Asserting is the act of claiming that something is the case—for instance, that oranges are citruses, or that there is a traffic congestion on Brooklyn Bridge (at some time). We make assertions to share information, coordinate our actions, defend arguments, and communicate our beliefs and desires. Because of its central role in communication, assertion has been investigated in several disciplines. Linguists, philosophers of language, and logicians rely heavily on the notion of assertion in theorizing about meaning, truth and inference.
The nature of assertion and its relation to other speech acts and linguistic phenomena (implicatures, presuppositions, etc.) have been subject to much controversy. This entry will situate assertion within speech act theory and pragmatics more generally, and then go on to present the current main accounts of assertion.
By an account of assertion is here meant a theory of what a speaker does (e.g., expresses a belief) in making an assertion. According to such accounts, there are deep properties of assertion: specifying those properties is specifying what asserting consists in. There must also be surface properties, which are the properties by which a competent speaker can tell whether an utterance is an assertion, for instance that it is made by means of uttering a sentence in the indicative mood.
We shall classify accounts according two parameters. Firstly, we distinguish between normative and descriptive accounts. Normative accounts rely on the existence of norms or normative relations that are essential to assertoric practice. Descriptive accounts don’t. Secondly, we distinguish between content-directed and hearer-directed accounts. Content-directed accounts focus on the relation between the speaker and the content of the proposition asserted, while hearer-directed accounts focus on the relations between speaker and hearer. Some theories have both normative and descriptive components. The entry is structured as follows
- 1. Speech Acts
- 2. Pragmatics
- 3. Descriptive Accounts, Content-Directed
- 4. Descriptive Accounts, Hearer-Directed
- 5. Normative Accounts, Content-Directed
- 6. Normative Accounts, Hearer-Directed
- Academic Tools
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- Related Entries
1. Speech Acts
Consider typical utterances made by means of the following sentences
- There is beer in the fridge.
- Is there a beer in the fridge?
- I wish there were a beer in the fridge.
- Put a beer in the fridge!
Sentence (1a) would typically be used to make an assertion. The speaker would tell or inform a hearer that there is a beer in the fridge. Such an utterance of is called assertoric, or assertive. By contrast, (1b) would be used to ask a question (and the utterance would then be interrogative), (1c) to express a wish (optative), and (1d) to make a command, or a request (imperative). This entry is about utterances of the first kind, and about the speech acts performed by means of them.
Gottlob Frege emphasized the distinction between judging a thought content (what Frege called a Thought) to be true, and merely thinking/entertaining that content. Both are distinct from the content itself. Analogously, he distinguished between utterances with assertoric quality, or force (see below), and utterances without assertoric force. For instance, an assertoric utterance of
- If it is raining, there will be umbrella salesmen in the street.
as a whole, by which the conditional proposition is asserted, contains as a proper part an utterance or the antecedent ‘it is raining’. But the utterance of “it is raining” is not itself assertoric. The conditional can be true whether the antecedent is true or false, and hence the speaker’s belief about rain is left open by the assertion
Like Frege, C.S. Peirce stressed the importance of distinguishing “between a proposition and what one does with it”. He also adopted, albeit implicitly, a distinction between force and content:
one and the same proposition may be affirmed, denied, judged, doubted, inwardly inquired into, put as a question, wished, asked for, effectively commanded, taught, or merely expressed, and does not thereby become a different proposition (Peirce [NEM]: 248).
Frege characterized the assertoric quality of an utterance as an assertoric force (“behauptende Kraft”; Frege 1918a [TFR: 330]) of the utterance. This idea was later taken over by J. L. Austin (1962 [1975: 99–100]), the founding father of the general theory of speech acts. Austin distinguished between several levels of speech act, including these: the locutionary act, the illocutionary act and the perlocutionary act. The locutionary act is the act of “ ‘saying something’ in the full normal sense” (1962 [1975: 94]), which is the utterance of certain words with certain meanings in a certain grammatical construction, such as uttering ‘I like ice’ as a sentence of English.
The notion of an illocutionary act was introduced by Austin by means of examples (1962 [1975: 98–102]), and that is the normal procedure. Illocutionary acts are such acts as asserting, asking a question, warning, threatening, announcing a verdict or intention, making an appointment, giving an order, expressing a wish, making a request. An utterance of a sentence, i.e., a locutionary act, by means of which a question is asked is thus an utterance with interrogative force, an if an assertion is made, it has assertoric force.
The perlocutionary act is made by means of an illocutionary act, and depends entirely on the hearer’s reaction. For instance, by means of arguing the speaker may convince the hearer, and by means of warning the speaker may frighten the hearer. In these examples, convincing and frightening are perlocutionary acts.
The illocutionary act does not depend on the hearer’s reaction to the utterance. Still, according to Austin (1962 [1975: 116–7]) it does depend on the hearer’s being aware of the utterance and understanding it in a certain way: I haven’t warned someone unless he heard what I said. In this sense, the performance of an illocutionary act depends on the “securing of uptake” (Austin 1962 [1975: 117]). However, although Austin’s view is intuitively plausible for speech acts verbs with speaker-hearer argument structure (like x congratulates y) or speaker-hearer-content argument structure (x tells y that p), it is less plausible when the structure is speaker-content (“Bill asserted that p”). It may be said that Bill failed to tell Lisa that the station was closed, since she had already left the room when he said so, but that Bill still asserted that it was closed, since Bill believed she was still there.
Austin had earlier (1956) initiated the development of speech act taxonomy by means of the distinction between constative and performative utterances. Roughly, whereas in a constative utterance you report an already obtaining state of affairs—you say something—in a performative utterance you create something new: you do something (Austin 1956 [1979: 235]). Assertion is the paradigm of a constative utterance. Paradigm examples of performatives are utterances by means of which actions such as baptizing, congratulating and greeting are performed. However, when developing his general theory of speech acts, Austin abandoned the constative/performative distinction, the reason being that it is not so clear in what sense something is done for instance by means of an optative utterance, whereas nothing is done by means of an assertoric one.
Austin noted, e.g., that assertions are subject both to infelicities and to various kinds of appraisal, just like performatives (Austin 1962 [1975: 13–66]). For instance, an assertion is insincere in case of lying as a promise is insincere when the appropriate intention is lacking (Austin 1962 [1975: 40]). This is an infelicity of the abuse kind. Also, an assertion is, according to Austin, void in case of a failed referential presupposition, such as in Russell’s
- The present King of France is bald
(Austin 1962 [1975: 20]). This is then an infelicity of the same kind—flaw-type misexecutions—as the use of the wrong formula in a legal procedure (Austin 1962 [1975: 36]), or of the same kind—misinvocations—as when the requirements of a naming procedure aren’t met (Austin 1962 [1975: 51]).
Further, Austin noted that when it comes to appraisals, there is not a sharp difference between acts that are simply true and false, and acts that are assessed in other respects (Austin 1962 [1975: 140–7]). On the one hand, a warning can be objectively proper or improper, depending on the facts. On the other hand, assertions (statements) can be assessed as suitable in some contexts and not in others, and are not simply true or false.
As an alternative to the constative/performative distinction, Austin suggested five classes of illocutionary types (or illocutionary verbs): verdictives, exercitives, commissives, behabitives and expositives (Austin 1962 [1975: 151–64]). You exemplify a verdictive, e.g., when as a judge you pronounce a verdict; an exercitive by appointing, voting or advising; a commissive by promising, undertaking or declaring that you will do something; a behabitive by apologizing, criticizing, cursing or congratulating; an expositive by acts appropriately prefixed by phrases like ‘I reply’, ‘I argue’, ‘I concede’ etc., of a general expository nature.
In this classification, assertion would best be placed under expositives, since the prefix “I assert” is or may be of an expository nature. Austin explicitly includes the verbs “affirm”, “deny”, and “state”, in his first group of expositives (1962 [1975: 162]). Marina Sbisà (2020) argues that assertion belongs to both expositives and to verdictives, insofar as assertion expresses a judgment/verdict.
Other taxonomies have been proposed, for instance by Stephen Schiffer (1972), John Searle (1975b), Kent Bach and Robert M. Harnish (1979), Francois Recanati (1987), and William P. Alston (2000).
Assertion is generally thought of being open, explicit and direct, as opposed for instance to implying something without explicitly saying it. In this respect, assertion is contrasted with presupposition and implicature. The contrast is, however, not altogether sharp, partly because of the idea of indirect speech acts, including indirect assertions.
A sentence such as
- Kepler died in misery.
is not true unless the singular term ‘Kepler’ has reference. Still, Frege argued that a speaker asserting that Kepler died in misery, by means of (4) does not also assert that ‘Kepler’ has reference (Frege 1892 [TPW: 69]). That Kepler has reference is not part of the sense of the sentence. Frege’s reason was that if it had been, the sense of its negation
- Kepler did not die in misery.
would have been that Kepler did not die in misery or ‘Kepler’ does not have reference, which is absurd. According to Frege, that ‘Kepler’ has reference is rather presupposed, both in an assertion of (4) and in an assertion of its negation.
The modern treatment of presupposition has followed Frege in treating survival under negation as the most important test for presupposition. That is, if it is implied that p, both in an assertion of a sentence s and in an assertion of the negation of s, then it is presupposed that p in those assertions (unless that p is entailed by all sentences). Other typical examples of presupposition (Levinson 1983: 178–181) include
- John managed [didn’t manage] to stop in time.
implying that John tried to stop in time, and
- Martha regrets [doesn’t regret] drinking John’s home brew.
implying that Martha drank John’s home brew.
In the case of (4), the presupposition is clearly of a semantic nature, since the sentence “Someone is identical with Kepler”, which is true just if ‘Kepler’ has reference, is a logical consequence of (4) and (under a standard interpretation) of (5). By contrast, in the negated forms of (6) and (7), the presupposition can be canceled by context, e.g., as in
- John didn’t manage to stop in time. He didn’t even try.
This indicates that in this case the presupposition is rather a pragmatic phenomenon; it is the speaker or speech act rather than the sentence or the proposition expressed that presupposes something.
