Law and Language

First published Thu Dec 5, 2002; substantive revision Tue Dec 21, 2021

The use of language is crucial to any legal system, not only in the same way that it is crucial to politics in general, but also in two special respects. Lawmakers characteristically use language to make law, and law must provide for the authoritative resolution of disputes over the effects of that use of language. Political philosophers are not generally preoccupied with questions in the philosophy of language. But legal philosophers are political philosophers with a specialization that gives language (and philosophy of language) a special importance.[1]

Philosophy of law can gain from a good philosophical account of the meaning and use of language, and from a good philosophical account of the institutionalized resolution of disputes over language. Philosophy of language can gain from studying the stress-testing of language in legal regulation and dispute resolution. And philosophers of language can gain from the reminder that their task is not only to account for what people share in virtue of the mastery of a language; they also need to account for the possibility of disagreements over the meaning and use of language, and for the possibility that there might be good reason for resolving those disagreements in one way rather than another.

After a brief historical note on the linguistic preoccupations of legal philosophers in section 1, section 2 outlines the relation between the law of a jurisdiction and the language with which law can be made and in which it can be expressed. Section 3 surveys philosophical work on the nature of law that rejects a preconception that you can find in this introduction and in sections 1 and 2: that law can be made by the use of language. Section 4 addresses the implications for legal philosophy of the widespread use of evaluative language in law, and section 5 addresses the implications for legal philosophy of the widespread use of vague language in law. Section 6 concludes with an assessment of philosophers’ efforts to use insights from the philosophy of language to address problems of the nature of law.

1. Historical introduction

Systematic efforts to use philosophical insights about language to solve problems in philosophy of law are relatively recent. Jeremy Bentham was perhaps the first to make a deliberate attempt at it. He developed a radically empiricist theory of the meaning of words, which supported his utilitarianism and his legal theory.

Bentham wanted to abandon what he considered to be a nonsensical mythology of natural rights and duties—that is, moral rights and duties that people have regardless of whether anyone is prepared to enforce them. He wanted, instead, to explain the nature of law by reference to ‘sensible’ phenomena (Bentham 1782, 251–2, 283n.). Linguistic acts struck him as respectably empirical phenomena, and he made them an essential element of his theory of law. He based his ‘legal positivism’ on his claims about the meaning and use of words.

Language had not been especially important to the natural law theorists whose views Bentham despised. They accounted for a law as a certain sort of reason. From that perspective, philosophy of language has no special role in explaining the nature of law. Philosophy of language cannot explain the nature of reasons; it has the ancillary role of explaining the possibility of communicating reasons and the possibility of creating reasons by the use of language (so that natural law theorists have the same reason as others to seek a good account of the legal effects of the use of language, and of the role of courts in resolving disputes over it). Bentham, by contrast, fastened on the ‘sensible’ phenomenon of a perceptible, intelligible linguistic act for his purpose of expounding the nature of law by reference to empirical phenomena.

Bentham seems to have thought of the meaning of a word in causal terms, as its capacity to act on a subject by raising an image of perceptible substances or emotions for which, he said, the word was a name. ‘By these general terms or names, things and persons, acts, and so forth are brought to view…’ (Bentham 1782, 82; see also Bentham 1776, 28, 108n). Words that do not bring to view such perceptible things have no meaning, on his theory, except insofar as they can be expounded by ‘paraphrasis’—Bentham’s method of translating whole sentences in which those words are used into sentences that do raise images of perceptible things.

To many legal theorists that approach appeared, as H.L.A. Hart put it, ‘as a revelation, bringing down to earth an elusive notion and restating it in the same clear, hard, empirical terms as are used in science’ (Hart 2012, 84). The theory supported not only Bentham’s empiricism, but also his utilitarianism, because it privileged what he viewed as the ultimate sensible (and therefore intelligible) ‘affections’: the pain and pleasure that utilitarianism treats as the basis for a theory of value and of morality.

In his legal theory, this view of language became the basis of an innovative account of law as the expression of the will of a sovereign in a political community. Bentham stated it as follows:

A law may be defined as an assemblage of signs declarative of a volition conceived or adopted by the sovereign in a state, concerning the conduct to be observed in a certain case by a certain person or class of persons, who in the case in question are or are supposed to be subject to his power… (Bentham 1782, 1)

He went on to explain that the signification of volition by such an assemblage of signs must be backed by ‘motives’ of pain or pleasure offered by the sovereign.

Two features of this theory tie the philosophy of law to the philosophy of language. One feature is methodological, and the other is substantive. First, Bentham proposes his theory as a definition of the term a law (see section 6.1 below, on ‘Definition as a methodology in philosophy of law’). Secondly, he defines a law as a particular kind of assemblage of signs (see section 2.1 below, on ‘Law and Signs’). In Bentham’s view, a law is an assemblage of signs, and legal philosophy is a form of philosophy of language. The legal theorist has a linguistic task of defining the terms (especially law, but others as well) of legal discourse.

That, in brief, is the apogee of the use of philosophy of language in philosophy of law. Bentham was ahead of his time. His theory of the meaning and use of words anticipated various trends in twentieth-century philosophy of language (including Frege’s and Wittgenstein’s ‘context principle’, some views of logical positivists, and the development of speech act theory). It was H.L.A.Hart who, in the 1950s and 1960s, made a concerted effort to use twentieth-century developments in philosophy of language to ‘elucidate’ the nature of law. He did so with an enthusiasm for the work of Wittgenstein, and also of the Oxford philosophers J.L.Austin and Paul Grice. So Hart had some advantages over Bentham. Wittgenstein’s Philosophical Investigations had been directed against the view that a word’s meaning is the thing for which it stands as a name. That was one of the misconceptions that distorted Bentham’s theory of the meaning of words: he thought that a word like ‘right’ had to be a name for an entity, and that since no such entity could be sensed, the word was a name for a ‘fictitious entity’ (Bentham 1782, 251). And J.L.Austin took an attitude to ordinary discourse that was quite opposed to that of Bentham, who thought that philosophy must tear away the ‘veil of mystery’ that ordinary language throws over every object of study (Bentham 1782, 251). Wittgenstein’s attitude was more complex: he thought both that philosophers create philosophical problems by bewitching themselves with language, and also that a clear understanding of the use of language could provide healthy therapy for people suffering from philosophical problems. Taking advantage of the insights of Wittgenstein and J.L.Austin, Hart aimed to put philosophy of language to work in addressing problems of legal philosophy, without making what he regarded as Bentham’s extravagant mistakes.

In 1961, Hart’s book The Concept of Law raised issues that have occupied legal philosophers ever since. He borrowed J.L. Austin’s method of ‘using a sharpened awareness of words to sharpen our perception of the phenomena’ (Hart 2012, v, 14). Hart’s observations about the use of language in law were elements in an innovative approach to explaining the normativity of law—that is, the fact that law presents itself as conferring rights and powers and as imposing obligations and liabilities. Hart argued that we can understand that feature of law more clearly, if we understand where Bentham and his nineteenth-century disciple John Austin (not to be confused with J.L.Austin) went wrong in explaining the meaning and use of normative language. Hart’s new approach to the issue has been a starting point for discussions of the normativity of law since the 1960s (see section 6.2 below).

Ronald Dworkin argued that Hart’s focus on language had a toxic effect on legal philosophy. He wrote that Hart suffered from a ‘semantic sting’, because he wrongly thought ‘that lawyers all follow certain linguistic criteria for judging propositions of law’ (Dworkin 1986b, 45; see section 6.1 below). That argument in the philosophy of language has set an agenda for much debate in philosophy of law (see, for example, the essays in Coleman, 2001).

Because of the allure of philosophy of language, and partly as a result of the influence of Hart, the use of philosophy of language in philosophy of law became the focus of much jurisprudential thought and debate in the 20th century. One notable example is the work of Jerzy Wróblewski, a Polish legal theorist who developed a ‘semantic conception of a legal norm’ (Wróblewski 1983), and offered a theory of legal language as a sub-type of natural language with multiple ‘fuzzy’ characteristics (Wróblewski 1985). In Italian analytical legal philosophy, the influential theorist Norberto Bobbio began in the 1950s ‘to consider law as a language and legal science as a meta-language’ (Pintore and Jori 1997, 3), in service of a theory of law based on a non-cognitivist moral theory. Two succeeding generations of Italian legal theorists have engaged in ‘dispute on semiotic ground, rather than directly by arguments of general legal philosophical positions’ (Pintore and Jori, 17).

That development was one instance of the widespread use of views about language in debunking conventional views about law in the 20th century. Perhaps this development resulted not so much from the influence of Bentham’s own writings, as from pursuit of the same search that he undertook, for ways of identifying the elements of law that suit empiricist philosophical sensibilities. The energetic 20th-century school of ‘Scandinavian legal realism’ viewed legal terms like ‘right’ as ‘lacking semantic reference’ and ‘denoting nothing’. So they considered statements asserting the existence of rights, duties, and other legal relations to be incapable of being true or false (Olivecrona 1971, 246, 255, 261). They variously explained the use of such statements as attempts to perform magical incantations, or as tools for taking advantage of the psychological conditioning that leads officials and citizens to act in one way or another when they hear such statements (see the outline of Scandinavian realism in Olivecrona 1971, 174–182, and see Ross 1956; see also section 5.1 of the entry on naturalism in legal philosophy).

