Notes to Assertion

1. The article only concerns assertion with respect to its speech act properties. The topic of the content of assertions is too large to be covered here. A few other more general topics have also been left out. However, an earlier version of this entry was organized around the relations of assertion to other topics, including truth and logic, and contained, e.g., discussions of conditional and hypothetical assertions. The earlier version is available at

2. For a discussion of Peirce’s account of force, see Brock (1981) and Bellucci (2019). Anticipations of a theory of force can also be found in the phenomenological tradition. For a historical overview, see B. Smith (1990). The development of systematic speech act theory, in the 1950s, connected mainly back to Frege.

3. The recent literature on silencing explores the varieties of ways in which the lack of appropriate uptake can be seen as silencing the speaker. On this view, a speaker who is ignored has failed to make an assertion or give an order. This can happen because the would-be hearers don’t pay attention, or because the hearers misunderstand the speaker’s intention, or even when the hearers do understand the speaker but refuse to take them seriously. For a central contribution, see Hornsby & Langton 1998. For an overview and a discussion of which theories of assertion can do justice to the phenomenon, see Tanesini 2020.

4. An example is

France is hexagonal.

The right thing to say, according to Austin, is that this statement “is just a rough description, it is not true or false” (1962: 143).

After Lewis (1979) it is common to treat standards of precision as a factor for determining truth or falsity relative to a context, rather than as separate dimension of evaluation.

5. In Bach and Harnish’s scheme, there are four top categories: constatives, directives (including questions and prohibitives), commissives (promises, offers) and acknowledgments (apologies, condolences, congratulations) (1979: 41). The category of constatives includes the subtypes, in Bach and Harnish’s terms, of assertives, predictives, retrodictives, descriptives, ascriptives, informatives, confirmatives, concessives, retractives, assentives, dissentives, disputatives, responsives, suggestives and suppositives (1979: 41).

In this list, predictives are distinguished by concerning the future and retrodictives by concerning the past, dissentives by the fact that the speaker is disagreeing with what was earlier said by the hearer, and so on. Assertives, according to this taxonomy, are not distinguished from other constatives by any such feature. As Bach and Harnish point out (1979: 46), most of the specialized types of constatives satisfy the definition of assertives (see section 4.2). This type then stands out as a higher category, including most but not all of the constatives; not for instance suggestives (suggestions, conjectures) and suppositives (assumptions, stipulations).

A leading idea in the taxonomies of Searle (1975a) and Recanati (1987) is to distinguish between types according to direction of fit. Constative utterances have a word-world direction of fit (what is said is supposed to conform to what the world is like), while performative utterances have world-word direction of fit (the world is supposed to be changed to fit what is said). Again, assertion is the paradigmatic constative type, if not the constative type itself. For overview and discussion, see Sbisà 2020.

6. In either case, presupposing should be kept distinct from asserting. One further reason is that the presupposition occurs in other illocutionary types as well. For instance, in asking

Did John [didn’t John] manage to stop in time?

the speaker normally assumes that John tried and is only asking about the success. Still, it is not easy to distinguish assertion from presupposition in pure speech act terms. Typically, the distinction is based either on the meaning properties of the sentence used, or on properties of the conversational setting, that is, on what is taken for granted (cf. section 3.2, regarding Stalnaker’s account).

For instance, by

We regret that the pool will be closed today.

a concierge may inform a group checking in to a hotel about the state of the pool. Formally, in (i) it is presupposed rather than asserted that the pool will be closed, but the information is conveyed equally well by means of the presupposition as by means of a more direct assertion with

The pool will be closed today.

given that the guests did not already know that the pool would be closed, and given that the guests were able to compute the presupposition (both taken for granted by the concierge). By contrast, assuming that the concierge believes that a guest does know that the pool will be closed, (i) will not be used to convey information about the pool, only about the attitude of the staff, while a sincere utterance of (ii) is an assertion that the pool will be closed, whatever is assumed about the hearer’s prior knowledge. The contrast between (i) and (ii) highlights a common intuition about a central feature of assertion: explicitness. See section 2.4.

7. The picture is more complex because of the distinction between particularized and generalized conversational implicatures. One of Grice’s own examples of the latter is,

X is meeting a woman this evening. (1975: 37)

carrying the generalized implicature that the woman is not “X’s wife, mother, sister or perhaps even close platonic friend”.