However, the issue of separating semantic from pragmatic aspects of presupposition is complex, and regarded differently in different approaches to presupposition (for an overview, see Simons 2006).
Frege noted (1879: [TPW:10]) that there is no difference in truth conditional content between sentences such as
- John works with real estate and likes fishing.
- John works with real estate but likes fishing.
“and” and “but” contribute the same way to truth and falsity. However, when using (9b), but not when using (9a), the speaker indicates that there is a contrast of some kind between working with real estate and liking fishing. The speaker is not asserting that there is a contrast. We can test this, for instance, by forming a conditional with (9b). The antecedent of (10) preserves the contrast rather than make it hypothetical, showing that the contrast is not asserted, forming a conditional with (9b) in the antecedent preserves the contrast rather than make it hypothetical:
- If John works with real estate but likes fishing, I think we can bring him along.
It is usually said that the speaker in cases like (9b) and (10) implicates that there is a contrast. These are examples of implicature. H. Paul Grice (1975, 1989) developed a general theory of implicature. Grice called implicatures of the kind exemplified conventional, since it is a standing feature of the word “but” to give rise to them.
Most of Grice’s theory is concerned with the complementing kind, the conversational implicatures. These are subdivided into the particularized ones, which depend on features of the conversational context, and the generalized ones, which don’t (Grice 1975: 37–8). The particularized conversational implicature rely on general conversational maxims, not on features of expressions. These maxims are thought to be in force in ordinary conversation. For instance, the maxim Be orderly! requires of the speaker to recount events in the order they took place. This is meant to account for the intuitive difference in content between
- John took off his shoes and sat down.
- John sat down and took off his shoes.
According to Grice’s account, the speaker doesn’t assert, only implicates that the events took place in the order recounted. What is asserted is just that both events did take place.
Real or apparent violations of the maxims generate implicatures, on the assumption that the participants obey the over-arching Cooperative Principle. For instance, in the conversation
- Where does John spend the summer?
- Somewhere in Canada.
B implicates that he doesn’t know where in Canada John spends the summer. The reasoning is as follows: B violates the Maxim of Quantity to be as informative as required. Since B is assumed to be cooperative, we can infer that he cannot satisfy the Maxim of Quantity without violating some other maxim. The best candidate is the sub-maxim of the Maxim of Quality, which requires you not to say anything for which you lack sufficient evidence. Hence, one can infer that B doesn’t know. Again, B has not asserted that he doesn’t know, but still managed to convey it in an indirect manner.
2.3 Indirect assertions
The distinction between assertion and implicature is to some extent undermined by acknowledging indirect assertion as a kind of assertion proper. A standard example of an indirect speech act is given by
- Can you pass the salt?
By means of uttering an interrogative sentence the speaker requests the addressee to pass the salt. The request is indirect. The question, literally concerning the addressee’s ability to pass the salt, is direct. As defined by John Searle (1975b: 59–60), and also by Bach and Harnish (1979: 70), an indirect illocutionary act is subordinate to another, more primary act and depends on the success of the first. An alternative definition, given by Sadock (1974: 73), is that an act is indirect just if it has a different illocutionary force from the one standardly correlated with the sentence-type used.
Examples of indirect assertions by means of questions and commands/requests are given by
- May I tell you that, obviously, the square root of a quarter is a half?
- Let me tell you that, obviously, the square root of a quarter is a half!
(Levinson 1983: 266). Rhetorical questions also have the force of assertions:
- Is not Switzerland a peace-loving nation?
Another candidate type is irony:
- Switzerland is known for its aggressive foreign policy.
assuming the speaker does mean the negation of what is literally said. However, although in a sense the act is indirect, since the speaker asserts something different from what she would do on a normal, direct use of the sentence, and relies on the hearer to realize this, it is not an indirect assertion by either definition. It isn’t on the first, since the primary act (the literal assertion) isn’t even made, and it isn’t on the second, since there is no discrepancy between force and sentence type.
The very idea of indirect speech acts is, however, controversial. It is not universally agreed that an ordinary utterance of (13) is indirect, since it has been denied, e.g., by Levinson (1983: 273–6) that a question has really been asked, over and above the request. Similarly, Levinson have questioned the idea of a standard correlation between force and sentence form, by which a request would count as indirect on Sadock’s criterion.
Common to all conceptions of indirect assertions is that they are not explicit: what is expressed, or literally said, is not the same as what is asserted. One question is whether an utterance is an assertion proper that p if that content is not exactly what is expressed, or whether it is an act of a related kind, perhaps an implicature.
A related question is how far an utterance may deviate from explicitness and yet be counted as an assertion, proper or indirect. According to one intuition, as soon as it is not fully determinate to the hearer what the intended content of an utterance is, or what force it is made with, the utterance fails to be assertoric. Underdetermination is the crucial issue. This has been argued by Elizabeth Fricker (2012). But the issue is controversial, and objections of several kinds have been made, for instance by John Hawthorne (2012), Andrew Peet (2015, forthcoming) and Manuel García-Carpintero (2016, 2019b).
3. Descriptive Accounts, Content-Directed
Descriptive accounts characterize assertion in terms of its psychological, social, and linguistic features, without appeal to normative notions. The content-directed accounts focus on the relations between the speaker and content and between hearer and content.
3.1 Relation to truth
Frege (1918a [TFR: 329]) held that an assertion is an outward sign of a judgment (Urteil). A judgment in turn, in Frege’s view, is a step from entertaining a Thought to acknowledging its truth (Frege 1892 [TPW: 64]). The subject first merely thinks the Thought that p, and then, at the judgment stage, moves on to acknowledge it as true. Since for Frege, the truth value is the reference (Bedeutung) of a sentence, a judgment is an advance from the sense of a sentence to its reference. In case the subject makes a mistake, it is not the actual reference, but the reference the subject takes it to have.
For Frege, truth is not relative. There is exactly one point of evaluation of a Thought, the world itself. If instead we accept more than one point of evaluation, such as different possible worlds, truth simpliciter is equated with truth at the actual world. We can then adapt Frege’s view to say that judging that p is advancing to reference at the actual world, or again, evaluating as true in the actual world.
On this picture, what holds for judgment carries over to assertion. It is in the force of an utterance that the step is taken from the content to the actual point of evaluation. This view has been stated by Recanati with respect to the actual world:
[…] a content is not enough; we need to connect that content with the actual world, via the assertive force of the utterance, in virtue of which the content is presented as characterizing that world. (Recanati 2007: 37)
In Pagin (2016a: 276–278), this idea is generalized. If contents are possible-worlds propositions, the points of evaluation are possible worlds. All actual judgments are then applications of propositions to the actual world. If contents are temporal propositions, true or false with respect to world-time pairs, then all actual judgments are applications to the ordered pair of the actual world and a relevant time, usually the time at which the judgment is made. This is the point with respect to which a sentence, used in a context of utterance, has its truth value (cf. Kaplan 1989: 522). Again, the relation is general: if the content of a judgment is a function from indices of some type to truth values, then a judgment is the very step of taking the content to be true at the actual/current index, or again applying the content to that index. The force of an assertion, on this view, connects the content of the assertion with the relevant index. The assertion indicates that the content is true at the index.
On the more social side, it is often said that in asserting a proposition the speaker “presents the proposition as true” (cf. Wright 1992: 34). Prima facie, this characterizes assertion well. However, there are problems with the idea. One is that it should generalize to other speech act types, but does not seem to do so. For instance, does a question present a proposition as one the speaker would like to know the truth value of? If so, it does not seem that this way of presenting the proposition distinguishes between the interrogative force in (17a), the optative force in (17b), and the imperative force in (17c).
- Is Elsa at home?
- I would like to know whether Elsa is at home.
- Inform me whether Elsa is at home!
If other speech act types could be characterized in ways analogous to assertion, that would strengthen the proposal. If not, it appears to be a weakness.
Another problem is that it remains unclear what “presenting” amounts to. It must be a sense of the word different from that in which the proposition is presented as true in the sentence
- The proposition that snow is white is true.
even if the sentence is not uttered assertorically. That is, “present as true” must not refer to a feature simply of content. Since there is a sense of “present as such-and-such” that does refer to representational content, there is a need to specify, in a non-question-begging way, the other sense of “present” that is relevant.
In addition, there is a question of distinguishing the assertoric way of presenting something as true from weaker illocutionary alternatives, such as guesses and conjectures, which also in some sense present their contents as being true.
There are therefore weaker senses of “present as true”, which do not require that the presentation itself is made with assertoric force (like an obsolete label on a bottle), and these senses are too weak. There is clearly also a stronger sense that does require assertoric force (for cases when the label is taken to apply), but that is just what we want to have (non-circularly) explained. Simply using the phrase “present as true” does not by itself help.
Another idea for characterizing assertion in terms of truth-related attitudes is that assertion aims at truth. This is stated for instance both by Bernard Williams (1966), by Michael Dummett (1973 ), and more recently by Marsili (2018). The notion of “aiming at truth” can be understood in rather different ways (for some ways of understanding what it could be for belief to aim at truth, see Engel 2004 and Glüer & Wikforss 2013).
Williams (1966) characterizes assertion’s aim in different terms. For him, the property of aiming at truth is what characterizes fact-stating discourse, as opposed to, e.g., evaluative or directive discourse. It is natural to think of
- The moon is about 384.000 km from the Earth.
as stating a fact, and of
- Bardot is good.
as expressing an evaluation, not corresponding to any fact of the matter. On Williams’s view, to regard a sincere utterance of
- It is wrong to steal.
as a moral assertion, is to take a realistic attitude to moral discourse: there are moral facts, making moral statements objectively true or false. This view again comes in two versions. On the first alternative, the existence of moral facts renders the discourse fact-stating, whether the speaker thinks so or not, and the non-existence renders it evaluative, again whether the speaker thinks so or not. On the second alternative, an utterance of (21) is an assertion if the speaker has a realistic attitude towards moral discourse and otherwise not.
On these views, it is assumed that truth is a substantial property (Williams 1966: 202), not a concept that can be characterized in some deflationary way. As a consequence, the sentence
- “Bardot is good” is true.
