John Austin

First published Sat Feb 24, 2001; substantive revision Fri Jan 14, 2022

John Austin is considered by many to be the creator of the school of analytical jurisprudence, as well as, more specifically, the approach to law known as “legal positivism.” Austin’s particular command theory of law has been subject to pervasive criticism, but its simplicity gives it an evocative power that continues to attract adherents.

1. Life

John Austin’s life (1790–1859) was filled with disappointment and unfulfilled expectations. His influential friends (who included Jeremy Bentham, James Mill, John Stuart Mill and Thomas Carlyle) were impressed by his intellect and his conversation, and predicted he would go far. However, in public dealings, Austin’s nervous disposition, shaky health, tendency towards melancholy, and perfectionism combined to end quickly careers at the Bar, in academia, and in government service (Hamburger 1985, 1992).

Austin was born to a Suffolk merchant family, and served briefly in the military before beginning his legal training. He was called to the Bar in 1818, but he took on few cases, and quit the practice of law in 1825. Austin shortly thereafter obtained an appointment to the first Chair of Jurisprudence at the recently established University of London. He prepared for his lectures by study in Bonn, and evidence of the influence of continental legal and political ideas can be found scattered throughout Austin’s writings. Commentators have found evidence in Austin’s writings of the German Pandectist treatment of Roman Law, in particular, its approach to law as something that is, or should be, systematic and coherent (Schwarz 1934; Stein 1988: pp. 223–229, 238–244; Lobban 1991: pp. 223–256, Lobban 2013).

Lectures from the course he gave were eventually published in 1832 as “Province of Jurisprudence Determined” (Austin 1832). However, attendance at his courses was small and getting smaller, and he gave his last lecture in 1833. A short-lived effort to give a similar course of lectures at the Inner Temple met the same result. Austin resigned his University of London Chair in 1835. He later briefly served on the Criminal Law Commission, and as a Royal Commissioner to Malta, but he never found either success or contentment. He did some occasional writing on political themes, but his plans for longer works never came to anything during his lifetime, due apparently to some combination of perfectionism, melancholy, and writer’s block. His changing views on moral, political, and legal matters also apparently hindered both the publication of a revised edition of “Province of Jurisprudence Determined,” and the completion of a longer project started when his views had been different.

(Some scholars have argued that Austin may have moved away from analytical jurisprudence (see below) towards something more approximating the historical jurisprudence school; cf. Hamburger 1985: pp. 178–91, arguing for Austin’s views having changed significantly, with Rumble 2013, arguing against that view.)

Much of whatever success Austin found during his life, and after, must be attributed to his wife Sarah, for her tireless support, both moral and economic (during the later years of their marriage, they lived primarily off her efforts as a translator and reviewer), and her work to publicize his writings after his death (including the publication of a more complete set of his Lectures on Jurisprudence) (Austin 1879). Credit should also be given to Austin’s influential friends, who not only helped him to secure many of the positions he held during his lifetime, but also gave important support for his writings after his death (Hamburger 1985: pp. 33, 197; Morison 1982: p. 17; Mill 1863).

Austin’s work was influential in the decades after his passing away (Rumble 2005); this influence was in part due to the restatement of is ideas by other thinkers, like T. E. Holland (Postema 2011: p. 4). E. C. Clark wrote in the late 19th century that Austin’s work “is undoubtedly forming a school of English jurists, possibly of English legislators also. It is the staple of jurisprudence in all our systems of legal education” (Clark 1883: pp. 4–5). A similar assessment is made by H.L.A. Hart, looking back nearly a century later: “within a few years of his death it was clear that his work had established the study of jurisprudence in England” (Hart 1955: p. xvi). As will be discussed, Austin’s influence can be seen at a number of levels, including the general level of how legal theory, and law generally, were taught (Stein 1988: pp. 238–244), and the use of an analytical approach in legal theory. At such levels, Austin’s impact is felt to this day. Hart could write that “Austin’s influence on the development of England of [Jurisprudence] has been greater than that of any other writer,” (Hart 1955: p. xvi) even while Austin’s particular command theory of law became almost friendless, and is today probably best known from Hart’s use of it (1958: 602–606, 2012: 18–25) as a foil for the elaboration of Hart’s own, more nuanced approach to legal theory. In recent decades, some theorists have revisited Austin’s command theory (and other works), offering new characterizations and defenses of his ideas (e.g., Morison 1982, Rumble 1985, see generally Freeman & Mindus 2013).

