Aristotle’s Categories is a singularly important work of philosophy. It not only presents the backbone of Aristotle’s own philosophical theorizing but has exerted an unparalleled influence on the systems of many of the greatest philosophers in the western tradition. The set of doctrines in the Categories, which I will henceforth call categorialism, provides the framework of inquiry for a wide variety of Aristotle’s philosophical investigations, ranging from his discussions of time and change in the Physics to the science of being qua being in the Metaphysics, and even extending to his rejection of Platonic ethics in the Nicomachean Ethics. Looking beyond his own works, Aristotle’s categorialism has engaged the attention of such diverse philosophers as Plotinus, Porphyry, Aquinas, Descartes, Spinoza, Leibniz, Locke, Berkeley, Hume, Kant, Hegel, Brentano, and Heidegger (to mention just a few), who have variously embraced, defended, modified or rejected its central contentions. All, in their different ways, have thought it necessary to come to terms with features of Aristotle’s categorial scheme.
Plainly, the enterprise of categorialism inaugurated by Aristotle runs deep in the philosophical psyche. Even so, despite its wide-reaching influence — and, indeed owing to that influence — any attempt to describe categorialism faces a significant difficulty: experts disagree on many of its most important and fundamental aspects. Each of the following questions has received markedly different answers from highly respected scholars and philosophers. What do the categories classify? What theory of predication underlies Aristotle’s scheme? What is the relationship between categorialism and hylemorphism, Aristotle’s other major ontological theory? Where does matter fit, if at all, in the categorial scheme? When did Aristotle write the Categories? Did Aristotle write the Categories? Is the list of kinds in the Categories Aristotle’s considered list, or does he modify his views elsewhere? Is Aristotle’s view of substance in the Categories consistent with his view of substance in the Metaphysics? Is there some method that Aristotle used in order to generate his list of categories? Is Aristotle’s categorialism philosophically defensible in whole or in part? If only in part, which part of categorialism is philosophically defensible?
Given the divergence of expert opinion about even the most basic aspects of Aristotle’s Categories, it is inevitable that an attempt to give a neutral account of the basic positions it contains will be seen as wrong-headed, perhaps drastically so, by some scholars or other. One could attempt to address this problem by commenting on every scholarly debate and opinion, but such a project would fail to bring to life the most striking features of Aristotelian categorialism. In what follows, therefore, I shall take a different route. I first present a natural, though perhaps overly simplified, interpretation of the main structures in Aristotle’s categorial scheme, while pausing en route to note some especially controversial points. I then go on to discuss one important scholarly and philosophical debate about the categories, namely the question of whether there is some systematic procedure by which Aristotle generated his famous list. The debate is of interest in large part because it concerns one of the most fundamental metaphysical topics: what is the correct system of categories? I am not ultimately concerned to present the correct interpretation of Aristotle’s Categories. Rather, I only hope to provide a useful introduction to the content of this endlessly fascinating work.
- 1. The Four-Fold Division
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- 3. Whence the Categories?
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The Categories divides naturally into three distinct parts — what have come to be known as the Pre-Predicamenta (chs.1–4), the Predicamenta (chs. 5–9), and the Post-Predicamenta (chs. 10-15). (These section titles reflect the traditional Latin title of the entire work, the Predicamenta.) In the Pre-Predicamenta, Aristotle discusses a number of semantic relations (1a1–16), gives a division of beings (τἃ ὄντα), into four kinds (1a20–1b9), and then presents his canonical list of ten categories (1b25–2a4). In the Predicamenta, Aristotle discusses in detail the categories of substance (2a12–4b19), quantity (4b20–6a36), relatives (6a37–8b24), and quality (8b25–11a39), and provides a cursory treatment of the other categories (11b1–14). And finally, in the Post-Predicamenta, he discusses a number of concepts relating to modes of opposition (11b15–14A25), priority and simultaneity (14a26–15a13), motion (15a14–15b17), and ends with a brief discussion of having (15b18–31). There is considerable debate about whether Aristotle thought all three parts belong to a single work, and if he did, why he thought they are all needed for the work to be a unified whole. There is nonetheless widespread agreement that at the very heart of the Categories are two systems of classification, one given in the Pre-Predicamenta, and the other in the Predicamenta.
Aristotle’s first system of classification is of beings, (τὰ ὄντα) (1a20). The division proceeds by way of two concepts: (1) said-of and (2) present-in. Any being, according to Aristotle, is either said-of another or is not said-of another. Likewise, any being is either present-in another or is not present-in another. Because these are technical notions, one would expect Aristotle to have defined them. Unfortunately, he does not define the said-of relation; and his definition of the present-in relation is either circular or rests on an undefined concept of being in. He says: ‘By “present in a subject” I mean what is in something, not as a part, and cannot exist separately from what it is in’ (1a24–5). Notice that the word ‘in’ occurs in this definition of present-in. So, either ‘in’ means the same as ‘present-in’, in which case the definition is circular; or ‘in’ is itself in need of a definition, which Aristotle does not give. Hence, Aristotle’s first system of classification rests on technical concepts whose precise characterization is not settled by anything Aristotle says.
Despite the lack of helpful definitions of these two concepts, there is a fairly straightforward, though certainly not uncontroversial, characterization of them that many scholars have adopted. By focusing on Aristotle’s illustrations, most scholars conclude that beings that are said-of others are universals, while those that are not said-of others are particulars. Beings that are present-in others are accidental, while those that are not present-in others are non-accidental. Now, non-accidental beings that are universals are most naturally described as essential, while non-accidental beings that are particulars are best described simply as non-accidental. If we put these possibilities together, we arrive at the following four-fold system of classification: (1) accidental universals; (2) essential universals; (3) accidental particulars; (4) non-accidental particulars, or what Aristotle calls primary substances. This system maps readily onto Aristotle’s own terminology, given at 1a20: (1) Said-of and present-in: accidental universals; (2) Said-of and not present-in: essential universals; (3) Not said-of and present-in: accidental particulars; and (4) Not said-of and not present-in: primary substances. A brief discussion of each of these classes should suffice to bring out their general character.