3.2 Cognitive models of communication
Perhaps the best way of capturing the cognitive nature of assertion is to give a theory of the cognitive features of normal communication by means of assertion. A classic theory is Stalnaker’s (1974, 1978). Stalnaker provides a model of a conversation in which assertion and presupposition dynamically interact. On Stalnaker’s model, propositions are presupposed in a conversation if they are on record as belonging to the common ground between the speakers. When an assertion is made and accepted in the conversation, its content is added to the common ground, and the truth of the proposition in question will be presupposed in later stages. What is presupposed at a given stage has an effect on the interpretation of new utterances made at that stage. For Stalnaker, the common ground is a set of propositions. He models this with the set of worlds in which all common ground propositions are true, the context set.
In this framework Stalnaker (1978: 88–89) proposes three rules for assertion:
- A proposition is always true in some but not in all of the possible worlds in the context set.
- Any assertive utterance should express a proposition, relative to each possible world in the context set, and that proposition should have truth value in each possible world in the context set.
- The same proposition is expressed relative to each possible world in the context set.
Stalnaker comments on the first rule:
To assert something incompatible with what is presupposed is self-defeating […] And to assert something which already presupposed is to attempt to do something that is already done.
On such an approach, the satisfaction of a presupposition is an admittance condition of an assertion (cf. Karttunen 1974; Heim 1988). This idea connects with Austin’s more general idea of felicity conditions of speech acts. Does Stalnaker offer an account of assertion itself? The answer is no, for the role of assertion is shared by other speech acts such as assuming and conjecturing (Stalnaker 1978: 153). What is added to the common ground is only for the purpose of conversation, and need not be actually believed by the participants. It is only required that it be accepted (cf. Stalnaker 2002: 716).
Stalnaker has not (as far as we are aware) attempted to add a distinguishing feature of assertion to the model. This has, however, been attempted by Schaffer (2008), Kölbel (2011: 68–70), and Stokke (2013).
Another cognitive account is offered by Pagin (2011, 2020). The account is summarized by the phrase: “an assertion is an utterance that is prima facie informative”. For an utterance to be informative is for it to be made in part “because it is true”. What this amounts to is different, but complementary, for speaker and hearer. For the speaker, part of the reason for using a particular sentence is that it is true (in context); that is, the speaker believes, with a sufficient strength, that the sentence expresses a true proposition, and utters it partly because of that. For the hearer, taking the utterance as informative, means, by default, to update their credence in the proposition as a response to the utterance, both in the upwards direction and to a level above 0.5.
The prima facie element of the account means that the typical properties on the speaker and hearer side are only default properties associated with surface features of the utterance: the declarative sentence type, a typical intonation pattern, etc. There are many possible reasons why a speaker may utter such a sentence without believing the proposition, and why a hearer may not adjust their credence in the typical manner. For example, the speaker may be lying, the hearer may distrust the speaker, or may already have given the proposition a very high credence before the utterance. On Pagin’s picture, it is the cognitive patterns associated with surface features, on the production and comprehension sides, that characterize assertion. This way of dividing the account between speaker and hearer is somewhat controversial.
Yet another cognitive account is elaborated in Jary (2010). Jary’s account is situated within Relevance Theory, a more general account of cognition and communication. As a typical ingredient of this general framework, when an assertion is made, the proposition expressed by the utterance is presented as “relevant to the hearer” (2010: 163), where ‘relevant’ is a technical term (Sperber & Wilson 1986 [1995: 265]).
What distinguishes assertion from other speech act types is something different:
Assertion cannot be defined thus, though. In order for an utterance to have assertoric force, it must also be subject to the cognitive and social safeguards that distinguish assertion. […] It is the applicability of these safeguards that distinguishes assertion both from other illocutionary acts and from other forms of information transfer. (Jary 2010: 163–164)
Social safeguards consist in sanctions against misleading assertions, while cognitive safeguards consist in the ability of the hearer to not simply accept what is said but meta-represent the speaker as expressing certain beliefs and intentions (2010: 160). It is part of a full account of assertion, according to Jary, that assertions are subject to these safeguards. This also distinguishes assertions from promises and commands, where the proposition is not presented as subject to the hearer’s safeguards; “rejection is not presented as an option for the hearer” (2010: 73).
4. Descriptive Accounts, Hearer-Directed
Hearer-directed accounts of assertion are primarily concerned with the speaker’s thoughts and intentions about their audience.
According to Frege (1918a [TFR: 329]), as noted, an assertion is an outward sign of a judgment (Urteil). The term “judgment” has been used in several ways. If it is used to mean either belief, or act by which a belief is formed or reinforced, then Frege’s view is pretty close to the view that assertion is the expression of belief.
This idea, that assertion is the expression of belief, has a longer history, going back to at least Kant. How should one understand the idea of expressing here? It is natural to think of a belief state, that is, a mental state of the speaker, as causally co-responsible for the making of the assertion. The speaker has a belief and wants to communicate it, which motivates an assertoric utterance. But what about the cases when the speaker does not believe what he asserts? Can we still say, even of insincere assertions, that they express belief? If so, in what sense?
Within the communicative intentions tradition, Bach and Harnish have emphasized that an assertion gives the hearer evidence for the corresponding belief, and that what is common to the sincere and insincere case is the intention of providing such evidence:
For S to express an attitude is for S to R-intend the hearer to take S’s utterance as reason to think S has that attitude. (Bach & Harnish 1979: 15, italics in the original)
(‘R-intend’ is, as above, short for “reflexively intend”). On this view, expressing is wholly a matter of hearer-directed intentions.
This proposal has the advantage of covering both the sincere and the insincere case, but has the drawback of requiring a high level of sophistication. By contrast, Bernard Williams (2002: 74) has claimed that a sincere assertion is simply the direct expression of belief, in a more primitive and unsophisticated way. Insincere assertions are different. According to Williams (2002: 74), in an assertion, the speaker either gives a direct expression of belief, or he intends the addressee to “take it” that he has the belief (cf. Owens 2006).
Presumably, the intention mentioned is an intention about what the hearer is to believe about the speaker. In this case the objection that too much sophistication is required is less pressing, since it only concerns insincere assertions. However, Williams’s idea (as in Grice 1969) has the opposite defect of not taking more sophistication into account. The idea, that the alternative to sincerity is the intention to make the hearer believe that the speaker believes what he asserts, is not general enough. For instance, there is double bluffing, where the speaker asserts what is true in order to deceive the hearer, whom the speaker believes will expect the speaker to lie. Again, an insincere speaker S who asserts that p may know that the hearer A knows that S does not believe that p, but may still intend to make A believe that S does not know about A’s knowledge, precisely by making the assertion that p. There is no definitive upper limit to the sophistication of the deceiving speaker’s calculations. In addition, the speaker may simply be stonewalling, reiterating an assertion without any hope of convincing the addressee of anything.
A more neutral way of trying to capture the relation between assertion and believing was suggested both by Max Black (1952) and by Davidson (1984: 268): in asserting that p the speaker represents herself as believing that p. This suggestion appears to avoid the difficulties with the appeal to hearer-directed intentions.
A somewhat related approach is taken by Mitchell S. Green (2007), who appeals to “expressive conventions”. Grammatical moods can have such conventions (2007: 150). According to Green (2007: 160), an assertion that p invokes a set of conventions according to which the speaker “can be represented as bearing the belief-relation to p”.
As one can represent oneself as believing, one can also represent oneself as knowing. Inspired by Davidson’s proposal, Peter Unger (1975: 253–270) and Michael Slote (1979: 185) made the stronger claim that in asserting that p the speaker represents herself as knowing that p. To a small extent this idea had been anticipated by G. E. Moore when claiming that the speaker implies that she knows that p (1912 [1966: 63]).
However, it is not so clear what representing oneself amounts to. It must be a sense different from that in which one represents the world as having certain features. The speaker who asserts
- There are black swans.
does not also claim that she believes that there are black swans. It must apparently be some weaker sense of “represent”, since it is not just a matter of being, as opposed to not being, fully explicit. If I am asked what I believe and I answer by uttering (23), I do represent myself as believing that there are black swans, just as I would have done by explicitly saying that I believe that there are black swans. I do represent myself as believing that there are black swans, equivalently with asserting that I do. What I assert then is false if I don’t have the belief, despite the existence of black swans.
On the other hand, it must also be stronger than the sense of “represent” by which an actor can be said to represent himself as believing something on stage. The actor says
- I’m in the biology department.
thereby representing himself as asserting that he is in the biology department, since he represents himself as being a man who honestly asserts that he is in the biology department. By means of that, he in one sense represents himself as believing that he is in the biology department. But the audience not invited to believe that the speaker, that is, the actor, has that belief.
Apparently, the relevant sense of “represent” is not easy to specify. That it nevertheless tracks a real phenomenon is often claimed to be shown by Moore’s Paradox. This is the paradox that assertoric utterances of sentences such as
- It is raining but I don’t believe that it is raining.
(the omissive type of Moorean sentences) are distinctly odd, and even prima facie self-defeating, despite the fact that they may well be true. Among the different types of account of Moore’s Paradox, Moore’s own emphasizes the connection between asserting and believing. Moore’s idea (1944: 175–176; 1912 [1966: 63]) was that the speaker in some sense implies that she believes what she asserts. So by asserting (25) the speaker induces a contradiction between what she asserts and what she implies. This contradiction is then supposed to explain the oddity.
4.2 Communicative intentions
Typically, the speaker who makes an assertion has hearer-directed intentions in performing a speech act. The speaker may intend the hearer to come to believe something or other about the speaker, or about something else, or intend the hearer to come to desire or intend to do something. Such intentions can concern institutional changes, but need not. Intentions that are immediately concerned with communication itself, as opposed to ulterior goals, are called communicative intentions.