In some later developments of the theory of generalized conversational implicatures, especially in Levinson (2000), some generalized implicatures are not really indirectly conveyed, but contribute to what is said, for instance (directly) asserted. Thereby it competes with Relevance Theory (Sperber & Wilson 1986 [1995]), the theory of implicitures (Bach 1994), and the theory of modulations (Recanati 2004), especially as regards so-called enrichments.

8. Irony does, however, qualify as indirect assertion on the definition given by Recanati (1987: 125). According to Recanati, an indirect speech act is a special kind of conversational implicature, where the speaker not only implicates some proposition p, but also intends to convey that p. In the case of (16), there is an apparent flagrant violation of the Quality principle to say only what is true. On the assumption that the speaker is cooperative, together with background knowledge of her political awareness, the hearer can infer that she does not mean what she literally says, but rather the opposite, that is, that what she wants to communicate is the negation of what she says. For Recanati, the communicative intention is what brings this act under the category of assertion proper (see section 4.2).

Although Searle’s definition of indirect speech acts is different, Searle too thinks that indirect speech acts work by means of an inferential mechanism, including that of conventional implicature. The hearer is supposed to understand that the speaker cannot merely be performing the primary act, since that would violate conversational principles, and then again conclude by conversational reasoning which other act has been performed.

9. Pagin (2004: 851) suggested a so-called inferential integration test, in which a sentence proposed as being used for indirectly asserting that p (e.g., by irony) replaces the corresponding explicit sentence in an inference. The idea is that if the intuitive validity of the inference is preserved, the proposed sentence can be accepted as being used for an indirect assertion.

10. Fricker is most directly concerned with what she calls “tellings” (2012: 62), assertions used to provide testimony, aimed at letting the hearer know what the speaker already knows. According to Fricker, such speech acts are

  1. subject to the knowledge norm (the content must be known by the speaker to be true, cf. section 5.1)
  2. acts in which the speaker undertakes responsibility to the hearer for the truth of the content (cf. section 6.1)
  3. acts in which the speaker represents herself as knowing that the content is true (cf. section 4.1).

On Fricker’s view, (1-3) is what gives tellings their “epistemic force”. This is what motivates the hearer to believe that what the speaker says is true. And, according to Fricker, only utterances that are linguistically explicit can have these properties: only such utterances are subject to the knowledge norm, and only by means of such utterance can the speaker assume the required responsibility. Successful hinting or indirect conveying do not qualify. What Fricker calls One-off Gricean communication does not qualify. These are cases when the speaker manages to get a message across by means of “an utterance that lacks any conventional symbolic features to constrain the intended message” (2012: 71).

Fricker’s main reason is that when the content is not fixed by linguistic conventions (together with salient contextual factors), the speaker is free to deny having asserted, or stated, the content she conveyed. That the content is fixed by linguistic convention and context, and hence recoverable by the hearer, is what incurs responsibility and makes the knowledge norm apply (2012: 76).

However, very many linguistic “explicit” assertions retain implicit features and ambiguities. There are lexical and syntactic ambiguities, implicit quantifier domain restrictions, and many other sources of underdetermination of utterance content by syntax and (standing/conventional) meaning. Because of this, the hearer is often not in a position to know what the content is, even when she is able to make a correct educated guess (Hawthorne 2012, cf. Rysiew 2007, Peet 2015). The message is then not strictly speaking recoverable by the hearer. By Fricker’s standards, assertoric quality of the utterance would be lost. The demands therefore seem too high.

Manuel García-Carpintero (2016, cf. 2019b) takes the diametrically opposite view to Fricker’s. He follows authors like Hawthorne, Rysiew and Peet in stressing normal underdetermination of content by standing meaning and context. He also criticizes Fricker’s appeal to deniability. Taken empirically, it does not distinguish between explicit tellings and indirect communication; oftentimes, speakers shamelessly deny what they have obviously asserted (2016: 40). Taken normatively, it doesn’t either, for denying indirectly conveyed messages can be equally incorrect (2016: 41). García-Carpintero concludes that given Fricker’s conditions, “almost nothing is an assertion” (2016: 42). García-Carpintero rejects Fricker’s conditions altogether, to the point of insisting that just about any type of indirect, Gricean communication can count as a telling in Fricker’s sense, if it is successful, and he illustrates this with an incredible story from Borges (2016: 37).