The pride of place in this classificatory scheme, according to Aristotle, goes to those entities that are neither said-of nor present-in anything. Such entities, Aristotle says, are primary substances (2a11). Although he only gives a negative characterization of primary substances in the Categories — they are neither said-of nor present-in — the examples of them that he provides allow us to form a more robust conception of what a primary substance is supposed to be. His favorite examples are an individual man and a horse (1a20, 2a11). So, it is natural to interpret him as thinking that among primary substances are concrete particulars that are members of natural kinds. Whether in the Categories Aristotle intended to restrict the class of primary substances to just members of natural kinds turns out to be among the more controversial topics in Aristotle scholarship. But at the very least, he seems to think that members of natural kinds present enough of a paradigmatic case that he can use them as examples.
Now, given the above interpretation of the said-of and present-in relation, a primary substance is a particular that is non-accidental. It must be admitted that it is difficult to say exactly what it means to say that a particular is non-accidental. In highlighting the fact that primary substances are not the sorts of beings that can be accidents, Aristotle seems to be indicating both that they are not predicated of anything accidentally and that they are not entities that are manifestly temporary, accidentally characterized, or artificially unified, such as Socrates-seated-in-a-chair. Similarly, by treating them as not said-of anything, Aristotle draws attention to the fact that primary substances are not predicated of anything either. Rather, they are themselves essential unities, and indeed not predicable at all. Beyond these few remarks, however, it is difficult to say exactly, given only what is made explicit in the Pre-predicamenta what a primary substance is. But this, one might argue, is appropriate for a metaphysically fundamental entity — we can say of it what it is not, but because it is so basic, we lack the vocabulary to say in an informative way what it is. And indeed, Aristotle thinks that primary substances are fundamental in this way since he thinks that all other entities bear some type of asymmetric dependence relation to primary substances (2a34–2b6).
If we continue to understand the said-of and present-in distinctions as I have characterized them, we will also find that Aristotle thinks that in addition to particulars in the category of substance there are accidental, or what we can now call non-substantial, particulars. Aristotle’s example of such an entity is an individual piece of grammatical knowledge (1a25). Perhaps a more intuitive example is the particular whiteness that some object has. If there are non-substantial particulars, then Socrates’ whiteness is a numerically distinct particular from Plato’s whiteness. Contemporary metaphysicians might call such entities tropes, and such a label is acceptable as long as one is careful not to expect Aristotle’s theory to resemble too much contemporary trope theories. In the first instance, if Aristotle does accept the existence of non-substantial particulars, he certainly does not think that they can exist apart from primary substances — indeed, it is most natural to interpret Aristotle on this point as thinking that a non-substantial particular is a dependent entity, individuated only by reference to the primary substance that it is present in. Hence, Socrates’ whiteness cannot exist without Socrates. Moreover, thinking of such entities as standing in a primitive relation of resemblance to one another is quite foreign to Aristotle’s way of thinking. Nonetheless, if the present interpretation is correct, Aristotle did accept what are appropriately called particularized properties.
Returning, then, to those beings that are not-present in other beings, Aristotle thinks that in addition to primary substances, which are particulars, there are secondary substances, which are universals (2a11-a18). His example of such an entity is man (1a21), which, according to the present interpretation, is a universal in the category of substance. If we again accept the distinctions in question as I have drawn them, we should interpret secondary substances as essential characteristics of primary substances. Moreover, because primary substances seem to be members of natural kinds, it is natural to interpret secondary substances as the kinds to which primary substances belong. If that is so, then Aristotle thinks that not only are primary substances members of natural kinds but that they are essentially characterized by the kinds to which they belong.
Finally, a being is both said-of and present-in a primary substance if it is an accidental universal. Aristotle’s example of such an entity is knowledge; but again, whiteness provides a somewhat more intuitive example. The universal whiteness is said-of many primary substances but is only accidental to them.
The way in which I have characterized the concepts of said-of and present-in is, as I have said, natural and relatively straightforward. Moreover, it was by far the orthodox interpretation amongst Aristotle’s Medieval interpreters. I would be remiss, however, were I not to mention the recent debate started by G.E.L. Owen about the said-of/present-in distinction (Owen, 1965a). According to Owen, Aristotle did not accept the existence of non-substantial particulars. Instead, Owen argues, a being that is not said-of but present-in primary substances is an accidental universal of the lowest possible generality. Hence, Owen denies that the said-of/not-said-of distinction is one between universals and particulars. I shall not discuss Owen’s interpretation but shall simply note that it has spawned a huge deal of scholarly attention. The interested reader can find a discussion of these issues here:
After providing his first system of classification, Aristotle turns to the predicamenta and presents a second, which ends up occupying him for much of the remainder of the Categories. Aristotle divides what he calls ta legomena (τἃ λεγόμενα), i.e. things that are said, into ten distinct kinds (1b25). Things that are said according to Aristotle, are words (De Int 16a3), and so it is natural to interpret his second system as a classification of words. And because the English word ‘category’ comes from the Greek word for predicate, one might naturally think of the second system as a classification of distinct types of linguistic predicates. There is, however, considerable debate about the subject matter of the second system of classification.
There are three reasons to think that Aristotle is not primarily interested in words but rather in the objects in the world to which words correspond. First, his locution ta legomena is in fact ambiguous, as between ‘things said’—where these might or might not be words—and ‘things spoken of’—where these are more naturally taken to be things referred to by means of words. Second, Aristotle’s examples of items belonging to the various categories are generally extra-linguistic. For instance, his examples of substances are an individual man and a horse. Third, Aristotle explicitly accepts a doctrine of meaning according to which words conventionally signify concepts, and concepts naturally signify objects in the world (De Int 16a3). So, even if he is in some sense classifying words, it is natural to view his classification as ultimately driven by concerns about objects in the world to which our words correspond.
Those scholars dissatisfied with the linguistic interpretation of Aristotle’s second system of classification have moved in one of several directions. Some have interpreted Aristotle as classifying concepts. The objections raised against the linguistic interpretation, however, can again be raised against the concept interpretation as well. Other scholars have interpreted Aristotle as classifying extra-linguistic and extra-conceptual reality. Finally, some scholars have synthesized the linguistic and extra-linguistic interpretations by interpreting Aristotle as classifying linguistic predicates in so far as they are related to the world in semantically significant ways. Although I think that this latter interpretation is probably the one that best withstands close textual scrutiny, the general character of the second system of classification is most easily seen by focusing on the extra-linguistic interpretation. So, in what follows, I shall simplify matters by talking as if Aristotle’s first classificatory system is really a classification of extra-linguistic items; and I shall note places at which such an interpretation faces difficulties.