The idea of communicative intentions derives from Grice’s (1957) article ‘Meaning’, where Grice defined what it is for a speaker to non-naturally mean something. Although Grice did not explicitly attempt to define assertion, his ideas can be straightforwardly transposed to provide a definition:
- S asserts that p by the utterance u iff
there is a hearer H such that
- S intends u to produce in H the belief that p
- S intends H to recognize that i
- S intends H to believe that p at least partly for the reason that i
In the early to mid 1960s Austin’s speech act theory and Grice’s account of communicative intentions began to merge. The connection is discussed in Strawson 1964. Strawson inquired whether illocutionary force could be made overt by means of communicative intentions. He concluded that when it comes to highly conventionalized utterances, communicative intentions are largely irrelevant, but that on the other hand, convention does not play much role for ordinary illocutionary types. Strawson also pointed out a difficulty with Grice’s analysis: it may be the case that all three conditions (i-iii) are fulfilled, but that the speaker intends the hearer to believe that they aren’t (for instance, if the speaker wants the hearer to believe that p for reasons altogether independent from his making the statement).
Such intentions to mislead came to be called sneaky intentions (Grice 1969), and they constituted a problem for speech act analyses based on communicative intentions. The idea was that genuine communication is essentially open: the speaker’s communicative intentions are meant to be fully accessible to the hearer. Sneaky intentions violate this requirement of openness, and therefore apparently they must be ruled out one way or another. Strawson’s own solution was to add a fourth clause about the speaker’s intention that the hearer recognize the third intention. However, that solution only invited a sneaky intention one level up (cf. Schiffer 1972: 17–42; Vlach 1981; Davis 1999).
Another solution was to make the intention reflexive. This was proposed by Searle (1969), in the first full-blown analysis of illocutionary types made by appeal to communicative intentions. Searle combined this with an appeal to social institutions as created by rules. We return to these in section 5.1.
Searle criticized Grice for requiring the speaker to intend perlocutionary effects, such as what the speaker shall come to do or believe, pointing out that such intentions aren’t essential (1969: 46–7). Instead, according to Searle, the speaker intends to be understood, and also intends to achieve this by means of the hearer’s recognition of this very intention itself. Moreover, if the intention is recognized, it is also fulfilled: “we achieve what we try to do by getting our audience to recognize what we try to do” (Searle 1969: 47). This reflexive intention is formally spelled out as follows:
- S utters sentence T and means it (i.e., means
literally what he says) = S utters T and
- S intends (i-1) the utterance U of T to produce in H the knowledge (recognition, awareness) that the states of affairs specified by (certain of) the rules of T obtain. (Call this the illocutionary effect, IE)
- S intends U to produce IE by means of the recognition of i-1
- S intends that i-1 will be recognized in virtue of (by means of) H’s knowledge of (certain of) the rules governing (the elements of) T (Searle 1969: 49–50).
The illocutionary effect IE is the effect of generating the state specified in the constitutive rule. In the case of assertion, the speaker intends that her utterance counts as an undertaking that p represents an actual state of affairs, depending on the constitutive rule (cf. section 5.1).
Bach and Harnish follow Searle in appealing to reflexive communicative intentions. On their analysis (1979: 42), assuming a speaker S and a hearer H,
- S asserts that p iff S expresses
- the belief that p, and
- the intention that H believe that p.
According to Bach and Harnish’s understanding, a speaker S expresses an attitude just in case S R-intends (reflexively intends) the hearer to take S’s utterance as reason to think S has that attitude. They understand the reflexive nature of the intention pretty much like Searle. They say (1979: 15) that the intended effect of an act of communication is not just any effect produced by means of recognition of the intention to produce a certain effect, it is the recognition of that intention.
These appeals to reflexive intentions were later criticized, in particular by Sperber and Wilson (1986 [1995:256–257]). Their point is that if an intention I has as sub-intentions both the intention J and the intention that the hearer recognize I, this will yield an infinitely long sequence: the intention that: J and the hearer recognize the intention that: J and the hearer recognize the intention that: J and …). If this is an intention content at all, it is not humanly graspable.
Apart from the communicative intentions accounts of assertion, there are more general questions about what intentions are required of a speaker in order for his utterance to qualify as an assertion. For instance, must he intend it to be an assertion? Must it be made voluntarily?
5. Normative Accounts, Content-Directed
5.1 Norms of assertion
Most of the discussion on assertion during the past twenty years has concerned norms of assertability. Simply put, philosophers aim to determine under which conditions it is epistemically permissible (or proper, warranted, correct, appropriate) to make an assertion.
5.1.1 Modern approaches: correctness and warranted assertability
Philosophers have long been interested in analyzing what we mean when we characterize an assertion as “correct”, “justified”, “proper”, “warranted”, “assertible”, or “warrantedly assertible”. The latter notion was taken on board in pragmatism, and in later forms of anti-realism. Dewey (1938) seems to have been the first to characterize truth in terms of assertoric correctness, with his notion of warranted assertibility, even though this idea had a clear affinity with the verifiability principle of Moritz Schlick (1936). Dewey, following Peirce, regarded truth as the ideal limit of scientific inquiry (1938: 345), and a proposition warrantedly asserted only when known in virtue of such an inquiry. Warranted assertibility is the property of a proposition for which such knowledge potentially exists (1938: 9). Dewey was later followed by, notably, Dummett (1976) and Putnam (1981). Common to them is the position that there cannot be anything more to truth than being supported by the best available evidence. In these early discussions, the strategy was that of getting a handle on truth by means of an appeal to the notion of the correctness of an assertion, which was taken as more fundamental. On Dummett’s view, we do get a notion of truth distinct from the notion of a correct assertion only because of the semantics of compound sentences (1976: 50–52). The question of what the correctness of an assertion consists in was not itself much discussed in earlier work, but became subject of discussion already in the 1980s, with the work of Boghossian and others.
5.1.2 Contemporary approaches: the norm of assertion
The contemporary wave of discussion about assertoric normativity is almost exclusively content-directed; the norms concern the epistemic relation between the speaker and the content of their assertion. Williamson (1996, 2000) initiated this debate by proposing that assertion is governed by a single norm, of the format:
- One must: assert p only if p has C.
According to this hypothesis, you are entitled to assert a proposition only if that proposition has a certain unspecified property C. The (N)-schema formalizes the key philosophical question about assertability: which epistemic property C that makes a proposition assertable?
Williamson’s answer is that property C must be knowledge, i.e., being known by the speaker. If this is right, you can properly assert only what you know: assertion is governed by the knowledge-norm (KNA):
- One must: assert p only if one knows p.
(Williamson 2000: 243). (KNA) is proposed as part of an account of assertion. Other norms have been proposed: the most prominent alternatives are the truth norm (TNA), the justification norm (JNA) and the belief norm (BNA):
- One must: assert p only if p.
- One must: assert p only if one is epistemically justified in believing p.
- One must: assert p only if one believes p.
Determining which of these norms governs assertion depends (at least in part) on what we mean by hypothesizing that assertion is governed by a simple norm by N. In the next section (5.1.3), we clarify what philosophers typically mean when they say that N governs assertions. In the subsequent section (5.1.4), we review the various accounts of which specific norm governs assertion (i.e., the different views as to which property C makes a proposition assertable).
5.1.3 What kind of norm?
Williamson’s initial framing of the debate on the norm of assertion takes for granted a number of assumptions: for instance, that there is a single norm, that it is constitutive of assertion, that all and only assertions are subject to it. In subsequent work, some of these assumptions have been questioned. Here we limit ourselves to list each assumption (ignoring the numerous objections that affect them). The interested reader will find a discussion of the case for and against each assumption in the supplementary document Which Kind of Norm?.
- Specificity: N applies specifically to assertion: only assertions are subject to N.
- Directness: Assertions are subject to N directly, qua assertions.
By Specificity, N is a norm that regulates only one species of action: asserting. In this sense, it is specific to assertion. It governs the making of assertions in general, and nothing else. Directness is closely connected to Specificity. It clarifies that assertions are subject to N only in virtue of the fact that they are assertions.
- Uniqueness: There is only one norm of assertion: assertion is only subject to N
- Indirectness: Assertions are subject to other normative standards, but only indirectly (not in virtue of the fact that they are assertions).
The “uniqueness assumption” holds that assertion is subject to a single norm. Indirectness specifies that Uniqueness is compatible with recognizing that there are other norms that apply to assertion, albeit only indirectly (Williamson 1996: 489). For instance, an assertion can follow N (e.g., satisfy the Justification Norm JNA) and violate standard of politeness, morality, legality, etc. Unlike N, these other normative standards are not specific to assertion, since they apply also to other actions (questions, orders, as well as non-linguistic actions).
An important corollary of Indirectness is that whether an assertion is all-things-considered permissible or not may depend on factors that are independent of N. When you say something offensive, or reveal a secret that you agreed to keep, you may follow N and yet make an (all-things-considered) impermissible assertion. And when you lie to save a life, you may violate N and make an assertion that is (all-things-considered) permissible.
- Individuation: N uniquely identifies assertion: assertion is the only speech act that is only subject to N.
According to the Individuation assumption, the norm of assertion is individuating: assertion can be defined as the unique speech act who is subject to this unique norm (Williamson 2000: 241; Goldberg 2015: 25; Montminy 2013a). It should be emphasized here that it is being subject to the norm that characterizes assertion, not conforming to the norm. An assertion that violates the norm is still an assertion. A definition of assertion in terms of its norm would read as:
- S asserts that p iff in saying p, S is subject to the obligation imposed by N.
If (A3) holds, an important motivation for identifying N is that it will provide us with a definition of assertion. Once we determine what N is (say, JNA), we can disambiguate the content of this definition (say, “the only speech act who is only subject to JNA”).
- Essentiality: Being subject to N is essential to assertion as an action type: Necessarily, assertion is subject to N.
The Essentiality assumption goes beyond Individuation: Individuation allows that assertion is only actually individuated by N, and that it could have been governed by some other norm. By contrast, (A4) holds that assertions could not exist and be governed by a different norm: if assertion were subject to a different norm, it would be a different speech act. Nothing but an assertion could violate the norm, if the (A3) and (A4) properties hold.
- Permissibility: N establishes a condition for permissible assertion: p is permissible to assert only if p meets C.
