# Bolzano’s Logic

*First published Sun Sep 23, 2007; substantive revision Fri Jul 8, 2022*

One of the great philosophers of the nineteenth century, Bernard
Bolzano (1781–1848) made outstanding contributions in a number
of fields (for a more comprehensive survey of his thought and
biographical details, see Edgar Morscher’s
article
on Bolzano in this Encyclopedia). As a logician, he focussed on
foundations, developing a theoretical framework that is still very
much worth studying today, so much so that a highly respected
contemporary logician could (only half facetiously) write a quite
positive review of Bolzano’s *Theory of Science* (1837)
as if it had just appeared (van Benthem, 2013). This is not to say
that all aspects of Bolzano’s logical work could be mistaken for
contemporary productions: if he seems at times to be at home in the
twenty-first century, it is equally clear at others that we have to do
with a thinker who was born in the eighteenth.

Bolzano’s presentation of logic in the modern sense is embedded
in the vast *Theory of Science* (henceforth *TS*; a
shorter introduction to Bolzano’s logic may be found in Bolzano
2004a). The best known innovations of this work belong to his
variation logic: definitions of universal validity and analyticity,
along with the creation of a complete system of extensional relations
between propositions, the most important being compatibility,
deducibility (consequence), and equivalence. Bolzano discovered the
link between deducibility and conditional probability, according to
which deducibility and incompatibility appear as two limit cases of
conditional probability. He is also recognized for adopting an
anti-psychologistic approach to logic, and for his contributions to
semantics. Bolzano’s theory of the grounding relation
(*Abfolge*) leading to a hierarchical order among the
propositions of a deductive science is the first modern study of
axiomatic systems. Moreover, the thorough discussions of concepts of
logic and many other insights contribute to make the *TS* one
of the classical works in logic and epistemology, on a par with those
of Aristotle, Leibniz, and Frege. The extensive historical notes
contained in it are a unique source for the history of logic. Although
written in natural language, Bolzano’s logic represents a
decisive breakthrough in the development of modern logic.

- 1. Early work in logic and methodology
- 2. Logic as Theory of Science
- 3. Propositions in themselves
- 4. Ideas
- 5. The analysis of propositions
- 6. Bolzano’s logic of variation
- 7. The objective connection among truths: grounding (
*Abfolge*) - 8. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Early work in logic and methodology

In 1810, Bolzano published a booklet entitled *Contributions to a
better founded presentation of mathematics* (Bolzano 1810; Bolzano
2004b) in which he developed his views about the unsatisfactory state
of the mathematics of his time and the need for its reform. He
proposed a new definition of mathematics as “the science which
deals with the general laws (forms) to which things must conform in
their existence” (Bolzano 1810, I, §8; Bolzano 2004b: 94),
a new division of mathematics into universal mathematics (arithmetic,
algebra, analysis, and elements of his future theory of collections)
and more specialized mathematical disciplines (e.g., the mathematical
theory of time, geometry, rational mechanics), and also put forth some
considerations on logic. As with Leibniz, logic is again seen as
closely connected with mathematics: it is, indeed, the mathematical
method (Bolzano 1810, II, §1; Bolzano 2004b: 103).

The logical theory of the *Contributions* is quite primitive,
but the work nonetheless contains a number of important insights.
Following Aristotle, Bolzano distinguished two sorts of proofs: those
that aim merely to convince us *that* something is the case and
those which also show *why* it is so. He called the former
“certifications” (Bolzano 2004b: 254:
“confirmations”) [*Gewissmachungen*], the latter
“groundings” [*Begründungen*]. The concept of
grounding reflects the “objective connection among
truths”, which need not and usually does not coincide with the
subjective order of recognition. It would later become the fundamental
concept in Bolzano’s treatment of axiomatic theories in the
*TS*.

He then extended this distinction to cover other elements of axiomatic theories. Subjectively, definitions are considerations that acquaint us with the meanings of certain words, while objectively, a definition indicates the parts and structure of a complex concept. Subjectively, some words do not require definition, because their meanings are already clearly understood, while objectively, some concepts cannot be defined because they are simple, i.e., have no parts. Similarly, an axiom or principle in the subjective sense is a proposition whose truth is evident to us, while in the objective sense an axiom is simply an indemonstrable truth from which other truths may be deduced.

Considered objectively, a mathematical theory itself becomes a mathematical object. It has an intrinsic structure, in which complex concepts are ultimately composed of simple ones, and propositions are ordered according to their relations of objective dependence, beginning with the axioms. The goal of foundational research, as he then saw things, is to discover and display this objective order (Bolzano 1810, II, § 2).

The *Contributions* also contains valuable epistemological
reflections. Since axioms in the objective sense need not be evident
to us, Bolzano states, it can and does happen that, at first anyway,
we find them less trustworthy than the theorems that are objectively
demonstrable from them. We become convinced of their truth not by
contemplating them in isolation, but rather by recognizing their role
within a deductive system: that is, by seeing that their objective
consequences include the theorems we believe to be true but no
propositions we take to be false (Bolzano 1810, II, §21, note;
Bolzano 2004b: 119). Similarly, even though simple concepts cannot be
defined in an objective sense, they may still require definition in
the subjective sense, that is, we may need to develop a clear
understanding of them. In such cases, our understanding

… is brought about by mentioning several sentences, in which the concept in question, designated by its own word, appears in various combinations. From the comparison of these sentences, the reader is able to abstract which determinate concept the word designates. […] This means is well known as that by which each of us learned the first meanings of words in our mother tongue (Bolzano 1810, II, §8; Bolzano 2004b: 107; our translation).

Bolzano called such circumlocutions “paraphrases” or
“circumscriptions” [*Umschreibungen*]. His method
points towards a solution of the paradox of definition according to
which all concepts are ultimately defined in terms of simple concepts,
but these remain undefined and thus devoid of meaning.

Bolzano also presents two important criteria for the correctness of
proofs: according to the first, “If the subject (or the
hypothesis) of a proposition is as wide as it can be so that the
predicate (or the thesis) can be applied to it, then in any correct
proof of this proposition all characteristics of the subject must be
used, i.e., they must be applied in the derivation of the
predicate.” The second is Bolzano’s version of
Aristotle’s ban on crossing from one genus to another: one
cannot deduce a general proposition from one of its special cases
(Bolzano 1810, II, §28, 29; Bolzano 2004b: 122–126). In a
proof of the intermediate value theorem, for instance, one of the
necessary conditions is that the functions be *real-valued*. An
attempted proof that makes no use of any attribute separating the
reals from the rationals can accordingly be diagnosed as incorrect
according to the first criterion, while an attempted proof that
appeals to geometry or kinematics will run afoul of the second. These
insights immediately bore fruit in Bolzano’s mathematical work
(1816, 1817).

## 2. Logic as Theory of Science

Bolzano did not long remain satisfied with the logic sketched in the
*Contributions* Already in 1812, he recorded his intention to
develop a new logic which would lead to a “total transformation
of the *a priori* sciences”. The *Theory of
Science*, written between 1820 and 1830 and published in 1837,
marks its realization, embedded in the broader context of general
epistemology and methodology of science (which Bolzano also counted as
logic in a broader sense).

Bolzano defined the theory of science by its ultimate goal, which is the division of human knowledge into disciplines and the composition of scientific treatises. According to the definition, the theory of science is

the collection of all rules which we must follow, if we want to do a competent piece of work, when we divide the total domain of truths into individual sciences, and present them in their respective treatises. (

TS, I, §1, 7)

This definition presupposes a whole sequence of disciplines involved
in the construction of a science, each of which is founded on the
preceding one. The ultimate discipline in this sequence deals with the
delimitation of sciences and the principles of style of scientific
writing that should lead to the composition of a collection of
scientific treatises forming an encyclopedia. Bolzano hoped that,
following the Great Encyclopedia of Diderot and D’Alembert, the
ideal of the Enlightenment, the effort to spread scientifically
organized useful knowledge would again find its finest expression in
the completion of an encyclopedia. In this way, the *TS* would
contribute to the general well-being.