What then is Aristotle’s second classificatory system? Quite simply, it is a list of the highest kinds, which are also known as categories. That there are highest kinds (or perhaps that there is one single highest kind) can be motivated by noticing the fact that the ordinary objects of our experience fall into classes of increasing generality. Consider, for instance, a maple tree. It is in the first instance a maple and so belongs in a class with all and only other maples. It is also, however, a tree and so belongs in a broader class, namely the class of trees, whose extension is wider than the class of maples. Continuing on, it is also a living thing and so belongs in a class whose extension is wider still than the class of trees. And so on. Now, once this basic pattern is before us, we can ask the following question: does this increase in generality go on ad infinitum or does it end at a class that is the most general possible? Does it end, in other words, at a highest kind?
It might seem that the answer to this question is obvious: of course there is a highest kind — being. After all, someone might argue, everything exists. So the class that contains all and only beings must be the class with the greatest possible extension. In the Metaphysics, however, Aristotle argues that being is not a genus (998b23, 1059b31). According to Aristotle, every genus must be differentiated by some differentia that falls outside that genus. Hence, if being were a genus, it would have to be differentiated by a differentia that fell outside of it. In other words, being would have to be differentiated by some non-being, which, according to Aristotle, is a metaphysical absurdity. Although he does not explicitly make this claim, Aristotle’s argument, if cogent, would generalize to any proposal for a single highest kind. Hence, he does not think that there is one single highest kind. Instead, he thinks that there are ten: (1) substance; (2) quantity; (3) quality; (4) relatives; (5) somewhere; (6) sometime; (7) being in a position; (8) having; (9) acting; and (10) being acted upon (1b25–2a4). I shall discuss the first four of these kinds in detail in a moment. But doing so will take us into matters that, while interesting, nonetheless distract from the general nature of the scheme. So I will first discuss some of the general structures inherent in Aristotle’s second system of classification, and then proceed to a more detailed discussion.
In addition to positing ten highest kinds, Aristotle also has views about the structure of such kinds. Each kind is differentiated into species by some set of differentiae. In fact, the essence of any species, according to Aristotle, consists in its genus and the differentia that together with that genus defines the species. (It is for this reason that the highest kinds are, strictly speaking, indefinable — because there is no genus above a highest kind, one cannot define it in terms of its genus and a differentia.) Some of the species in various categories are also genera — they are, in other words, differentiated into further species. But at some point, there is a lowest species that is not further differentiated. Under these species, we can suppose, fall the particulars that belong to that species.
Now, if we accept the characterization of said-of and present-in that I have given, we can see that Aristotle’s two classificatory systems can, so to speak, be laid on top of each other. The resulting structure would look something like the following.
Substance Quantity Relatives Quality … Said-of
Some features of this system are worth pointing out. First, as I have already noted, Aristotle gives pride of place in this scheme to primary substances. He says that were primary substances not to exist then no other entity would exist (2b6). As a result, Aristotle’s categorialism is firmly anti-Platonic. Whereas Plato treated the abstract as more real than material particulars, in the Categories Aristotle takes material particulars as ontological bedrock — to the extent that being a primary substance makes something more real than anything else, entities such as Socrates and a horse are the most real entities in Aristotle’s worldview. Moreover, among secondary substances, those at a lower level of generality are what Aristotle calls ‘prior in substance’ than those at a higher level (2b7). So, for instance, human is prior in substance than body. Whether this is to be interpreted in terms of the greater reality of the kind human is an open question. Nonetheless, Aristotle’s equating an increase in generality with a decrease in substantiality is at least in spirit strongly anti-Platonic.
There is one other interesting general feature of this scheme that is worth pointing out before looking at its details. Aristotle’s rejection of the view that being is a genus and his subsequent acceptance of ten distinct highest kinds leads to a doctrine concerning being itself that is at the center of Aristotle’s Metaphysics. (It should be noted, however, that there is genuine disagreement over the extent to which Aristotle accepted the doctrine of being that appears in the Metaphysics when he wrote the Categories.) According to Aristotle, some words do not express a genus but instead are what he calls pros hen homonyms — that is, homonyms related to one thing (pros hen), variously called cases of ‘focal meaning’ or ‘focal connection’ or ‘core-dependent homonymy’ in the literature on this topic (1003a35 ff.). Such words are applicable to various items in the world in virtue of the fact that those items all bear some type of relation to some one thing or type of thing. An example of such a homonym, according to Aristotle, is ‘healthy’. A regimen, he says, is healthy because it is productive of health; urine is healthy because it is indicative of health; and Socrates is healthy because he has health. In this case, a regimen, urine, and Socrates are all called ‘healthy’ not because they stand under some one genus, namely healthy things, but instead because they all bear some relation to health. Similarly, according to Aristotle, things in the world are not beings because they stand under some genus, being, but rather because they all stand in a relation to the primary being, which in the Categories he says is substance. This explains in part why he says in the Metaphysics that in order to study being one must study substance (1004a32, 1028a10–1028b8).
It must be admitted, I think, that when stated in the abstract there is a certain beauty about the structure of Aristotle’s two classificatory schemes. Aristotle’s system, however, begins to look somewhat awkward when his list of highest kinds is scrutinized. Some of the categories are natural, but others seem much less so. As a result, philosophers have proposed changes to Aristotle’s list, arguing that various categories should be eliminated, and scholars have suggested that Aristotle’s categories are not merely the highest kinds but rather represent various complex relations between words and different aspects of the world. A brief discussion of the first four categories, which are the only ones that Aristotle discusses at length, should bring out both the interest of Aristotle’s list as well as some of its peculiarities.