By (A5), an assertion is permissible (appropriate, epistemically proper, warranted, correct—depending on one’s favorite terminology) only if it meets condition C, and impermissible if it does not meet C. Permission is related to the negative evaluation of assertions: assertions who violate N are prima facie faulty, and criticizable (qua violations of N). Permissibility only establishes what is necessary for permissible assertion, not what is sufficient.
- Constitutivity: N is the constitutive norm of assertion.
However, there is substantial (and often unacknowledged) disagreement about what constitutivity amounts to (for more the debate surrounding each of these assumptions, see the supplementary document Which Kind of Norm?).
5.1.4 Which Norm of Assertion?
For the most part, the literature on norms of assertion has concerned the question of which specific norm governs assertion, and what are the reasons for favoring one candidate norm over another. Below, we briefly go through the main candidates from the literature.
The knowledge norm
- One must: assert p only if one knows p.
Over and above Williamson, (KNA) has been favored by DeRose (2002), Reynolds (2002), Adler (2002: 275), Hawthorne (2004), Stanley (2005), Engel (2008), Schaffer (2008), and Turri (2010), among others.
In addition to direct intuitions about the appropriateness of specific sentences, proponents of the knowledge norm have adduced indirect evidence in the form of intuitions about conversational patterns, claiming that these patterns are best explained by the acceptance of the knowledge norm. Williamson himself appeals to such patterns, such as those arising from Moorean Assertions (26), Lottery Assertions (27), and Challenges (28):
- It is raining, but I don’t know that it is raining.
- Your ticket did not win.
- How do you know that?
Concerning the first, Williamson (2000: 253) claims that an utterance of (26) is just as odd as any ordinary Moorean sentence involving belief, such as (25) above. The oddity of (26) can be explained by appeal to the knowledge norm, and this is taken by supporters of (KNA) to be a datum in its favor. By (KNA), (26) is proper only if the speaker knows that the proposition expressed by (26) is true. Since knowledge distributes over conjunction, this means that the speaker should know that it is raining and also that she does not know that it is raining. Since knowledge is factive, this generates a contradiction: it follows that an assertion of (26) cannot be proper, and this explains its oddity.
Similarly, (KNA) seems well positioned to explain the oddity of asserting (27) merely on probabilistic grounds. Suppose that a (fair) lottery with a large number of tickets has been held; only one ticket has won. B has a ticket, but neither A nor B knows the result. A asserts (27) on merely probabilistic grounds. Although the probability that the ticket has won is very low (and one can get it arbitrarily low, short of zero, by increasing the number of tickets in the lottery), it is intuitively incorrect for A to tell (27) to B (Williamson 2000: 246–249). No probability short of 1 seems to authorize A’s utterance of (27). Since A does not know that (27) is true, (KNA) explains the unacceptability of A’s utterance.
Finally, in standard contexts, it is perfectly appropriate to challenge an assertion with questions like (28), but (28) presupposes that the speaker knows that what she says is true. (KNA) is well positioned to explain why this presupposition is appropriate: if speakers are only entitled to assert what they know, then it is within the hearer’s conversational rights to assume (and presuppose) that the speaker knows that what they say is true. Further conversational patterns supporting (KNA) have been proposed, e.g., by Benton (2011).
The claim that (KNA) is supported by these conversational patterns has been extensively criticized. The most common line is that the available data can be explained equally well (if not better) by competing accounts. For instance, several authors argue that the oddity of Moorean Assertions and Lottery Assertions can be explained by appeal to a justification norm. Others have noted that these conversational patterns may be explained by appealing to more general principles, rather than assertoric norms specifically. For instance, it has been argued that Lottery Assertions and Moorean Assertions are improper because they violate more general (Gricean) conversational principles.
A different criticism comes from Sosa (2009), who notes that (KNA)’s explanation of Moorean assertions fails to generalize as it should, because (KNA) is unable to explain “dubious assertions”: cases in which the speaker asserts p while admitting that he doesn’t know whether he knows that p (but see Benton 2013, Montminy 2013a). Finally, several authors have questioned the assumption that it is always improper to assert that one’s ticket is a loser on purely probabilistic grounds.
The argument from challenges like (28) is surely the least compelling. First, to meet the challenge raised by (28), it would be sufficient for the speaker to show that she has good reasons to believe that what she said is true (Lackey 2007: 610; Kvanvig 2009: 143; McKinnon & Turri 2013). It does not seem, by contrast, that the speaker has to prove that she knows (rather than merely believe) that what she said is true. Second, taking the argument seriously proves too much. Consider (29):
- Are you sure?
- How can you be certain?
Since (29) and (30) are also natural ways to challenge an assertion, by the same logic, we should conclude that assertion is also governed by a certainty rule. We could extend this to other challenges (Is that true?). So the challenge argument doesn’t seem to show a primacy of knowledge over alternative rules.
A general problem with the appeal to conversational patterns is that they don’t seem to favor specifically normative views over corresponding non-normative views. For instance, it appears that any linguistic phenomenon that can be explained by appeal to a knowledge norm can be equally well explained by appeal to the view that asserters represent themselves as knowing what they say, although there is no norm (cf. Pagin 2016b; D. Black 2018). Combine this with extraneous, non-assertion-specific norms. That A’s lottery assertion (27) is bad can then be explained by appeal to self-representation of knowledge, together with the general moral norm that it is wrong to mislead hearers.
Many objections against (KNA) are based on the idea that its requirements are too strong. First, Gettiered assertions. Suppose that you have a justified true belief that falls short of knowledge. For instance, you walk into a café, look at the clock, and conclude that it’s 4.35; but your belief is only accidentally true because (unbeknownst to you) the clock has been stuck at 4.35 for several days. If someone asks you the time, it seems perfectly appropriate for you to respond “4.35 pm”. However, by making such an assertion, you would be violating (KNA), which intuitively speaks against it (Lackey 2007: 596; Kvanvig 2009: 146–7; Coffman 2014: 36).
Similar objections arise in relation to the intuitive permissibility of unlucky assertions: assertions that you have excellent reasons to believe to be true, but that happen to be false. Since the problem with unlucky assertions is that (KNA) entails (TNA) (it only allows true assertions), we will discuss it below, as we consider objections to (TNA).
Lackey objects that (KNA) fails to accommodate selfless assertions. She presents several examples: one involves a teacher, Stella, who firmly believes in creationism, but is aware that the scientific consensus is that humans evolved from apes. Stella recognizes that Darwinism is supported by stronger empirical evidence, but this is not enough to shake her firm belief in creationism. Suppose that she tells her students:
- Homo sapiens evolved from Homo erectus.
Intuitively, it would be appropriate for Stella, as a teacher, to assert (31). However, (KNA) predicts that (31) is incorrect, because Stella does not believe, and therefore does not know, that (31) is true. Selfless assertion have generated a lively debate, mostly involving attempts to explain their propriety within a (KNA)-framework (see Montminy 2013a, Turri 2015, Milić 2017).
Further objections concern so-called unsafe assertions, where the speaker does know what is asserted, but would easily have made the assertion in a similar situation without knowledge.
A few authors who sympathize with (KNA) have emphasized the role of the hearer. Their proposals are similar to (KNA), but set the condition in relation to the transmission of knowledge to the hearer. An example is García-Carpintero (2004: 156):
- One must: assert p only if one’s audience comes thereby to be in a position to know that p.
Similar norms have also been proposed by Pelling (2013a) and by Hinchman (2013). García-Carpintero suggests that his version is preferable to Williamson’s because it brings out the social, communicative function of language (but see Willard-Kyle forthcoming for objections to KNA-T). 
The truth norm
Most alternatives to the knowledge norm that are weaker than (KNA): they require less than knowledge for proper assertion. Weiner (2005) and Whiting (2013, 2015) propose a truth norm (cf. also Alston 2000):
- Assert that p only if p is true.
Just like the knowledge norm, the truth norm is factive: both entail that you can assert a proposition only if it is true. This generates a problem concerning the intuitive appropriateness of unlucky assertions. To illustrate, imagine that you have had a cat for several years. During a conversation, a friend asks you if you have any pets at home, and you reply:
- I have a cat at home.
Unbeknownst to you, however, some thieves broke into your house and stole everything you have, including your cat. Since you could not possibly have foreseen the eventuality of such an absurd theft, it seems that your assertion is appropriate: in response to your friend’s question, (32) is simply the right thing to say. However, (KNA) and (TNA) give a different verdict: they predict that (32) is an inappropriate response. What’s more, (TNA) (but not (KNA)) predicts that the appropriate reply would have been to assert the negation of (32), namely that you don’t have a cat at home. But again, such a “lucky assertion” would be intuitively inappropriate: since you have no reason to believe that your cat was stolen, in saying that you don’t have a pet you would be lying.
Proponents of (KNA) and (TNA) tend to concede that unlucky assertions (and Gettiered assertions) are intuitively appropriate, and that lucky assertions are intuitively inappropriate. Their standard defense strategy is to invoke some distinctions that explain away their incorrect predictions. Williamson (2000: 256–257) suggests that making unlucky and Gettiered assertions is reasonable, and this is why assertions like (32) usually don’t warrant criticism. However, here the prediction that uttering (32) is reasonable is made by general observations about rationality, and not by (KNA) itself. If (KNA)’s job is to tell us which assertions are appropriate and which are not, it is not clear how these observations really help its case, since there are other norms (such as (JNA)) that are able to make this prediction without appeal to independent epistemic standards.
A parallel solution has been delineated by DeRose, who draws a distinction between primary and secondary propriety. Primary propriety is just what a rule says: when a rule prescribes to f only if C, it is primarily proper to f if C, and primarily improper to f if not C. Secondary propriety is dictated by whether you have reasons to think you are following the rule. If you f because you reasonably believe that C, but C is accidentally false, your action is primarily improper but secondarily proper, and doesn’t deserve blame. If you f although you reasonably believe that C is false, but C is accidentally true, your assertion is primarily proper but secondarily improper, and doesn’t deserve praise. This strategy helps defend (TNA) and (KNA) against the devised counterexamples. Unlucky and Gettiered assertions are primarily improper but secondarily proper, and that’s why they don’t deserve blame. Lucky assertions are primarily proper but secondarily improper, and that’s why they don’t deserve praise.