2. Analytical Jurisprudence and Legal Positivism

Early in his career, Austin came under the influence of Jeremy Bentham, and Bentham’s utilitarianism is evident (though with some differences) in the work for which Austin is best known today. On Austin’s reading of utilitarianism, Divine will is equated with Utilitarian principles: “The commands which God has revealed we must gather from the terms wherein they are promulg[ate]d. The command which he has not revealed, we must construe by the principle of utility” (Austin 1873: Lecture IV, p. 160; see also Austin 1832: Lecture II, p. 41). This particular reading of utilitarianism, however, has had little long-term influence, though it seems to have been the part of his work that received the most attention in his own day (Rumble 1995: p. xx). Some have also seen Austin as being one of the early advocates of “rule utilitarianism” (e.g., Austin 1832: Lecture II, p. 42, where Austin urges that we analyze not the utility of particular acts, but that of “class[es] of action”). Additionally, Austin early on shared many of the ideas of the Benthamite philosophical radicals; he was “a strong proponent of modern political economy, a believer in Hartleian metaphysics, and a most enthusiastic Malthusian” (Rumble 1985: pp. 16–17). Austin was to lose most of his “radical” inclinations as he grew older.

Austin’s importance to legal theory lies elsewhere—his theorizing about law was novel at four different levels of generality. First, he was arguably the first writer to approach the theory of law analytically (as contrasted with approaches to law more grounded in history or sociology, or arguments about law that were secondary to more general moral and political theories). Analytical jurisprudence emphasizes the analysis of key concepts, including “law,” “(legal) right,” “(legal) duty,” and “legal validity.” Though analytical jurisprudence has been challenged by some in recent years (e.g., Leiter 2007, Leiter and Etchemendy 2021, Postema 2021 [Other Internet Resources]), it remains the dominant approach to discussing the nature of law. Analytical jurisprudence, an approach to theorizing about law, has sometimes been confused with what the American legal realists (an influential group of theorists prominent in the early decades of the 20th century) called “legal formalism”—a narrow approach to how judges should decide cases. The American legal realists saw Austin in particular, and analytical jurisprudence in general, as their opponents in their critical and reform-minded efforts (e.g., Sebok 1998: pp. 65–69). In this, the realists were simply mistaken; unfortunately, it is a mistake that can still be found in some contemporary legal commentators (see Bix 1999, 903–919, for documentation).

Second, Austin’s work should be seen against a background where most English judges and commentators saw common-law reasoning (the incremental creation or modification of law through judicial resolution of particular disputes) as supreme, as declaring existing law, as discovering the requirements of “Reason,” as the immemorial wisdom of popular “custom.” Such (Anglo-American) theories about common law reasoning fit with a larger tradition of theorizing about law (which had strong roots in continental European thought—e.g., the historical jurisprudence of theorists like Karl Friedrich von Savigny (1975)): the idea that generally law did or should reflect community mores, “spirit,” or custom. In general, one might look at many of the theorists prior to Austin as exemplifying an approach that was more “community-oriented”—law as arising from societal values or needs, or expressive of societal customs or morality. By contrast, Austin’s is one of the first, and one of the most distinctive, theories that views law as being “imperium oriented”—viewing law as mostly the rules imposed from above from certain authorized (pedigreed) sources. More “top-down” theories of law, like that of Austin, better fit the more centralized governments (and the modern political theories about government) of modern times (Cotterrell 2003: pp. 21–77).

Third, within analytical jurisprudence, Austin was the first systematic exponent of a view of law known as “legal positivism.” Most of the important theoretical work on law prior to Austin had treated jurisprudence as though it were merely a branch of moral theory or political theory: asking how should the state govern? (and when were governments legitimate?), and under what circumstances did citizens have an obligation to obey the law? Austin specifically, and legal positivism generally, offered a quite different approach to law: as an object of “scientific” study (Austin 1879: pp. 1107–1108), dominated neither by prescription nor by moral evaluation. Subtle jurisprudential questions aside, Austin’s efforts to treat law systematically gained popularity in the late 19th century among English lawyers who wanted to approach their profession, and their professional training, in a more serious and rigorous manner (Hart 1955: pp. xvi–xviii; Cotterrell 2003: pp. 74–77; Stein 1988: pp. 231–244).