The most fundamental category is substance. We have already seen that according to Aristotle substances divide into primary and secondary substances. Although Aristotle does not discuss the different kinds of secondary substances in the Categories, various remarks he makes throughout his corpus suggest that he would divide secondary substances into at least the following kinds (DA 412a17, 413a21, 414a35, Meta. 1069a30, NE 1098a4):
- Immobile Substances — Unmoved Mover(s)
- Mobile Substances — Body
- Eternal Mobile Substances — Heavens
- Destructible Mobile Substances — Sublunary bodies
- Unensouled Destructible Mobile Substances — Elements
- Ensouled Destructible Mobile Substances — Living things
- Incapable of Perception — Plants
- Capable of Perception — Animals
- Irrational — Non-Human Animals
- Rational — Humans
This genus/species hierarchy is far from complete — Aristotle’s biological treatises contain a remarkably rich taxonomy of animals that is neither captured nor indeed obviously commensurate with the division into irrational and rational animals— but it does nicely illustrate the general structure of Aristotle’s categories. The lowest species in this taxonomy give way to kinds of increasing generality until the highest kind, substance is reached. Moreover, there is something rather intuitive about the idea that members of natural kinds are a fundamental type of entity in the world and hence that there is a system of kinds of increasing generality to which each such entity belongs. Of course, someone might think that some kind stands above substance. But it is not clear what such a kind would be except being, or perhaps the even more general kind thing; and as I have already said, not only does Aristotle reject the idea that being is a genus, but it is difficult to see what the relevant sense of thing is, if this is not simply another word for substance.
The second category Aristotle discusses in the Categories is quantity, and in the chapter devoted to quantity Aristotle actually divides quantity into distinct species. In fact, he gives two divisions; but for the sake of illustrating the general nature of the category, discussing the first division he gives should suffice. According to Aristotle, quantity divides into continuous and discrete quantities; continuous quantity divides into line, surface, body, time, and place; and discrete quantity divides into number and speech (4b20–23). Hence, we have the following genus/species structure:
- Continuous Quantities
- Discrete Quantities
- Continuous Quantities
Like substance, quantity seems like a reasonable candidate for a highest kind — quantities exist; quantities are not substances; substances are not quantities, and it is not clear what kind would stand above quantity. So, Aristotle’s decision to make quantity a highest kind appears well motivated. Aristotle’s treatment of quantity, however, does raise some difficult questions.
Perhaps the most interesting question concerns the fact that some of the species in quantity appear to be quantified things rather than quantities themselves. Consider, for instance, body. In its most natural sense, ‘body’ signifies bodies, which are not quantities but rather things with quantities. The same is true of line, surface, place, and arguably speech. Of course, there are quantities naturally associated with some of these species. For instance, length, breadth, and depth are associated with line, body, and surface. But Aristotle does not list these as the species under quantity. So, in the first instance, we can ask: does Aristotle intend his division of Quantity to be a division of quantities or quantified things?
The difficulties involved in Aristotle’s list of species in the category of quantity can be made more precise by noting that in several places he seems to commit himself to the view that body is a species in the category of substance (Top. 130b2, DC 2681–3, DA 434b12, Meta. 1079a31, 1069b38). And as I have drawn the genus-species structure in the category of substance above, body is one of the two species immediately under substance. Yet body also appears as a species under the species Continuous Quantity. The difficulty arises because Aristotle is committed to the view that no species can occur in both the category of substance and in some other category. For, he thinks that a species in substance is said-of primary substances while species in the other categories are not said-of primary substances. Hence, any species in both substance and some accidental category would be said-of and not said-of primary substance. Aristotle’s list of species in the Category of Quantity is thus not merely puzzling but seems to commit Aristotle to a contradiction. So, a second question about Aristotle’s category of quantity naturally suggests itself: how can body be a species in both the category of quantity and the category of substance? (Studtman 2002)
A number of other questions about Quantity could be asked. For instance, Aristotle’s treatment of quantity in the Metaphysics includes species not present in his treatment in the Categories (Meta. 1020a7–34), which raises questions as to the extent to which the set of doctrines in the Categories coheres with the doctrines in his other physical and metaphysical works. Furthermore, questions about Aristotle’s views about the nature of some of the species in quantity arise. So, for instance, to what does Aristotle think the species number corresponds? He surely does not think that numbers exist apart from the material world. But then what exactly does Aristotle think a number is? All we get for an answer from the Categories is that number is a discrete quantity. But such an answer hardly provides much of an understanding as to what Aristotle has precisely in mind. Moreover, why does Aristotle include speech as a species in the category of quantity? Speech hardly seems like a natural candidate for this category. Perhaps, Aristotle has in mind the quantities of vowels and syllables of Greek words. But, if anything, speech would seem to be some kind of vocal sound, which arguably is a kind of affection. Each of these questions is interesting and worth pursuing. I shall not, however, offer any answers to them here. Rather, I hope only to have illustrated how deeply intriguing and yet difficult to pin down fully Aristotle’s Categories is.
After quantity, Aristotle discusses the category of relatives, which both interpretively and philosophically raises even more difficulties than his discussion of quantity. A contemporary philosopher might naturally think that this category contains what we would nowadays call ‘relations’. But this would be a mistake. The name for the category is ta pros ti (τὰ πρός τι), which literally means ‘things toward something’. In other words, Aristotle seems to be classifying not relations but rather things in the world in so far as they are toward something else. It would seem, however, that for Aristotle things are toward something else insofar as a relational predicate applies to them. Aristotle says: Things are called ‘relative’ if as such they are said to be of something else or to be somehow referred to something else. So, for instance, the greater, as such, is said to be of something else, for it is said to be greater than something (6a36).
Perhaps the most straightforward reading of Aristotle’s discussion is the following. He noticed that certain predicates in language are logically incomplete — they are not used in simple subject/predicate sentences of the form ‘a is F’ but rather require some type of completion. To say ‘three is greater’ is to say something that is incomplete — to complete it requires saying what three is greater than. Nonetheless, Aristotle accepted a doctrine according to which properties in the world always inhere in a single subject. In other words, although Aristotle countenanced relational predicates, and though he certainly thought that objects in the world are related to other objects, he did not accept relations as a genuine type of entity. So, Aristotle’s category of relatives is a kind of halfway house between the linguistic side of relations, namely relational predicates, and the ontological side, namely relations themselves.
