, but no actor has the power to control the consequences of his or her deeds.

Another and related reason for the unpredictability of action is that its consequences are boundless: every act sets in motion an unlimited number of actions and reactions which have literally no end. As Arendt puts it: “The reason why we are never able to foretell with certainty the outcome and end of any action is simply that action has no end” (HC, 233). This is because action “though it may proceed from nowhere, so to speak, acts into a medium where every action becomes a chain reaction and where every process is the cause of new processes … the smallest act in the most limited circumstances bears the seed of the same boundlessness, because one deed, and sometimes one word, suffices to change every constellation” (HC, 190).

Closely connected to the boundlessness and unpredictability of action is its irreversibility. Every action sets off processes which cannot be undone or retrieved in the way, say, we are able to undo a faulty product of our hands. If one builds an artifact and is not satisfied with it, it can always be destroyed and recreated again. This is impossible where action is concerned, because action always takes place within an already existing web of human relationships, where every action becomes a reaction, every deed a source of future deeds, and none of these can be stopped or subsequently undone. The consequences of each act are thus not only unpredictable but also irreversible; the processes started by action can neither be controlled nor be reversed.

The remedy which the tradition of Western thought has proposed for the unpredictability and irreversibility of action has consisted in abstaining from action altogether, in the withdrawal from the sphere of interaction with others, in the hope that one’s freedom and integrity could thereby be preserved. Platonism, Stoicism and Christianity elevated the sphere of contemplation above the sphere of action, precisely because in the former one could be free from the entanglements and frustrations of action. Arendt’s proposal, by contrast, is not to turn one’s back on the realm of human affairs, but to rely on two faculties inherent in action itself, the faculty of forgiving and the faculty of promising. These two faculties are closely connected, the former mitigating the irreversibility of action by absolving the actor from the unintended consequences of his or her deeds, the latter moderating the uncertainty of its outcome by binding actors to certain courses of action and thereby setting some limit to the unpredictability of the future. Both faculties are, in this respect, connected to temporality: from the standpoint of the present forgiving looks backward to what has happened and absolves the actor from what was unintentionally done, while promising looks forward as it seeks to establish islands of security in an otherwise uncertain and unpredictable future. Forgiving enables us to come to terms with the past and liberates us to some extent from the burden of irreversibility; promising allows us to face the future and to set some bounds to its unpredictability (HC, 237). Both faculties, in this sense, depend on plurality, on the presence and acting of others, for no one can forgive himself and no one can feel bound by a promise made only to one’s self. At the same time, both faculties are an expression of human freedom, since without the faculty to undo what we have done in the past, and without the ability to control at least partially the processes we have started, we would be the victims “of an automatic necessity bearing all the marks of inexorable laws” (HC, 246).

5. Arendt’s Conception of Citizenship

In this section, we reconstruct Arendt’s conception of citizenship around two themes: (1) the public sphere, and (2) political agency and collective identity, and to highlight the contribution of Arendt’s conception to a theory of democratic citizenship.

5.1 Citizenship and the Public Sphere

For Arendt the public sphere comprises two distinct but interrelated dimensions. The first is the space of appearance, a space of political freedom and equality which comes into being whenever citizens act in concert through the medium of speech and persuasion. The second is the common world, a shared and public world of human artifacts, institutions and settings which separates us from nature and which provides a relatively permanent and durable context for our activities. Both dimensions are essential to the practice of citizenship, the former providing the spaces where it can flourish, the latter providing the stable background from which public spaces of action and deliberation can arise. For Arendt the reactivation of citizenship in the modern world depends upon both the recovery of a common, shared world and the creation of numerous spaces of appearance in which individuals can disclose their identities and establish relations of reciprocity and solidarity.

There are three features of the public sphere and of the sphere of politics in general that are central to Arendt’s conception of citizenship. These are, first, its artificial or constructed quality; second, its spatial quality; and, third, the distinction between public and private interests.

As regards the first feature, Arendt always stressed the artificiality of public life and of political activities in general, the fact that they are man-made and constructed rather than natural or given. She regarded this artificiality as something to be celebrated rather than deplored. Politics for her was not the result of some natural predisposition, or the realization of the inherent traits of human nature. Rather, it was a cultural achievement of the first order, enabling individuals to transcend the necessities of life and to fashion a world within which free political action and discourse could flourish.

The stress on the artificiality of politics has a number of important consequences. For example, Arendt emphasized that the principle of political equality does not rest on a theory of natural rights or on some natural condition that precedes the constitution of the political realm. Rather, it is an attribute of citizenship which individuals acquire upon entering the public realm and which can be secured only by democratic political institutions.

Another consequence of Arendt’s stress on the artificiality of political life is evident in her rejection of all neo-romantic appeals to the volk and to ethnic identity as the basis for political community. She maintained that one’s ethnic, religious, or racial identity was irrelevant to one’s identity as a citizen, and that it should never be made the basis of membership in a political community.

