Supplement to Assertion

Which Kind of Norm?

In this supplementary note, we present some alternative views about which kind of norm governs assertion, exploring some objections to the key assumptions made by standard accounts. In the discussion below we first report each assumption (as a reminder for the reader), and then provide a critical discussion of it.

Specificity: N applies specifically to assertion: only assertions are subject to N.
Directness: Assertions are subject to N directly, qua assertions.

Against Specificity and Directness, some authors construe the norm of assertion as a particular instance of a more general norm with a wider scope of application: for instance, a norm regulating all practical reasoning (i.e., reasoning that motivates practical action, of which assertion is a particular case). On this “commonality view”, N is not specific to assertion, but to another, more general action-type A, of which assertion represent a particular instance (Hawthorne 2004; Stanley 2005; Hawthorne & Stanley 2008; Smithies 2012; Montminy 2013b; see also Fantl & McGrath 2009). A compelling case against commonality is made in Brown (2012), McKenna (2013), and Gerken (2014) (although Gerken defends a weaker version, structural commonality); for a review, see Gerken and Petersen (2020). An alternative route is explored by Brogaard (2014), who derives KNA from a more general norm of intellectual flourishing. Other derivation strategies are explored in Douven (2006) and Smithies (2012).

Another way to challenge Specificity is to hold that there are other speech acts that are subject to the same norm N. Marsili (2015) argues that, if N regulates assertion, then it’s plausible that N will also regulate every speech act whose sincerity conditions are stronger than (or equivalent to) those of assertions (in Searle & Vanderveken 1985’s sense)—such as swearing, warning, confessing, denying, admitting, and so forth. Consider

I ate all your biscuits.
I admit that I ate all your biscuits.
I swear that I ate all your biscuits.
I warn you that I ate all your biscuits.

The suggestion is that if (1a) must meet the epistemic standards set by N, so must (1b), (1c), and (1d).

Uniqueness: There is only one norm of assertion: assertion is only subject to N
Indirectness: Assertions are subject to other normative standards, but only indirectly (not in virtue of the fact that they are assertions).

Uniqueness is often dropped in the literature. As DeRose (2002: fn 15) points out, (A2) is “little more than an item of faith for Williamson, with no justification offered other than that a simple account consisting of such a single rule would be ‘theoretically satisfying’ ”. For this reason, several authors have explicitly taken a stance against this assumption (Brown 2008; Carter & Gordon 2011; Gerken 2014; McKenna 2015; Carter 2017; Marsili forthcoming-a).

Others have advanced positive proposals that are in tension with Uniqueness, suggesting that different standards of assertability apply in different contexts. This line has been taken by several authors (cf. DeRose 2002; Stone 2007; Levin 2008; Gerken 2012, 2014, 2017; Goldberg 2015: chs 10–11; McKinnon 2015).

Some of these accounts hold that different norms apply in different contexts, while others postulate a single context sensitive norm, according to which the standard of acceptability depends on the context (in some contexts, knowledge is required; in others, something less demanding is enough, such as justified belief). Greenough (2011) takes this line even further by proposing norm-relativism: what norm is relevant for an assertion in a context is relative to a perspective. Carter and Gordon (2011) reject altogether a “quantitative view” of the epistemic support needed for asserting, to which they prefer a “qualitative view”, according to which different assertions can be subject to radically different kinds of epistemic standards (e.g., understanding something vs knowing it).

A question arises about these contextual views. If the speech act type is individuated by the norm governing it, and norms of utterances vary between contexts, is it then still the case that one and the same (illocutionary) speech act type is performed across contexts? One who has denied this is John Turri (2010). Reviving an influential view (cf. Searle & Vanderveken 1985: 98–99), Turri suggests a class of “alethic” speech acts, including conjecturing, asserting, and guaranteeing. The first is weaker and the third stronger than assertion. They are ranked on a so-called “credibility index” (2010: 85), depending on what degree of credibility is required by the speech act type. In contexts with different demands on credibility, different speech acts are performed. For assertion itself, the standard is invariant: it is simply knowledge.