For our purposes, we need not determine how to best interpret Aristotle’s theory of relatives, but can rather consider some issues that Aristotle’s discussion raises. First, anyone who is comfortable with relational properties will no doubt find Aristotle’s discussion somewhat confused. Although Aristotle does discuss important features of relational predicates, for instance, that relational predicates involve a kind of reciprocal reference (6b28), his fundamental stance, according to which all properties in the world are non-relational, will appear wrongheaded. Second, Aristotle’s category of relatives raises interpretive issues, in particular the issue concerning what exactly his categorical scheme is meant to classify. As in the case of quantity, Aristotle seems to be focusing on things that are related rather than relations themselves. Indeed, this is evident from the name of the category.
This latter fact, namely that in his discussion of relatives Aristotle seems focused on related things rather than relations, places pressure on the easy characterization of the categories that I discussed previously, namely that each category is a distinct type of extra-linguistic entity. If that easy characterization were correct, Aristotle should have countenanced some type of entity corresponding to relatives as a highest kind. But he did not. Hence, it is tempting to shift to an interpretation according to which Aristotle is after all focused on linguistically characterized items. And perhaps he thinks that the world contains just a few basic types of entity and that different types of predicates apply to the world in virtue of complex semantic relations to just those types of entity. As it turns out, many commentators have interpreted him in this way. But their interpretations face their own difficulties. To raise just one, we can ask: what are the basic entities in the world if not just those that fall under the various categories? Perhaps there is a way to answer this question on Aristotle’s behalf, but the answer is not clearly contained in his texts. So again we are once again forced to admit just how difficult it is to pin down a precise interpretation of Aristotle’s work.
After relatives, Aristotle discusses the category of quality. Unlike quantity and relatives, quality does not present any obvious difficulties for the interpretation according to which the Categories classify basic types of entity. Aristotle divides quality as follows (8b26–10a11):
- Habits and Dispositions
- Natural Capabilities and Incapabilities
- Affective Qualities and Affections
Each of these species looks like an extra-linguistic type of entity, and none of the species appears to be a species in another category. Hence, any difficulties with Aristotle’s treatment of quality concern the appropriateness of the divisions he makes rather than the extent to which the category fits into a larger interpretation of the categorial scheme. But, as with just about everything in Aristotle’s scheme, the divisions he makes among qualities have been severely criticized. J.L. Ackrill, for instance, criticizes Aristotle as follows:
He [Aristotle] gives no special argument to show that [habits and dispositions] are qualities. Nor does he give any criterion for deciding that a given quality is or is not a [habit-or-disposition]; why, for example, should affective qualities be treated as a class quite distinct from [habits and dispositions]? (Ackrill 1963)
Ackrill finds Aristotle’s division of quality at best unmotivated. And Ackrill, it would seem, is being polite. Montgomery Furth has said: ‘I shall largely dispense with questions like…the rationale (if there be one) for comprehending into a single category the monstrous motley horde yclept Quality…’ (Furth 1988).
It must be admitted, that Aristotle’s list of the species in quality is at first blush a bit odd. For instance, why should we consider any of the species listed as falling directly under quality? Indeed, when Aristotle lists the species, he does not follow his usual procedure and provide the differentiae that distinguish them. If there are such differentiae, we should expect that habits and dispositions, for instance, can be defined as such and such a quality. The same would of course be true for the other qualities. But not only does Aristotle not provide these differentiae, but it is also difficult to see what they might be. To appreciate the difficulty, one need only ask: what differentia can be added to quality so as to define shape?
To be fair, Aristotle’s category of quality has had its defenders. In fact, some of those defenders have gone so far as to provide something of a deduction of the species in the category from various metaphysical principles. Aquinas, for instance, says the following about the category in his Summa Theologiae:
Now the mode of determination of the subject to accidental being may be taken in regard to the very nature of the subject, or in regard to action, and passion resulting from its natural principles, which are matter and form; or again in regard to quantity. If we take the mode or determination of the subject in regard to quantity, we shall then have the fourth species of quality. And because quantity, considered in itself, is devoid of movement, and does not imply the notion of good or evil, so it does not concern the fourth species of quality whether a thing be well or ill disposed, nor quickly or slowly transitory.
But the mode of determination of the subject, in regard to action or passion, is considered in the second and third species of quality. And therefore in both, we take into account whether a thing be done with ease or difficulty; whether it be transitory or lasting. But in them, we do not consider anything pertaining to the notion of good or evil: because movements and passions have not the aspect of an end, whereas good and evil are said in respect of an end.
On the other hand, the mode or determination of the subject, in regard to the nature of the thing, belongs to the first species of quality, which is habit and disposition: for the Philosopher says (Phys. vii, text. 17), when speaking of habits of the soul and of the body, that they are “dispositions of the perfect to the best; and by perfect I mean that which is disposed in accordance with its nature.” And since the form itself and the nature of a thing is the end and the cause why a thing is made (Phys. ii, text. 25), therefore in the first species we consider both evil and good, and also changeableness, whether easy or difficult; inasmuch as a certain nature is the end of generation and movement. (Aquinas, Summa Theologica, Part I-II, Q. 49, Art. 2)
Aquinas seems to see the species in the category of quality as unfolding systematically from some basic metaphysical principles. Whether Aquinas’s derivation of the species in the category of quality is plausible or whether some other derivation that stems from Aristotelian principles can be given has become the subject of recent scholarship (Kahm 2016, Studtmann 2003a). Although the issue may seem a local one pertaining only to Aristotle’s category of quality, it is in fact relevant to the larger issue, which I will discuss shortly, of Aristotle’s method of deriving the categories generally. A systematic derivation of Aristotle’s category of quality would give credence to the claim that Aristotle’s categorial scheme as a whole admits of some kind of systematic derivation.