Arendt’s emphasis on the formal qualities of citizenship made her position rather distant from those advocates of participation in the 1960s who saw it in terms of recapturing a sense of intimacy, of warmth and authenticity. For Arendt political participation was important because it permitted the establishment of relations of civility and solidarity among citizens. She claimed that the ties of intimacy and warmth can never become political since they represent psychological substitutes for the loss of the common world. The only truly political ties are those of civic friendship and solidarity, since they make political demands and preserve reference to the world. For Arendt, therefore, the danger of trying to recapture the sense of intimacy and warmth, of authenticity and communal feelings is that one loses the public values of impartiality, civic friendship, and solidarity.

The second feature stressed by Arendt has to do with the spatial quality of public life, with the fact that political activities are located in a public space where citizens are able to meet one another, exchange their opinions and debate their differences, and search for some collective solution to their problems. Politics, for Arendt, is a matter of people sharing a common world and a common space of appearance so that public concerns can emerge and be articulated from different perspectives. In her view, it is not enough to have a collection of private individuals voting separately and anonymously according to their private opinions. Rather, these individuals must be able to see and talk to one another in public, to meet in a public-political space, so that their differences as well as their commonalities can emerge and become the subject of democratic debate.

This notion of a common public space helps us to understand how political opinions can be formed which are neither reducible to private, idiosyncratic preferences, on the one hand, nor to a unanimous collective opinion, on the other. Arendt herself distrusted the term “public opinion,” since it suggested the mindless unanimity of mass society. In her view representative opinions could arise only when citizens actually confronted one another in a public space, so that they could examine an issue from a number of different perspectives, modify their views, and enlarge their standpoint to incorporate that of others. Political opinions, she claimed, can never be formed in private; rather, they are formed, tested, and enlarged only within a public context of argumentation and debate.

Another implication of Arendt’s stress on the spatial quality of politics has to do with the question of how a collection of distinct individuals can be united to form a political community. For Arendt the unity that may be achieved in a political community is neither the result of religious or ethnic affinity, not the expression of some common value system. Rather, the unity in question can be attained by sharing a public space and a set of political institutions, and engaging in the practices and activities which are characteristic of that space and those institutions.

A further implication of Arendt’s conception of the spatial quality of politics is that since politics is a public activity, one cannot be part of it without in some sense being present in a public space. To be engaged in politics means actively participating in the various public forums where the decisions affecting one’s community are taken. Arendt’s insistence on the importance of direct participation in politics is thus based on the idea that, since politics is something that needs a worldly location and can only happen in a public space, then if one is not present in such a space one is simply not engaged in politics.

This public or world-centered conception of politics lies also at the basis of the third feature stressed by Arendt, the distinction between public and private interests. According to Arendt, political activity is not a means to an end, but an end in itself; one does not engage in political action to promote one’s welfare, but to realize the principles intrinsic to political life, such as freedom, equality, justice, and solidarity. In a late essay entitled “Public Rights and Private Interests” (PRPI) Arendt discusses the difference between one’s life as an individual and one’s life as a citizen, between the life spent on one’s own and the life spent in common with others. She argues that our public interest as citizens is quite distinct from our private interest as individuals. The public interest is not the sum of private interests, nor their highest common denominator, nor even the total of enlightened self-interests. In fact, it has little to do with our private interests, since it concerns the world that lies beyond the self, that was there before our birth and that will be there after our death, a world that finds embodiment in activities and institutions with their own intrinsic purposes which might often be at odds with our short-term and private interests. The public interest refers, therefore, to the interests of a public world which we share as citizens and which we can pursue and enjoy only by going beyond our private self-interest.

5.2 Citizenship, Agency, and Collective Identity

Arendt’s participatory conception of citizenship provides the best starting point for addressing both the question of the constitution of collective identity and that concerning the conditions for the exercise of effective political agency.

With respect to the first claim, it is important to note that one of the crucial questions at stake in political discourse is the creation of a collective identity, a “we” to which we can appeal when faced with the problem of deciding among alternative courses of action. Since in political discourse there is always disagreement about the possible courses of action, the identity of the “we” that is going to be created through a specific form of action becomes a central question. By engaging in this or that course of action we are, in fact, entering a claim on behalf of a “we,” that is, we are creating a specific form of collective identity. Political action and discourse are, in this respect, essential to the constitution of collective identities.

This process of identity-construction, however, is never given once and for all and is never unproblematic. Rather, it is a process of constant renegotiation and struggle, a process in which actors articulate and defend competing conceptions of cultural and political identity. Arendt’s participatory conception of citizenship is particularly relevant in this context since it articulates the conditions for the establishment of collective identities. Once citizenship is viewed as the process of active deliberation about competing identities, its value resides in the possibility of establishing forms of collective identity that can be acknowledged, tested, and transformed in a discursive and democratic fashion.