Unlike García-Carpintero, Borg (2019) believes that “the extent to which a speaker is held responsible for a linguistically conveyed content” (2019: 20) varies depending on how explicitly she conveys that content. Borg introduces a distinction between strict linguistic liability (which tracks “minimal content”, as defined in Borg (2012), and conversational linguistic liability (which tracks “explicature content”, as defined in Sperber & Wilson (1995: 182). Her view maintains a strict distinction between assertion and implicatures (i.e., implicatures can never be asserted), but allows that speakers can assert both minimal and explicature contents, depending “on the kind of linguistic exchange taking place” (Borg 2019: 20). The hypothesis that attributions of liability and responsibility may track distinctions between asserted content and (different varieties of) implicit content has since been subject to experimental investigation (Mazzarella, Reinecke, Noveck, & Mercier 2018; Bonalumi, Scott-Phillips, Tacha, & Heintz 2020). For a systematic discussion of these issues in relation to assertoric commitment and deniability, see Peet (2015, forthcoming).

Is there a basic conflict between assertion and the underdetermination of content? There is a strong intuition that in an assertion, the speaker relies on being understood. And in case the hearer reacts by believing what she takes to have been said, she assumes she has understood. Too much uncertainty about communicative success alters the nature of the exchange. The parties to the current debate appear to agree on that point. What is at stake is primarily whether linguistic explicitness is sufficient for achieving justified certainty, and whether it is necessary. Secondarily, there is also a question what explains the phenomenon. Is it because of responsibility, or because of something else? Proponents of different accounts of assertion will answer this question differently.

11. Translation in TPW: 64; we have used ‘acknowledgment’ instead of ‘admission’ for Frege’s ‘Anerkennung’.

12. Marsili (2018: 644) takes assertion’s truth-aim to establish a success condition for the action performed by the speaker. An assertion is (prima facie) successful if it is true, in the same way in which shooting a penalty in football is (prima facie) successful if one scores a goal. The idea here is that truth is the purported goal of asserting a proposition: you make an assertion only if you purport to try to say something true. This echoes Dummett’s point that:

A man makes an assertion if he says something in such a manner as deliberately to convey the impression of saying it with the overriding intention of saying something true. (Dummett 1973 [1981: 356])

The claim made by these authors is not that asserting requires that you actually try to tell the truth: on this picture, actually trying to tell the truth is only required for cooperative assertion. Note, further, that this characterization of assertion cannot be defended as a definition, but at most as a necessary condition, since there are other assertives (conjectures, hypotheses, objections) that “aim at truth” in this sense.

13. Pointing to the difference between fact-stating and evaluative discourse may help to distinguish assertions from evaluations, but does not, again, help to distinguish assertion from other acts within the fact-stating family, such as conjectures and assumptions. In fact, unless we read a lot into “stating”, it is not enough even to distinguish assertion from other acts that concern facts, such expressing a wish that a fact obtains.

In addition, recent years have seen a broadening of the use of the terms “truth” and “assertion” that runs counter to characterizing assertion by means of the fact-value dichotomy. In various forms of relativism, expressions of judgments of personal taste, such as

Licorice is tasty.

are characterized as assertions, and the semantic treatments use truth as the basic sentence property. Common to varieties of relativism with respect to predicates of personal taste is the idea that there is an extra parameter of evaluation, a standard of taste, over and above, say, possible world and time. Despite the lack of objectivity in a more ordinary sense, such a semantics is typically coupled with treating utterances of sentences such as (i) as assertions (for discussion, see Kölbel 2004: 71; Lasersohn 2005; Egan 2012; MacFarlane 2014: ch. 7; Baghramian & Carter 2020).

There is, of course, a further question whether such a treatment is appropriate.

14. As was already pointed out by Stalnaker (1974: 55), and later stressed in Lewis (1979), an assertion that intuitively presupposes the truth of another proposition need not fail, but can instead have the effect of adjusting the common ground. In so-called accommodation, the hearer adds the background assumptions that would be required for interpretation. For instance, upon hearing Lewis utter

The cat has gone upstairs.

the hearer who didn’t know may accommodate by adding the assumption that there is a unique, contextually salient cat. Accommodation is further discussed in Stalnaker (2002), where it is stressed, among other things, that it works, when it works, because of what is already presupposed. For example, in (i) it is presupposed that the speaker knows whether or not he has a cat.

Whatever the truth about presupposition accommodation, Stalnaker offers a model of the cognitive features of communication and the role of assertion therein.

15. Schaffer proposes to add a topic-sensitive knowledge norm (cf. section 5.1.4) to the Stalnakerian picture. Kölbel focuses on commitments instead.