It may seem odd to quote Aquinas at such length in an essay devoted to Aristotle’s categories, but I have done so for two reasons. First, as Ackrill’s and Furth’s comments illustrate, Aristotle’s scheme has been severely criticized by scholars and philosophers alike. Aquinas’s comments about quality, however, show that in the hands of a truly talented interpreter — and there certainly has been no interpreter of Aristotle greater than Aquinas — many of the criticisms can be met. Second, and more importantly, the attention that Aquinas gives to the category of quality is indicative of one of the most important facts about Aristotle’s categories, namely its profound historical importance in the development of metaphysical speculation. Whether philosophers have agreed or disagreed with Aristotle’s categorial scheme, his categorialism has played a significant instrumental role — it has provided in the millennia since its appearance the starting point for a great deal of metaphysical inquiry. In this respect, it can be compared to the quantifier in Twentieth-century metaphysics. Whether or not the quantifier is of philosophical interest, it is hard to imagine twentieth-century analytical metaphysics without it. So, to the extent that interest in the history of philosophy lies in the way in which ideas have had an influence from generation to generation, Aristotle’s categorial scheme is worth studying not only for the doctrines it contains but also for the interest that other philosophers have taken in it and the philosophy that they produced by using it as a springboard. (See the entry on Commentators on Aristotle.)
It is a tradition that scholars are increasingly attending to. Much of the recent scholarship concerning Aristotle’s Categories has either been translations of commentaries or discussions that stem from them.
After quality, Aristotle’s discussion of individual categories becomes very sparse. He devotes a few comments to the categories of action and passion (11b1) and then has a brief discussion of one of the odder categories, having, at the end of the work (15b17–35).
The bulk of the remaining discussion, which is known as the Post-Predicamenta, is directed at concepts involving some kind of opposition, the concepts of priority, posteriorty, simultaneity, and change. Although the latter part of the Categories is interesting, it is not clear that it is integral to either of Aristotle’s classificatory schemes. Moreover, his discussion there is largely superseded by his discussion of the same concepts in the Metaphysics. Hence, instead of discussing the Post-Predicamenta in detail, I shall at this point turn to a topic about Aristotle’s categories that is of fundamental philosophical and interpretive interest: how did Aristotle arrive at his list of categories?
The issue concerning the origin of the categories can be raised by asking the most difficult question there is about any philosophical position: why think that it is correct? Why, in other words, should we think that Aristotle’s list of highest kinds contains all and only the highest kinds there are?
One might, of course, reject the idea that there are some metaphysically privileged kinds in the world. But here it is important to distinguish between internal and external questions concerning a system of categories. We can approach category theory externally in which case we would ask questions about the status of any system of categories. So, for instance, we could ask whether any system of categories must exhibit some kind of dependency on the mind, language, conceptual schemes, or whatever. Realists will answer this question in the negative, and idealists of one stripe or another in the affirmative. In addition, we can ask about our epistemic access to the ultimate categories in the world. And we can adopt positions ranging from a radical skepticism about our access to categories to a kind of infallibilism about such access.
If, on the other hand, we approach category theory from an internal perspective, we will assume some answer to the external questions and then go on to ask about the correctness of the system of categories under those assumptions. So, for instance, we might adopt a realist perspective and hence assume that there is some correct metaphysically privileged list of mind and language independent highest kinds as well as a correct account of the relations between them. And we can then try to determine what that list is. Now, Aristotle certainly belongs to this latter tradition of speculation about categories: he assumes rather than defends a posture of realism with respect to the metaphysical structures in the world. It is thus appropriate to assume realism along with him and then inquire into the question of which categories there might be.
One way of approaching this question is to ask whether there is some principled procedure by which Aristotle generated his list of categories. For, if there is, then one could presumably assess his list of highest kinds by assessing the procedure by which he generated it. Unfortunately, with the exception of some suggestive remarks in the Topics, Aristotle does not indicate how he generated his scheme. Without some procedure by which one can generate his list, however, Aristotle’s categories arguably lack any justification. The issue is, of course, complicated by the fact that his list might be justified without some procedure to generate it — perhaps we can use a combination of metaphysical intuition and philosophical argumentation to convince ourselves that Aristotle’s list is complete. Nonetheless, without some procedure of generation Aristotle’s categories at least appear in an uneasy light. And as a matter of historical fact, the lack of any justification for his list of highest kinds has been the source of some famous criticisms. Kant, for instance, just prior to the articulation of his own categorial scheme, says:
It was an enterprise worthy of an acute thinker like Aristotle to try to discover these fundamental concepts; but as he had no guiding principle he merely picked them up as they occurred to him, and at first gathered up ten of them, which he called categories or predicaments. Afterwards he thought he had discovered five more of them, which he added under the name of post-predicaments. But his table remained imperfect for all that … (Kant, Critique of Pure Reason, Transcendental Doctrine of Elements, Second Part, First Division, Book I, Chapter 1, Section 3, 10)
According to Kant, Aristotle’s list of categories was the result of an unsystematic, albeit a brilliant, bit of philosophical brainstorming. Hence, it cannot stand firm as a correct set of categories.
As it turns out, although Kant did not know of any procedure by which Aristotle might have generated his list of categories, scholars have given a number of proposals. The proposals can be classified into four types, which I shall call: (1) The Question Approach; (2) The Grammatical Approach; (3) The Modal Approach; (4) The Medieval Derivational Approach.
J.L. Ackrill (1963) is the most prominent defender of the Question Approach. He takes as evidence for his interpretation Aristotle’s remarks in Topics I 9. Ackrill claims that there are two different ways to generate the categories, each of which involves asking questions. According to the first method, we are to ask a single question — what is it? — of as many things as we can. So, for instance, we can ask of Socrates, what is Socrates? And we can answer — Socrates is a human. We can then direct the same question to the answer we have given: what is a human? And we can answer: a human is an animal. Eventually, this process of question asking will lead us to some highest kind, in this case, Substance. If, on the other hand, we had begun asking that same question of Socrates’ color, say his whiteness, we would eventually have ended at the highest kind quality. When carried out completely, Ackrill claims, this procedure will yield the ten distinct and irreducible kinds that are Aristotle’s categories. According to the second method of questioning, we are to ask as many different questions as we can about a single primary substance. So, for instance, we might ask — how tall is Socrates? Where is Socrates? What is Socrates? And in answering these questions, we will respond five feet, in the Agora, Human. We will then realize that our answers to our various questions group into ten irreducible kinds.