A more radical conclusion has been drawn by Herman Cappelen (2011, 2020). According to Cappelen, the context-sensitivity of our normative expectations suggests that assertion as a speech act type doesn’t exist. The term “assertion” fails to pick out an act-type that we engage in, and it is not a category we need in order to explain any significant component of our linguistic practice (2011: 21). From similar considerations, Greenberg (forthcoming) draws a weaker conclusion: that there is no suis-generis norm of assertion (just norms of actions that apply also to assertion).

Individuation: The condition of N uniquely identifies assertion: assertion is the only speech act that is only subject to N.

Recall that accepting Individuation means that we can define assertion as follows:

S asserts that p iff in saying p, S is subject to the obligation imposed by N.

Against Individuation, MacFarlane (2011: 86) and Maitra (2011: 282) have questioned whether a definition of this sort really explains what an assertion is. (D) does not really tell us what it is to assert something, or what kind of action it is. It specifies which specific obligation one incurs when they token this action-type, but does not tell us what that action-type is, or what it is to token it.

Accepting Individuation entails accepting both (A1) (Specificity) and (A2) (Uniqueness): it is therefore conditional on their validity. Since both assumptions are contested, this means that (A3) rests on shaky grounds (cf. MacFarlane 2011: 86; Marsili forthcoming-a: §6). If the objections to (A1) are sound, you can be subject to N even if you are not asserting: the sufficiency leg of (D) does not hold. And if the objections to (A4) (below) are sound, you do not need to be subject to N to assert: the necessity leg of (D) does not hold.

Essentiality: Being subject to N is essential to assertion as an action type: Necessarily, assertion is subject to N.

Rescorla (2007) argues that a norm of truthfulness cannot be essential to assertion in this sense. García-Carpintero (2019a) urges us to distinguish between the claim that N is essential to assertion in this sense, but not actually in force (and the action-type not instantiated in the community) and the claim that N is essential to assertion and actually in force (for the idea of a norm’s being in force, see below). According to Dummett (1976: 89), it is a matter of convention and personal strategy what counts as warranting assertion; assertability does not individuate the speech act type.

Permissibility: N establishes a condition for permissible assertion: p is permissible to assert only if p meets C.

Some authors have proposed to relax Permissibility, typically to defend KNA from the objection that it is too demanding (cf. section 5.1.4). Adler (2002: 235, 275) distinguishes between proper assertions, requiring knowledge, and warranted assertions, requiring full belief. Mehta (2016) has argued that KNA would be more plausible if understood as setting a standard for a successful assertion, rather than a permissible one. In a similar spirit, Turri (2014) argues that KNA sets the standard for asserting well, rather than permissibly. On this view (abandoned by Turri in subsequent work), knowledge is “supererogatory”: it exceeds what assertion requires (just rational belief) but it also sets the optimal epistemic ground to make an assertion. Similar points have been made about the role of truth in determining assertability. Marsili (2018) argues that the data accommodated by factive norms (KNA, TNA) would be better explained by a view that takes truth to be the aim (standard for success), rather than the rule (standard for permissibility) of assertion.

Different formal interpretations of Permissibility in deontic logic have been offered by Schlöder (2018), McIntosh (2020) and Rosenkranz (forthcoming).

Constitutivity: N is the constitutive norm of assertion.

There is substantial (and often unacknowledged) disagreement about what constitutivity amounts to. A reason for this divergence of interpretations is that there is a pre-existing tradition in speech act theory (and social ontology) that opposes “constitutive rules” to “regulative rules”. According to a fairly common interpretation of this distinction (e.g., Midgley 1959, Hindriks 2007), constitutive rules are like definitions: they specify descriptive (non-prescriptive) requirements that a brute entity must meet in order to constitute another (socially constituted) entity (e.g., if one extracts Excalibur, one counts as the King); since these rules are non-prescriptive definitions, they cannot be violated (at most, they can fail to be enforced). Regulative rules, by contrast, are said to impose prescriptions (e.g., “If you drive, you must keep the right”) that can be violated in the strict sense of the word. Since (by (A5)) N imposes a genuine prescription that can be violated, on this understanding of the constitutive/regulative opposition N is regulative, rather than constitutive (cf. Hindriks 2007: 396; Maitra 2011; McCammon 2014: 137–9; Marsili forthcoming-a: §5).