Similarly, various strands in the influential American legal academic enterprise of ‘economic analysis of law’ share Bentham’s debunking attitude toward central legal terms such as ‘right’ and ‘obligation’. Like Bentham, some economic analysts oscillate (or equivocate) between (1) a moral theory that reduces those normative terms to terms describing maximization of human satisfactions, and (2) a theory that does not engage in moral argument, but only claims to describe human motivation, accounting for terms such as ‘right’ and ‘obligation’ as rhetorical epithets that agents use to pursue what they will (see the entry on the economic analysis of law, section 2.2).

Not all legal sceptics have been driven by the empiricism of Bentham and the Scandinavians. Many other forms of scepticism about law have also sought support in scepticism about the meaning of language. Attacks on the coherence of the idea of the rule of law, and on the meaningfulness of legal discourse, have used ideas in the philosophy of language as diverse as Saul Kripke’s interpretation of Wittgenstein’s remarks on rule following (see section 3.1 of the entry on interpretation and coherence in legal reasoning), and deconstruction (see Endicott 2000, chapter 1).

2. The use of language in law

2.1 Law and signs

There are insurmountable objections to Bentham’s idea that a law is an assemblage of signs. Law (in the sense that is relevant here) is the systematic regulation of the life of a community by standards treated as binding the members of the community and its institutions. A law is a standard that is part of such a systematic form of regulation. Many such standards have no canonical linguistic formulation (that is, no form of words which, according to law, determines the content of the standard). Lawyers in common law systems are familiar with such norms: murder may be a criminal offence (or slander may be a tort, or certain agreements may be enforceable as contracts…), not because of the expression by any person or institution of a rule that it should be so, but because the institutions of the legal system customarily treat murder as an offence (or slander as a tort...). Moreover, common law systems cannot be distinguished from legal systems consisting only of linguistic acts, because no legal system consists only of linguistic acts. A civil law system with a civil code and a criminal code may make murder an offence (and slander a tort…) by a written act, and it may be a written constitution that gives legal force to the civil code and to the criminal code. But the validity of the written constitution will depend on a norm which is not created by the use of signs: the rule that the constitution makers’ act of using that text to set out the constitution is to be treated as authoritative.[2]

Bentham and John Austin knew that there are rules of law that were not laid down in language. Preserving their view of law as signification of volition, they accounted for such laws as tacit commands of the sovereign. That convoluted device cannot provide the resources needed to explain the existence of a norm. In the right circumstances, it is certainly possible to communicate without using signs (and in particular, it is possible to convey a volition, backed by a threat of force, just by saying or writing nothing). But silence can only be a means of communication when the circumstances give it a meaning. We can say that a tacit command has been issued only if it is possible to identify features of the situation that distinguish the tacit communication from mere inaction communicating nothing (see Hart 2012, 45–48). Those features do not generally accompany customary rules (in fact, they generally do not accompany customary rules).

There is another conclusive objection to the idea that a law is an assemblage of signs. When a lawmaking authority does use language to make a law (as when a legislature uses a lawful process to pass an enactment that is within its powers), the resulting law is not an assemblage of signs. When I write you an email message to make a request, the message is an assemblage of signs, but the request is not an assemblage of signs; I used the assemblage of signs to make it. The law that results from the use of language in an enactment is a norm or norms whose existence and content are determined by the legal effect that the law ascribes to that use of an assemblage of signs (see Von Wright 1963, Chapter VI, on the distinction between norm formulations and norms).

A law, therefore, is not an assemblage of signs, and law is not necessarily made by the use of language, and every legal system has norms that were not made by the use of language. Laws are not linguistic acts. Laws, you may say, are standards of behaviour that can be communicated (and some of which are made) by using language. But even this is controversial among writers on legal interpretation.

2.2 Language and legal interpretation

What is the relationship between the language that is used to make legal standards, and the law itself? If the law provides that a form of words determines the content of a standard (such as a term of a contract, or a criminal offence, or a duty of the executor of a will), what is the effect of the use of the words? The question seems to demand general theories of the meaning of language and of the interpretation of communicative acts. If there are no general theories to be had, then there is no general answer to the question. A theory of meaning and interpretation of legal language would not be very much less general than a theory of meaning and interpretation of language.

Legal theorists have tried to construct theories of the meaning of legal language, and theories of legal interpretation, based on specific features of law, of legal systems, and of the use of language in making law. The entries on constitutionalism (see section 7, ‘Constitutional Interpretation’), interpretation and coherence in legal reasoning, legal interpretation, legal interpretivism, the nature of law, and naturalism in legal philosophy all address theories of legal interpretation. This section addresses features of language that raise challenges for philosophy of law and for philosophy of language. Any good account of the legal effect of the use of language in law making depends on the context of its use (addressed in this section). Section 2.3 addresses ‘pragmatic’ effects of language use, such as context-dependence, which have long been the matter of jurisprudential debate; recently the use of Gricean and post-Gricean pragmatics has become a major field of debate among philosophers of language and philosophers of law. These pragmatic features of communication raise insuperable difficulties for any attempt to give a true account of legal interpretation that is well enough organised to deserve to be called a ‘theory’. Debates over the pragmatics of legal language are often premised on the view that the effect of a lawmaking use of language is that the content of the linguistic communication in question determines the content of the law. But we will see in section 3 that even this premise is controversial; it has been denied by theorists who account for the law as being determined by moral reasons for conclusions as to what rights, duties, powers, and liabilities people have, given the facts of legal practice and history.

As an instance of controversy over the effect of the use of language in law, consider the case of Garner v Burr [1951] 1 KB 31. The legislature had made it an offence to use a ‘vehicle’ on a road without pneumatic tires. Lawrence Burr fitted iron wheels to his chicken coop, and pulled it down the road behind his tractor. Burr was prosecuted under the statute. The magistrates acquitted him, apparently on the ground that a chicken coop is not a ‘vehicle’. The appeal court reversed that decision. The Lord Chief Justice wrote,

The regulations are designed for a variety of reasons, among them the protection of road surfaces; and, as this vehicle had ordinary iron tyres, not pneumatic tyres, it was liable to damage the roads. [The magistrates] have put what is in my opinion too narrow an interpretation on the word ‘vehicle’ for the purposes of this Act. It is true that, according to the dictionary definition, a ‘vehicle’ is primarily to be regarded as a means of conveyance provided with wheels or runners and used for the carriage of persons or goods. It is true that the [magistrates] do not find that anything was carried in the vehicle at the time; but I think that the Act is clearly aimed at anything which will run on wheels which is being drawn by a tractor or another motor vehicle. Accordingly, an offence was committed here. It follows that [the magistrates] ought to have found that this poultry shed was a vehicle within the meaning of s. 1 of the Road Traffic Act of 1930. ([1951] 1 KB 31 at 33)

The magistrates and the appeal court seem to have disagreed over the effect of two principles: a principle that statutes should only be read as imposing criminal liability if they do so unequivocally, and a principle that the purposes for which Parliament passed the statute should be pursued. Assume that those principles are legal principles, in the sense that a decision in accordance with the law must respect them. The apparent tension between the principles might be resolved in one of the following two ways. We do not have the magistrates’ reasons, but let’s presume that they resolved the tension in the first way; the appeal court resolved it in the second way:

1. by concluding that Parliament’s purposes can be respected appropriately while still construing the prohibition narrowly (so that it is no offence to pull a chicken coop down the road on iron wheels, because the chicken coop is not undeniably a vehicle), or

2. by concluding that Parliament’s purpose is sufficiently clear that it can be pursued by convicting Mr.Burr, without jeopardising the principle that criminal liabilities ought to be clearly spelled out, even if someone might reasonably claim that a chicken coop on wheels is not a ‘vehicle’.

It may seem that this common sort of disagreement tells us nothing about language, except perhaps that language is of no particular importance in law. It may seem that the two courts did not disagree over any question of language (after all, everyone involved was competent in English), but only over whether they ought to give effect to Parliament’s evident purpose of protecting roads by convicting Mr.Burr, or whether that would be unfair to him.

One explanation of the decision would be that the appeal court ignored the word ‘vehicle’, and treated the pneumatic tires rule as if it applied to anything that moves on wheels (instead of applying to vehicles, which is what the legislation said). But the Lord Chief Justice did not explain his decision that way. He did not hold that, because Parliament aimed to protect roads from iron wheels, Burr should be convicted regardless of the meaning of the word ‘vehicle’. He held that the magistrates ought to have found that the chicken coop was a vehicle, ‘for the purposes’ of the Road Traffic Act. Presumably the magistrates, too, considered themselves to be giving effect to the language of the Act, rather than ignoring (in the interests of fairness) what Parliament had enacted.

No doubt, legal decisionmakers sometimes depart from what the legislature provided in a valid enactment (or a testator provided in a valid will...). They may do so corruptly, or in the exercise of an equitable jurisdiction to depart from the law, or because they consider that justice demands it even if the law accords them no power to depart from the enactment or the will. But in Garner v Burr, the magistrates and the appeal judges evidently saw themselves as giving effect to the Road Traffic Act. And the sort of disagreement that arose in that case (disagreement over the legal effect of the use of a word) is so common that we seem to find a paradox:

The apparent paradox of legislative language:

Competent speakers of the English language share a knowledge of the meaning of the word ‘vehicle’, and the law that is made by legislation using the word must be determined by the meaning of the word, yet English speakers disagree—apparently sincerely—over the effect of legislation using the word.