Several authors reject this distinction between primary and secondary propriety. Most of them think that this distinction is spurious. If the job of an epistemic norm is to identify the one epistemic standard C from which it is appropriate to assert, then it is not clear that appealing to secondary propriety, epistemic excuses or reasonableness is a legitimate move, given that more economic alternatives are available. Reasonably thinking that you are in C (secondarily following the rule) is itself an epistemic state; if being in such a state epistemically entitles you to assert, such permissibility should be built into the norm.
Accepting the distinction between primary and secondary propriety induces a problem for the intuitive support for the various theories. A large part of the intuitions that serve to support one or the other norm theory relies on raw intuitions about what one should or shouldn’t assert in some situation, or what is proper or improper to assert there. If there are several ways an assertion can be proper or improper, then it is not easy to see which concept of propriety is being tracked by these intuitions. The idea is that a particular intuition that seems to disconfirm a particular normative theory can be explained away by saying that it does not in fact track the primary propriety, but instead only some secondary propriety. Since intuitions don’t come labeled as “primary” and “secondary”, there is a risk of a substantial underdetermination of theory by data (stressed by Pagin 2016b): two theorists need not agree about whether or not an intuition about a particular case supports a certain theory.
A problem persists even if we reject the primary/secondary distinction. As noted, everyone agrees that assertions are governed by various norms: moral, prudential, conversational, rules of etiquette. When does an intuition track the intended notion of a proper assertion, and when something else altogether? Kvanvig (2011: 235) and Engel (2008: 52–54) have drawn attention to this. According to Kvanvig, intuitions typically concern whether assertions are all-things-considered appropriate. But an assertion may be “all-things-considered appropriate” without being “epistemic appropriate” (or the other way around). Since we do not have a reliable method for telling apart intuitions about “overall appropriateness” from intuitions about “epistemic appropriateness”, it is often unclear to which extent a given set of intuitions supports or undermines a given theory (cf. Hawthorne & Stanley 2008: 585–6). To address this problem, Greenberg (forthcoming) proposes to reframe the debate in terms of epistemic norms constraining action, rather than assertion.
Complex refinements of (TNA) have been proposed, too. MacFarlane (2014: 103) adopts a truth norm, but requires it to be qualified as being reflective. This means, in the context of MacFarlane’s relativism, that the proposition should be true in the context of utterance, as assessed from the same context of utterance. According to MacFarlane, the truth norm needs to be complemented by a retraction rule that enjoins the speaker to retract the assertion if it turns out not be true (cf. Dummett 1991: 165), in a context of assessment:
- Retract an (unretracted) assertion if it turns out not to be true.
This rule is also stated in the context of MacFarlane’s relativism, with respect to a context of use and a context of assessment. According to the resulting view, assertion is governed jointly by the (reflective) truth norm and the retraction rule. Rescorla (2009a), who defends a commitment account of assertion (see section 6.1), argues there is no norm at all for proper making of assertions. There are only norms that govern later reactions. He proposes three alternatives to (RNA), which share the idea that when a speaker is challenged with respect to an assertion he has made, he must either defend the assertion or else retract it (Rescorla 2009a: 103–105; cf. Rescorla 2009b).
The justification norms
Several authors have argued that assertability requires justification, rather than belief or knowledge. A standard formulation would be:
- Assert only that for which you have proper justification.
What “justification” is taken to refer to varies between authors. Douven (2006, 2009) and Lackey (2007, 2008) argue for a norm of rational belief. Note that (JNA) does not require that you believe what you say: all that it requires is that it is (or would be) rational for you to believe it. As such, (JNA) classifies selfless assertions (which are disbelieved, but rational to believe) as appropriate, a prediction that Lackey (2007) takes to be a crucial advantage of (JNA).
Different conversational contexts may require different degrees of justification. For instance, suppose that you are serving your friend a curry that you just defrosted. You remember that you prepared it for a vegan dinner over a month ago, but you’re not absolutely sure. If your friend has a mild dislike for cheese, (33) may be an appropriate thing to say; not so much if your friend has a deadly allergy to lactose:
- There is no cheese in this curry.
To accommodate this sort of intuitions, some authors have proposed context-sensitive versions of (JNA). Gerken (2012, 2014, 2017) says that an assertion must be based “on a degree of discursive justification for believing that p that is adequate” relative to the conversational context. He also argues that the notion of justification is best understood in internalist terms: a speaker asserting p is justified only if they would be able to consciously articulate their reasons in support of p. McKinnon (2013, 2015) also defends a version of (JNA) that is context-sensitive. She argues that one may assert that p only if (i) the speaker has supportive reasons for p, and (ii) the relevant conventional and pragmatic elements of the context of assertion are present. On this view, the pragmatic features of the context have an effect on which epistemic support is needed. Pragmatic features can regard the stakes involved (how much depends practically on the truth of what is asserted) or pedagogical requirements (in case the speaker is a teacher who is required to teach what is rational to believe; McKinnon 2015: Section 4.4).
If justification comes in degrees, perhaps some propositions are more assertable than others. According to an influential view (Jackson 1974, 565, cf. Lewis 1976, 297), the degree to which a proposition is assertable is a function of its probability. But Sam Carter (forthcoming) shows that this view makes systematically incorrect predictions. He suggests that assertability is a matter of normality instead: “asserting p is more appropriate than asserting q, for a speaker in evidential state E, iff amongst the worlds compatible with E, p is more normal than q” (in turn, normality has to do with what is compatible with our evidence-based expectations; cf. Carter forthcoming: §5 for a formal definition).
(JNA) does not explicitly forbid insincere assertions (assertions that are believed to be false). Some find this feature unattractive, and prefer to amend (JNA) so as to introduce a belief-requirement, as in (JBNA):
- Assert that p only if you justifiably believe that p.
Since (JBNA) requires both justification and belief, it entails that both (JNA) and (BNA) are true. But how should we characterize justification for the purpose of this more demanding norm? For Kvanvig (2009, 2011), the relevant notion is knowledge-level justification: “the kind [of justification] that is sufficient for knowledge in the presence of ungettiered true belief” (2009: 156); a stronger version of this requirement (would-be-knowledge) is defended by Coffman (2014).
A datum that justification rules may have trouble explaining is the wrongness of false assertions. There seems to be something inherently defective about false assertions, and there is clearly a sense in which true, justified assertions are more valuable than false, equally justified ones. But (JNA) and (JBNA) have no resources to explain what is defective about falsity. In response, Marsili (2018) notes that proponents of non-factive accounts can avail themselves of the notion of an assertion’s aim: when we make an assertion, we purport to describe the world as it is; our assertion’s purported goal is met only if the assertion is true. On this view, false assertions are not impermissible, but are still defective, because they fail to meet their purported aim.
There are views that come very close to justification rules. Maitra and Weatherson (2010: 112) propose what they call The Evidence Responsiveness Rule: that one assert that p only if one’s attitude towards p is properly responsive to the evidence (they also propose to complement it with an action rule, that it is proper to assert that p only if acting as if p is “the thing for you to do”). Smithies (2012) defends the view that p is assertable only if you have a justification to believe that you are in a position to know that p (cf. Koethe 2009, Rosenkranz forthcoming). This version of (JNA) restores a guiding normative role for knowledge, while accommodating many of the intuitions that motivate a preference for (JNA) or (KNA) (for a critique, see M. Smith 2012).
Belief norms are the weakest norms on the market:
- Assert only what you believe.
The belief norm is explicitly stated by Hindriks (2007) and Bach (2008: 77). If one substitutes ‘say’ for ‘assert’, this is close to a reformulations of Grice’s second submaxim of Quality (“Do not say what you believe to be false” (Grice 1989: 27).
Intuitively, (BNA) is too permissive: it allows us to assert whatever we believe, even if we have no evidence but a hunch to support our claim. To explain away this prediction, advocates of (BNA) typically add that while (BNA) is the only norm that is specific to assertion (and regulates assertion directly, cf. (A1) and (A2)), it is not the only norm that regulates it. Since assertions necessarily express a belief, and appropriate belief (and/or practical action) is allegedly governed by a knowledge-norm, (KNA) ultimately determines which assertions all-things-considered appropriate (Hindriks 2007; Bach 2008; Montminy 2013a).
All the alternatives to the knowledge norm considered so far require less than knowledge for proper assertion. A stronger requirement has been suggested by Stanley (2008):
- Assert only what is epistemically certain.
Here one is epistemically certain of a proposition p
if and only if one knows that p (or is in a position to know that p) on the basis of evidence that gives one the highest degree of justification for one’s belief that p. (2008: 35)
According to Stanley, since the certainty norm requires more than just knowledge, everything that can be explained by appeal to the knowledge norm can also be explained by appeal to the certainty norm.
Goldberg (2015) argues that the norm of assertion hypothesis can explain why we have a (pro tanto) epistemic entitlement believe what we are told. He identifies some requirements that are needed to meet this desideratum. One is that the norm of assertion is robustly epistemic, and strong enough to warrant testimonial belief (2015: 96). Another is that it must be common knowledge between speaker and hearer that the speaker’s assertion is subject to this norm. A further requirement (2015: 8) is that the speaker authorizes the hearer to defer back to the speaker the responsibility of meeting challenges to the assertion. Together, these assumptions should be able to explain why beliefs based on testimony are pro tanto justified.
Most authors who write about the norm of assertion appeal to their own intuitions. However, this is an area where experimental data is highly relevant. If the aim is to describe a real-word communicative act, rather than a purely idealized philosopher’s construct, it follows a good theory of assertion should make predictions that are consistent with our actual practice: it should deem appropriate the assertions that ordinary speakers deem appropriate, and inappropriate the ones that they criticize as inappropriate. If this is right, competing accounts can be tested empirically against the intuitions of competent speakers of the language.