Of all the proposals that scholars have given, Ackrill’s is the most supported by Aristotle’s texts, though the evidence he cites is far from conclusive. But from a philosophical point of view, the question method suffers from some serious problems. First, it is far from clear that either method actually produces Aristotle’s list. Suppose, for instance, I employ the second method and ask: does Socrates like Plato? The answer, let us grant, is ‘yes’. But where does that answer belong in the categorical scheme? Ackrill might respond by forcing the question to be one that is not answered with ‘yes’ or ‘no’. But we can still ask the question: is Socrates present-in or not present-in something else? The answer, of course, is: not present-in; but where in Aristotle’s list of categories does not present-in belong? It is indeed hard to see. Similar problems face the first method. Suppose I were to ask: what is Socrates’ whiteness? I might respond by saying ‘a particular’. Again, where does being a particular belong in Aristotle’s list of categories. Of course, particulars are part of the four-fold system of classification that Aristotle articulates. But we are not at the moment concerned with that scheme. Indeed, to advert to that scheme in the present context is simply to re-open the question of the relations between the two main systems of classification in the Categories.
Even if Ackrill can find some plausible route from questions to Aristotle’s categories, the methods he proposes still seem unsatisfactory for the simple reason that they depend far too much on our question-asking inclinations. It may be that the questions that we in fact ask will yield Aristotle’s categories, but what we should want to know is whether we are asking the right questions. Unless we can be confident that our questions are tracking the metaphysical structures of the world, we should be unimpressed by the fact that they yield any set of categories. But to know whether our questions are tracking the metaphysical structures of the world requires us to have some way of establishing the correctness of the categorial scheme. Clearly, at this point, we are in a circle that is too small to be of much help. Maybe all metaphysical theorizing is at some level laden with circularity, but circles this small are generally unacceptable to a metaphysician.
According to the grammatical approach, which traces to Trendelenburg (1846) and has most recently been defended by Michael Baumer (1993), Aristotle generated his list by paying attention to the structures inherent in language. On the assumption that the metaphysical structure of the world mirrors the structures in language, we should be able to find the basic metaphysical structures by examining our language. This approach is quite involved but for our purposes can be illustrated with a few examples. The distinction between substance and the rest of the categories, for instance, is built into the subject-predicate structure of our language. Consider, for instance, the two sentences: (1) Socrates is a human; and (2) Socrates is white. First, we see that each sentence has a subject, namely ‘Socrates’. Corresponding to that subject, one might think, is an entity of some kind, namely a primary substance. Moreover, the first sentence contains what might be called an individuating predicate — it is a predicate of the form, a such and such, rather than of the form, such and such. So, one might think, there are predicates that attribute to primary substances properties the having of which suffices for that substance to be an individual of some kind. On the other hand, the second sentence contains a non-individuating predicate. So by examining the details of the predicates in our language, we have some grounds for distinguishing between the category of substance and the accidental categories.
The grammatical approach certainly does have some virtues. First, we have ample evidence that Aristotle was sensitive to language and the structures inherent in it. So it would not be all that surprising were he led by his sensitivity to linguistic structures to his list of categories. Moreover, some of the peculiarities of his list are nicely explained in this way. Two of the highest kinds are action and passion. In Physics III 3, however, Aristotle argues that in the world there is only motion and that the distinction between action and passion lies in the way in which one is considering the motion. So why should there be two distinct categories, namely action, and passion, rather than just one, namely motion? Well, the grammatical approach offers an explanation: in language, we differentiate between active and passive verbs. Hence, there are two distinct categories, not just one.
Despite these virtues, the grammatical approach faces a difficult question: why think that the structures we find in language reflect the metaphysical structures of the world? For instance, it may simply be a historical accident that our language contains individuating and non-individuating predicates. Likewise, it may be a historical accident that there are active and passive verbs in our language. Of course, this type of objection, when pushed to its limits, leads to one of the more difficult philosophical questions, namely how can we be sure that the structures of our representations are in any way related to what some might call the basic metaphysical structures and to what others might call the things in themselves? But one might hold out hope that some justification for a categorial scheme could be given that did not rest entirely on the unjustified assertion of some deep correspondence between linguistic and metaphysical structures.
The Modal Approach, which traces to Bonitz (1853) and has most recently been defended by Julius Moravscik (1967), avoids the defects of both the previous two approaches. As Moravscik formulates this view, the categories are those types of entities to which any sensible particular must be related. He says:
According to this interpretation the constitutive principle of the list of categories is that they constitute those classes of items to each of which any sensible particular — substantial or otherwise — must be related. Any sensible particular, substance, event, sound, etc. must be related to some substance; it must have some quality and quantity; it must have relational properties, it must be related to times and places; and it is placed within a network of causal chains and laws, thus being related to the categories of affecting and being affected.
In virtue of its explicitly modal nature, the Modal Approach avoids the defects of the previous two approaches. Whereas the first two approaches ultimately rely on some connection between metaphysical structures and what appear to be merely contingent features of either our question asking proclivities or the structures inherent in our language, the Modal Approach eliminates contingency altogether.
Despite its explicitly modal character, the Modal Approach does face a difficulty similar to the one faced by the Question Approach. It might turn out that employing the approach yields exactly the list of Aristotle’s categories, but then again it might not. So, for instance, every material particular must be related to a particular. But there is no category of particulars. There are, of course, beings that are not said-of other beings. But not being said-of is not one of Aristotle’s categories. Moreover, must not every material particular be related to matter? But matter is not a highest kind. Indeed, it is far from clear where matter belongs in the categories. So, even if the Modal Approach is a good one for generating some list of kinds, it is not obvious that it is a good approach for generating Aristotle’s list of kinds. This problem could of course be alleviated somewhat if instead of merely appealing to modal structures as such, one could appeal to modal structures that arguably Aristotle would have thought are part of the very fabric of the world. Then one would at least have an explanation as to why Aristotle derived the list he in fact derived, even if one is inclined to reject Aristotle’s list.
The last approach to the categories, namely the Medieval derivational approach, goes some way in the direction suggested but not taken by Moravscik’s Modal Approach. There is a rich tradition of commentators including Radulphus Brito, Albert the Great, Thomas Aquinas, and most recently their modern heir Franz Brentano, who provide precisely the kind of derivation for Aristotle’s categorial scheme found wanting by Kant. According to the commentators in this tradition, Aristotle’s highest kinds are capable of a systematic and arguably entirely a priori derivation. The following quotation from Brentano captures nicely the philosophical import of such derivations.