To resolve the apparent paradox of legislative language, we can say that what speakers of the English language share, in virtue of their grasp of the meaning of a word like ‘vehicle’, is an ability to use the word in a way that depends on the context. The question of whether a chicken coop on wheels counts as a ‘vehicle’ would be a different question (and might have a different answer), if another statute or regulation imposed a tax on ‘vehicles’. The relevant considerations might be different again if a statute or regulation required ‘vehicles’ to keep to the left-hand side of the road. The Lord Chief Justice was right that a dictionary definition of ‘vehicle’ could not conclude the question of whether the chicken coop was a vehicle in Garner v Burr, because the purpose of a dictionary definition is to point the reader to features of the use of the word that can be more-or-less important in a variety of more-or-less analogical ways in various contexts. A definition of ‘vehicle’ as a mode of conveyance offers the reader one central strand in the use of that word, but does not tell the reader whether a more-or-less analogical extension of the word to a chicken coop on wheels is warranted or unwarranted by the meaning of the word. Another way of stating this resolution of the apparent paradox of legislative language is by distinguishing between the meaning of a word (which the magistrates and the appeal judges all knew) and the way in which a communicative act using the word ought to be understood (over which they disagreed). The judges and magistrates in Garner v Burr shared a knowledge of the meaning of the word ‘vehicle’; they could all share mastery of that word, while disagreeing over the effect of the legislature’s use of the word. The evident good sense of that proposition has led some philosophers to theories that state or imply that law is not made by the use of language; see section 3 below.

2.3 The pragmatics of legal language

The dependence of the effect of legal language on context is an instance of a general feature of communication, which some philosophers of language have approached by distinguishing semantics from pragmatics. The distinction is, roughly, between the meaning of a word or phrase or other linguistic expression, and the effect that is to be ascribed to the use of the expression in a particular way, by a particular user of the language, in a particular context. The pragmatics of legal language is a vast field, because the term ‘pragmatics’ could be used as a heading for much of what modern legal scholars and theorists have described as grounds for interpretation. In fact, ‘pragmatics’ could also be used as a heading for much that they have described as the theory of interpretation – since ‘pragmatics’ is a term not only for effects of communication, but also for the study of those effects. For example, the work of the judges in Garner v Burr can be described as an exercise in pragmatic inference. The technical sound of the word ‘pragmatics’ may suggest that it is a term for the theoretical study of its object; in fact, the field of study is what might be inferred from the fact that someone said what they said in the context in which they said it. No object of study is less apt for theorising.

This vast field has been much studied over millennia by lawyers and philosophers, but only recently through the use of resources that may be borrowed from the 20th-century development of ‘pragmatics’ as a discipline in linguistics and the philosophy of language. Much recent work in the pragmatics of legal language has focused on Gricean and post-Gricean pragmatics, as a source of insights into the theory of legal interpretation (see e.g. Marmor 2008, 2014, Soames 2008, Ekins 2012 (see especially pp 205–211), Carston 2013, Solum 2013; on Gricean and post-Gricean pragmatics, see pragmatics).

It is controversial whether legal pragmatics is simply a part of the pragmatics of language use in general (see Dascal and Wróblewski 1988). It stands to reason that if the pragmatics of language use depends on the context of an utterance, the legal context of a lawmaking use of language will have implications for the meaning conveyed and, therefore, for the law that is made. Scott Soames has argued that the question of the relation between the content of the law and authoritative sources (such as statutes), is ‘an instance of the more general question of what determines the contents of ordinary linguistic texts’ (Soames 2008). It is a popular idea that when a legislature enacts a statute, ‘The content of the statute is what the lawmakers asserted and committed themselves to, in adopting the statutory language’ (Soames 2008). Speakers can commit themselves to something that they have not asserted, and can make assertions in contexts that make it clear that they are not committed to what they have asserted.

But Andrei Marmor has argued that the pragmatics of legal language is unique in crucial respects (Marmor 2008), with pragmatic considerations playing some very significantly lesser role in law than in other contexts: ‘In ordinary conversations, pragmatic enrichment is the norm, not the exception; in statutory law, it is the exception’ (Marmor 2014, 34). In his view, the Gricean maxims of conversation, derived from a general principle of cooperation, do not straightforwardly apply in legislative communication, because legislative communication is ‘strategic’ rather than cooperative (Marmor 2014, 45–57). Likewise, Francesca Poggi has argued that Grice’s theory does not apply to legislation, because of the ‘conflictual behaviour’ of those addressed by legislation (Poggi 2011, 35). As Marmor points out, speakers and listeners in strategic communication take advantage of uncertainties in the implicatures to be derived from pragmatic norms of communication. For present purposes, we can think of an implicature as a proposition that a person is to be understood to have conveyed by using language in a particular way, although it is not expressed by what the person said (see Grice 1975, 43–4). Speakers may exploit implicatures in order to avoid asserting what they prefer to implicate, and listeners may exploit uncertainties concerning implicatures in order to bend the effect of a communication to their liking. Yet these aspects of communication are not distinctive to law making. And they depend on cooperation among participants in the ‘conversation’ in question: some degree of cooperation is necessary in order for it to make any sense for a speaker to take advantage of an implicature, or for a listener to treat an uncertain implicature as a genuine implicature.

‘Near-side’ pragmatics (for Korta and Perry’s distinction between ‘near-side’ and ‘far-side’ pragmatics, see pragmatics) is a matter of what is said by an utterance; in informal conversation it involves the use of indexicals and pronominal figures that are avoided in legislation, and involves the implications of context for an understanding of the uses of terms. And ‘far-side’ pragmatics (determining what is implicated rather than said, and determining what speech acts are carried out by means of an utterance) can involve figurative uses of language such as sarcasm, innuendos, and other techniques that lawmakers avoid. There is some force in Marmor’s claim that pragmatics is different in law. Legislation systematically avoids many communicative devices that can be so very useful in other contexts of communication. But those devices are also avoided in a wide range of other formalized and technical uses of language—for example, in most wedding invitations, in Wikipedia articles that have not been hacked, and in well-written instruction guides for applying for bank account or for operating a rice cooker.

Yet the pragmatic effects of communication are essential in all of those formalised contexts of language use, and they are essential to the legislative use of language. This is true both of ‘near-side’ and ‘far-side’ pragmatics. The discussion of the decision in Garner v Burr, above, provides an illustration of the ways in which the context of a legislative enactment can determine the reference of terms such as ‘vehicle’, and this determination of meaning is an aspect of near-side pragmatics. The dispute over the requirement of pneumatic tires on ‘vehicles’ in Garner v Burr can be understood as a dispute over the effect of the context on the content of the regulatory provision; another way of making the same point is to describe it as a dispute over the implicatures to be drawn from the fact of the enactment of that provision. This aspect of the pragmatics of legal language is simply an instance of the pragmatics of the use of language in general. It would be very easy to formulate a version of the apparent paradox of legislative language, discussed in section 2.2 above, in a non-legal context: only imagine that Lawrence Burr’s mother told him not to go driving the farm vehicles down her driveway without tires.

The role of far-side pragmatics is illustrated by the master implicature of every legislative act: it is never said in legislation, but there is always an implicature, that the rights and duties and powers established by the legislation are to be legal rights and duties and powers, under the law of the jurisdiction for which the enactment is made (see Endicott 2014, 55). Very many other more particular lawyers’ presumptions serve as maxims of the pragmatics of lawmaking (such as the presumption that a new enactment overrides a contrary previous enactment).

It is worth noting, as well, that the diversity of contexts of communication (even the diversity of conversations that the same two people may have, let alone all the diversity of exchanges that might be called ‘conversations’ by more or less remote analogy) is so great that the variations among pragmatic aspects of ordinary conversations are much wider and deeper than any general distinction that can be drawn between legislative communication as a class, and ordinary conversations as a class. The use of language in making law is so closely interwoven with the use of language to exercise authority in other contexts, and with the use of language in games, in talk (in many different contexts) of what is right and wrong, and generally in communication in families and in organisations of every kind, that the pragmatics of legal language is best seen as a deeply integral part of the pragmatics of the use of language in general.

It may seem otherwise, because the persons to whom laws are addressed can be extraordinarily creative in finding ways of fitting the laws to their own interests, and parties to a dispute over the law tend to disagree deeply over the effect of the language that has been used to make law (so that it is not at all unusual for each side to end up with a deeply-felt conviction that the law is so clearly on his or her own side, that no reasonable person could think otherwise). So it seems, as Marmor argues, that the use of language to make law is not part of a cooperative exchange between lawmakers and the persons to whom their communications are addressed.