In order to divide truths into different disciplines and present them
in particular treatises, we first have to discover them. Such is the
goal of *The Art of Discovery* or *Heuristic*, which
contains rules for finding new truths. Heuristic presupposes the
possibility of recognizing truths, which is the object of *The
Theory of Knowledge*. Now, the decisive step in the exploration of
the layers of science leads to the most important part of the
*TS*, *The Theory of Elements*, which analyses the
objective conditions of the subjective activity of knowing, namely the
theory of ideas, propositions and deduction, considered in and of
themselves, in short: formal logic. The *Theory of
Fundamentals* attempts to show that these elements are
propositions in themselves and ideas in themselves, that there are
infinitely many truths in themselves and that we can know at least
some of them. Taking all the disciplines of the *TS* in the due
order, we obtain the following structure:

- Theory of Fundamentals (Vol. I, §§17–45),
- Theory of Elements, i.e., formal logic (Vol. I and Vol. II, §§46–268),
- Theory of Knowledge (Vol. III, §§269–321),
- Heuristic (Vol. III, §§322–391),
- Theory of Science Proper, i.e., the theory of the division of the truths into particular sciences and the principles of composition for scientific treatises (Vol. IV, §§392–718).

## 3. Propositions in themselves

Bolzano’s first important innovation in the *TS* aims at
the transformation of the domain of logic (more specifically, of the
Theory of Elements). According to him, logic is not a theory of ideas
and judgments in our mind, it is not an *art de pensée*
in the sense of Arnauld’s and Nicole’s *Port-Royal
Logic* or an exposition of the laws of thought. Rather, logic is
concerned with the objective relations between propositions and ideas
*in themselves*, that is, independently of their being thought
or expressed.

Although Bolzano took propositions to be composed of parts, which he
called *ideas*, he does not offer a definition of the concept
of a proposition as a certain kind of structured whole. The reason for
this was that no definition he had found in the writings of others,
nor any that he could think of himself, was satisfactory. Instead, he
seeks to convey what he means by ‘proposition’ using the
procedure he had earlier called ‘circumscription’ (cf.
*TS*, §668, no. 9), presenting the reader with a number of
sentences containing the word that are supposed to be true when it is
rightly understood.

One will gather what I mean by

propositionas soon as I remark that I do not call aproposition in itselfor anobjective propositionthat which the grammarians call a proposition, namely, the linguistic expression, but rather simply the meaning of this expression, which must be exactly one of the two, true or false; and that accordingly I attribute actuality to the grasping of a proposition, tothoughtpropositions as well as to thejudgments madein the mind of a thinking being (existence, namely, in the mind of the one who thinks this proposition and who makes the judgment); but the mere proposition in itself (or theobjective proposition) I count among the kinds of things that do not have any existence whatsoever, and never can attain existence. Ourthinkingof a proposition, ourjudgmentthat a thing is so and so, is something actual, which began at a certain time and will end at a certain time; the writtensigns, through which we record these propositions in some place or other are equally really existing things; the propositions themselves, however, do not exist in any time or place (Bolzano 2004a: 40–41).

The expression ‘in itself’, as Bolzano explains elsewhere,
is used to indicate that a term is used in its full generality, and
hence that any customary tacit additions (such as *thought* or
*expressed in a language*) should be suppressed
(*TS*,§ 57, no. 2). In view of the unhelpful Kantian
associations with the expression ‘in itself’,
Bolzano’s expression ‘*an sich*’ might also
be rendered as ‘as such ’ (as suggested by Jan Berg) or
‘*per se*’.

Bolzano maintained that *there are* (*es gibt*)
propositions in themselves, though they are not *actual*
(*wirklich*), that is, do not act, or enter into causal
relations. Thus they have the status often accorded to mathematical
objects. And although he thought that the recognition of propositions
in themselves was crucial for metaphysics, he also sought to persuade
those who did not share his metaphysical views to accept propositions
based on pragmatic and methodological considerations (*TS*,
§20, no. 1).

In this article, we will follow the common practice of the secondary literature on Bolzano by using square brackets to form designations of propositions in themselves and like entities. Thus, for instance, ‘[Socrates has wisdom]’ designates the proposition in itself expressed by the sentence ‘Socrates has wisdom’, while ‘[Socrates]’ designates the part of that proposition (or idea) designated by ‘Socrates’.

### 3.1 Forms of propositions

In Bolzano’s view, propositions can be expressed more or less
adequately by sentences, and consideration of linguistic structures
accordingly informs his treatment of the parts and structures of
propositions. Consider a sentence such as ‘Romeo loves
Juliet’, for instance. We recognize that we could replace
‘Romeo’ with another proper name such as
‘Othello’ and still have a perfectly grammatical sentence.
Moreover, given a set of proper names, we can specify a class of
sentences that differ from ‘Romeo loves Juliet’ at most by
having a different one of those names at the beginning. We could
proceed similarly with ‘loves’ and a suitable set of
transitive verbs. Or we could consider the class of sentences
obtainable when both sorts of replacements are permitted, and so on.
These classes of sentences would correspond to the *sentential
forms* ‘**a** loves Juliet’, ‘Romeo **V**
Juliet’, and ‘**a V** Juliet’, respectively.

So too, Bolzano clearly thinks, with propositions in themselves. Given
a proposition, we can think of others just like it except for having
different parts (ideas) at certain places. And though there can be no
actual variation, i.e., no change in time, in the realm of
propositions in themselves, nor any places strictly speaking, we can
nonetheless speak metaphorically of making substitutions at certain
places within propositions, using this as a *façon de
parler* about atemporal relations between propositions and their
parts. Given a proposition, then, we can consider certain of its parts
*variable*, i.e., subject to replacement by other parts, and,
given classes of suitable substituends for each site of substitution,
we can again determine a class of propositions.

If certain parts of a sentence correspond to parts of the proposition
it expresses, the sentential forms we obtain by replacing one or more
of these parts with signs for variables, along with a specification of
permissible substituends, will determine not just a class of sentences
but also a class of propositions of the kind just described. Bolzano
sometimes calls such classes of propositions *propositional
forms*. Strictly speaking, however, he reserves this term for the
sentential forms that determine such classes:

[T]he proposition “Some people have white skin” occurs in logic at best as an example, and not as the subject of a theorem, while a class of propositions, such as the class determined by the expression “Some

AareB” may well be the subject of a theorem. If these classes of propositions are to be called generalformsof propositions, then it is permissible to say that logic is concerned with forms rather than with individual propositions. (Actually, only the written or oralexpression“SomeAareB”, and not the class itself, should be called a form) (TS, §12, no. 2 [I.48]).

Note that a sentence need not be perfectly distinct (i.e., such that there is a one-to-one structure-preserving correspondence between its parts and the parts of the proposition is expresses) to be used in this way, provided only that the parts of the sentence that are replaced by signs for variables do correspond to parts of the proposition. For instance, if we are satisfied that ‘mammal’ and ‘bear’ correspond to parts of the proposition [Some mammal is a bear], we can use the sentential form ‘Some A is a B’ to determine a class of propositions, even if it turns out that this proposition might be more distinctly expressed by a different sentence, e.g., by ‘There exists an individual that is a mammal and that is also a bear.’

Since different parts of a proposition may be considered variable, each proposition belongs to a number of different forms. In particular, there is no absolute distinction between the form and matter of propositions on Bolzano’s definition.

## 4. Ideas

As mentioned above, Bolzano defines an *idea* as a part of a
proposition, more precisely, as “any constituent of a
proposition that is not itself a proposition” (*TS*,
§128, no. 2 [II.18]; cf. §48). For example, assuming the
sentence ‘Fido, who is a dog, is not a reptile’ to be a
fairly distinct expression of the corresponding proposition, we might
distinguish within that proposition ideas (i.e., sub-propositional
parts) such as [Fido], [dog], [reptile], but also [who], [is], and
[not]. As with propositions, Bolzano carefully distinguishes between
ideas in themselves, thought (or subjective) ideas, and linguistic
signs for ideas.