Empirical research on the norm of assertion was initiated by Turri. His (2013) study aims to determine whether people’s assertability judgments are better predicted by a factive norm, like (KNA) or (TNA), or a non-factive one, like (JNA) or (BNA). Turri reports the results of six experiments, primarily investigating judgments about unlucky assertions (false assertions that the speaker reasonably believes to be true). In the first experiment, Maria incorrectly thinks that she has a 1990 Rolex in her watch collection, because this is what her inventory says. When a friend asks Maria if she has that particular Rolex, participants are asked: “Should Maria tell her guest that she has a 1990 Rolex in her collection?” [Yes/No]. Participants overwhelmingly selected the negative option (No), even when different factors were manipulated (the control questions, what is at stake, the response options, etc.), apparently providing robust evidential support for factive accounts. Turri has since conducted several more studies, accumulating an impressive body of evidence supporting factive accounts of assertion in general and the knowledge-norm in particular (for a review, see Turri 2017), including studies on other potential counterexamples to (KNA), like selfless assertions (2015a), and Gettiered assertions (2016).
It seemed that the debate was settled in favor of the knowledge rule, until new studies came out that pointed in the opposite direction. Reuter and Brössel (2019) argue that two factors likely skewed the results in favor of factive accounts in Turri’s (2013) seminal study. First, the protagonist (Maria) has a defeater against her belief: she is aware that her inventory is occasionally mistaken. Second, participants were asked what Maria should say, but it would seem more appropriate to ask whether her assertion was permissible. Manipulating these factors reverted the results: a majority of participants gave responses aligning with non-factive accounts. The authors then conducted new experiments involving both lucky assertions (true, but not justified) and unlucky assertions (false, but justified), finding that (JNA) was reliably a better predictor of assertability than any of its factive rivals (TNA, KNA).
Kneer (2017) also found solid evidence that (JNA) is a better predictor of assertability judgments than (KNA), TNA, and (BNA). In a first experiment, he tested Gettiered assertions and unlucky assertions, measuring assertability with different prompts: he asked whether the protagonist “should say p”, whether she “is permitted to say p”, and if saying p is “appropriate”. In both the Gettiered condition and the unlucky condition, the overwhelming majority of participants considered p assertable, but not known. Kneer concludes that “knowledge quite clearly doesn’t constitute the norm of assertion”. The other experiments were therefore designed to verify whether (JNA) makes more reliable predictions. Experiments 2 and 3 found robust evidence that (JNA) is a better predictor of assertability judgments than (KNA), both in Gettier assertions and unlucky assertions, even when different factors (like the response options or the kind of epistemic support) are manipulated. Experiment 4 shows that (JNA) is a better predictor of assertability judgments than (BNA): people judge that “having a hunch” that p is true is not good enough ground to assert p. Like Reuter and Brössel, Kneer concludes that (JNA), rather than (KNA), is better supported by the empirical evidence. In a subsequent study, Kneer (2021) found that these results are stable across different cultures.
These results are at odds with the initial findings by Turri and colleagues. Given the contrasting data available, how can we determine which account is best supported by empirical evidence? To answer this question, Marsili and Wiegmann (2021) note that, in all their differences, Turri’s studies share a central methodological aspect: they explore laypeople intuitions by asking a sample of subjects to judge what a particular agent should do in a given scenario, before the protagonist makes the assertion; Kneer, Reuter and Brössel adopt instead different prompts and tense structures. Marsili and Wiegmann argue that the divergent results are the predictable bi-product of a flaw in the questioning method employed in the former set of studies. They note that “should” can be interpreted in two ways: teleologically (or instrumentally), when it indicates what you should do to achieve your aims, and deontologically, when it indicates what you should do to live up to some norms or obligations. The authors found experimental evidence that participants in Turri’s studies interpreted the test questions teleologically, which undermines a factive interpretation of the results. Furthermore, they identify measures that can be introduced to prompt the intended (deontological) reading of the test question, finding that when these measures are implemented into Turri’s vignettes, participants’ judgments overwhelmingly align with non-factive views like (JNA).
It would therefore seem that the latest studies have tipped the scale in favor of non-factive views like (JNA). However, further research will be needed to settle the disagreement on empirical grounds.
Austin held that illocutionary acts as opposed to perlocutionary acts are conventional, in the sense that they can be made explicit by the so-called performative formula (Austin 1962: 103). According to Austin, one can say “I argue that” or “I warn you that” but not “I convince you that” or “I alarm you that”. Presumably, the idea was that a speech act type is conventional just if there exists a convention by which an utterance of a sentence of a certain kind ensures (if uptake is secured) that a speech act of that type is performed. Austin probably thought that in virtue of the performative formulas this condition is met by illocutionary but not by perlocutionary act types.
The more general claim that illocutionary force is correlated by convention with sentence type has been advocated by Dummett (1973 [1981: 302, 311]). On this view, it is a convention that declarative sentences are used for assertion, interrogative for questions and imperative for commands and requests. Similar views have been put forward by Searle (1969) and Kot’átko (1998), and the idea has been more recently defended by Kölbel (2010). According to Searle (1969: 38, 40), illocutionary acts are conventional, and the conventions in question govern the use of so-called force-indicating devices (Searle 1969: 64) specific to each language.
However, the view that illocutionary acts types are conventional in this sense has met with much opposition. Strawson (1964: 153–154) objected early on that ordinary illocutionary acts can be performed without relying on any convention to identify the force, for instance when using a declarative sentence like “The ice over there is very thin” for a warning. This kind of criticism, directed against Dummett, has later been reinforced by Robert J. Stainton (1996, 2006), stressing that in appropriate contexts, sub-sentential phrases like “John’s father” (pointing at a man) or “very fast” (looking at a car) can be used to make assertions, and gives linguistic arguments why not all such uses can be treated as cases of ellipsis (that is, as cases of leaving out parts of a well-formed sentence that speaker and hearer tacitly aware of). If Strawson and Stainton are right, convention isn’t necessary for making assertions.
Moreover, Davidson (1979, 1984) stressed that no conventional sign could work as a force indicator in this sense, since any conventional sign could be used (and would be used) in insincere utterances, where the corresponding force was missing, including cases of deception, jokes, impersonation and other theatrical performances. Basically the same point is made by Bach and Harnish (1979: 122–127). If Davidson, and Bach and Harnish are right, then conventions are also not sufficient (but see Kölbel 2010 for an argument against this view).
Williamson (1996, 239) has argued that that speech acts defined by constitutive rules (like assertion, in his own view) cannot be conventional. However, García-Carpintero (2019) has shown that this position is controversial. The situation is complicated by the fact that the general question of when a convention, or rule of any kind, is in force for a speaker, is substantial and complex (for more on the relation of assertion to convention, Green 2020a).
6. Normative Accounts, Hearer-Directed
Making an assertion has normative consequences. To characterize the social dimension of assertion, some authors focus on the distinctive responsibilities (“commitments”) that a communicator takes on when they claim that something is the case. We shall begin by reviewing two main ways to understand what assertoric commitment is.
A first view, that we may call “commitment as accountability”, focuses on the sanctions that speakers accept to face if what they claimed turns out to be false. This characterization of assertion was first developed by Peirce:
an act of assertion […] renders [the speaker] liable to the penalties of the social law (or, at any rate, those of the moral law) in case [the asserted proposition] should not be true, unless he has a definite and sufficient excuse. ([CP]: 2.315)
William P. Alston (2000: 55) presents the idea as follows: a speaker accepts responsibility for a content p being true iff the speaker
knowingly [takes] on the liability to ([lay] herself open to) blame (censure, reproach, being taken to task, being called to account), in case of not-p.
The notion of liability at play here is normative: when you assert that p, your audience acquires a (defeasible) right to criticize you if what you say is false. On this view, to assert is akin to signing a contract by means of which you take responsibility for something (what you said) being true, and accept to pay the consequences otherwise.
To emphasize this, some authors write that assertions guarantee (Peirce [CP]: 5.543; Watson 2004: 66), assure (Moran 2005, Hinchman 2013) or warrant (Carson 2006) that their content is true. However, it is not obvious that what assertions guarantee is that their content is true. It may be that an assertor instead accepts the responsibility for being justified in believing that one knows that the proposition is true (Green 2009), or that they know that the proposition is true.
An alternative way to characterize the responsibilities generated by assertions is to focus on what the speaker is expected to do, in virtue of making an assertion. Assertoric responsibility can be understood as a commitment to act in a certain way. When you make an assertion, you generate an expectation that you will behave in certain ways and not in others, especially in relation to what you will say next. To take a simple example, once you assert that p, it becomes inappropriate for you to make statements that blatantly contradict p (Hamblin 1970b), or to behave in ways that are sharply at odds with accepting p as true (Geurts 2019).
Furthermore, making an assertion commits you to respond to people’s questions and challenges in certain ways, as the conversation evolves. Brandom (1994: 173–175) emphasizes this, and argues that asserting achieves two different social results at the same time: (i) it commits the speaker to defend her claim in response to legitimate challenges; and relatedly (ii) authorizes the hearer to claim anything that follows from what the speaker asserted. MacFarlane (2003: 14 [Other Internet References]) summarizes (and revises) the underlying idea as follows:
To assert a sentence S (at a context U) is (inter alia) to commit oneself to providing adequate grounds for the truth of S (relative to U), in response to any appropriate challenge, or (when appropriate) to defer this responsibility to another asserter on whose testimony one is relying. One can escape this commitment only by withdrawing the assertion.
Several technical notions are at play here. One is the notion of challenge. To challenge an assertion is to question its veracity (or, at least, the speaker’s entitlement to make the assertion). An interlocutor can challenge an assertion by means of questions, such as (Q), or explicit denials, like (D):
- How do you know that?
- That’s not true!
Challenges like (Q) and (D) are usually appropriate, but not always. For instance, they may be inappropriate if in the conversaation it is already settled that what the speaker said is true. Asserting only commits you to respond to appropriate challenges – or else retract your assertion (on norms of retraction, see section 5.1.4.)