For this very reason, of course, every legal system has tribunals for the resolution of legal disputes. They are always an integral part of the system of governance in a state that is ruled by law, although they very often have various forms of independence from other institutions of the system. The tribunals or courts typically have authority to interpret the lawmaking use of language and to determine its effect in particular cases. Unlike the parties to a dispute, courts are characteristically involved with the lawmakers in the enterprise of governance (even where the courts are independent), and often have their own lawmaking capacities. Their role in the system is the substratum for a cooperative principle that has even deeper significance (and somewhat simpler implications) in the operation of a legal system, than Grice’s cooperative principle has in ordinary conversation. And, of course, that cooperative role of a court in the legal system constrains the arguments of parties to a dispute: however strongly they are inclined to twist the language of the law (and however strongly they may feel that the other side is twisting the language of the law), they need an argument that will persuade an institution that is committed, at least in principle, to cooperative interpretation of lawmaking acts. One way of explaining the decision in is to say that the Lord Chief Justice cooperated with the legislature by treating the legislature as having adhered to Grice’s Cooperative Principle: ‘Make your conversational contribution such as is required, at the stage at which it occurs, by the accepted purpose or direction of the talk exchange in which you are engaged’ (Grice 1989, 26; for discussion of the principle see Grice). Sometimes, as lawyers know well, courts interpret legislation in more or less non-cooperative ways, and it is not hard to envisage legislative pathologies (or to identify real life examples of pathologies) that justify such an attitude on the part of judges. If courts take a generally non-cooperative attitude to legislation, the whole legal system suffers from a pathology: an inability to sustain the rule-of-law values of openness and clarity of the laws.

The problem faced in cases like Garner v Burr is an especially vivid reminder of a problem that philosophers of language have long been more or less aware of (see Aristotle’s discussion of the notion of ‘friendship’ in Eudemian Ethics VII, 2, 1236a 33). The context-dependence of the meaning of utterances requires an account of linguistic competence that relates it to other human capacities—capacities to judge the importance of context and to draw analogies. It would be a mistake in the philosophy of language to account for language in a way that divorces its mastery from other aspects of reason. That connection between the use of language and reason is also illustrated by the contentious nature of the use of language in law. Much work on pragmatics by philosophers of language has concerned the conditions for understanding an utterance; judicial disputes over language are a reminder that those conditions—even though they are conditions of intelligibility of communication—lend themselves to disagreement and to reasoned dispute over how an utterance is to be understood (see Carston 2013, for discussion of controversies over the application of conversational maxims). The special feature that distinguishes the legal use of language from ordinary conversation is not that participants in a legal system act strategically while participants in an ordinary conversation act cooperatively; the special feature is that in order to attain the ideal of the rule of law, legal systems need institutions and processes for resolution of the disputes about the effect of law-making uses of language that arise as a result of its context-dependence, and as a result of other pragmatic aspects of communication.

3. Can law be made by the use of language?

Discussions of the pragmatics of legal language are expressly or implicitly premised on a view of the relation between a law-making use of language, and the law that is made. It is the view that if an agency or a person is authorised to make law, it makes the law that it communicates by its use of language.[3] That ‘communication model’ must be qualified in at least four ways, because the law itself regulates the making of law:

  1. the law that is made will be limited by any legal limit on the power of the law maker (as to the substance of the law that it can make, or as to the process by which it can lawfully make law), and
  2. rules of law may qualify the law that is made in a variety of ways that are not susceptible of any general characterisation[4] (see Solum 2013 for an extensive discussion of ways in which the law that is made by a communicative act may be qualified), and
  3. courts may need to resolve indeterminacies in the effect of an act of law making, and where they do so, their decisions may have conclusive legal effect (for the parties, and also for the future if the decision is treated as a precedent), and
  4. if a court departs from the law that the law maker communicated (for good reasons or bad), the decision of the court may still have conclusive legal effect (for the parties, and also for the future if the decision is treated as a precedent).

Even with those qualifications, some theorists reject the communication model. They argue that the identification of legal rights and duties cannot be based merely on facts such as the fact that an authority has communicated this or that. This section will address theories that seek to ground the law on something more dignified than mere words. And we will have to ask whether those theories can account for the diverse normative powers that legal systems confer on institutions and agencies and persons.

3.1 The Semantic Sting

The most influential theory to have denied the communication model is that of Ronald Dworkin, as it emerged in his argument against the idea that the law of a country is a system of rules. H.L.A.Hart had tried to explain the nature of a legal system on the basis of social rules for identifying the law of a community, which provide shared tests of validity for rules of the system. Hart treated it as obvious that such rules commonly identify the acts of law-making authorities as sources of law, conferring power on those authorities to make law, and that (subject to qualifications that are part of the communication model such as those listed above) the law becomes what a lawmaker conveys that it is to be, in the communicative act by which it exercises such a power.

On that view, the content of the law of a community depends on a conventional way of recognizing legal rules. But if members of the community share a way of recognizing their law, how can they engage in the deep disputes about the law that we are all so familiar with? Dworkin made that question into a focus of jurisprudential debate. And he framed the question as an objection to a misguided view of language, and of the relation between law and language. He began his book Law’s Empire (Dworkin 1986b) by contending that legal theorists like Hart cannot explain theoretical disagreement in legal practice, because they think that lawyers share uncontroversial tests (tests which Dworkin termed ‘criteria’) for the truth of propositions of law. The ‘semantic sting’ involves the misconception that the language of the law can be meaningful only if lawyers share such criteria. It is fatal to a legal theory, because it leads the theorist to think that people cannot have any deep (or ‘substantive’ or ‘genuine’) disagreement about the law. They can only disagree (1) about empirical questions such as what words were used in a statute, or (2) about how to resolve penumbral cases, or (3) about whether the law should be changed. If you suffer from the semantic sting, you will conclude that disagreeing about the criteria for application of the language of the law would be like using the same words with different meanings. People who disagree in that way are only talking past each other. Here is how Dworkin set out the views of theorists who suffer from the semantic sting:

We follow shared rules, they say, in using any word: these rules set out criteria that supply the word’s meaning. Our rules for using ‘law’ tie law to plain historical fact.… Philosophers of law must elucidate them for us by a sensitive study of how we speak. They may disagree among themselves, but that alone casts no doubt on their common assumption, which is that we do share some set of standards about how ‘law’ is to be used. (Dworkin, 1986b, 31)

Dworkin argued that legal philosophy needs to make a fresh start, in order to face the challenge of explaining disagreement about the law. Any theory of law, he claimed, needs to be a ‘constructive interpretation’ of legal practice. A constructive interpretation is one that simultaneously fits the facts of the object of interpretation (in the case of legal interpretation, the object is not some particular communicative act by a lawmaker, but the entire practice of the community) and portrays it as an object that achieves its purpose. On this view, a theory that does not present law as an exercise in constructive interpretation cannot even compete as a theory of law, because it suffers from the semantic sting. And the communication model is incompatible with the idea that law is an exercise in constructive interpretation.

The semantic sting really does seem a gruesome fate for a lawyer, because those who suffer from it would have to say that no one really disagrees with anyone about the law: whenever people think they disagree about how to identify the law on any point, that fact in itself would demonstrate that there is nothing to disagree about: there is no law on the point at issue, if the agreed ways of identifying the law do not decide the point. So if you suffer from the semantic sting, you will conclude that sincere, competent lawyers who know the facts of a case will never disagree with each other. When an apparent disagreement arises, they ought to throw up their hands and say that there is no law on the point. If you suffer from the semantic sting, you will think that at least one party to any dispute over the content of the law is either legally inept and philosophically misguided, or dishonest.

Dworkin somewhat obscured his brilliant argument by melding the vice of thinking that legal philosophy is a matter of disclosing the agreed way of using the word ‘law’ (see section 6.1 below) with the vice of thinking that the content of the law of a jurisdiction is determined by agreement over the use of the words in which it is formulated. Pierluigi Chiassoni has recently isolated the second vice and called it the ‘container-retrieval’ theory (Chiassoni 2019, 113). On the container-retrieval theory, legislative language is filled up with content by linguistic conventions as to the application of the words in which it is expressed. The task of applying legislation is the task of identifying those cases to which its words conventionally apply. On that approach, Garner v Burr was rightly decided if English speakers were disposed in 1951 to apply the word ‘vehicle’ to a chicken coop on wheels. If they were disposed to withhold the term, the case was wrongly decided. And if they had no shared disposition either way, then there was a gap in the law, and the Court of Appeal had to fill it. In any case, the content-retrieval theorist is, as Dworkin suggested, doomed to conclude that competent lawyers cannot disagree in good faith as to what law has been made.

Dworkin’s challenge is pressing because of the absurdity of the content-retrieval view. To meet the challenge, it is necessary to explain how it can be reasonable to disagree over the application of rules made by communicative acts. If the meaning of words determines the rules, and the Lord Chief Justice and the magistrates agreed in their grasp of the meaning of the words of the legislation, how could they differ on the question of what the rules required?

The potential for such a reasonable disagreement (even among people who understand the language of the lawmaker equally well) is to be found in the complex pragmatic considerations discussed in section 2.3 above, concerning the effect of a lawmaking communicative act. Consider that if we tried to adhere to the content-retrieval theory, we would have to say that the relevant dispositions of speakers have to be contextualised: because the context affects speakers’ dispositions, we would have to ask whether they are disposed to apply the word to a chicken coop with wheels, in the context of the application of the word ‘vehicle’ in a statutory provision making it an offence to use a vehicle without tires, for the purpose of protecting road surfaces... And once we ask the dispositions of speakers in that proper context, it becomes obviously absurd to think that there should be any legal force in their dispositions to decide the very question that the Court had jurisdiction and duty to decide.