Bolzano’s term is ‘*Vorstellung*’. This was
the standard rendering of ‘idea’ in German translations of
Locke, Hume, *et al.* It is also sometimes rendered as
‘presentation’ or ‘representation’, e.g., in
translations of the works of Kant and Husserl. Bolzano’s
decision to continue to use the term tends to obscure the vast
differences between his views and those he found in the logical
literature of his time. Ideas, for him, are akin to Husserl’s
part-meanings or to Fregean senses other than thoughts. This is not at
all what most of the authors Bolzano discussed meant when they spoke
of ideas, even if there was a tiny point of contact in the
circumstance that, like him, those authors usually maintained that
ideas (or notions, concepts, cognitions) could occur as parts of
judgments, namely, as their subjects and predicates.

Bolzano recognizes three individuating features of ideas with objects
: *extension, content*, and *structure*. Loosely
speaking, the extension of an idea is “the collection of all the
objects standing under it” (Bolzano 2004a: 46); more strictly,
it is “that particular attribute of an idea by virtue of which
it represents only those and no other objects.” (*TS*,
§66, I:298). While ideas with different extensions, for example,
[prime number] and [odd number], are perforce different on
Bolzano’s account, this is only a sufficient condition, witness
the coextensive but clearly different ideas [even prime number] and
[positive square root of 4].

Though these ideas are coextensive, we can still distinguish them by
noting that they have different parts, e.g., that [prime] occurs in
the first, but not in the second. Bolzano will say in such cases that
the *content* of the two ideas is different. According to his
definition, the content of a complex idea is the *sum* of its
parts. ‘Sum’ is a technical term in Bolzano’s
ontology, designating collections “in which the manner of
combination does not matter and in which the parts of the parts may be
considered parts of the whole” (*TS*, §84). For our
purposes, it is sufficient to note that when Bolzano asks us to think
about the content of an idea, he wants us to consider its parts, but
not their arrangement.

To resume: ideas with different content also differ. Once again,
however, this condition is merely sufficient, as the same parts can be
arranged differently, witness: [ignorant son of a learned father],
[learned son of an ignorant father]. Accordingly, Bolzano recognizes
the *structure* of a complex idea, the way its parts are
combined (their *Verbindungsart*), as an additional
individuating attribute. Indeed, sometimes structure is the only
individuating attribute, as Bolzano shows in *TS* (§96,
no. 2) with the clever example of [\(2^{4}\)] and [\(4^{2}\)], which
have the same content and the same extension but differ
nonetheless.

Although in many cases ideas are assumed to be structured like
linguistic expressions, it is also clear that Bolzano recognized ideas
whose structure cannot be captured in a linear script. For example, in
ideas of the form ‘\(A\), which has the properties \(b, b',
b'',\ldots\)’, no ordering is supposed between the parts \(b,
b', b'',\ldots\), which occur in the idea in itself as a unordered
collection (*Menge*).

Bolzano was a semantic atomist: in his view, all ideas are ultimately
composed of simple parts, which are themselves ideas (*TS*,
§61). In the case of simple ideas with objects, there is no
content strictly speaking since there are no parts, and hence no
structure either. Thus such ideas are individuated by their extensions
alone (*TS*, §93, no. 3). The relation of a simple idea to
its objects is primitive, hence undefinable. It is instructive to
compare this position with the contemporary practice of interpreting a
formal language by assigning extensions (objects or sets of objects)
to the non-logical constants (or parameters).

Bolzano does not tell us how simple ideas without objects (e.g., [and], [not]) are individuated. This strikes us as a significant oversight.

### 4.1 Varieties of ideas

Some ideas, called *objectual* (*gegenständlich*)
by Bolzano, have, or represent, one or more objects, for instance,
[the Bolzano-Weierstrass theorem], [raven]. Others are
*objectless* (*gegenstandlos*), e.g., [round square],
[golden mountain], [not] (*TS*, §67). Not recognizing
empty collections, Bolzano says that objectless ideas have no
extensions.

If an idea has exactly one object, it is called *singular*,
and, if has more than one, *general* (§68). Some general
ideas are complex, e.g., [star of the first magnitude]. Others,
Bolzano maintains, are simple: he thinks that [object] and [attribute]
are likely such. In the case of singular ideas, similarly, he holds
that some are complex, e.g., [the most massive planet in our solar
system], while others are simple. Appropriating Kant’s term for
his own purposes, he calls the latter kind of ideas, that is, simple,
singular ideas, *intuitions* (§72). Ideas that are not
intuitions and do not have any intuitions among their parts are called
(pure) *concepts*, while ideas that have both concepts and
intuitions among their parts are called *mixed* (§73).

Those familiar with the role played by logically proper names in Russell’s philosophy of logical atomism will have an easier time understanding Bolzano’s use of the concept of an intuition. Intuitions are the counterpart in the realm of ideas in themselves to the essentially indexical elements in language: they are best expressed by using a bare demonstrative (‘this’) and, in the case of subjective human intuitions, always have particular contemporaneous mental states as their objects. Any singular idea of a contingently existing particular, moreover, must number intuitions among its parts. Intuitions thus serve as markers of empirical content.

If no part of a proposition is an intuition, it is called *purely
conceptual*, otherwise *intuitional*. This distinction,
defined at the level of propositions in themselves, is prior to the
distinction between *a priori* and *a posteriori*
judgements, and used to define it:

If the propositions from which a judgement

Mis deduced, as well as those from which the former follow, down to the immediate judgements, are all purely conceptual propositions, then judgementMcan be called ajudgement from pure concepts, orpure, ora priori. In all other cases it could be said to bedrawn from experienceora posteriori(TS, §306, no.12).

Some sciences, e.g., number theory or real analysis, consist entirely
of purely conceptual propositions, and are accordingly called
*purely conceptual sciences*. Though Bolzano optimistically
held that *most* purely conceptual truths could be known *a
priori*, he refrains from claiming this of all of them, and
clearly recognizes that many purely conceptual propositions, even in
mathematics, are accepted based at least partly on empirical
(intuitional) evidence (*TS*, §133; Bolzano 2004a: 53).

### 4.2 Extensional relations between ideas: the logic of classes

Of the two main parts of Bolzano’s formal logic, the extensional
logic of ideas (the logic of classes) and the extensional logic of
propositions, the first part comes from a long tradition beginning
with Boethius (and derived from Aristotelian syllogistic) and ending
— in Bolzano’s times — with Gergonne. Bolzano did
not take his logic of classes from Gergonne or Euler, the most
influential authors in their time, but rather from a small booklet
entitled *Outline of Logic* (*Grundriß der Logik*)
by a now completely forgotten logician, J.G.E. Maaß, published
in 1793.

In *TS*, §§ 94–108, Bolzano defines a system of
relations between the extensions of ideas, and proves various theorems
about these relations. To begin with, ideas \(A, B, C, \ldots\) are
said to be *compatible* just in case there is at least one
object that stands under all of them; otherwise, they are called
incompatible. In the case in which not only some but all objects
represented by \(A\) are also represented by \(B\), \(A\) is said to
be *included* in \(B\). If the converse also holds, i.e., if
\(A\) is included in \(B\) and \(B\) included in \(A\), the ideas
\(A\) and \(B\) are called *equivalent* (or
*interchangeable*). He defines two further special cases:
first, compatibility where neither \(A\) is included in \(B\), nor
\(B\) in \(A\); Bolzano calls this relation *overlapping* or
*linking*. Second, we have the relation of
*subordination*, which is inclusion without reciprocity.

Three kinds of incompatibility are distinguished: mutual exclusion,
contradiction and contrariety. Ideas \(A\), \(B\), *C*, …
are said to *exclude* each other iff they are pairwise
incompatible. The ideas \(A\) and \(B\) are contradictory iff \(B\)
has “an extension that includes everything that does not stand
under the idea \(A\)” (*TS* II, §103, 477), i.e. if
\(B\) is equivalent to *non-A*. They are *contrary*,
finally, iff they are incompatible but not contradictory.