With respect to the second claim, concerning the question of political agency, it is important to stress the connection that Arendt establishes between political action, understood as the active engagement of citizens in the public realm, and the exercise of effective political agency. This connection between action and agency is one of the central contributions of Arendt’s participatory conception of citizenship. According to Arendt, the active engagement of citizens in the determination of the affairs of their community provides them not only with the experience of public freedom and public happiness, but also with a sense of political agency and efficacy, the sense, in Thomas Jefferson’s words, of being “participators in government.” In her view only the sharing of power that comes from civic engagement and common deliberation can provide each citizen with a sense of effective political agency. Arendt’s strictures against political representation must be understood in this light. She saw representation as a substitute for the direct involvement of the citizens, and as a means whereby the distinction between rulers and ruled could reassert itself. As an alternative to a system of representation based on bureaucratic parties and state structures, Arendt proposed a federated system of councils through which citizens could effectively determine their own political affairs. For Arendt, it is only by means of direct political participation, that is, by engaging in common action and collective deliberation, that citizenship can be reaffirmed and political agency effectively exercised.

6. The Life of the Mind and its Moral Significance

The Life of the Mind, a work that was to encompass the three faculties of thinking, willing and judging, provides an account of our mental activities that was missing from Arendt’s earlier work on the vita activa. Due to her sudden death, Arendt was unable to complete this late work. The two volumes on thinking and willing appeared posthumously as The Life of the Mind (LM), and her preparatory work on judgment was published separately (LKPP).

In the introduction to The Life of the Mind, Arendt explains that it was the Eichmann trial that sparked her interest in the phenomenon of thinking (LM, 6). It was Eichmann’s “inability to think” (EJ, 49) that struck her most, because it was responsible in her view for his inability to judge independently in a totalitarian system. Against this background, she asked: “Is evil-doing … possible in default of not just ‘base motives’ … but of any motives whatever … Might the problem of good and evil, our faculty for telling right from wrong, be connected with our faculty of thought?” (LM, vol. I, 4–5). Although Arendt had in fact been repeatedly preoccupied with thinking long before (Bernstein 2000), it is noteworthy that Arendt’s investigation of thinking and judging cannot be separated from her reflections on evil and morality, and vice versa.

In the following, we will first present the development of Arendt’s concept of evil from The Origins of Totalitarianism to Eichmann in Jerusalem (1). Thereafter we will show why thinking and judging is morally relevant (2), and why, according to Arendt, self-awareness is linked to autonomy (3). After that, we present Arendt’s two models of political judgment (4). Lastly, we will discuss the role of opinion and truth in politics (5).

6.1 Eichmann in Jerusalem: Arendt’s Reconceptualization of Evil

In 1945, Arendt wrote that “the problem of evil will be the fundamental question of postwar intellectual life in Europe.” (EU, 134) Reflecting on its nature, she initially described the evil committed by totalitarian regimes as “absolute” or “radical” evil, using Kant’s expression. Radical evil consists in the destruction of human plurality and spontaneity, and in rendering human beings superfluous (OT, 445). In her Concluding Remarks of OT’s first edition, she writes: “The danger of the corpse factories and holes of oblivion is that today, with populations and homelessness everywhere on the increase, masses of people are continuously rendered superfluous of we continue to think of our world in utilitarian terms.” (OT 1951, 433). As mentioned in section 3, this type of evil cannot be grasped with traditional explanations such as selfish motives (OT, 440), and is therefore unpunishable and unforgivable (OT, 439).

Reporting on the trial of Adolf Eichmann gave Arendt’s reflections on evil a new direction: Otto Adolf Eichmann was a German SS-Obersturmbannführer and member of the Gestapo during the Second World War who organized the deportation of Jews from Germany and other European countries occupied by Nazi Germany as part of the so-called Final Solution. He made logistically possible the murder of six million Jews, and was therefore directly responsible for it. After Eichmann was kidnapped by Israeli agents in Argentina, where he was hiding, he was brought to trial in Israel in 1961, and found guilty of crimes against the Jewish people. In 1962, Eichmann was hanged.

Arendt reported on the trial, which she attended in part, in articles for The New Yorker and published the text subsequently as Eichmann in Jerusalem. A Report on the Banality of Evil, her most controversial book (Benhabib 2000). EJ contains four main narratives: the trial and the course of the proceedings, the motives of the Israeli government, the status of the Jewish Councils (Judenräte) and, last but not least, the question of personal responsibility under dictatorship in general and the accused’s deeds and his state of mind in particular.

It was not only the tone of book, its use of irony and sarcasm, that alienated many readers, but also her claim that some members of the Jewish Councils were collaborators in that they provided the Nazis with lists of their Jewish fellow citizens who were then deported to the extermination camps in the East (EJ, 11, 91, 117–126). Furthermore, her assessment of Eichmann, in whom she saw a “clown” rather than a “monster” (EJ, 54), was met with incomprehension.

The idea that evil is not necessarily committed by ‘demons’ can already be found in OT: “The mass man whom Himmler organized for the greatest mass crimes ever committed in history bore the features of the philistine rather than the mob man” (OT, 338). But it was the book on Eichmann that introduced the catchy phrase “banality of evil” prominently in its subtitle. Although the expression appears only once more in the book (Ej, 252), it contributed significantly to the fierce controversy that erupted immediately after its publication: EJ has been gravely misinterpreted as a trivialization of the Nazi crimes or even as a defense of Eichmann (cf. Benhabib 2000). Many critics accused Arendt of having mistaken the true, fanatically anti-Semitic Eichmann for a mere bureaucrat (Ceserani 2006, Lipstadt 2011, Stangneth 2014).