This ambiguity generates substantial disagreement about what (A6) is supposed to mean: some authors (Rescorla 2007: 253; 2009a: 99; Turri 2013: 281) take N to be “constitutive” in the received speech-act theoretic sense. Others challenge the traditional reception of the constitutive-regulative distinction, in favor of one that takes some (García-Carpintero 2019a, forthcoming) or all (Pagin 1987; Reiland 2020) constitutive rules to be prescriptive. Marsili (forthcoming-a) identifies some problems for both interpretations.

The prevalent interpretation of (A6) takes it to denote the conjunction of Essence (A4) and Individuation (A3)—which, in turn, entails the truth of Specificity (A1) and Uniqueness (A2). This interpretation of what “constitutive” means better tracks Williamson’s foundational discussion of N, but so interpreted (A6) is a very strong claim. Unsurprisingly, it is highly contested.

The Constitutivity assumption is usually defended in conjunction with an analogy with games (Williamson 1996: 489). Just as chess it is constituted by its rules, it is said, assertion is constituted by its norm. Usually, this assumption is followed by the consideration that, in order to play a game, one must display a reasonable amount of sensitivity to its rules. For instance, if you move pawns diagonally on the chessboard as if they were bishops, and your opponent does not object to it, it seems that you are not really playing chess.

Against the constitutivity claim, Pagin (2011) has argued that insofar as there are norms of assertion, their status among speakers do not much resemble rules of games. Firstly, players of a game rarely disagree about what the rules of the game are. If there is a disagreement, it is settled either by appeal to a generally recognized authority, such as a rule-book, or by stipulation, if it concerns a new case to be covered by rules. We don’t find players appealing to intuition or the oddity of certain conversational patterns to convince each other of claims about what the rules are, as in the norms-of-assertion debate.

Moreover, as stressed in Pagin (2016b), if speakers are assumed to know what speech act they perform by knowing which norms govern it, and they do perform the same speech act—assertion—then they should also agree about what the norms are. The debate over assertion shows that this is not the case. It is not just disagreement over general principles, but also disagreement about individual cases (e.g., over unlucky assertions; see section 5.1.4 on objections against (KNA)). Mona Simion and Christoph Kelp (2020: 61–53) have objected that disagreement among philosophers is only disagreement over general principles, and that, pace Pagin, speakers actually agree over individual cases. In this objection, however, Simion and Kelp only take into account philosophical agreement over intuitions about particular cases, and pass silence on the disagreement about their evidential weight, and about whether these intuitions can be explained away (e.g. by appeal to the distinction between primary and secondary propriety, cf. section 5.1.4). Once the full picture is taken into consideration, it seems hard to deny that philosophers strongly disagree about the norm governing assertion.

Another problem with the game analogy concerns being in force. For a constituted game action type, like castling in chess, to be performable at all, the rules of chess must by some decision be in force; if the rules of chess are not in force for a person at a particular time, her moving two pieces of wood at that time does not constitute castling (cf. Pagin 1987: ch. 3; Glüer & Pagin 1998). But this again seems very unlike the relation of norms to assertion. It does not seem that an utterance is recognizable as an assertion in virtue of a decision to regard it as subject to this or that norm. Rather, it seems that recognizing an utterance as an assertion precedes seeing it as subject to evaluation (cf. MacFarlane 2011: 85–87).

The question about being in force is fundamental: in virtue of what is a norm of assertion in force for a speaker or a speech community, if it is in force? Is it because of a collective acceptance? If so, it must be tacit, and, because of the wide disagreement among theorists, usually not accessible to introspection. Is it because of some metaphysical fact that assertions are essentially governed by this or that norm whenever they are performed, and whatever speakers think about it? That would indeed make sense of the debate, since it can be construed as an investigation into normative reality. But there remains a question of what influence normative reality has on linguistic practice. Probably none (or at best a pretty haphazard one, judging from the disagreement). Is it perhaps something internal to each speaker, and not intersubjectively shared? That can explain the differences among the participants in the debate. But it is hard to square this with the assumption that we share a practice of making and understanding assertions. If you and I accept different norms, then I simply misapply my norm to your utterances when interpreting them, and consequently systematically misinterpret your utterances. But for all we can tell, this does not generally seem to happen. This remains a challenge to the norm approach (cf. Pagin 1987, 2016b; García-Carpintero 2019a).

Copyright © 2021 by
Peter Pagin <>
Neri Marsili <>

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