As all these relations are derived from compatibility and its
negation, it is possible to represent them in the form of a
genealogical tree (see Šebestík 1992: 174). Simplifying
somewhat, we can define Bolzano’s relations for pairs of ideas
in the language of set theory as shown below. (Here, we depart from
Bolzano by also admitting universal ideas such as “something in
general” [*Etwas überhaupt*], along with objectless
ideas and the empty set as their extension (for Bolzano, an objectless
idea has no extension, and there are no empty collections)).

\(A \textrm{ is } \textit{compatible} \textrm{ with } B \) | \( =_{\textrm{df}} \) | \(Ext(A) \cap Ext(B) \not= \emptyset\) |

\(A \textrm{ is }\textit{incompatible}\textrm{ with } B\) | \(=_{\textrm{df}}\) | \(Ext(A) \cap Ext(B) = \emptyset\) |

\(A\textrm{ is }\textit{included}\textrm{ in } B\) | \(=_{\textrm{df}}\) | \(A\) is compatible with \(B\) and \(Ext(A) \subseteq Ext(B)\) |

\(A\textrm{ is }\textit{equivalent}\textrm{ to }B\) | \(=_{\textrm{df}}\) | \(A\) is included in \(B\) and \(B\) is included in \(A\) |

\(A\textrm{ is }\textit{subordinate}\textrm{ to }B\) | \(=_{\textrm{df}}\) | \(A\) is included in but not equivalent to \(B\) |

\(A\textrm{ is }\textit{contradictory}\textrm{ with } B\) | \(=_{\textrm{df}}\) | \(A\) is incompatible with \(B\) and \( Ext(A) \cup Ext(B) = \textrm{universal class}\) |

\(A\) is contrary to \(B\) |
\(=_{\textrm{df}}\) | \(A\) and \(B\) are incompatible but not contradictory. |

## 5. The analysis of propositions

If Bolzano’s thesis of semantic atomism is correct, then there
is a *finest* form for every proposition; namely, the one in
which every simple idea in the proposition is considered independently
variable. We can see from this the task that confronts someone who
seeks to define the concept of a proposition as a certain kind of
structured whole using formation rules: this would require not only a
specification of all possible syntactic structures, but also a
complete set of semantic categories (since different sites of
variation may come with different classes of admissible items).
Moreover, it would be necessary to do this not just for a formal
language of our own devising, or for a single natural language, but
for any possible language. Seen in this light, Bolzano’s
forthright admission that he could find no satisfactory definition of
the concept of a proposition is hardly surprising.

Instead of trying to begin with simple ideas and construct
propositions from them, Bolzano works from the outside in, trying to
distinguish parts within propositions, generally following what Quine
called the “maxim of shallow analysis”, namely,
“expose no more logical structure than seems useful for the
deduction or other inquiry at hand” (Quine, 1960: §33;
160). Since propositions in themselves are causally inert, this cannot
be done by inspecting them. Rather, one considers linguistic
expressions, drawn from a variety of languages, along with one’s
own thoughts, and attempts to identify features of logical
significance, bearing in mind that “common usage does not aim at
logical correctness but rather at brevity and *sufficient*
distinctness.” (*TS*, §170 [II.213]; see also
§350, 366).

Bolzano makes a number of specific proposals concerning the analysis of propositions, most of them now of merely historical interest. We will briefly present a few of these here.

First, he argues that every proposition belongs to the
subject-predicate form ‘\(A\) has \(b\)’ (*TS*,
§ 127; recall that this does not prevent them from also belonging
to other forms.) He acknowledges that he has no conclusive argument
for his thesis, but claims that he has been able to find acceptable
subject-predicate paraphrases of all the sentence forms that have
occurred to him (Bolzano 1843: 48).

In true propositions of this form, the place marked by ‘\(A\)’ is occupied by an idea that has one or more objects, while the place marked by ‘\(b\)’ is occupied by an idea representing one or more attributes. The copula, expressed by ‘has’, understood to be without tense or number, indicates the possession of an attribute. Tense is dealt with by adding temporal determiners to the subject-idea. For example, ‘Smith is in pain’ would be more distinctly expressed as ‘Smith at the present moment–has (tenselessly)–pain’ (§127, no. 5).

Since both the subject- and predicate-ideas may be general, we must understand ‘\(A\) has \(b\)’ to convey that every object standing under the idea [\(A\)] has an attribute standing under the idea [\(b\)] (§131). Accordingly, he takes propositions of the form ‘All \(A\) have \(b\)’ to be synonymous with those of the forms ‘Each \(A\) has \(b\)’ and ‘\(A\) has \(b\)’, e.g., ‘All men have mortality’, ‘Each man has mortality’, and ‘Man has mortality.’

Bolzano believes that the subject-predicate form can accommodate
relational claims, interpreting them as statements about collections.
For instance, a claim that items \(A, B, C, \ldots\) are equal in the
sense of all having attributes \(b, b', b'', \ldots\) could be
interpreted as a claim about a collection containing two unordered
sub-collections (*Mengen*), i.e., \(\langle (A, B, C, \ldots),
(b, b', b'', \ldots)\rangle\), stating that the collection has the
attribute that every item in the first sub-collection has each of the
attributes in the second sub-collection (cf. §135, no.15).

For Bolzano, truth and falsity (or lack-of-truth) are properties of
propositions. Given his assumption that all propositions belong to the
form ‘\(A\) has \(b\)’, he is able to offer the following
definition of truth (*TS*, §28):

That is,A proposition is true when it states what belongs to its object.

[A has b] has truth iff A has b.

Bolzano’s analysis of existential claims such as ‘There
are prime numbers greater than 100’ is also noteworthy. What we
mean in such cases, he says, is that the idea [prime number greater
than 100] has objectuality (§137). This analysis shows its worth
in the case of true negative existentials such as ‘Round squares
do not exist’, allowing him to solve the associated riddle of
non-being. For this sentence says the same as the more distinct
‘[Round square] has lack-of-objectuality’ according to
Bolzano, and, in this case, we have an objectual subject-idea (its
object is the *idea* [round square]) and ascribe to its object
a property that it has (namely, objectlessness) (§138).

Bolzano proposes similar analyses of forms such as ‘Some \(A\) are \(B\)’ and ‘No \(A\) is \(B\)’. These are taken to be more distinctly expressed as follows: ‘[\(A\), which has \(b\)] has objectuality’, and ‘[\(A\), which has \(b\)] has non-objectuality’, respectively (§137,138).

Claims of objectuality are not to be confused with claims of
*actuality* (§142). Though, for example, Bolzano
maintained that there are (*es gibt*) propositions and ideas in
themselves, as well as geometrical points and other mathematical
objects, he denied at the same time that they had actual existence
(i.e., they do not act, or enter into causal relations, no spatial or
temporal determinations attach to them, etc.). The ideas [proposition
in itself], [geometrical point], etc., that is, have objectuality but
propositions, points, etc., lack the property of actuality.

Bolzano distinguishes predicate and propositional negation, the former taking the form ‘\(A\) has non-\(b\)’, the latter ‘[\(A\) has \(b\)] has non-truth’ (§189, 1(e); cf. §136). The two forms are not equivalent, since, for example, [Mozart’s 35th piano concerto is not in E-flat] is false, its subject-idea being objectless, while [[Mozart’s 35th piano concerto is in E-flat] has non-truth] is true.

Material disjunctions, i.e., claims of the forms ‘\(A\) or \(B\) or \(C \ldots\)’ are paraphrased as follows (§181): ‘[True proposition in the collection (\([A], [B], [C], \ldots\))] has objectuality’ (inclusive disjunction) or as ‘[True proposition in the collection \(([A], [B], [C], \ldots\))] has objectuality and [Plurality of true propositions in the collection (\([A], [B], [C], \ldots\))] has non-objectuality’ (exclusive disjunction).