Arendt, however, never wrote that Eichmann simply followed orders, as he tried to claim. According to her, Eichmann was not a mere cog within the Nazi machine, but a person who zealously transported Jews to their death and who even disobeyed orders “to make the Final solution final” (EJ, 146; cf. 137–14). Arendt believed him to be fully responsibility for his deeds and supported the death sentence.

Moreover, the phrase was not meant to denote a general theory of the nature of evil, not even of totalitarian or Nazi evil, but as what Arendt observed as a subjectively evident fact of Eichmann’s personality (LM, 3–4). Thus, “the banality of evil” was meant to describe not the nature of the deeds, but the character and the motives of the doer Eichmann (Bernstein 2000; Benhabib 2000).

According to her own statements, Arendt proposed herself to report on the trial because she absolutely wanted to know how someone looked like who had done radical evil (cf. Heuer 1987, 58) However, what she perceived during the trial was not a monster or a demon, but a person endowed with “a curious, quite authentic inability to think.” (TMC, 417) According to her, his evil deeds “could not be traced to any particularity of wickedness, pathology or ideological conviction in the doer, whose only personal distinction was a perhaps extraordinary shallowness” (TMC, 417). Struck by Eichmann’s inability to assess a situation himself or to express himself without falling back on his repertoire of stock phrases and clichés, Arendt attributed his monstrous deeds not to a fanatical hatred of Jews (EJ, 146), but to his devotion to Hitler (EJ, 149) and his “thoughtlessness” (LM, 4), by which she understood his “inability ever to look at anything from the other’s point of view” (EJ, 48).

Following this experience, Arendt’s conviction about the nature of evil changed: In a letter to Gershom Scholem from 1964, she explained: “It is indeed my opinion now that evil is never ‘radical’, that it is only extreme, and that it possesses neither depth nor any demonic dimension. It can overgrow and lay waste the whole world precisely because it spreads like a fungus on the surface. … Only the good has depth that can be radical.” (JP, 251)

6.2 The Moral Significance of Thinking and Judgment

In reaction to the controversy, Arendt tried to explain the phenomenon she had perceived. In the works to follow, she asked whether “the activity of thinking as such, the habit of examining whatever happens to come to pass or to attract attention, regardless of results and specific content, [could] be among the conditions that make men abstain from evil-doing or even actually ‘condition’ them against it?” (LM, vol. I, 5)

Arendt attempted a reply by connecting the activity of thinking to that of judging in a twofold manner. First, thinking — the silent dialogue of me and myself — dissolves our fixed habits of thought and the accepted rules of conduct, and thus prepares the way for the activity of judging particulars without the aid of pre-established universals. It is not that thinking provides judgment with new rules for subsuming the particular under the universal. Rather, it loosens the grip of the universal over the particular, thereby releasing judgment from ossified categories of thought and conventional standards of assessment. It is in times of historical crisis that thinking ceases to be a marginal affair, because by undermining all established criteria and values, it prepares the individual to judge for him or herself instead of being carried away by the actions and opinions of the majority.

The second way in which Arendt connected the activity of thinking with that of judging is by showing that thinking, by actualizing the dialogue of me and myself, which is given in consciousness, produces conscience as a by-product.

6.3 Self-Consciousness, Social Pressure and Autonomy

The impact of the Eichmann trial had forced Arendt to ask whether we are entitled to presuppose “an independent human faculty, unsupported by law and public opinion, that judges anew in full spontaneity every deed and intent whenever the occasion arises” (PRD, 187). In various essays from the 1960s and 70ies, Arendt explored the role of the mental faculties for the conflict between moral autonomy and social pressure. In “Personal Responsibility under Dictatorship” she discusses the problem of voluntary conformity during the Nazi era and asks what characterized the few people who refused to collaborate (RJ, 43). She finds the answer in the ability to judge for oneself, which is rooted in an explicit self-relationship: “[T]he nonparticipants […] were the only ones who dared judge by themselves, and they were capable of doing so, not because the old standards of right and wrong were firmly planted in their mind and conscience, but because they asked themselves to what extent they would still be able to live in peace with themselves after having committed certain deeds” (RJ, 44). The prerequisites for moral autonomy are therefore not education or firm moral convictions, but the certainty that, as a self-aware being, one cannot avoid oneself: “If I disagree with other people I can walk away; but I cannot walk away from myself, and therefore I better first try to be in agreement with myself before I take all others into consideration” (RJ, 90).