Legal positivism asserts (or assumes) that it is both possible and valuable to have a morally neutral descriptive (or “conceptual”—though this is not a term Austin used) theory of law. (The main competitor to legal positivism, in Austin’s day as in our own, has been natural law theory.) Legal positivism does not deny that moral and political criticism of legal systems is important, but insists that a descriptive or conceptual approach to law is valuable, both on its own terms and as a necessary prelude to criticism.

(The term “legal positivism” is sometimes used more broadly to include the position that we should construct or modify our concept of law to remove moral criteria of legal validity; or to include a prescription that moral values should not be used in judicial decision-making (Schauer 2010—see the Other Internet Resources). I do not think anything turns on whether the term is used more broadly or more narrowly, as long as it is clear which sense is being used. Additionally, while Schauer claims (2010) that Austin could be seen as supporting some of the views associated with the broader understanding of “legal positivism”, there is need for more evidence and argument before the point should be granted.)

There were theorists prior to Austin who arguably offered views similar to legal positivism or who at least foreshadowed legal positivism in some way. Among these would be Thomas Hobbes, with his amoral view of laws as the product of Leviathan (Hobbes 1996); David Hume, with his argument for separating “is” and “ought” (which has been taken by some as a sharp criticism for some forms of natural law theory, those views that purported to derive moral truths from statements about human nature, Hume 1739, Section 3.1.1, but see Chilovi and Wodak 2021, raising questions about the relevance of Hume’s views here for either natural law theory or legal positivism); and Jeremy Bentham, with his attacks on judicial lawmaking and on those commentators, like Sir William Blackstone, who justified such lawmaking with natural-law-like justifications (Bentham 1789).

Austin’s famous formulation of what could be called the “dogma” of legal positivism is as follows:

The existence of law is one thing; its merit or demerit is another. Whether it be or be not is one enquiry; whether it be or be not conformable to an assumed standard, is a different enquiry. A law, which actually exists, is a law, though we happen to dislike it, or though it vary from the text, by which we regulate our approbation and disapprobation. (Austin 1832: Lecture V, p. 157)

(While Austin saw himself as criticizing natural law theory, a view shared by most of the legal positivists who followed him, the extent to which the two schools disagree, and the location of their disagreement, remains a matter sharply contested (e.g., Finnis 2000a, 2000b.))

Andrew Halpin has argued (Halpin 2013) that Austin shaped the nature of modern analytical jurisprudence and legal positivism by his choice to exclude legal reasoning from his discussion of “jurisprudence.” A greater focus on legal reasoning, Halpin argues, would have made it harder to claim a clear separation of law “as it is” and law “as it ought to be.” Halpin points out that prominent later legal positivists have followed Austin, either in speaking little about legal reasoning (Hans Kelsen, and, to some extent, H. L. A. Hart), or speaking about the topic at length, but treating the issue as sharply separate from their theories of (the nature of) law.

Fourth, Austin’s version of legal positivism, a “command theory of law” (which will be detailed in the next section), was also, for a time, quite influential. Austin’s theory had similarities with views developed by Jeremy Bentham, whose theory could also be characterized as a “command theory.” Bentham, in a posthumously published work, defined law as an:

assemblage of signs declarative of a volition conceived or adopted by the sovereign in a state, concerning the conduct to be observed in a certain case by a certain person or class of persons, who in the case in question are or are supposed to be subject to his power: such volition trusting for its accomplishment to the expectation of certain events which it is intended such declaration should upon occasion be a means of bringing to pass, and the prospect of which it is intended should act as a motive upon those whose conduct is in question (Bentham 1970: p. 1).

However, Austin’s command theory was more influential than Bentham’s, because the latter’s jurisprudential writings did not appear in an even-roughly systematic form until well after Austin’s work had already been published, with Bentham’s most systematic discussion only appearing posthumously, late in the 20th century (Bentham 1970, 1996; Cotterrell 2003: p. 50).

3. Austin’s Views

Austin’s basic approach was to ascertain what can be said generally, but still with interest, about all laws. Austin’s analysis can be seen as either a paradigm of, or a caricature of, analytical philosophy, in that his discussions are dryly full of distinctions, but are thin in argument. The modern reader is forced to fill in much of the meta-theoretical, justificatory work, as it cannot be found in the text. Where Austin does articulate his methodology and objective, it is a fairly traditional one: he “endeavored to resolve a law (taken with the largest signification which can be given to that term properly) into the necessary and essential elements of which it is composed” (Austin 1832: Lecture V, p. 117).