We hope this is enough to give some sense of Bolzano’s approach and some of its limitations. More details may be found in the secondary literature.

## 6. Bolzano’s logic of variation

### 6.1 Propositions and propositional forms

Bolzano’s logic of extensional relations between propositions represents a major innovation which has no equivalent in traditional logic. It is based on the method of variation that we have already encountered. Bolzano introduces this part of his logic as follows:

Given a proposition, we could merely inquire whether it is true or false. But some very remarkable properties of propositions can be discovered if, in addition, we consider the truth values of all those propositions which can be generated from them, if we take some of their constituent ideas as variable and replace them by any other ideas whatever (

TS, § 147).

Often, Bolzano uses sentential forms such as ‘The man **A**
is mortal’ in his discussions. At other times, he will simply
write something like this: “Let us … consider the
proposition ‘The man Caius is mortal’, and let us envisage
the idea ‘Caius’ as arbitrarily variable”
(*TS*, § 147).

These two manners of speaking correspond to two different levels. On
the first, linguistic level, we deal with sentential forms, i.e.,
expressions containing signs for variables, which become sentences
(and express propositions) after appropriate substitutions are made.
The second level is the level of propositions and ideas in themselves,
the level of meaning. Here, Bolzano cannot use variables, letters or
other indeterminate signs, for, in the realm of the propositions and
ideas in themselves, there are no indeterminate entities that would
correspond to sentential forms; there are only propositions, true or
false. This might be the reason for Bolzano’s cumbersome way of
speaking about “the idea *Caius* considered
variable”.

Bolzano’s loose manner of speaking about substitutions of ideas
in propositions is adopted in what follows. To declare one or several
ideas in a given proposition variable is to consider the class of all
propositions which have the same structure and contain the same ideas
except perhaps at places occupied by the variable ideas. A proposition
which results from such a substitution performed on the given
proposition is called a *variant*.

The class of allowable substituends is often restricted by Bolzano; in some cases, for instance, he will require that the substitutions do not “destroy the objectuality of the proposition,” that is, do not produce an objectless subject-idea. Such would be, for example, the effect of substituting [Beijing] for [Nero] in the proposition [Nero, who is a human being, is mortal]. In his discussion of the degree of validity of a proposition relative to certain ideas, too, he stipulates that no two equivalent ideas may be included in the class of possible substituends. Thus when Bolzano speaks of “variable ideas”, we should bear in mind that the specification of a variable also involves the specification of a range of possible values.

### 6.2 Universal validity/invalidity and analyticity

Bolzano begins by defining attributes of of single propositions with
variable parts (*TS*, §147). When the method of variation
is applied to a proposition, he notes, three different cases may
arise: either the class of (objectual) propositions obtained by
substitution contains only true propositions, or it contains only
false propositions, or it contains both true and false propositions.
In the first case, the initial proposition is called *universally
valid*, in the second *universally invalid*, in both cases
relative to the specified variables. Bolzano does not give a name to
the third case; such propositions could be called neutral. Here are
some examples:

[The man Caius is mortal]

is universally valid relative to the variable idea [Caius], because each appropriate substitution generates a true proposition, or alternatively, because all its objectual variants are true.

[The man Caius is omniscient]

is universally invalid relative to the same variable idea [Caius], because all its variants are false.

The same proposition

[The man Caius is wealthy]

is neutral relative to the variable idea [wealthy], because some of its variants are true (e.g., the first example quoted) while others are false (the second example).

Consider now the proposition [Murgatroyd’s favourite number, which is
an integer between 1 and 10, is prime], and let [Murgatroyd’s
favourite number] be tagged as variable. Furthermore, let us restrict
the class of permissible substituends by stipulating that (1)
objectuality be preserved and (2) no two equivalent ideas be included.
In this case, there will be eight permissible substitutions and, of
these, four will result in true propositions. The ratio of the number
of substitutions resulting in true propositions to the total number is
accordingly equal to 1:2. Bolzano calls this the *degree of
validity* of the proposition relative to the specified variables.
He comments (*TS*, II: 81): “This ratio determines the
degree of probability which the proposition takes on under certain
circumstances.” Universal validity and universal invalidity are
extreme cases, in which the ratio is respectively equal to 1:1 and
0:1.

Bolzano appropriated Kant’s term *analytic* for
propositions that are either universally valid or universally invalid
relative to some specification of variable parts or other. This choice
of terminology was based on his analysis of Kant’s examples.
Consider, for instance, the proposition (Kant: judgement): [A
right-angled triangle is a triangle]. Kant had declared such judgments
analytic because analysis, i.e., decomposition, of the subject concept
would reveal the presence of the predicate. For Bolzano, this
containment relation was just a distraction: what was truly
interesting about this proposition, he thought, was that we could
substitute whatever other ideas we like for [triangle] and
[right-angled] without changing the truth-value (subject to the
proviso about objectuality). That is, as Quine would later put it,
certain parts of such propositions occur *vacuously*:

I believe that th[e] importance [of analytic propositions] lies in the fact that their truth or falsity does not depend upon the individual ideas of which they are composed, but that it remains the same irrespective of the changes to which some of their ideas are subjected, provided only that the objectuality of the proposition is not destroyed (

TS, § 148).

The truly noteworthy feature of the propositions Kant had called analytic, that is, is the invariance of their truth-value under an entire class of transformations. It is this feature and no other that Bolzano singles out with his definition of analyticity.

Given the breadth of Bolzano’s definition, it is clear that analytic propositions are quite common, notably in mathematics. Here are some of Bolzano’s examples of analytic propositions, true as well as false, where the underlining or the letters indicate the variable parts:

- If all
__men__are__mortal__and__Caius__is a__man__, then__Caius__is__mortal__. (*TS*,§315) - If A is larger than B, then B is smaller than A.
(
*TS*,§148) - If \(P=Mm\), then \(M = P/m\). (
*TS*, §148) - The soul of
__Socrates__has been annihilated. (*TS*, § 369) - The soul of
__Socrates__is a simple substance. (*TS*, §447) - A is A. (
*TS*, §148) - An A, which is B, is A. (
*TS*, §148) - An A, which is B, is B. (
*TS*, §148) - Every object is either B or non-B. (
*TS*, §148)

The last four examples in the above list are noteworthy, Bolzano
claims, because the only invariable parts in them are logical
concepts. He speaks of *logical analyticity* in such cases.
Like Tarski after him, he comments that his definition of logical
analyticity is not completely determinate, because the “domain
of concepts belonging to logic is not circumscribed so sharply that
controversies could not arise at times” (*TS*, §
148, no. 3; Tarski, 1983, 418–419).

Though the similarities should not be exaggerated, there are clear affinities between this narrower notion and later ones in the works of Adjukiewicz, Carnap, Quine, and Tarski (see Künne, 2006 for detailed discussion).

As Bolzano was well aware, analyticity in his general sense entails
neither necessity nor apriority (*TS*, §197). [Truman, who
was president of the USA in in the 20th century, was male], for
instance, is universally valid with respect to [Truman], and thus
analytic according to Bolzano’s definition. Clearly, his use of
the term ‘analytic’ differs radically not only from
Kant’s, but also from later uses of the term in the writings of
Frege, Carnap, and others. This has led to some misunderstandings on
the part of some of his later readers (e.g., Bar-Hillel, 1950).

### 6.3 Relations among several propositions with variable parts

In contemporary treatments of logic, logical relations between
formulas of a formal language are sometimes defined in terms of
relations between sets of interpretations of the language. For
example, a set of formulas \(\Gamma\) might be said to *imply*
a formula \(\alpha\) iff the set of interpretations making all members
of \(\Gamma\) true is a *subset* of the set of interpretations
making \(\alpha\) true, while \(\Gamma\) itself might be said to be
*satisfiable* iff the set of interpretations making all its
members true is non-empty.