If we accept the communication model, we will conclude that participants in legal practice typically share an understanding of the meaning of the language of legislation; yet it is still clear that there are bound to be deep disagreements as to the implications of those law-making acts in some cases. Disagreement about the content of the law will arise if the persons subject to the law must apply a test that, like the legislation in Garner v Burr, can be controversial in its application in some cases. Likewise, disagreement will arise if the legislative act delegates authority to a court (as legislatures often do), or if the legislature communicates unclearly. The persons subject to the law must decide (and may dispute) how to interpret the acts of the legislature. And it may also be unclear (and controversial) in some cases whether the legislature has the power that it claims to have exercised, or whether a court has power to depart (and if so, whether it ought to depart) from a decision of the legislature.

Does the recent outpouring of work on the pragmatics of legal language provide a successful defence of the communication model against Dworkin’s semantic sting argument? That work makes it abundantly clear that the communication model does not need to rely on the content-retrieval picture of the meaning of words. The point of legal interpretation in Garner v Burr was not to decide whether the meaning of the word ‘vehicle’ encompasses a chicken coop on wheels. It was, instead, to decide what it was that Parliament had done, when it required vehicles on the roads to have tires. In J.L.Austin’s slogan, ‘The total speech act in the total speech situation is the only actual phenomenon which, in the last resort, we are engaged in elucidating.’ (Austin 1962, 148).

But Dworkin would presumably have extended his ‘semantic sting’ argument into an argument that the communication model suffers from a ‘semantic-and-pragmatic sting’—i.e., the misconception that the content of the law is determined by agreement both as to the semantics of words, and also as to the pragmatics of communication. He would no doubt have said that the only antidote to this sting is his theory of ‘constructive interpretation’, holding that the ‘pragmatic’ aspects of the use of language in law include the attitude that law must justify the use of state coercion, which requires the interpreter to construct the theory of rights and duties that best fits and justifies the whole pattern of legal practice. That was Dworkin’s essential claim. His semantic sting argument cannot in itself undermine the communication model, because his argument was based on an impoverished view of the controversy that can result from communication.

3.2 How to make a legal norm

So the communication model can explain controversy over the law. But can it explain how a law maker can do ‘normative magic’ (Enoch 2014, 296), making mere words into law? Mark Greenberg has argued that:

Trying to understand legislation on the model of communication is misguided because legislation and legislative systems have purposes that have no parallel in the case of communication and that may be better served if a statute’s contribution to the content of the law is not constituted by what is communicated by the legislature. (Greenberg 2011, 221; for arguments against Greenberg’s claim, see Marmor 2014, 15–22, and Asgeirsson 2020, Chapter 1)

That can indeed be the case if, for example, the purposes of the law are best served if a court is authorised to depart from what the legislature decided. But it is also possible for the law’s purposes to be served by treating a law maker’s contribution to the content of the law as being just what the law maker communicated. Consider for simplicity the making of a particular legal norm. With a gesture of a hand, a police officer at the scene of an accident can wave to a driver to indicate that she can go ahead, or can direct the driver to stop. The law, by authorising the officer to direct traffic, makes the officer’s gesture count as the law’s decision as to whether the driver has permission to proceed or a duty to stop.

Language facilitates the making of far more articulate legal norms. When the appeal court in Garner v Burr sent the matter back to the magistrate with instructions to convict, suppose that the magistrate wrote ‘fine: five shillings’ on the court docket. If the justice was authorised to impose such a fine, and writing those words on the docket was a lawful way of exercising that legal power, then how should we understand the contribution to the law of the act of the magistrate? That contribution would, in English law, be just what the magistrate indicated by using the words: that Mr Burr was thereby fined five shillings. A court bailiff would be treated by English law as being authorised to collect five shillings, and not more. The law’s good reasons for such a way of proceeding are very evident: after Mr Burr’s presumably fair hearings in the magistrate’s court and the appeal court, when a magistrate (in the exercise of a jurisdiction on behalf of a court) wrote those words on the docket, the best way to proceed is for the bailiff to treat the judgment of the court as a fait accompli. Suppose, instead, that the bailiff treated the magistrate’s decision as one weighty consideration among others in the overall calculation concerning how much property to seize from Mr Burr. The loss of finality would be a setback for the rule of law. The resulting discretionary power of bailiffs would likewise be a setback for the rule of law. And the shift of decision making power from the magistrates (subject to the appeal court’s oversight) to a bailiff would be a setback for regulatory justice because of the loss of just and expert decision making as to the rights and the liabilities of the parties to a dispute.

It is the capacity of the law to regulate its own allocation of power in a just and effective way that explains why it is appropriate for the law to give a court legal power to impose a fine by its act (that is, by what the judge says in the exercise of the power).

Now consider the making of general legal norms. In England there is a Value Added Tax of 20 per cent. That is the case because the U.K. Parliament enacted (in language that you may well consider rather peremptory) that ‘VAT shall be charged at the rate of 20 per cent’ (Value Added Tax Act 1994 s 2(1), as amended by the Finance (No 2) Act 2010, s 3(1)), and English law treats Parliament as having law-making authority. We can imagine a system in which the contribution of that legislative act to the law of England is qualified by a discretion on the part of tax collectors to collect more or less than 20 per cent. We can imagine a system in which judges are given an equitable jurisdiction to reduce the tax where a company supplying goods and services is at risk of insolvency. There are sound and pressing reasons, instead, for English law to treat the decision of the legislature as having determined the tax. The central reason, of course, is the allocation of the taxing power to the Parliament; subsidiary but very important reasons concern the rule of law values to be secured if taxpayers and enforcement officials and judges are all bound by the decision of Parliament.

Mark Greenberg writes, in the entry on legal interpretation,

It is crucial not to conflate a provision’s linguistic meaning with its contribution to the content of the law.... If, in addressing the preliminary question of what legal interpretation seeks, we simply conflate a statute’s contribution with its linguistic meaning, then, among other mistakes, we miss the need for a substantive argument for that claim. (Greenberg 2021)

Here is the substantive argument: the purposes of a legal system very commonly include the allocation of decision-making power, enabling a person or an agency not merely to take an action that they know will be treated as legally consequential, but to decide what the law is to be on some point. The law can authorise them to take an action that the law itself treats as its decision of a matter of right or duty or liability. When, for example, the U.K. Parliament enacts that ‘VAT shall be charged at the rate of 20 per cent’, the contribution to the law is that VAT shall be charged at the rate of 20 per cent.

That argument, you might say, should not be overgeneralised, for not all legislation is like the Value Added Tax. Just as it is possible to make law by the use of language, it is also possible to fail to do so: when the would-be lawmaker has no authority, or when the law deprives the act of lawmaking effect because of a defect in the substance or the process of the action of the would-be lawmaker, or when the law confers on another agency the power to override or to change the law made by the lawmaker. And it is possible for the law made by a legislature or by the framers of a constitution to be morphed out of all recognition by a pattern of judicial acts that change its effect, even if the courts and all the lawyers describe the courts’ role all along as ‘interpretation’. Moreover, in some circumstances and for some purposes there is something to Ronald Dworkin’s picture of a judge in the United States as ‘a partner continuing to develop, in what he believes is the best way, the statutory scheme Congress began’ (Dworkin 1986b, 313). For legislation can create a scheme of regulation that cries out for elaboration in the course of the judicial resolution of disputes over its operation. But that work of reasoned elaboration is only an occasional aspect of a role in which a judge may be bound by a legislative decision, where the law allocates a power of lawful decision to the legislature.

We should conclude that it is not merely possible for an agency or a person to make law by the use of language; it is a central technique of legal ordering (and of the rule of law) for the law to confer authority on persons and agencies to make particular legal norms and general rules of law. The reasons of political morality for doing so are indeed a dignified ground for the content of the law, although the techniques that enable the effective allocation of legal power also lend themselves to abuse. And the moral value of the allocation of legal power and its potential for abuse both depend on human language: the most prodigiously useful set of tools for the articulation of a policy and for the conferral and for the exercise of power.

When lawmakers use those tools to make law, is it the linguistic meaning of their action that determines the content of the law? Greenberg says that ‘Linguistic meaning is the information that is reliably and systematically conveyed by words, sentences, and other linguistic entities.’ (see the entry on legal interpretation, section 2.1). But linguistic entities do not convey information, or make law. We need to remind ourselves of J.L.Austin’s slogan, and we need to remind ourselves of the lesson of the semantic sting: when an agency or a person has authority to make law, and exercises its authority lawfully (as Parliament did in imposing the Value Added Tax, or as a court does in ordering the payment of a fine), it would be absurd to think that the contribution to the law of its action is determined by the dispositions of speakers of the language to use the words of the law maker in one way or another. The content of the law made by the lawmaker is what the lawmaker did in the exercise of its lawmaking authority. That is, what it communicated by using the language it used, in the way that it did, in ‘the total speech situation’.