As to what is the core nature of law, Austin’s answer is that laws (“properly so called”) are commands of a sovereign. He clarifies the concept of positive law (that is, man-made law) by analyzing the constituent concepts of his definition, and by distinguishing law from other concepts that are similar:

  • “Commands” involve an expressed wish that something be done, combined with a willingness and ability to impose “an evil” if that wish is not complied with.

  • Rules are general commands (applying generally to a class), as contrasted with specific or individual commands (“drink wine today” or “John Major must drink wine”).

  • Positive law consists of those commands laid down by a sovereign (or its agents), to be contrasted to other law-givers, like God’s general commands, and the general commands of an employer to an employee.

  • The “sovereign” is defined as a person (or determinate body of persons) who receives habitual obedience from the bulk of the population, but who does not habitually obey any other (earthly) person or institution. Austin thought that all independent political societies, by their nature, have a sovereign.

  • Positive law should also be contrasted with “laws by a close analogy” (which includes positive morality, laws of honor, international law, customary law, and constitutional law) and “laws by remote analogy” (e.g., the laws of physics).
    (Austin 1832: Lecture I).

Austin also included within “the province of jurisprudence” certain “exceptions,” items which did not fit his criteria but which should nonetheless be studied with other “laws properly so called”: repealing laws, declarative laws, and “imperfect laws”—laws prescribing action but without sanctions (a concept Austin ascribes to “Roman [law] jurists”) (Austin 1832: Lecture I, p. 36).

In the criteria set out above, Austin succeeded in delimiting law and legal rules from religion, morality, convention, and custom. However, also excluded from “the province of jurisprudence” were customary law (except to the extent that the sovereign had, directly or indirectly, adopted such customs as law), public international law, and parts of constitutional law. (These exclusions alone would make Austin’s theory problematic for most modern readers.)

Within Austin’s approach, whether something is or is not “law” depends on which people have done what: the question turns on an empirical investigation, and it is a matter mostly of power, not of morality. Of course, Austin is not arguing that law should not be moral, nor is he implying that it rarely is. Austin is not playing the nihilist or the skeptic. He is merely pointing out that there is much that is law that is not moral, and what makes something law does nothing to guarantee its moral value. “The most pernicious laws, and therefore those which are most opposed to the will of God, have been and are continually enforced as laws by judicial tribunals” (Austin 1832: Lecture V, p. 158).

In contrast to his mentor Bentham, Austin, in his early lectures, accepted judicial lawmaking as “highly beneficial and even absolutely necessary” (Austin, 1832: Lecture V, p. 163). Nor did Austin find any difficulty incorporating judicial lawmaking into his command theory: he characterized that form of lawmaking, along with the occasional legal/judicial recognition of customs by judges, as the “tacit commands” of the sovereign, the sovereign’s affirming the “orders” by its acquiescence (Austin 1832: Lecture 1, pp. 35–36). It should be noted, however, that one of Austin’s later lectures listed the many problems that can come with judicial legislation, and recommended codification of the law instead (Austin 1879: vol. 2, Lecture XXXIX, pp. 669–704).

4. Criticisms

As many readers come to Austin’s theory mostly through its criticism by other writers (prominently, that of H.L.A. Hart; see also Kelsen 1941: 54–66), the weaknesses of the theory are almost better known than the theory itself:

First, in many societies, it is hard to identify a “sovereign” in Austin’s sense of the word (a difficulty Austin himself experienced, when he was forced to describe the British “sovereign” awkwardly as the combination of the King, the House of Lords, and all the electors of the House of Commons). Additionally, a focus on a “sovereign” makes it difficult to explain the continuity of legal systems: a new ruler will not come in with the kind of “habit of obedience” that Austin sets as a criterion for a system’s rule-maker.

A few responses are available to those who would defend Austin. First, some commentators have argued that Austin is here misunderstood, in that he always meant “by the sovereign the office or institution which embodies supreme authority; never the individuals who happen to hold that office or embody that institution at any given time” (Cotterrell 2003: p. 63, footnote omitted); there are certainly parts of Austin’s lectures that support this reading (e.g., Austin 1832: Lecture V, pp. 128–29; Lecture VI, p. 218).