Bolzano’s system of extensional relations between propositions
with variable ideas is motivated by similar thoughts, though it is
cast in terms of the extensions of ideas, propositions, and variable
ideas within them. The key notion is that of a collection of ideas
\(i’, j’, k’, \ldots\) which, when substituted for
the variable ideas \(i, j, k, \ldots\) in propositions \(A, B, C,
\ldots\), results in a collection of propositions all of which are
true. (More loosely, Bolzano speaks of “collections of ideas
whose substitution for \(i, j, k, \ldots\), makes all of \(A, B, C,
\ldots\) true” (*TS* II: §155, 114, 122, and
§156, 133).) We will call such collections of ideas \(i’,
j’, k’, \ldots\) *verifying ideas* for \(A, B, C,
\ldots\) relative to the variable ideas \(i, j, k, \ldots.\)

In a crucial passage, Bolzano sets up the correspondence he needs to carry out his plan:

With ideas, the crucial question was whether or not a certain object is indeed represented by them; the corresponding question for propositions is whether or not they are true. Just as I have called ideas compatible or incompatible with each other, depending on whether or not they have certain objects in common, so I call propositions compatible or incompatible, depending on whether or not there are certain ideas which make all of them true. (

TSII: §154, 101; Bolzano 1973: 198–199)

That is, just as *ideas* \(A, B, C, \ldots\) are said to be
*compatible* iff at least one object stands under each of \(A,
B, C, \ldots\), so too we can say that *propositions* \(A, B,
C, \ldots\) are compatible with respect to variable ideas \(i, j, k,
\ldots\) iff there is at least one collection of ideas \(i’,
j’, k’, \ldots\) which are verifying ideas for each of
\(A, B, C, \ldots\). Equivalently, \(A, B, C, \ldots\) are compatible
relative to \(i, j, k, \ldots\) iff the *ideas* [verifying
ideas for \(A\) relative to \(i, j, k, \ldots\)], [verifying ideas for
\(B\) relative to \(i, j, k, \ldots\)], [verifying ideas for \(C\)
relative to \(i, j, k, \ldots\)] are compatible in the previously
defined sense; otherwise, they are said to be incompatible.

For example, the propositions [Wellington predeceased Napoleon] and
[Napoleon predeceased Wellington] are incompatible when all
occurrences of [Napoleon] and [Wellington] are considered uniformly
variable, but compatible when [predeceased] is varied in both
propositions, since the substitution [fought] for [predeceased]
produces two true propositions. (Here, we have to do with the forms
‘ \(\mathbf{A}\) predeceased \(\mathbf{B}\)’ and ‘
\(\mathbf{B}\) predeceased \(\mathbf{A}\)’ in the first case,
and ‘Napoleon **R** Wellington’ and ‘Wellington
**R** Napoleon’ in the second.)

Next, propositions \(M, N, O, \ldots\) are said to be
*deducible* from propositions \(A, B, C, \ldots\) with respect
to variable ideas \(i, j, k, \ldots\) iff \(A, B, C, \ldots, M, N, O,
\ldots\) are compatible with respect to variable ideas \(i, j, k,
\ldots\) and the idea [verifying ideas for \(A, B, C, \ldots\)
relative to \(i, j, k, \ldots\)] is included in the idea [verifying
ideas for \(M, N, O, \ldots\) relative to \(i, j, k, \ldots\)] in the
previously defined sense, i.e., iff the extension of the former is a
subset of the extension of the latter (*TS*, § 155).

In the shorter version of his logic, Bolzano states this definition as follows:

If one or more propositions \(A, B, C, \ldots\) are compatible with one or more others \(M, N, \ldots\) with respect to the components \(i, j, \ldots\), then there must be, as just said, at least some ideas that, when put in the places of \(i, j, \ldots\) make all of \(A, B, C, \ldots\) as well as all of \(M, N, \ldots\) true. One especially noteworthy case occurs, however, if not just some, but

allof the ideas that, when substituted for \(i, j, \ldots\) in \(A, B, C, \ldots\) make all these true, also make all of \(M, N, \ldots\) true. In this case I say that the propositions \(M, N, \ldots\) stand in the relation ofdeducibilityto the propositions \(A, B, C, \ldots\) with respect to the variable parts \(i, j, \ldots\) (Bolzano 2004a: 54),

—giving the following examples: [All \(i\) are \(k\)] is deducible from [All \(i\) are \(j\)] and [All \(j\) are \(k\)] , and [\(\angle ijk = \angle ikj\)] is deducible from [\(i, j, k\) are the three vertices of a triangle] and [\(\overline{ij}\) = \(\overline{ik}\)], in both cases with respect to \(i, j, k\).

Proceeding in this way through his table of relations among ideas,
Bolzano obtains at one stroke a complete system of extensional
relations between propositions, relative to certain of their parts
considered variable (in other words, between propositional
*forms* in the sense of *classes* of propositions). The
result is a genealogical tree whose fundamental structure is exactly
the same as the structure of the tree representing the relations
between ideas. In most cases, he uses the same terms, speaking of
compatibility, deducibility (inclusion), subordination (unilateral
deducibility), equivalence (mutual deducibility), overlapping,
contrariety, and contradiction among propositions.

To obtain a clearer overview of these relations, let us introduce some notation and once again use the language of set theory. We will use bold letters to symbolize sets of items (propositions or variable ideas). Thus, for instance, ‘\(\mathbf{A(i)}\)’ and ‘\(\mathbf{M(i)}\)’ will be used to represent sets of propositions \(\mathbf{A}=\{A, B, C, \ldots\}\) and \(\mathbf{M}=\{M, N, O, \ldots\}\) in which the ideas \(\mathbf{i}=i, j, k, \ldots\) are considered variable. Let \(\mathbf{V(A(i))}\) represent the set of verifying ideas for \(\mathbf{A(i)}\). Finally, let \(\mathbf{\neg A}\) represent \(\{\neg A, \neg B, \neg C, \ldots\}\). We then have:

**A** is compatible with **M** with respect
to variable ideas **i**:

\(\mathbf{V(A(i))} \cap \mathbf{V(M(i))} \not= \emptyset\)

**A** is incompatible with **M** with
respect to **i**:

\(\mathbf{V(A(i))} \cap \mathbf{V(M(i))} = \emptyset\)

**M** is deducible [*ableitbar*] from
**A** with respect to **i**:

**A** and **M** are compatible with respect
to **i** and \(\mathbf{V(A(i))} \subseteq
\mathbf{V(M(i))}\).

**A** is equivalent to **M** with respect to
**i**:

**A** is deducible from **M** and
**M** is deducible from **A**, both with
respect to **i**, i.e., \(\mathbf{V(A(i))} \not=
\emptyset\) and \(\mathbf{V(A(i))} = \mathbf{V(M(i))}\).

**M** is unilaterally deducible from **A**
with respect to **i**:

**M** is deducible from but not equivalent to
**A** with respect to **i**.

**A** and **M** are contradictory with
respect to **i**:

\(\neg\mathbf{A}\) is equivalent to **M** and
**A** equivalent to \(\neg\mathbf{M}\), both with respect
to **i**.