According to Arendt, having such an awareness of one’s own self-relationship is the result of thinking, i.e. of the silent dialog that one conducts with oneself (JR, 44f). Therefore, morality is not a question of our relationship to others, but a question of our relationship to ourselves. (RJ, 67) Following Kant, Arendt understands this explicit self-relation as an awareness of one’s own autonomy, i.e. as the realization that one is not a small cog in a big machine, but that everyone is a responsible legislator: “If I am the legislator, sin and crime can no longer be defined as disobedience to somebody else’s law, but on the contrary as a refusal to act my part as legislator of the world” (RJ, 69). The reference to Kant’s Categorical Imperative shows that selfhood in Arendt’s moral philosophy can no more be thought of in isolation than in her political theory (cf. EU, 441). The morally responsible self does not have to make authentic, but universalizable, representative decisions.

Arendt called this capacity to think representatively an “enlarged mentality,” adopting the same terms that Kant employed in his Third Critique to characterize aesthetic judgment. The “enlarged mentality” judges both independently of all others and includes the perspective of all others in its judgment. Although thinking is a lonely activity in Arendt’s eyes, the inner dialog can stay in contact with the world as long as the world is represented in the dialog of the self (OT, 476.). Only those who actualize this difference in their identity allow conscience to emerge as a by-product of consciousness (RJ, 189). When Arendt describes the public sphere as a condition of judgment (DT, 570), she does not necessarily mean the actual presence of other people, but this inner plurality. Listening to such an inner representation of other people can help to withstand the pressure of public opinion.

6.4 Judgment and Politics: Two Models

The foregoing account has underlined the moral significance of thinking and judgment. For Arendt, however, the capacity to judge is no less a political ability insofar as it enables individuals to orient themselves in the public realm and to judge the phenomena that are disclosed within it from a standpoint that is relatively detached and impartial.

Together with the theory of action, her unfinished theory of judgment represents her central legacy to twentieth century political thought. We now explore some of the key aspects of her theory of judgment, and will examine its place in the architectonic of Arendt’s theory of politics. Arendt’s theory of judgment was never developed as systematically or extensively as her theory of action. She intended to complete her study of the life of the mind by devoting the third volume to the faculty of judgment, but was not able to do so because of her untimely death in 1975. What she left was a number of reflections scattered in The Life of the Mind, a series of lectures on Kant’s political philosophy (LKPP), the essay “Thinking and Moral Considerations” (TMC, 417–46), and two articles included in Between Past and Future where judgment and opinion are treated in relation to culture and taste (“The Crisis in Culture” – BPF, 197–226) and with respect to the question of truth (“Truth and Politics” – BPF, 227–64). However, these writings do not present a unified theory of judgment but rather two distinct models, one based on the standpoint of the actor, the other on the standpoint of the spectator, which are somewhat at odds with each other.

Arendt’s writings on the theme of judgment can be seen to fall into two more or less distinct phases, an early one in which judgment is the faculty of political actors acting in the public realm, and a later one in which it is the privilege of non-participating spectators, primarily poets and historians, who seek to understand the meaning of the past and to reconcile us to what has happened. In this later formulation Arendt is no longer concerned with judging as a feature of political life as such, as the faculty which is exercised by actors in order to decide how to act in the public realm, but with judgment as a component in the life of the mind, the faculty through which the privileged spectators can recover meaning from the past and thereby reconcile themselves to time and, retrospectively, to tragedy.

As to the first account: In the essays “The Crisis in Culture” and “Truth and Politics”, Arendt treated judgment as a faculty that enables political actors to decide what courses of action to undertake in the public realm, what kind of objectives are most appropriate or worth pursuing, as well as who to praise or blame for past actions or for the consequences of past decisions. In this model judgment is viewed as a specifically political ability, namely, as “the ability to see things not only from one’s own point of view but from the perspective of all those who happen to be present,” and as being “one of the fundamental abilities of man as a political being insofar as it enables him to orient himself in the public realm, in the common world” (BPF, 221). In contrast to speculative thought, judging has its roots in common sense. Therefore, judging “is one, if not the most, important activity in which this sharing-the-world-with-others comes to pass” (BPF, 221). Moreover, Arendt stressed the non-coercive character of judgment, the fact that it can only appeal to but never force the agreement of others, she claims that “this ‘wooing’ or persuading corresponds closely to what the Greeks called peithein, the convincing and persuading speech which they regarded as the typically political form of people talking with one another” (BPF, 222).

For the second account, Arendt, based her theory of political judgment on Kant’s aesthetics in his Critique of Judgment, which she claimed contained Kant’s unwritten political philosophy, (cf. BPF, 219–20). For Arendt it is the spectators who have the privilege of judging impartially and disinterestedly, and in doing so they exercise two crucial faculties, imagination and sensus communis. Through the imagination one can represent objects that are no longer present and thus establish the distance necessary for an impartial judgment. Once this distancing has occurred, one is in a position to reflect upon these representations from a number of different perspectives, and thereby to reach a judgment about the proper value of an object. Kant believed that for our judgments to be valid we must transcend our private or subjective conditions in favor of public and intersubjective ones, and we are able to do this by appealing to our community sense, our sensus communis. The criterion for judgment, then, is communicability, and the standard for deciding whether our judgments are indeed communicable is to see whether they could fit with the sensus communis of others. Arendt points out that the emphasis on the communicability of judgments of taste, and the correlative notion of an enlarged mentality, link up effortlessly with Kant’s idea of a united mankind living in eternal peace. She argues that “It is by virtue of this idea of mankind, present in every single man, that men are human, and they can be called civilized or humane to the extent that this idea becomes the principle not only of their judgments but of their actions. It is at this point that actor and spectator become united; the maxim of the actor and the maxim, the ‘standard,’ according to which the spectator judges the spectacle of the world, become one” (LKPP, 75).