Secondly, one could argue (see Harris 1977) that the sovereign is best understood as a constructive metaphor: that law should be viewed as if it reflected the view of a single will (a similar view, that law should be interpreted as if it derived from a single will, can be found in Ronald Dworkin’s work (1986: pp. 176–190)).

Thirdly, one could argue that Austin’s reference to a sovereign whom others are in the habit of obeying but who is not in the habit of obeying anyone else, captures what a “realist” or “cynic” would call a basic fact of political life. There is, the claim goes, entities or factions in society that are not effectively constrained, or could act in an unconstrained way if they so chose. For one type of example, one could point out that if there was a sufficiently large and persistent majority among the United States electorate, nothing could contain them: they could elect Presidents and legislators who would amend the Constitution and, through those same officials, appoint judges who would interpret the (revised or original) Constitution in a way amenable to their interests. A different sort of example (and some would say that there are recent real-life examples of this type) would be a President who ignored the constraints of statutory law, constitutional law, and international treaty commitments, while the public and other officials lacked the will or the means to hold that President to the legal norms that purported to constrain his or her actions.

As regards Austin’s “command” model, it seems to fit some aspects of law poorly (e.g., rules which grant powers to officials and to private citizens—of the latter, the rules for making wills, trusts, and contracts are examples), while excluding other matters (e.g., international law) which we are not inclined to exclude from the category “law.”

More generally, it seems more distorting than enlightening to reduce all legal rules to one type. For example, rules that empower people to make wills and contracts perhaps can be re-characterized as part of a long chain of reasoning for eventually imposing a sanction (Austin spoke in this context of the sanction of “nullity” (Austin 1879: 522, 523, 923)) on those who fail to comply with the relevant provisions. However, such a re-characterization misses the basic purpose of those sorts of laws—they are arguably about granting power and autonomy, not punishing wrongdoing.

A different criticism of Austin’s command theory is that a theory which portrays law solely in terms of power fails to distinguish rules of terror from forms of governance sufficiently just that they are accepted as legitimate (or at least as reasons for action) by their own citizens.

Finally, one might note that the constitutive rules that determine who the legal officials are and what procedures must be followed in creating new legal rules, “are not commands habitually obeyed, nor can they be expressed as habits of obedience to persons” (Hart 1958: p. 603).

Austin was aware of some of these lines of attack, and had responses ready; it is another matter whether his responses were adequate. It should also be noted that Austin’s work shows a silence on questions of methodology, though this may be forgivable, given the early stage of jurisprudence. As discussed in an earlier section, in many ways, Austin was blazing a new path. On matters of methodology, later commentators on Austin’s work have had difficulty determining whether he is best understood as making empirical claims about the law or conceptual claims; elements of each sort of approach can be found in his writings (Lobban 1991: pp. 224–225; Cotterrell 2003: pp. 81–83).

When H.L.A. Hart revived legal positivism in the middle of the 20th century (Hart 1958, 2012), he did it by criticizing and building on Austin’s theory: for example, Hart’s theory did not try to reduce all legal rules to one kind of rule, but emphasized the varying types and functions of legal rules; and Hart’s theory, grounded partly on the distinction between “obligation” and “being obliged,” was built around the fact that some participants within legal systems “accepted” the legal rules as reasons for action, above and beyond the fear of sanctions. Hart’s “hermeneutic” approach, building on the “internal point of view” of participants who accepted the legal system, diverged sharply from Austin’s approach to law.

5. A Revisionist View?

Some modern commentators appreciate in Austin elements that were probably not foremost in his mind (or that of his contemporary readers). For example, one occasionally sees Austin portrayed as the first “realist”: in contrast both to the theorists that came before Austin and to some modern writers on law, Austin is seen as having a keener sense of the connection of law and power, and the importance of keeping that connection at the forefront of analysis (cf. Cotterrell 2003: pp. 49–77). One commentator wrote:

Austin’s theory is not a theory of the Rule of Law: of government subject to law. It is a theory of the ‘rule of men’: of government using law as an instrument of power. Such a view may be considered realistic or merely cynical. But it is, in its broad outlines, essentially coherent. (Cotterrell 2003: p. 70)

When circumstances seem to warrant a more critical, skeptical or cynical approach to law and government, Austin’s equation of law and force will be attractive—however distant such a reading may be from Austin’s own liberal-utilitarian views at the time of his writing, or his more conservative political views later in his life (Hamburger, 1985).


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