**A** and **M** are contrary with respect to
**i**:

**A** and **M** are incompatible but not
contradictory with respect to **i**.

- If \(A, B, C, \ldots\) are incompatible with respect to
**i**then any collection of propositions that contains \(A, B, C, \ldots\) is also incompatible with respect to**i**(*TS*,§154, no. 10). - If
**A**is compatible with respect to \(i, j, \ldots\), then it is also compatible w.r.t. any collection of variands that contains \(i, j, \ldots \) (§154, no. 11). - If \(M\) is deducible from \(A, B, C, \ldots\) with respect to \(i, j, k, \ldots\) then \(M\) is also deducible from \(A, B, C, \ldots\) relative to any sub-collection of \(i, j, k, \ldots\), provided that \(A, B, C, \ldots\) are compatible relative to the sub-collection (§155, no. 19).
- \(\neg M\) is deducible from
**A**, a class of compatible premises, iff**A**is incompatible with*M*(§155, nos. 14, 15). - If
**M**is deducible from**A**, \(X\) as well as from**A**, \(\neg X\), then**M**is deducible from**A**alone (§155, no. 17). - If all propositions deducible from the premises
**A**are true,**A**is true (§155, no. 6). -
If
**M**is deducible from**A**, and**X**from**M**,**R**(both with respect to \(i, j, k, \ldots\)), then**X**is deducible from**A**,**R**with respect to \(i, j, k, \ldots\) (§155, no. 24). -
(§224, no. 2) If the inference:

\( \begin{array}{l} A, B, C, D, E, F, G, \ldots \\ \hline M, N, O\\ \end{array} \)is valid, then so is:

\( \begin{array}{l} A, B, C, D, \ldots\\ \hline \text{If } E, F, G, \text{ are true, then so are } M, N, O \ldots\\ \end{array} \)

### 6.4 Conditional probability

According to Bolzano’s definition, deducibility requires
compatibility. This gives rise to some complications, e.g.,
deducibility is not reflexive, and from the fact that \(B\) is
deducible from \(A\) with respect to \(i, j, \ldots\) we can conclude
that not-\(A\) is deducible from not-\(B\) only if \(B\) is not
universally valid with respect to \(i, j, \ldots.\) But it also brings
an important benefit, namely, it allows him to integrate a relation of
relative probability directly into his system. In *TS*, §
161, he defines the *conditional probability* (or relative
validity) of a proposition *M*(**i**) with respect
to a class of premises or hypotheses
**A**(**i**) with variables
**i**, as the ratio of the number of cases in which all
the propositions of the class as well as
*M*(**i**) are true to the number of cases in
which the propositions **A**(**i**) are all
true. In other words, it is the ratio of the number of true variants
of **A**(**i**) and
*M*(**i**) to the number of true variants of
**A**(**i**). Bolzano’s conditional
probability is objective, *an sich*.

Because for each objectual idea there are infinitely many other
equivalent ones, we cannot determine relative probabilities simply by
counting variants. It could be done, however, if the class of
substitutions were restricted as in the case of relative validity by
only allowing one idea among all those equivalent to a given one to be
included in the class of substituends, provided that the resulting
classes were finite (Bolzano sets out a different proposal in
*TS*, §161, no. 7).

For example, consider the premises [The number of eggs in the nest is
between 1 and 10] and [The number of eggs in the nest is odd], along
with the conclusion [The number of eggs in the nest is prime], in
which only the idea [the number of eggs in the nest] is considered
variable in each of the propositions. Of the admissible substitutions,
four make both premises true and, of those four, three make the
conclusion true as well. Thus the degree of validity of the conclusion
relative to the premises and the specified variable is .75. We can
also think of this as a relation between the forms ‘**A** is
between 1 and 10’, ‘**A** is odd’, and
‘**A** is prime’.

One can immediately see why the premises of a probable deduction must
be compatible: the probability of *M*(**i**)
relative to **A(i)** is defined only if the denominator
of the fraction is not zero, which means that the premises
**A**(**i**) are compatible. On the other
hand, the number of ideas that make both
**A**(**i**) and
*M*(**i**) true cannot be greater than the number
of ideas that make true *M*(**i**); as a
consequence, the conditional probability of
*M*(**i**) cannot be greater than 1. It is equal
to 1 when the number of ideas that make true both
**A**(**i**) and
*M*(**i**) is equal to the number of ideas that
make true **A**(**i**) alone, which means
that all substitutions of ideas that make true
**A**(**i**) also make true
*M*(**i**), i.e., if
*M*(**i**) is *deducible* from
**A**(**i**). In other words, if
*M*(**i**) is deducible from
**A**(**i**), its probability relative to
**A**(**i**) is equal to 1, which means that
the probability equals certainty. The probability is zero if no ideas
make both **A**(**i**) and
*M*(**i**) true, i.e., if
**A**(**i**) and
*M*(**i**) are incompatible. Incompatibility and
certainty are thus two extreme cases of probability with values of 0
and 1.

Though some details remain rough, this is still an extraordinary
achievement. Bolzano’s approach yields the first logical
definition of probability. For the first time deductive logic and
inductive logic are united in a global theory and the former appears
as a limit case of the latter. It is possible that in his
*Tractatus* 5.15, Wittgenstein took over Bolzano’s
treatment of probability, perhaps through the mediation of the 1st
edition of the *Philosophical Propedeutic* of R. Zimmermann
(1853). Carnap’s regular confirmation functions, too, are
strongly reminiscent of Bolzano’s approach.

Bolzano adds proofs of a number of standard theorems, and also defines subjective probability and different important probabilistic notions such as the degree of confidence, the credibility of a witness, etc. He gives the formula of the degree of credibility of an event reported by independent testimonies as a function of the number of witnesses, of the number of testimonies, and of the number of true and false propositions stated by each witness. All these concepts play an important role in the chapter “on the nature of historical knowledge, particularly concerning miracles” in Bolzano 1834.

Both the class-logical relations and the relations between
propositions are constructed from the initial relation of
compatibility by adding specific conditions to previously defined
relations. Compatibility is thus the basic relation of Bolzano’s
extensional logic. It is embedded in the very foundations of his
system and all other relations (with the exception of different cases
of disjunction, *TS* II, §160), deducibility included, are
special cases of it.

### 6.5 Deducibility more closely considered

When defining semantic notions such as joint satisfiability or logical consequence, contemporary logicians generally work with formal languages, the specification of which involves a separation of logical and non-logical elements. Consequence and other semantic relations are then defined in terms of the behaviour of formulas when arbitrary semantic values of the appropriate kinds are assigned to all of the non-logical parameters (usually including a tacit parameter for the domain of quantification). On this view, consequence is a dyadic relation between a set of premises and a conclusion or set of conclusions.

Because non-logical parameters are never held constant, many inferences can only be declared valid if they are interpreted as enthymematic, requiring supplementation in the form of “tacit” premises. For example, \(e \lt \pi\) cannot be said to follow from \(e \lt 3\) and \(3 \lt \pi\) because there are models of \(aRb\) and \(bRc\) that are not models of \(aRc\). Adding \(\forall x \forall y \forall z ((Rxy \wedge Ryz) \rightarrow Rxz)\) to the premises, however, we obtain a valid argument form.

By contrast, Bolzano’s deducibility is a relation between
propositions in themselves and variable ideas. It does not rely on a
strict classification of ideas as either logical or non-logical (as we
saw, Bolzano had doubts about whether such a line could be drawn).
Indeed, it is not a notion of logical consequence at all, but rather a
more general notion of which logical consequence is a special case.
Deducibility is a *triadic* relation involving collections of
premises, conclusions, and variable ideas.

Thus, for example, [\(e \lt \pi\)] is deducible from [\(e \lt 3\)] and [\(3 \lt \pi\)] with respect to the variable ideas [\(e\)], [3], and, [\(\pi\)]. In agreement with contemporary logic, this conclusion is not deducible from the premises if [\(\lt\)] is added to the variable ideas, but it is deducible with respect to those variables if we add the allegedly tacit premise. An additional noteworthy feature of Bolzano’s approach is that the allegedly unstated premise is equivalent to the claim that a relation of deducibility holds with respect to the ideas [\(e\)], [3], and, [\(\pi\)] (George, 1983).

The individuation of arguments, on Bolzano’s view, involves not only a specification of premises and conclusions(s) but also of an inference. Usually, inferences embody repeatable patterns or forms. And we determine the form-matter distinction (and thus what the inference is) in each particular case by specifying which ideas are to be considered variable:

In every inference there are variable ideas with respect to which the deducibility of the conclusion from the premises is stated. … the matter of the inference consist[s] precisely in these variable ideas, while the form consists in what is common to all inferences which differ merely with respect to their matter (

TS, §254 [II.516–7]).