6.5 Opinion and Truth in Politics

Against Plato and Hobbes, who denigrated the role of opinion in political matters, Arendt reasserts the value and importance of political discourse, of deliberation and persuasion, and thus of a politics that acknowledges difference and the plurality of opinions. This, however, raises the question as to which opinions are justified or which judgments can claim validity.

For Arendt, the validity of political judgment depends on our ability to think “representatively,” that is, from the standpoint of everyone else, so that we are able to look at the world from a number of different perspectives: “The more people’s standpoints I have present in my mind while I am pondering a given issue, and the better I can imagine how I would feel and think if I were in their place, the stronger will be my capacity for representative thinking and the more valid my final conclusions, my opinion.” (BPF, 241) This ability can only be acquired and tested in a public forum where individuals have the opportunity to exchange their opinions on particular matters and see whether they accord with the opinions of others. In this respect the process of opinion formation is never a solitary activity; rather, it requires a genuine encounter with different opinions so that a particular issue may be examined from every possible standpoint until, as she puts it, “it is flooded and made transparent by the full light of human comprehension” (BPF, 242). Debate and discussion, and the capacity to enlarge one’s perspective, are indeed crucial to the formation of opinions that can claim more than subjective validity; individuals may hold personal opinions on many subject matters, but they can form representative opinions only by enlarging their standpoint to incorporate those of others. In this respect one is never alone while forming an opinion; as Arendt notes, “even if I shun all company or am completely isolated while forming an opinion, I am not simply together only with myself in the solitude of philosophical thought; I remain in this world of universal interdependence, where I can make myself the representative of everybody else” (BPF, 242).

The representative character of judgment and opinion has important implications for the question of validity. Arendt always stressed that the formation of valid opinions requires a public space where individuals can test and purify their views through a process of mutual debate and enlightenment. She was, however, quite opposed to the idea that opinions should be measured by the standard of truth, or that debate should be conducted according to strict scientific standards of validity. In her view, truth belongs to the realm of cognition, the realm of logic, mathematics and the strict sciences, and carries always an element of coercion, since it precludes debate and must be accepted by every individual in possession of her rational faculties. Set against the plurality of opinions, truth has a despotic character: it compels universal assent, leaves the mind little freedom of movement, eliminates the diversity of views and reduces the richness of human discourse. In this respect, truth is anti-political, since by eliminating debate and diversity it eliminates the very principles of political life. As Arendt writes, “The trouble is that factual truth, like all other truth, peremptorily claims to be acknowledged and precludes debate, and debate constitutes the very essence of political life. The modes of thought and communication that deal with truth, if seen from the political perspective, are necessarily domineering; they don’t take into account other people’s opinions, and taking these into account is the hallmark of all strictly political thinking” (BPF, 241).

Arendt’s defense of opinion is motivated not just by her belief that truth leaves no room for debate or dissent, or for the acknowledgment of difference, but also by her conviction that our reasoning faculties can only flourish in a dialogic context. She cites Kant’s remark that “the external power that deprives man of the freedom to communicate his thoughts publicly deprives him at the same time of his freedom to think,” and underlines the fact that for Kant the only guarantee of the correctness of our thinking is that “we think, as it were, in community with others to whom we communicate our thoughts as they communicate theirs to us” (BPF, 234–5).

For Arendt opinion is not a defective form of knowledge that should be transcended or left behind as soon as one is in possession of the truth. Rather, it is a distinct form of knowledge which arises out of the collective deliberation of citizens, and which requires the use of the imagination and the capacity to think “representatively.” By deliberating in common and engaging in “representative thinking” citizens are in fact able to form opinions that can claim intersubjective validity. It is important to stress that Arendt does not want to dismiss the philosophers’ attempt to find universal or absolute standards of knowledge and cognition, but to check their desire to impose those standards upon the sphere of human affairs, since they would eliminate its plurality and essential relativity. The imposition of a single or absolute standard into the domain of praxis would do away with the need to persuade others of the relative merits of an opinion, to elicit their consent to a specific proposal, or to obtain their agreement with respect to a particular policy.