4. Evaluative language and the nature of law

The context of the use of the word ‘vehicle’ in Garner v Burr requires anyone addressing the problem in the case to make evaluative judgments, just to decide whether the word applied to the chicken coop on wheels. The context of use is a criminal prohibition imposed for a presumably good public purpose of protecting road surfaces. To determine in that context whether the word ‘vehicle’ extends to a chicken coop on wheels, you need to address (and to resolve any tension between) the two principles mentioned above: that the purposes for which Parliament passed the statute should be pursued, and that criminal liability should not be extended to conduct that has not been unequivocally prohibited. Because of that context, the question of the meaning and application of the language of the statute cannot be answered without making judgments on normative questions as to how those principles are to be respected. The role of evaluative considerations in the application of ordinary descriptive terms like ‘vehicle’ raises a challenge for any thorough-going scepticism about value: the challenge is to decide whether to adopt a thorough-going scepticism about the meaning and application of descriptive language, which seems to follow from general scepticism concerning value (see Chiassoni 2019 for a sustained defence of such a form of scepticism, concluding that ‘The province of proper and practical legal interpretation“the province of judicial and juristic interpretation”is, properly speaking, a province without truth.’ (at 46)).

The effect of the use of descriptive language can depend on evaluative considerations. For philosophy of law, that dependence raises special problems. If you cannot tell whether to describe an object as a ‘vehicle’ for the purposes of the Act without evaluative reasoning, then the legal effect of the Road Traffic Act does not depend merely on physical facts (such as that there were wheels on the chicken coop) and social facts (such as that Parliament used the word ‘vehicle’ in the Act, or the complex social fact of the whole pattern of uses that have been made of the word ‘vehicle’). You cannot identify the law (that is, you cannot tell what legal rights and duties people have) without evaluative reasoning. That conclusion, if it is sound, seems to have important implications for the long-running debates in theory of law over the relation between fact and value in law, and over relations between law and morality. The conclusion seems to contradict one of the most provocative and controversial claims in the theory of law—the ‘sources thesis’, which Joseph Raz has stated as follows:

All law is source-based. A law is source-based if its existence and content can be identified by reference to social facts alone, without resort to any evaluative argument. (Raz (1994), 194–5; see entry the nature of law)

We can only decide whether the chicken coop was a ‘vehicle’ for the purpose of the Road Traffic Act by understanding the Act as pursuing something that the legislature decided to pursue, and by making an normative judgment as to whether due respect for the goal that the legislature valued through the enactment, and due respect for the requirement of certainty in criminal liability, support the conclusion that the chicken coop is to be treated as a ‘vehicle’ in the relevant sense. So we cannot apply the law without resort to evaluative and normative reasoning.

It may seem that judges need to make such evaluative judgments only in borderline cases for the application of legal language—and that they have discretion in those cases (that is, the judge must make a decision that is not determined by law). That, you might say, would vindicate the sources thesis. But a clear case of a vehicle counts as a ‘vehicle’ for the purpose of the Road Traffic Act just because the evaluative considerations that justify the use of the word ‘vehicle’ in that context clearly support its application. The sources thesis seems to be contradicted even in the clearest cases of the application of a law stated in descriptive language, if the content of such laws depends on how the purposes of the law ought to be conceived. That form of evaluation, you may say, can only be carried out by engaging in the very same form of reasoning that, in Raz’s theory, law excludes.

It is true that, in order to decide what the sources have directed (and thereby, in Raz’s terms, to identify the existence and content of a law), you need to understand the sense in which a word like ‘vehicle’ is used. But the existence and content of the offence can still be identified without first judging whether it ought to be an offence to do what Mr.Burr did, or whether there ought to be any offence at all of driving without pneumatic tires. The sources thesis articulates this important insight: in English law, there was no offence of driving without pneumatic tires (whether or not it would be a good idea for that to be an offence), until Parliament acted to create the offence. And then, it became an offence because of the fact that Parliament had done so (whether or not it was a good idea to do so). Moreover, if the institutions of the law had not been prepared to treat the chicken coop as a vehicle, then because of that social fact, it would have been false (after a decision with precedential effect) to say that it was an offence to pull a chicken coop on iron wheels on the road. Law is reflexive in the sense that the law gives legal authority to legal institutions to identify the law. Therefore, the courts’ decisions determine legal rights and obligations. So, we might say, a law is source-based if its existence and content can be identified by reference to social facts alone, without resort to any evaluative argument, other than whatever evaluative argument may be needed to determine the social facts, or to work out their implications for the case at hand.

Raz’s explanation of the nature of law is not undermined by the fact that evaluative judgments are necessary in order to identify the implications of the social fact that Parliament prohibited vehicles from being driven without pneumatic tires. It is still possible for legal directives to have the exclusionary force that, in his theory of authority, they claim (Raz 2009, chapters 1 and 2). The court in Garner v Burr can decide whether it is an offence to pull a chicken coop on wheels without pneumatic tires, without answering the question, ‘should it be an offence to pull a chicken coop down a road on iron wheels?’, or the question, ‘should it be an offence to use a vehicle without pneumatic tires?’ But the court needs to ask the related question: ‘what is the relevant sense of “vehicle” for the purposes of this Act?’ It is what Parliament did that determines Lawrence Burr’s liability; it may take evaluative reasoning to answer the question of social fact, ‘what did Parliament prohibit, when it prohibited vehicles from being driven without pneumatic tires?’

5. Vagueness in language and in law

A speed limit on a highway is a fairly precise law: in most cases it is clear whether a driver has conformed to the standard. But highway traffic regulation also needs (and typically uses) rules against careless or dangerous driving. Such abstract standards are designed to control a variety of behaviour that is too diverse for the legislative purpose to be attained by reference to any uniform, measurable criterion that would allow the precision of a speed limit.

Vague laws, such as a rule against careless driving, pose problems for philosophy of law that are related to problems that philosophers of language and of logic have addressed in arguments about the paradox of the heap (see the entry on the Sorites paradox). Suppose that, according to law, it counts as careless driving to drive with bald tires. If the law gives a precise definition of the thickness of tire tread that counts as bald, then in this regard the law is (more or less) precise, and for the purposes of the law, virtually every tire is either clearly bald or clearly not bald. But if there is no such precise standard, then there are ‘borderline cases’ in which it is neither clearly true that a tire is bald, nor clearly false. And we can construct a sorites series and a sorites paradox for the application of the law:

  1. A new tire is not bald.[5]
  2. If a tire is not bald, it does not become bald by losing one molecule of rubber from its tread.
  3. So a tire that has lost one molecule of rubber is not bald.
  4. Reiterate 2.
  5. So a tire that has lost two molecules of rubber is not bald.
  6. Reiterate 2.

N. So a tire never goes bald.

N+1. So no one can ever break the rule against careless driving by driving with bald tires.

The false conclusions N and N+1 arise by apparently valid reasoning from apparently true premises. Philosophical approaches to the paradox seem to have implications for legal theory: arguments that vague terms are incoherent, and that reasoning with them is impossible, would support arguments that vague laws are incoherent. Since vague laws are an important part of every legal system (Endicott 2001), the implications seem to be far-reaching.

Epistemic’ arguments that the only way to solve the paradox is to deny the truth of step 2 (so that vagueness is a problem of ignorance as to where the sharp boundary is between tires that are and are not bald) imply that there is always a single right answer to the application of a law stated in vague language. Arguments that the application of a vague expression is indeterminate in borderline cases (or in some borderline cases) imply that the application of a law that can be expressed in vague language is indeterminate in some cases. But it is even controversial whether such theories matter to legal philosophy (Schiffer 2001 and 2021, Greenawalt 2001).

Philosophers of law have not been especially concerned with the question of how to solve (or to resolve) the paradox, but they have debated the nature of borderline cases, and its implications for the role of judges in a community, and for the possibility of the rule of law. If the application of vague laws is indeterminate in some cases, then in those cases a judge (or other official) responsible for applying the law cannot decide the matter by applying the law, since the law does not determine the matter (and in fact, no one can use the law to guide their conduct).

Some legal philosophers have responded to this problem by claiming that judges never (or virtually never) have such a choice, and that there is virtually always a right answer to a question of legal rights (Dworkin, 1986a, 1991). Others have responded to the problem by claiming that the law gives judges discretion, in all or some borderline cases, to decide issues that the law does not determine (Hart, 2012, chapter VII.1). That is, the standards of the system leave a choice to judges as to how to decide the issue. Then judges must treat the parties to litigation as having liabilities or obligations or entitlements that were not determinately theirs at the time when the dispute arose. That power of judges appears to some to run contrary to a requirement of the rule of law: that laws (or at least, that legal burdens) should not be imposed retroactively.

As a result, vagueness raises an extraordinarily important set of problems for the philosophy of law. It may seem to be a different set of problems from those raised by vague language in general, because of three ways in which the legal use of vague language is distinctive. First, legal systems need to provide for authoritative resolution of disputes as to the effect of the use of vague language (where in some other domains of the use of language, we can get by without any such resolution).