According to Kölbel, assumptions differ from assertion in two respects. Firstly, they are temporary, which means that they can be revoked when they have served their purpose. Secondly, they do not have the same commitment properties. On Kölbel’s view, an assertion that p is made with the (Brandomian) undertaking of the “obligation to justify that p on request”. This undertaking, according to Kölbel, also distinguishes assertion from presupposition, although in a more subtle way. It is not, however, clear why in Kölbel’s view, Stalnaker’s account would be needed in addition to the obligation property (for another view that brings together Stalnaker’s and Brandom’s accounts, see Antonsen (2018).

Stokke chooses a different strategy: to differentiate between assertions and other speech acts, like assumptions and conjectures, he proposes to distinguish between “official” and “unofficial” common grounds. Unofficial common grounds are “temporary”: they open up in order to store information that is used for the purpose of an argument or a reductio; by contrast, official common grounds are, so to say, “permanent”. Since assumptions and conjectures are only added to the common ground temporarily, the only affect the “unofficial” common ground. Assertion can then be defined as a proposal to add a proposition to the official, permanent common ground (for criticisms, see Fallis 2013, Van Riel 2019, Marsili forthcoming-b).

16. An analogous move has been made as regards knowledge-varieties of Moorean sentences, such as

It is raining, but I don’t know that it is raining.

Clearly, utterances of sentences like (i) are bad, and some think that they are as bad as the paradigmatic Moorean sentences like (25). It is then argued that their badness shows that a speaker who asserts that p also represents himself as knowing that p (cf. Unger 1975: 256–260; Slote 1979: 179, and Williamson 2000: 253–255 with application to the knowledge norm).

For an overview and discussion, see Siebel 2020.

17. Another variant of the communicative intention analysis is Recanati’s. Part of Recanati’s solution to the sneaky intention problem, following Grice (1969), consists in simply demanding that sneaky intentions be absent. This is what it is for an intention to be open, or default-reflexive (Recanati 1987: 191–207). He also follows Sperber and Wilson’s idea of making something manifest, i.e., perceptible or inferable (1987: 120, 180; Sperber & Wilson 1986: 38). Putting the various ingredients together (including prototypicality conditions of assertion—(Recanati 1987: 183), we get:

To assert that p is to make an utterance u by which it is made manifest that the speaker has an open (default-reflexive) intention that
u gives the audience reason to believe that the speaker knows that p and wishes to share that knowledge with the audience, and
the audience recognize (a), and recognize it as open.

This is another complex analysis. The complexity of these accounts is itself a problem, since it assumed that ordinary speakers are in the habit of making assertions, and thereby to have the required intentions for doing it. But since it requires detailed analytic work to come up with the accounts, and there even are competing accounts, it is unlikely that ordinary speakers have the intentions required. If they do, they are clearly not aware of having them as agents usually are aware of their intentions. Postulating such intentions in ordinary speakers is clearly problematic.

The difficulty is made more severe, because there are speakers with a demonstrated inability to understand belief and other cognitive attitudes. Some speakers with autism, who are clearly by everyday standards using language for making assertions, fail so-called false-belief tests. Thereby they reveal an inability to distinguish between a proposition being believed and being true, and hence (since they do distinguish between truth and falsity), reveal a lack of understanding of what it is to believe something. If you cannot understand what it is to believe something, you cannot intend someone to believe something either (cf. Glüer & Pagin 2003). All in all, the complexity and sophistication required of asserters by these communication-intentions accounts, gives a reason to suspect that they do not provide necessary conditions for making assertions.

18. Only minor and partial exceptions to this pattern occur: a few accounts concern norms that are not content-directed, or non-epistemic. These accounts will be discussed in this section for simplicity, and flagged as exceptions

19. Some authors have explored versions of the norm that also specify a sufficiency condition. A good biconditional formulation of (A5) is as follows (cf. Lackey 2011: 252):

Bi-Permissibility: One is epistemically positioned to assert that p iff p meets C.

DeRose (2002) defends a biconditional version of the knowledge norm KNA, Hawthorne (2004: 23 n 58) expresses sympathy to this view. Several counterexamples against the sufficiency part have been presented (see Brown 2010, 2011; Lackey 2011; and Carter 2017; Gerken 2017: 141–143; for replies, Benton 2016 and Simion 2016).

20. These include Williamson 2000: 238–241; García-Carpintero 2019a; Stanley 2008: 52; Rescorla 2009a: 99–101; Kölbel 2010: 109–111; and MacFarlane 2014: 101–102.