Now, we must be careful not to impute to Arendt the view that truth has no legitimate role to play in politics or in the sphere of human affairs. She does indeed assert that “All truths — not only the various kinds of rational truth but also factual truth — are opposed to opinion in their mode of asserting validity” (BPF, 239), since they all carry an element of compulsion. However, she is only preoccupied with the negative consequences of rational truth when applied to the sphere of politics and collective deliberation, while she defends the importance of factual truth for the preservation of an accurate account of the past and for the very existence of political communities. Factual truth, she writes, “is always related to other people: it concerns events and circumstances in which many are involved; it is established by witnesses and depends upon testimony … It is political by nature.” It follows, therefore, that “facts and opinions, though they must be kept apart, are not antagonistic to each other; they belong to the same realm. Facts inform opinions, and opinions, inspired by different interests and passions, can differ widely and still be legitimate as long as they respect factual truth. Freedom of opinion is a farce unless factual information is guaranteed and the facts themselves are not in dispute. In other words, factual truth informs political thought just as rational truth informs philosophical speculation” (BPF, 238).

The relationship between facts and opinions is thus one of mutual entailment: if opinions were not based on correct information and the free access to all relevant facts they could scarcely claim any validity. And if they were to be based on fantasy, self-deception, or deliberate falsehood, then no possibility of genuine debate and argumentation could be sustained. Both factual truth and the general habit of truth-telling are therefore basic to the formation of sound opinions and to the flourishing of political debate. Moreover, if the record of the past were to be destroyed by organized lying, or be distorted by an attempt to rewrite history, political life would be deprived of one of its essential and stabilizing elements. In sum, both factual truth and the practice of truth-telling are essential to political life. The antagonism for Arendt is between rational truth and well-grounded opinion, since the former does not allow for debate and dissent, while the latter thrives on it. Arendt’s defense of opinion must therefore be understood as a defense of political deliberation, and of the role that persuasion and dissuasion play in all matters affecting the political community.


Works by Arendt

[LA] Der Liebesbegriff bei Augustin. Berlin: Julius Springer Verlag, 1929. Translation as Love and Saint Augustine, with an interpretive essay by Joanna V. Scott and Judith C. Stark. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1996.
[RV] Rahel Varnhagen: The Life of a Jewish Woman. Revised edition translated into English by Richard and Clara Winston. New York: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich, 1974. Critical edition edited by Liliane Weissberg. Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1997.
[OT] The Origins of Totalitarianism. New York: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich, 1951. Third edition with new prefaces, 1973.
[HC] The Human Condition. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1958.
[EJ] Eichmann in Jerusalem: A Report on the Banality of Evil. New York: Viking Press, 1963. Revised and enlarged edition, 1965.
[OR] On Revolution. New York: Viking Press, 1963. Revised second edition, 1965.
[BPF] Between Past and Future. New York: Viking Press, 1961. Revised edition, 1968.
[MDT] Men in Dark Times. New York: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich, 1968.
[OV] On Violence. New York: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich, 1970.
[CR] Crises of the Republic. New York: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich, 1972.
[JP] The Jew as Pariah. Edited and with an introduction by Ron H. Feldman. New York: Grove Press, 1978.
[JW] The Jewish Writings. Edited by Jerome Kohn and Ron H. Feldman. New York: Schocken Books, 2007.
[LM] The Life of the Mind. New York: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich, 1978.
[LKPP] Lectures on Kant’s Political Philosophy. Edited and with an interpretive essay by Ronald Beiner. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1982.
[EU] Essays in Understanding: 1930–1954. Edited and with an introduction by Jerome Kohn. New York: Harcourt Brace & Company, 1994.
[RJ] Responsibility and Judgment. Edited and with an introduction by Jerome Kohn. New York: Schocken Books, 2003.
[PP] The Promise of Politics. Edited and with an introduction by Jerome Kohn. New York: Schocken Books, 2005.
[RPW] Hannah Arendt: The Recovery of the Public World. Edited by Melvyn A. Hill. New York: St. Martin’s Press, 1979.
[DT] Denktagebuch 1950–1973. Edited by Ursula Ludz and Ingeborg Nordmann. Munich and Zurich: Pieper 2002.
[UP] “Understanding and Politics.” Partisan Review, vol. 20, no. 4 (July–August 1953): 377–92. Reprinted in Essays in Understanding: 1930–1954.
[PRD] “Personal Responsibility under Dictatorship.” The Listener, (6 August 1964): 185–205. Reprinted in Responsibility and Judgment.
[TMC] “Thinking and Moral Considerations: A Lecture.” Social Research, 38(3) (Autumn 1971): 417–46. Reprinted in Social Research, 51(1) (Spring 1984): 7–37, and in Responsibility and Judgment.
[PRPI] “Public Rights and Private Interests.” In M. Mooney and F. Stuber, eds., Small Comforts for Hard Times: Humanists on Public Policy. New York: Columbia University Press, 1977.