Secondly, vagueness in legal language is distinctive because lawmakers avoid ordinary vague expressions like ‘driving very fast’ and prefer precise speed limits (or blood alcohol limits...). When the law uses vague language, it uses abstract evaluative expressions. Lawmakers typically do not prohibit driving with ‘bald’ tires; they either impose precise measures (such as tire tread measurements), or address the problem as part of an abstract, general prohibition on, e.g., ‘careless’ driving. An abstract standard calls upon its subjects to construct a view of the care that, in their law, a driver owes to another person—(and not merely to ask the seemingly pointless question, how bald is a bald tire?). Abstract standards are a very common and a very important part of lawmaking technique. A negligence standard may require ‘reasonable care’; a constitution may define a procedural right as a right to ‘due process’, or a contract may require the delivery of goods in ‘satisfactory condition’. Those abstract terms are very different from the vague descriptive terms that philosophers of logic use to illustrate their arguments about the sorites paradox (‘heap’, ‘thin’, ‘bald’, ‘red’…). It misses the point, you might think, to say that abstract standards do not draw sharp lines, because they are not designed to draw lines at all. By using an abstract standard, the lawmaker requires the people who must apply the law to construct a theory of the standard (of care, or of process, or of condition), which will draw any line that is needed. Ronald Dworkin has claimed that abstract expressions are not vague at all—that they have a different semantics from that of vague words like ‘heap’ (Dworkin, 1986b, 17).

Thirdly, the legal context of an expression may be very different from other contexts of its use. Principles of legal interpretation (for example, a legal requirement that vague criminal enactments are to be interpreted as applying only in clear cases) may make the legal effect of the use of a word more precise than its ordinary effect. The interpretation of a legal prohibition on careless driving demands an understanding of what counts as careless for the purposes of the law. The effect of a vague legal prohibition may be governed by precedents that rule out decisions that would otherwise be a reasonable application of the vague language. Even apart from the regulatory role of precedent, a good advocate or judge may have a relatively clear sense of the accepted practice in applying the prohibition, and the practice may well involve not treating certain forms of conduct as careless, when it would be fair enough, apart from that practice, to call them careless.

Given these distinctive features of law, it may seem that logicians’ discussions of heaps and baldness are beside the point, and that legal reasoning is exempt from any implications that the paradox may have for logic or for semantics. And because of the context dependence of the use of language in law (see section 2.2), some have argued that indeterminacies in law are not significantly related to the susceptibility of statements of law to sorites reasoning (Lanius 2019, Chapter 3). Yet statements of law that use abstract expressions, and use them to different effect in different contexts, certainly are vague in the philosophers’ sense: that is, they appear to be susceptible to sorites reasoning. ‘Careless driving’ in its legal sense is a much more complex concept than ‘driving with bald tires’, and driving with bald tires is an instance of careless driving only in virtue of the evaluative and contextual considerations that must be understood if the law of careless driving is to be understood. Yet ‘careless driving’ is susceptible to sorites reasoning: e.g., those evaluative and contextual considerations give reason to conclude that it is careless to drive with bald tires. For all their complexity (and their relation to deep questions of the rights of the citizen and the responsibilities and the liabilities that a community can justifiably impose on the citizen), those considerations do not determine a standard that is more precise than a standard that could be expressed using such an ordinary vague expression as ‘bald’. That is, those considerations do not provide a way of distinguishing between one tire in the sorites series and the next. Similarly, it is obviously possible to construct sorites series for the application of even more abstract legal standards such as the right to due process, or the United States constitutional prohibition on cruel and unusual punishment. These evaluative tests have special legal meanings that can only be understood in the context of a legal system, and in the more particular context of a specific area of law, and by reference to their elaboration and development in a common law system of precedent. Even with a mastery of all those aspects of the context, however, the best theory of the effect of such standards will not provide a way of distinguishing between one tire in the sorites series and the next. A theory of careless driving in some particular legal system at a particular time would be a defective theory, if it yielded the conclusion that the loss of one molecule of rubber from a tire can make the difference between driving that is careless and driving that is not careless according to law.

Consider again the case of Garner v Burr (above, section 2.2). The term ‘vehicle’, as properly understood for the purposes of the Road Traffic Act, is vague if there are borderline cases for its application (cases in which it is unclear whether the term applies to some object). It may seem that nothing is more patently a borderline case of a ‘vehicle’ than a chicken coop on wheels. But we should bear in mind that (if the discussion in section 2.2 above is sound) the correct application of the term depends on legal principles relating to the purposes of the legislation and to the need for clarity in criminal liabilities. So the chicken coop on wheels is a borderline case if it is unclear whether those principles required the provision to be applied to it. And the application of the term was indeterminate in the case, if those principles did not require a decision one way or the other. Of course, the appeal court held that a conviction was required—which we might say amounts to a decision that the term applied to the chicken coop on wheels. The magistrates and the appeal court disagreed about it, but that disagreement in itself does not mean either that the application of the term was determinate or that it was indeterminate. And the fact that the appeal judges seem to have thought that the term clearly applied to the chicken coop cannot tell us that the application of the term was determinate.

The magistrates’ approach put a special emphasis on the principle of certainty in criminal liability, and the appeal court’s approach put a special emphasis on the effective accomplishment of the purpose the legislation was designed to pursue. Each approach would take the law in a different direction. The application of the term was indeterminate (before the decision of the appeal court set a precedent) if neither approach was demanded by the complex resources of legal reasoning that the courts (as a matter of legal obligation) had to act upon. If that was the case, then the appeal court’s decision was not contrary to the law. But a decision upholding the acquittal would not have been contrary to the law, either. The law as it was at the time of the decision allowed the courts to move it in either direction.

That account of a case like Garner v Burr would support the controversial claim that judges have widespread discretion in resolving legal disputes. Legal philosophers have debated whether that claim undermines the ideal of the rule of law, or reflects a basic requirement of the rule of law: that a legal system needs techniques for the resolution of legal issues that are not determined by the law (see Endicott 2000, chapter 9, and on the value of vagueness in law see Asgeirsson 2020; on a variety of issues concerning vagueness and philosophy of law, see the essays in Keil and Poscher 2016).

6. The use of philosophy of language in philosophy of law

6.1 Introduction: Definition as a methodology in philosophy of law

Bentham presented his theory as a definition. In focusing their attention on the meaning of the main terms of legal discourse, Bentham and John Austin were ahead of their time. But it has come to be a commonplace view in legal theory (though still controversial) that they were misguided in attempting to define those terms. So, for example, Hart in the 1960s rejected definition as a useful technique in philosophy of law (Hart 2012, 14–17). Dworkin in the 1980s accused Hart of only repackaging the same approach as the ‘more candidly definitional’ method of John Austin (Dworkin 1986, 32–33). And Richard Posner in the 1990s accused both Hart and Dworkin of pointlessly “trying to define ‘law’” (Posner 1996, vii).

There is no reason to describe the work of either Hart or Dworkin as defining the word ‘law’. And defining that word would not solve any of the problems of jurisprudence (as Hart pointed out). The fundamental reason is that the legal philosophers’ problems and their disputes would not be resolved by a statement of the meaning of the word ‘law’ that would be useful to someone who did not know it. Philosophers of law cannot solve their problems by giving a definition of the word ‘law’, any more than philosophers of language can solve their problems by giving a definition of the word ‘language’ (for discussion of the implications for legal philosophy of the semantics and metasemantics of the word ‘law’, see Coleman and Simchen 2003).

A further reason is that, as John Finnis and Ronald Dworkin have both explained in different ways, the word ‘law’ can be used in a variety of senses: the law of the jungle, the law of gravity, laws of thought, Murphy’s law, etc. (Finnis 1980, 6; Dworkin 1986, 104). A definition would have to allow for those senses. It might be an intriguing (and arduous) study in culture and human thought to explain the analogies among those senses, but it is a study that holds out no special promise for understanding the law of a community.

6.2 Language and the normativity of law

Legal philosophers have tried to explain the normativity of law—the fact that the law of a community is, or presents itself as, a guide to the conduct of members of a community. One easy way to express this abstract feature of law is by pointing out that the law can be stated by making normative statements (i.e. statements that use expressions like ‘obligation’, ‘right’, ‘must’, ‘may’). And one attractive way of trying to explain the normativity of law is by explaining the meaning and use of the normative language that is often used in stating the law. That is, the problem of explaining the nature of legal norms (obligations, rights, etc.) can be addressed by explaining the meaning or the use of the normative words that are used in law (‘obligation’, ‘right’,…). Joseph Raz has put it that ‘The problem of the normativity of law is the problem of explaining the use of normative language in describing the law or legal situations.’ (1990, 170)

We saw that Bentham’s theory of normative language in general was that, because there is no object, substance or perceptible human affection for which they stand as a name, words such as ‘right’ must be ‘expounded’ by paraphrasing sentences containing them. The paraphrase would use sentences that contain only words that can be defined as referring to objects, substances, and affections. When no such paraphrase is available, he considered that normative language is meaningless. So he held that the phrase ‘natural rights’ is “simple nonsense: natural and imprescriptible rights, rhetorical nonsense; nonsense upon stilts” (Bentham 1843, Art.II). While the language is meaningless, he thought, we can explain its use—as a way of doing something. Using such nonsensical expressions is a way in which the speaker expresses his preferences.

Although Bentham and John Austin thought that the notion of a natural right was nonsense, they did not at all think the same about the notion of legal rights. In their command theory they found a way of paraphrasing normative expressions in their legal use. They explained the meaning of the word ‘duty’—and thereby the normativity of law—by reference to the pain and pleasure that a superior offered as motivation for compliance with the superior’s will:

That is my duty to do, which I am liable to be punished, according to law, if I do not do: this is the original, ordinary, and proper sense of the word duty. (Bentham 1776, 109; cf. John Austin 1832, 14).