21. Kvanvig 2009: 149–50, 156; Hill & Schechter 2007; Douven 2009; Lackey 2007; McKinnon 2015: chs 5 and 6.

22. Strategies along these lines are pursued by Douven (2006: 474–475), Maitra & Weatherson (2010: 110), and Cappelen (2011: 38–40) in relation to Moorean assertions, and by Weiner (2005: §3), Levin (2008), Hill & Schechter (2007), and Lackey (2007) in relation to Lottery assertions.

23. Weiner 2005: 248fn7; Hill & Schechter 2007: 110–111; Lackey 2007: 618; Cappelen 2011: 38–40.

24. For discussion, see Turri 2011; Blaauw & Ridder 2012; Pritchard 2014; Pelling 2013; and Milić 2015. Additional arguments against (KNA) can be found in Weiner 2005: §2, §4; Douven 2006: §2; Maitra & Weatherson 2010; and Begby 2020.

25. DeRose argued from the knowledge norm and the observation that in different contexts more or less stringent standard for asserting apply, to the conclusion that epistemic contextualism is true (2002b: 182). Epistemic contextualism is the view that “know” is semantically context dependent. The truth value of a knowledge attribution “X knows that p” depends on standards of knowledge in the context of the knowledge attributor.

DeRose’s argument has been challenged by several authors. For instance, Brown (2008, 2010) points out that the argument depends on the biconditional version (A5*) of the knowledge norm, and argues that the sufficiency part is less well supported. Stanley also criticizes DeRose, despite accepting that the standards of proper assertion vary between contexts. According to Stanley, the reason this does not lead to contextualism about knowledge is that assertion is governed by the certainty norm (2008: 55–56). According to Stanley, the varying standards of proper assertion depend on the context dependence of “certain”, not on any context dependence of “know” (which Stanley rejects). According to Schaffer (2008), on the other hand, knowledge itself is relative to a question under discussion, which is reflected in his version of the knowledge norm (2008: 10).

26. Factive views like (KNA) and (TNA) share another problem: they seem to predict that certain assertions are both permissible and impermissible. For discussion, see Pelling (2011, 2013b) and Rosenkranz (forthcoming).

27. See Douven (2006: 476–480), Lackey (2007: 604), Engel (2004: 56), Kvanvig (2011: 242), Stone (2007: 100), Koethe (2009: 631. n 16), Cappelen (2011: 242), Greenough (2011: 208), Hinchman (2013: 641 n 6), and Marsili (2018: 646).

28. Lackey (2011), on the other hand, proposes that justification has two aspects, a quantitative and a qualitative. The first concerns how much justification the speaker has, the second the kind of justification it is.

29. Selecting the context of utterance itself as the context of assessment relevant for assertion avoids an early critical point made by Gareth Evans (“Does tense logic rest on a mistake?”, 1985: 349–350): if it is left open when to assess an assertion, so that an assertion can be correct at one time and incorrect later, the speaker aiming at correctness cannot decide what to say. If the context of assessment is the context of utterance, then the speaker does know. As a result, however, a traditional connection between correctness and truth is given up. If the sentence is a future contingent, the truth value determined at a later time has no bearing on the correctness of the utterance (cf. García-Carpintero 2008; Greenough 2011; Marques 2014; and Caso 2014 for further discussion of assertion in connection with relativism).

30. Stanley also considers an alternative “subjective certainty” norm, where it is the degree of confidence of the speaker that matters, but he eventually opts for regarding this norm as derivable from the epistemic certainty norm.

31. Searle does not claim that the standard sentence types are force indicating devices (but speculates that a representation of illocutionary type would be part of the syntactic deep structure).

32. The term commitment denotes several subordinate concepts along a descriptive-normative axis. At the descriptive end, we have purely psychological commitments. A commitment, in this descriptive sense, consists in mental states (intentions, expectations, and preferences). At the normative end of the scale, an agent can have commitments that are completely independent of their own actions, intentions or preferences. An agent might be committed to giving up smoking, whether they like to or not, simply because that is the morally right thing to do. In between there is a spectrum of possible notions combining descriptive and normative elements. Standard commitment accounts tend not to be explicit about where on the spectrum the account lies, but on natural interpretations, they all have a normative ingredient. At the descriptive end of the scale, if I in such a sense commit myself to stop smoking, my commitment consists in a plan , i.e., a complex intention, to stop smoking, a preference for realizing the intention over not realizing it, and an expectation of, for instance, rebuke from my family if I fail. In this sense, I can cancel my commitment at any time; I just stop having the intention.