Secondary Literature

  • Aschheim, S. (ed.), 2001, Hannah Arendt in Jerusalem, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Baehr, P., 2010, Hannah Arendt, Totalitarianism, and the Social Sciences, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
  • Baluch, F., 2014, “Arendt’s Machiavellian Moment”, European Journal of Political Theory, 13 (2): 154–177.
  • Barnouw, D., 1990, Visible Spaces: Hannah Arendt and the German-Jewish Experience, Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • Benhabib, S., 1996, The Reluctant Modernism of Hannah Arendt, London: Sage Publications.
  • –––, 2000, “Arendt’s Eichmann in Jerusalem”, D. Villa (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Hannah Arendt (Cambridge Companions to Philosophy), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2003, The Reluctant Modernism of Hannah Arendt. New Edition with a New Preface and an Appendix, New York: Rowman and Littlefield Publishers.
  • ––– (ed.), 2010, Politics in Dark Times: Encounters with Hannah Arendt, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Berkowitz, R., Keenan, T. and Katz, J. (eds.), 2009, Thinking in Dark Times: Hannah Arendt on Ethics and Politics, New York: Fordham University Press.
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  • Bernstein, R., 1986, Philosophical Profiles, Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • –––, 1996, Hannah Arendt and the Jewish Question, Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • –––, 2000, “Arendt on thinking”, D. Villa (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Hannah Arendt, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2018, Why Read Hannah Arendt Now?, Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • Birmingham, P., 2006, Hannah Arendt and Human Rights: The Predicament of Common Responsibility, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Bowen-Moore, P., 1989, Hannah Arendt’s Philosophy of Natality, London: Macmillan.
  • Bradshaw, L., 1989, Acting and Thinking: The Political Thought of Hannah Arendt, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
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  • –––, 1992, Hannah Arendt: A Reinterpretation of Her Political Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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  • Ettinger, E., 1995, Hannah Arendt/Martin Heidegger, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
  • Gottsegen, M., 1993, The Political Thought of Hannah Arendt, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Hansen, P., 1993, Hannah Arendt: Politics, History and Citizenship, Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • Hill, M. (ed.), 1979, Hannah Arendt: The Recovery of the Public World, New York: St. Martin’s Press.
  • Hinchman, L. and Hinchman, S. (eds.), 1994, Hannah Arendt: Critical Essays, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Honig, B. (ed.), 1995, Feminist Interpretations of Hannah Arendt, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Isaac, J., 1992, Arendt, Camus, and Modern Rebellion, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
  • Kaplan, G. and Kessler, C. (eds.), 1989, Hannah Arendt: Thinking, Judging, Freedom, Sydney: Allen & Unwin.
  • Kateb. G., 1984, Hannah Arendt: Politics, Conscience, Evil, Oxford: Martin Robertson.
  • Kielmansegg, P., Mewes, H. and Glaser-Schmidt, E. (eds.), 1995, Hannah Arendt and Leo Strauss: German Emigrés and American Political Thought after World War II, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kohn, J. and May, L. (eds.), 1996, Hannah Arendt: Twenty Years Later, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Kristeva, J., 2001, Hannah Arendt, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Lederman, S., 2016, “Philosophy, Politics and Participatory Democracy in Hannah Arendt’s Political Thought”, History of Political Thought, 37 (3): 480–508.
  • May, D., 1986, Hannah Arendt, Harmondsworth: Penguin Books.
  • McGowan, J., 1998, Hannah Arendt: An Introduction, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Nedelsky, J., and Beiner, R. (eds.), 2001, Judgment, Imagination, and Politics: Themes from Kant and Arendt, New York: Rowman and Littlefield Publishers.
  • Parekh, B., 1981, Hannah Arendt and the Search for a New Political Philosophy, London: Macmillan.
  • Passerin d’Entrèves, M., 1994, The Political Philosophy of Hannah Arendt, New York and London: Routledge.
  • Pitkin, H., 1998, The Attack of the Blob: Hannah Arendt’s Concept of the Social, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Ring, J., 1997, The Political Consequences of Thinking, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Stangneth, B., 2014, Eichmann Before Jerusalem: The Unexamined Life of a Mass Murderer, New York: Knopf Doubleday Publishing Group.
  • Taminiaux, J., 1997, The Thracian Maid and the Professional Thinker: Arendt and Heidegger, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Tömmel, T. N., 2013, Wille und Passion. Der Liebesbegriff bei Heidegger und Arendt, Berlin: Suhrkamp.
  • Villa, D., 1996, Arendt and Heidegger: The Fate of the Political, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 1999, Politics, Philosophy, Terror: Essays on the Thought of Hannah Arendt, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • ––– (ed.), 2000, The Cambridge Companion to Hannah Arendt, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Watson, D., 1992, Hannah Arendt, London: Fontana Press.
  • Whitfield, S., 1980, Into the Dark: Hannah Arendt and Totalitarianism, Philadelphia: Temple University Press.
  • Wolin, S., 1977, “Hannah Arendt and the Ordinance of Time,” Social Research, 44(1): 91–105.
  • Young-Bruehl, E., 1982, Hannah Arendt: For Love of the World, New Haven: Yale University Press. Second edition, 2004.
  • –––, 2006, Why Arendt Matters, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.

Other Internet Resources

  • Hannah Arendt”, entry by Majid Yar, in The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy
  • Hannah Arendt”, entry in the Wikipedia.

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Tatjana Tömmel <tatjana.noemi@gmx.de>
Maurizio Passerin d’Entreves

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