Hart used the resources of twentieth-century philosophy to challenge that approach to normative language. He drew on the work of J.L. Austin, a philosopher of language who thought that problems in many areas of philosophy could be dissolved by pointing out the things that people do with words. J.L. Austin once suggested that “a statement of ‘the law’” is a performative statement, rather than “a statement of fact” (Austin 1962, 4 n.2). The suggestion is that to state the law is to perform an act (an act other than the making of an assertion that could be true or false). J.L. Austin’s claim offered to account for the normativity of law by reference to the things that people do with words. That hint attracted Hart (Hart, 1954), whose theory of law is based on a ‘practice theory of rules’. He articulated the theory by pointing out what people do with the normative language they use in stating rules.

Hart started by arguing that Bentham and Austin had explained the meaning and use of normative language in a way that failed to account for its role in ordinary discourse. He pointed out that their account of the meaning of the word ‘duty’ left them unable to draw a distinction that people ordinarily draw in their use of language, between the command of a gunman (which no one would say imposes a ‘duty’ or an ‘obligation’), and a legal prescription:

The plausibility of the claim that the gunman situation displays the meaning of obligation lies in the fact that it is certainly one in which we would say that B, if he obeyed, was ‘obliged’ to hand over his money. It is, however, equally certain that we should misdescribe the situation if we said, on these facts, that B ‘had an obligation’ or a ‘duty’ to hand over the money. So from the start it is evident that we need something else for an understanding of the idea of obligation. There is a difference, yet to be explained, between the assertion that someone was obliged to do something and the assertion that he had an obligation to do it. (Hart 2012, 82)

Bentham and Austin would have had a ready response: that people ordinarily misuse the word ‘obligation’. They fail to give it a meaning that can be expounded by reference to sensible objects. Bentham and Austin were linguistic philosophers, but (unlike J.L. Austin) not ordinary language philosophers. They sought a way of using language that would back up their empiricism and utilitarianism, and they were actually pleased if that technique called for a reorganisation of ordinary language: it showed that they were disclosing what had been obscured by mere cant.

Hart’s approach to language was different. It may seem that he did not need to talk about language, and that his point could have been made without mentioning types of assertions, or what ‘we would say’. His argument, you might think, simply puts into the linguistic mode an argument that could be made with no mention of language: an argument that you can have an obligation without being liable to sanction. And yet, the linguistic form of the argument was important to Hart. He wanted to avoid explaining the difference between obligation and coercion in the way a natural law theorist might (by saying that an obligation is a kind of reason). So his focus on the use of the word ‘obligation’ is no accident. He did not point out the way we use that word as an oblique way of appealing to our shared wisdom as to what obligation is. It was actually important to him to point out how we use the word. His explanation of the normativity of law relies on the use of such words to display an attitude.

Hart claimed that a legal system is a system of power-conferring and duty-imposing rules, which are validated by a ‘rule of recognition’. That rule is not made valid by another rule; it is a ‘social rule’. In explaining that crucial notion of a social rule, Hart turned to the use of words to explain the normativity of law. He claimed that a social rule is a regular pattern of conduct accompanied by a ‘distinctive normative attitude’, which ‘consists in the standing disposition of individuals to take such patterns of conduct both as guides to their own future conduct and as standards of criticism’ (Hart, 2012, 255). In accounting for that disposition, or ‘internal attitude’, Hart’s emphasis was on speech acts—on the use that participants in the practice make of normative language.

What is necessary [for a social rule to exist] is that there should be a critical reflective attitude to certain patterns of behaviour as a common standard, and that this should display itself in criticism (including self-criticism), demands for conformity, and in acknowledgments that such criticism and demands are justified, all of which find their characteristic expression in the normative terminology of ‘ought’, ‘must’, and ‘should’, ‘right’ and ‘wrong’ (Hart, 2012, 57).

Hart’s interest in normative language was focused not on its meaning, but on the attitude that people display when they use it. His explanation of the difference between non-normative and normative assertions (between, as he put it, ‘the assertion that someone was obliged to do something and the assertion that he had an obligation to do it’) was merely that the latter sort of assertion is used to display a distinctive sort of attitude.

Just as Bentham’s approach to normative language was allied to his empiricism and his utilitarianism, Hart’s approach to normative language was allied to his philosophical methodology, and to his views on the relation between law and morality. His methodological purpose was to elucidate human practices, and he wanted to defend a conceptual separation between law and morality—a distinction in kind between legal obligation and moral obligation (see Hart 2012, 239–240). The practice theory of rules attracted him as a tool for those purposes, because it offered a way of accounting for the normativity of law by pointing to forms of behaviour which could be described, and which did not (in his view) carry any moral baggage. In saying that people use normative language to display an attitude to regularities of behaviour, the theorist did not need to do moral philosophy, and did not need to make any moral evaluations of the practice being described. The theorist did not even need to ascribe any moral evaluations to the participants in the practice, since the fact that people use normative language to display an attitude is, Hart considered, consistent with their having various moral views or none at all.

How much simpler it would be to say that normative language means the same in its moral uses and in its legal uses. While a person who says that you must stop at a red light may display various attitudes, what he or she asserts is a necessity that implies a (presumptively) conclusive reason to stop. If the statement is a statement of law, the necessity is a legal necessity; if the statement is a moral statement, the necessity is a moral necessity.

That approach is not only simpler; it closes the gap that Hart left in his theory. According to Hart, the meaning of normative language differs in morality and in law. But in fact, Hart had nothing to say about the meaning of normative expressions such as ‘ought’ and ‘must’ or ‘obligation’ or ‘right’ (except that their meaning differs in law and in morality). He only pointed out that people display an attitude when they use such language.

Joseph Raz rejected Hart’s claim that normative terms have a distinctive meaning in statements of law. In Raz’s view, to make a normative statement such as ‘you must stop at a red light’ is to imply that you have a certain sort of reason for action. If it is a statement applying the law, it implies that you have reason to stop from the point of view of the law. Raz’s theory of law, unlike Hart’s, is part of a theory of practical reason in general, and his account of normative statements treats them as having the same meaning in law and in morality. Hart initially thought that that approach would necessarily lead to an extreme sort of natural law theory, in which every true statement of law is necessarily a true moral statement, and every valid legal obligation is necessarily a moral obligation. But Raz resolved that concern of Hart’s, by pointing out that normative statements can be made in a detached way. People can make them without endorsing the point of view from which the reasons they are stating are valid (see Raz 1990, 175–177). Still, Hart did not accept Raz’s approach, which he felt created a certain sort of conceptual connection between law and morality. In responding to Raz, he insisted that ‘statements of the subject’s legal duties need have nothing directly to do with the subject’s reasons for action’ (Hart 1982, 267). And in an interview with the Spanish journal Doxa near the end of his career he maintained ‘that legal and moral obligation are conceptually different’, so that a statement of obligation has a different meaning in law and in morality (De Paramo 1988). He never explained the difference in meaning; its necessity only follows from a methodological preconception.


Cited Works

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Further Reading

  • Alchourrón, Carlos, and Bulygin, Eugenio, 1971, Normative Systems, Vienna: Springer.
  • Bix, Brian, 1996, Law, Language and Legal Determinacy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Blackburn, Simon, 1984, Spreading the Word, Oxford: Oxford University Press; especially pages 205–209.
  • Brink, David O., 1988, “Legal Theory, Legal Interpretation, and Judicial Review,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 17: 105–48.
  • Bulygin, Eugenio, 1982, “Norms, normative propositions and legal statements”, in G. Floistad (ed.), Contemporary Philosophy A New Survey, The Hague: M. Nijhoff, 157–163.
  • Endicott, Timothy, 2002, “How to Speak the Truth,” American Journal of Jurisprudence, 46: 229–248.
  • –––, 2005, “The Value of Vagueness,” in Vijay K. Bhatia, Jan Engberg, Maurizio Gotti and Dorothee Heller (eds.), Vagueness in Normative Texts, Bern: Peter Lang, Chapter 1, 27–48.
  • Fish, Stanley, 1989, Doing What Comes Naturally, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Green, Michael, 2003, “Dworkin’s Fallacy, or What the Philosophy of Language Can’t Teach Us about the Law”, Virginia Law Review, 89: 1897–1952.
  • Greenawalt, Kent, 1992, Law and Objectivity, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Greenberg, Mark and Harry Litman, 1998, “The Meaning of Original Meaning,” Georgetown Law Journal, 86: 569.
  • Moore, Michael, 1985, “A Natural Law Theory of Interpretation,” Southern California Law Review, 58: 277
  • Patterson, Dennis, 1996, Law and Truth, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Perelman, Chaim, 1963, The Idea of Justice and the Problem of Argument, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • Plunkett, David and Tim Sundell, 2014, “Antipositivist Arguments from Legal Thought and Talk: The Metalinguistic Response,” in G. Hubbs and D. Lind (eds.), Pragmatism, Law, and Language, London: Routledge, 56–75.
  • Stavropoulos, Nicos, 1996, Objectivity in Law, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Williams, Glanville, 1945–1946, “Language and the Law”, Law Quarterly Review, 61: 71, 179, 293, 384; 62: 387.

Other Internet Resources


Thanks for research assistance by Mikolaj Barczentewicz, and for helpful comments from Jonny McIntosh and William Edmundson.

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