On the contrary, it seems to me that there is no doubt that Aristotle could have arrived at a certain a priori proof, a deductive argument for the completeness of the distinction of categories … (On the Several Senses of Being in Aristotle, Ch.5, section 12)
Brentano’s enthusiasm about the possibility of deriving Aristotle’s categories is perhaps unjustified, but the idea that an a priori proof of the completeness of Aristotle’s categories is certainly an intriguing one.
Perhaps the best representative of this type of interpretation occurs in Aquinas’s commentaries on Aristotle’s Metaphysics. All of Aquinas’s derivation deserves considerable attention, but for our purposes, it will suffice to quote just a portion of it so as to bring out its general character as well as one of its more interesting aspects.
A predicate is referred to a subject in a second way when the predicate is taken as being in the subject, and this predicate is in the subject either essentially and absolutely and as something flowing from its matter, and then it is quantity; or as something flowing from its form, and then it is quality; or it is not present in the subject absolutely but with reference to something else, and then it is relation. (Commentaries on Aristotle’s Metaphysics, Book V, Lesson 9, Section 890)
This passage illustrates the tenor of the Medieval derivational approach. Aquinas articulates what appear to be principled metaphysical principles concerning the way in which a predicate can be, in his words, ‘taken as being in a subject’. There are two such ways: (1) essentially and absolutely; or (2) essentially and not absolutely but with reference to something else. The latter way corresponds to the category of relatives; the former, to the categories of quality and quantity. Aquinas then divides the former way of being in a subject in terms of form and matter. He claims, strikingly, that the category of quality flows from form and that the category of quantity flows from matter.
Inspecting all of Aquinas’s derivation to determine its cogency is far too large a project to undertake here. I have quoted the portion above to show the way in which the Medieval derivational approach augments in an interesting way Moravscik’s Modal Approach. The Modal Approach, I argued, would gain some plausibility if there were some way of seeing Aristotle’s own attitudes about the modal structures in the material world somehow determining the generation of the categories. By invoking a combination of a priori sounding semantic principles and theses about the relationship between form and quality and matter and quantity, Aquinas has gone some way toward doing this. Aristotle is certainly committed to the claim that form and matter are two of the absolutely fundamental aspects of the material world. Indeed, he argues in the Physics that form and matter are necessary for the existence of motion, which, he thinks, essentially characterizes bodies.
If the Medieval Derivational Approach is correct, Aristotle’s categories ultimately trace to the ways in which form, matter, and perhaps motion relate to substances and the predicates that apply to them. Whether the derivations can withstand philosophical scrutiny is of course an important question, one that I will not pursue here, though I will say that Brentano was probably a bit too enthusiastic about the prospects for an entirely satisfactory a priori proof of the completeness of Aristotle’s categories. Moreover, the Medieval interpretations face the charge that they are an over-interpretation of Aristotle. Aristotle simply does not provide in his surviving writings the sort of conceptual connections that underlie the Medieval derivations. So perhaps the Medievals have succumbed to the temptation to read into Aristotle’s system connections that Aristotle did not accept. Indeed, from a twentieth-century perspective, the Medieval derivations look very strange. It is commonplace in contemporary Aristotle scholarship to view the Categories as an early work and to think that Aristotle had not developed his theory of form and matter until later in his career. If this general approach is correct, the claim that the categorial scheme can somehow be derived at least in part from form and matter appears implausible.
As should be clear from this brief discussion, providing a complete derivation of Aristotle’s categorical scheme would be a difficult, indeed perhaps impossible, task. After all, someone might conclude that Aristotle’s categorial scheme was either in part or in whole mistaken. Minimally, the task is a daunting one. But of course, the difficulty in establishing its ultimate correctness is not peculiar to Aristotle’s categorial scheme. Indeed, it should not be at all surprising that the difficulties that have beset metaphysical speculation in the Western tradition can be seen in such a stark and provocative fashion in one of the great founding works of that very tradition. In fact, it is in part due to such difficulties that external questions about categorial and other metaphysical structures arise. Such difficulties understandably lead to questions about the legitimacy of category theory and metaphysical speculation in general. Unfortunately, the history of metaphysical speculation has shown that it is no less difficult to establish answers to external than to internal questions about category theory. That acknowledged it is noteworthy that questions of both sorts owe their first formulations, ultimately, to the categorialism of Aristotle’s seminal work, the Categories.
Two trends in recent philosophical scholarship are of special note. These engage Aristotle’s categorialism in different ways. The first considers it directly, as a topic of investigation in its own right; see Shields (ed.) 2012. The second treats it more indirectly, either by considering issues in Aristotle’s philosophy on which his categorialism bears or, more generally, by advancing the tradition his categorialism inaugurated; see Haaparanta and Koskinen (eds.) 2012.
In Shields (ed.) 2012, we find an argument that Aristotle’s categorialism and his hylomorphism can be systematically unified (Studtmann 2012). The role of the famous phrase—Being Qua Being—in Aristotle’s thought is thoroughly examined, first by way of the many criticisms of Aristotle’s views and second by way of interpretation of Aristotle’s famous slogan that can withstand philosophical scrutiny (Shields 2012). The ontology of the Categories is examined with a critical lens sharpened by a number of contemporary debates (Loux 2012a).
Haaparanta and Koskinen (eds.) 2012 begins with Michael Loux’s (2012b) examination of a thesis that structures Aristotle’s categorialism, namely that being is said in many ways (pollachôs legomenon). Many commentators have thought such a thesis to be deeply problematic. Loux agrees in part with such a sentiment, arguing that the thesis makes univocal but transcategorial reference impossible, thereby rendering a statement of the thesis that being is said in many ways impossible as well. Loux, however, finds a way to salvage the Aristotelian thesis by denying the claim that it is about the meaning or sense of universal terms. The volume continues with discussions that become increasingly remote in time but which therefore show the lasting influence of his categorialism. Kukkonen (2012), Knuttilla (2012), and Normore (2012) discuss in separate essays the influence Aristotle’s categories on aspects of Medieval philosophy. And by the latter part of the volume, the essays begin to focus on other philosophers, e.g., Hegel, Pierce, Bolzano, and Meinong, each of whom avowedly manifests a clear and deep debt to Aristotle and his categorialism.
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