At the normative end of the scale, I may count as committed to stop smoking in virtue of, say, being a physician (who should set an example of a healthy lifestyle), whatever I myself think about it.

Between these two extremes, we find commitments that result from freely chosen actions that the agent was not originally committed to perform (like making a promise). But once the commitment is incurred by the action, e.g., a public promise or declaration to stop smoking, the agent is not free to cancel it. If I continue smoking, then I have failed to live up to my commitment, and I could not prevent this by first canceling the commitment. The commitment, once incurred, has an independent normative status outside the control of the agent.

Commitment accounts of assertion tend to belong in the middle of this scale. To make an assertion is a free action that incurs a commitment that is not under the discretion of the speaker. The speaker cannot cancel the commitment short of retracting the assertion. Because of this feature, we shall treat commitment accounts as being mainly of a normative type.

33. In his (2000), Alston reviews many accounts of taking responsibility (in his terminology, “R’ing”), identifying the merits and weaknesses of each. The one we mentioned is apt to characterize assertoric commitment, but Alston eventually endorses a different view, according to which R’ing can be characterized as follows:

A speaker S R’s that p in uttering U iff in uttering U, S subjects his utterance to a rule that, in this context, implies that it is permissible for S to utter U only if p (2006b: 60, edited).

Alston then (2000: 120) analyses assertion as a speech act by means of which the speaker R’s a proposition that they explicitly expressed:

S asserted that p in uttering U iff:
S R’d that p
S explicitly presents the proposition that p, or S is uttered as elliptical for a sentence that explicitly presents the proposition that p.

For a critical discussion of Alston’s analysis of assertion, see Cull 2019.

34. Which specific sanctions are linked to false assertions? The sanctions to which assertors are subject cannot be easily codified: asserting a proposition “is to make oneself responsible for it, without any definite forfeit” (Peirce [CP]: 5.543). Still, asserting falsehoods leads to a loss of credibility, which in itself is a significant price to pay for speaking falsely: “if what is asserted is not true, the assertor forfeits in a measure his reputation for veracity” (Peirce [MS]: 5). Since communicators care about their credibility, it also seems that these reputational costs play an important role in limiting the spread of misinformation within communication systems, human or otherwise (Green 2009, Graham 2020).

35. For detailed discussion of this point, see Toulmin 1958, Hamblin 1970a: ch. 8, Brandom 1983, Brandom 1994: 172–175, MacFarlane 2003 [Other Internet Resources]; 2005: 227–229; 2011), Rescorla 2009a; cf. also Green 2013; 2017.

36. More specifically, Geurts characterizes commitment as follows:

To say that a is committed to b to act on p is to say that a is committed to b to act in a way that is consistent with the truth of p. I take this to entail that b is entitled by a to act on p, and should b wish to act on p, and p turn out false, then b may hold a responsible for the consequences.

The reader interested in how the notion of commitment relates to other pragmatic notions such as common ground, implicature, and communicative intentions can refer to Geurts 2019 and other papers in a dedicated special issue of Theoretical Linguistics (2019: 45(1–2)).

37. That noted, there is substantial disagreement on what counts as an “appropriate” challenge: for an overview, see Rescorla (2009b).

38. See Lyons 1977: 793–809, Holmes 1984, Coates 1987, Caffi 1999, Sbisà 2001: §3.3, Labinaz & Sbisà 2014: 52, and Labinaz 2018; cf. Nes 2016 and Incurvati & Schlöder 2019. This “expressivist” analysis of modifiers has a “descriptivist” alternative, according to which such modifiers simply alter the proposition to which the speaker (plainly) commits herself, instead of the strength of her commitment to the proposition (for overviews, see Papafragou 2006, Brogaard & Gatzia (2017).

39. For more on illocutionary logic, see Green 2020b.

40. The reader who is interested in exploring Peirce’s views about assertion in better detail can refer to Hookway 1985: 128–129, Brock 1981, Tuzet 2006, Marsili 2015: 113–115, Shapiro 2018, and the articles in a dedicated special issue of the Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society (Vol. 57, No. 2, 2021).

41. This distinction was popularized by Searle (1969), but its earliest formulation is arguably in Znamierowski (1924); other precursors include Reinach (1983), Rawls (1955), and Midgley (1959). For a historical overview on the notion of constitutive rule, see Conte 1991; for further discussion, cf. section 5.1.3 of this entry.

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