It is often argued that there is a whole family of speech acts (“assertives” or “representatives”) that “commit the speaker (to varying degrees) to something’s being the case” (Searle 1979: 12): illocutionary acts such as warning, denying, reminding, arguing, deducing, and so forth. These speech acts differ in the strength of the commitments they generate (e.g., swearing that p involves a stronger commitment than plain assertion), and in the conditions required for their felicitous performance (e.g., warning about p is only appropriate if p involves a risk or danger for the interlocutor). If a speech act involves a stronger commitment than assertion and/or extra felicity conditions, we can say that it is “stronger” than assertion. Searle and Vanderveken (1985) note that whenever you perform the stronger speech act, you have also made an assertion. For example, it would not be incorrect to report (34) or (35) by saying that the speaker has claimed, asserted, or affirmed that she is a certified forklift operator:
- I swear that I am a certified forklift operator.
- I warn you that I am a certified forklift operator.
If this is right, the term “assertion” does not designate a single illocutionary act, but rather a class of them: it denotes every speech act that is normatively stronger than (or equal to) assertion. This seems to lose track of a narrower meaning of the term “assertion”, one that sets plain assertions apart from stronger assertives. A strategy to rescue this narrow meaning while acknowledging assertion’s close ties with other assertives is found in Green (2013, 2017, 2020b: 8). Green, (like Brandom) understands commitment as a responsibility to defend your claim, and argues that an assertion commits you to a greater justificatory burden than weaker assertives, and lesser than stronger assertives (for an alternative, like-minded solution, Marsili 2015: 123–127). Labinaz (2018) outlines some difficulties for extending the Brandomian framework to assertive speech acts, and proposes to adopt an alternative approach to degrees of commitment that rather owes to the work of Austin (cf. also Labinaz & Sbisà 2014: §3).
We have seen that assertions differ from other speech acts in terms of the commitments that they engender. It has also been noted that assertions themselves can differ in terms of the commitments that they generate: not all assertions generate commitment of the same strength.
Using expressions like “I think that A is B”, “Probably/Perhaps A is B”, or “A is quite B”, a speaker can mitigate their assertion that A is B. And using intensifiers like “I know that A is B”, “Surely A is B”, or “A is absolutely B”, the speaker can strengthen or boost their assertion that A is B. These expressions modulate the degree of the commitment engendered by the assertions in which they occur: they can be used to undertake more or less responsibility towards the content of the assertion, and more generally to modulate the force and of the resulting speech act.
The commitments generated by assertions have often been compared to those generated by promises. For instance, by saying (36) to a friend, a speaker will typically commit herself to calling the repair shop at 8.
- I promise to call the repair at 8.
In a standard context, as a result of uttering (36), both the speaker and the addressee will regard the speaker as having incurred an obligation to the addressee.
In the literature, the standard view is that assertions and promises generate commitments of different kinds, so that they belong to different families (e.g., Searle 1969, 1979). The relation between asserting and promising is discussed in detail in Watson (2004), who introduces a distinction between primary and secondary commitments. Assertions and promises differ in the primary commitments that they generate. When you promise to φ, your primary commitment is to (intend to) act so as to make φ happen. By contrast, when you assert that p, your primary commitment is to facts that are independent of your actions: namely, for Watson, the defensibility of p (Watson 2004: 68). Furthermore, both assertions and promises also involve a secondary commitment to act in certain ways “if one is queried or if things go wrong” (2004: 67). The speaker’s commitment to defend the assertion if challenged is on this view a secondary commitment, that follows from the primary one (2004: 70).
Some authors maintain a stronger connection between promising and asserting. Marsili (2016) argues that promising that you will φ “illocutionary entails” asserting that you will φ. The idea is that promises behave like the “strong assertives” discussed above (swearing, confessing, guaranteeing, etc.), whose performance commits the speaker to having made an assertion. For instance, if Pepa utters (36), it would be appropriate to say that Pepa has asserted, affirmed or claimed that she will call the repair shop. And if Pepa does not believe that she will call the repair shop, it would be appropriate to say that Pepa has lied. In this sense, promising that you will do something entails asserting that you will do it.
Hawley (2019) also draws a strong connection between asserting and promises, but in the opposite direction: she analyses assertion in terms of promising (cf. also Carson 2006). Hawley suggests that whenever you make an assertion about p, you also promise to speak truthfully as to whether p. This means that whenever you assert, your promise to speak truthfully is simultaneously made and either fulfilled or broken (depending on whether you are speaking truthfully or not). However, this view has trouble explaining an important difference between asserting and promising: assertions can be mitigated (“Maybe I will do it” is perfectly fine) but promises cannot (“I promise that maybe I will do it” is not a genuine promise).
Commitment-making is central to some “mixed” accounts of assertion—that is, accounts that incorporate insights from different theories of assertion. For Peirce, commitment is central to assertion, but not alone in characterizing it. In his view, asserting also involves belief-expression: it “consists in the furnishing of evidence by the speaker to the hearer that the speaker believes something” (Peirce [CP]: 2.335). Furthermore, for Peirce assertion is necessarily accompanied by an intention to convince the hearer: “every assertion involves an effort to make the intended interpreter believe what is asserted” (Peirce [CP]: 5.547). In short, Peirce’s view is that in asserting that p, you attempt to convince your audience that p is true by providing them with evidence that you believe that p, thereby becoming committed to (i.e., accountable for) the truth of p.
Another mixed account is defended by Searle (1969) (cf. also Searle 1975b: 322 and Searle & Vanderveken 1985). Searle’s characterization of assertion varies slightly throughout his writings, but the central idea is that assertion can be identified on the basis of its distinctive rules—the rules for uttering an assertion “successfully” and “non-defectively” (i.e., felicitously). They are presented as rules for the use of force-indicating devices (Searle 1969: 62–4). The rules can be summarized as follows. Here S is the speaker and H the hearer:
- The propositional content rule: what is to be expressed is any proposition p
- First preparatory rule: S has evidence (reasons etc.) for the truth of p.
- Second preparatory rule: It is not obvious to both S and H that H knows (does not need to be reminded of, etc.) p.
- Sincerity rule: S believes p.
- Constitutive rule: Counts as an undertaking to the effect that p represents an actual state of affairs.
The fifth rule is the crucial one, and is held to be constitutive of assertion. Searle contrasts constitutive rules with regulative rules. Constitutive rules, according to Searle, are like definitions: they define what it is to engage in a certain activity: for instance, “attacking the king in such a way that no move will leave it unattacked counts as checkmate” (Searle 1969: 33).
Searle seems to adopt a notion of “commitment” that involves both a responsibility to respond to challenges (à la Brandom) and a liability to sanctions (à la Peirce): the assertor is expected to “be able to provide reasons for the original statement […] and can be held publicly responsible if it turns out to be false” (Searle 2010: 82). Like Peirce, also Searle (1969: 65) integrates commitment with belief-expression: the speaker expresses the state required by the sincerity rule, i.e., in the case of assertion, whose sincerity rule is (4), the speaker expresses a belief. Finally, the speaker implies that the preparatory conditions are met—so that Searle’s view has the odd consequence that in asserting p, you imply that p is not obviously true.
A third “mixed” account is defended by Green (1999, 2000, 2007, 2013, 2017, 2020a). Green distinguishes three different normative notions in terms of which assertions (and other assertive speech acts) can be characterized:
The first component, fidelity, tracks commitment: one’s responsibility to respond to legitimate challenges. More specifically, for Green, being assertorically committed to p means being responsible to provide “strong justification if challenged” (2017). Here “strong” is used in contrast to weaker assertives, like conjectures, for performing which is sufficient to be able to provide some (non-conclusive) justification if challenged.
The second component is liability to error:
one who asserts that P is liable to be right or wrong on the issue of P’s truth exactly as P turns out to be true or false. (2020a: 350)
This is a feature that assertion has in common with weaker assertives: also in guessing or hypothesizing that p, you may be right or wrong depending on whether p is actually true. This relates to Dummett’s idea that “an assertion is a kind of gamble that the speaker will not be proved wrong” (1976: 84).
The third component, frankness, has to do with sincerity: “assertion is sincere just in case the speaker believes the content she has asserted” (Green 2020a: 350). This requirement sets assertion aside from other assertives (such as educated guesses and conjectures) that do not require belief for sincere performance (but rather, e.g., some reasons to think the content true).
A full account of assertion has to provide necessary and sufficient conditions for asserting. But is commitment to what you say sufficient for asserting? That is, if you say that p and thereby also commit to the truth of p, does it follow that you have asserted that p? Pagin (2004) offers a negative response. The reason is that one can construct an utterance type that isn’t assertoric, but that would be assertoric according to envisaged sufficiency view. A simple example is given by
- I hereby commit myself to the truth of the proposition that there are black swans.
Whoever utters (37) felicitously incurs a commitment to the truth of the proposition that there are black swans. However, intuitively (37) would not be an assertion that there are black swans; at most, it is a declaration of the speaker’s intent to be committed to that proposition. What is said here does not entail that there are black swans (it may be accurate even if there are no black swans). If this is right, then incurring a commitment is not sufficient for asserting. This objection puts pressure on any “hearer-directed” account, including all the ones discussed in section 4, because parallel constructions can be derived from any hearer-directed view; for instance (against belief-expression views) by letting the speaker declare that she is representing herself as believing a given proposition.
Some authors have questioned whether this test really undermines commitment accounts of assertion (and social accounts more generally). Pegan (2009) argues that the counterexamples can be blocked by carefully amending the theory; see Pagin (2009) for a response. MacFarlane (2011) and García-Carpintero (2013) suggest that if we distinguish between what is said and what is asserted, we can regard (37) as an assertion that all swans are black. Marsili & Green (2021) argue that this sort of test is unreliable, questioning some key assumptions needed for (37) to work as a counterexample. They acknowledge, nonetheless, that assertions are not fully reducible to their social effects.
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Other Internet Resources
- MacFarlane, John, 2003, “Epistemic Modalities and Relative Truth”, unpublished manuscript.
- Philpapers Bibliography on assertion, edited by Ofra Magidor, Oxford University.
- Philpapers bibliography on the Norms of Assertion, edited by Matthew A. Benton, Seattle Pacific University.
- NDPR review of Jary’s book Assertion, by Peter Pagin.
- NDPR review of Goldberg’s book Assertion, by Brian Montgomery.
- NDPR review of Brown and Cappelen’s edited volume Assertion, by Mikhail Kissine.