Limiting our interpretations of arguments to the inferential forms afforded by formal languages in which there are only logical constants thus precludes us from representing the forms of many arguments, in much the same way that the design of the IBM 360 ruled out file names with more than eight characters (cf. van Benthem, 2013).

As with analyticity, deducibility can obtain for all sorts of reasons,
necessary or contingent, logical or non-logical, known or unknown.
[Not all birds fly], for instance, is deducible from [Some birds
don’t fly] with respect to [birds] and [fly], and [Buddy is a
bird] is deducible from [Buddy is a crow] with respect to [Buddy],
while [Harry Truman wasn’t a Buddhist] is also deducible from
[Harry Truman was a 20th-century US president] with respect to [Harry
Truman]. The last example shows that deducibility does not require
that the connection between premises and conclusion be necessary, nor
that it be knowable *a priori* (though, unsurprisingly, Bolzano
held that there are cases of deducibility that are necessary, some of
which are also knowable *a priori*). There is thus a clean
isolation of truth-preservation as a phenomenon of intrinsic logical
interest.

In some cases, a deduction contains idle elements. For example, in an argument of the form ‘All \(A\) are \(C\), All \(B\) are \(C\), All \(C\) are \(D\), therefore All \(A\) are \(D\)’, the second premise can be omitted without destroying the relation of deducibility. Similarly in an argument of the form ‘Anything that is either \(A\) or \(B\) is \(C\), All \(C\) are \(D\), therefore All \(A\) are \(D\)’, we could get by with a simpler premise of the form ‘Anything that is \(A\) is \(C\)’ instead of the first premise. Seeing this, Bolzano sought a narrower notion that would filter out redundant or trivial inferences.

In *TS*, § 155, no. 26, he introduces the concept of
*exact deducibility*: \(M\) is exactly deducible from \(A, B,
C, \ldots\), we read there, just in case \(M\) is deducible from \(A,
B, C, \ldots\) but no relation of deducibility holds if any of the
premises, or any of their parts, is omitted. A deduction that is not
exact is called *redundant*. In the shorter version of his
logic (Bolzano 2004a: 54), the stipulation about omitting parts is
dropped. This was probably wise, as the additional condition seems to
have some unwelcome consequences (cf. Rusnock and
Šebestík, 2019, 312–3).

Bolzano proves some significant theorems about the narrower relation: If \(M\) is exactly deducible from \(A, B, C, \ldots\), then none \(A, B, C, \ldots, M\) is universally valid or universally invalid with respect to the variables of the deduction. Furthermore, the negation of each premise is compatible with the remaining premises. Hence, since compatibility is required for deducibility, each premise is independent of the others with respect to the variables of the deduction. In addition, it follows from a result proved by Rolf George that when a relation of exact deducibility holds, at least one of the variables must occur both within the premises and within the conclusion (George, 1983; cf. Rusnock and Šebestík, 2019, 314–5). Exact deducibility thus satisfies a condition of relevance (Stelzner, 2002).

Another special case of deducibility is *logical* deducibility;
it holds when all the invariable elements in a deduction are logical
concepts (*TS*, § 223). There are obvious parallels
between this notion and Tarski’s notion of logical consequence.
More intriguing, perhaps, are the similarities between Bolzano’s
logical deducibility and a relation described by Frege in the course
of his dispute with Hilbert and Korselt (Frege, 1906, 426ff), which
are so striking that Göran Sundholm suggested that Frege may have
profited from an unacknowledged acquaintance with Bolzano’s
logic (Sundholm, 2000; but cf. Künne, 2008, 330ff.). Another
plausible explanation is that Frege simply reverse-engineered
something quite like Bolzanian logical deducibility by making the
logical methodology of Hilbert’s *Foundations of
Geometry* explicit.

Bolzano’s characterization of logical deducibility is substitutional, an approach examined only to be rejected by Tarski because it was liable to produce unsatisfactory results in cases where “the language we are dealing with does not possess a sufficient stock of extra-logical constants” (Tarski 1936 [1983]: 415). Bolzano did not face exactly the same problem, because his logic deals with ideas in themselves and not with linguistic expressions. The structural problem underlying Tarski’s criticism also did not occur to him because he assumed that for every object there is an idea in itself that represents it exclusively, a thesis that is not consistently tenable with his other free-wheeling ontological assumptions (the difficulties are discussed in detail by Simons (1987: 42) and Siebel (1996: 216–223)). Tarski, who did not make Bolzano’s assumption with respect to languages, stated his definitive formulation in terms of models, or the satisfaction of sentential functions by sequences of objects.

## 7. The objective connection among truths: grounding (*Abfolge*)

The *Contributions* of 1810 already contain speculation about
an “objective connection among truths” that is supposed to
guide the organization and presentation of scientific knowledge.
Bolzano’s discussion of this notion in the *TS*
represents the last stage of his development of formal logic and is at
the same time the first modern study of axiomatic systems (§162,
168 198–222, 378; see also Bolzano 2004a, §13, 14, 17, and
the other Bolzanian texts translated in Roski and Schnieder, 2022)
.

Bolzano’s idea of an objective order among truths has its origin
in the Aristotelian distinction between proofs of the *fact*
and those that yield the *reason* of the fact. His problem is
that of determining what should count as a proof of the second kind,
the sort that he calls an *objective grounding* of a truth.
Preliminary to this inquiry is one in which he tries to characterize
the individual steps of such proofs in terms of the relation of
*ground to consequence*, which he calls *Abfolge* (also
translated as ‘grounding’).

Finding no satisfactory definition of grounding in the works of others
and declaring himself unable to define the concept of grounding (or
rather of a ground), he says that he is inclined to regard it as
simple (§202). In accordance with his methodology, he tries to at
least partially characterize the notion by stating a number of theses
about it that he considers to be true. To begin with, he claims that
only true propositions stand in the relation of ground to consequence.
Perhaps unwisely, he assumes uniqueness: “there is only one
objective ground [for a given truth]” (*TS* IV:
§528; cf. §206). In many cases, the ground consists of a
collection of truths. The parts (members) of this collection are
called partial grounds, the collection the complete or total ground.
Similarly, Bolzano distinguishes between the total and merely partial
consequences of a given ground. In modern terms, we would take the
relation he describes to be one that holds between two sets, an option
not open to Bolzano because, on his understanding, a collection must
contain at least two parts.

Grounding is anti-transitive: If \(\Gamma\) is the ground of
\(\Delta\) and \(\Delta\) in turn the ground of \(E\), then \(\Gamma\)
is not the ground of \(E\), though we can speak of *supporting
truths* or, improperly, of *remote grounds* in such cases.
Grounding is also anti-symmetrical and anti-reflexive. It should not
be confused with either deducibility or causality. Not with the former
because deducibility holds among false as well as true propositions,
is reflexive (for propositions that are not universally invalid wrt to
the variables of deduction), merely asymmetrical, and merely
intransitive (being transitive, notably, in cases where the variables
are the same). Nor with the latter, because the causal relation holds
between actual objects, while grounding relates non-actual objects,
namely, true propositions in themselves. Causality and grounding are
nonetheless connected, Bolzano thinks, taking claims of the form
‘A causes B’ to be analyzable as follows: ‘[A
exists] (partially) grounds [B exists]’ (*TS*,
§168).

Although grounding is not a species of deducibility, Bolzano thinks
that there are cases in which a truth is both deducible from, and
grounded in, other truths. In some cases of this kind, he thinks, a
relation of ground to consequence also holds among the variants of the
original propositions, provided only that the resulting propositions
are all true. He speaks of *formal grounding* in such cases
(*TS*,§162). Later, he cites the following example:
[Socrates was an Athenian and a philosopher] is both grounded in and
deducible from [Socrates was an Athenian] and [Socrates was a
philosopher] (wrt [Socrates], [Athenian], and [philosopher]), and the
same holds, he clearly thinks, for all variants consisting of true
propositions, e.g., [Nixon was a Republican and a crook], [Nixon was a
Republican], [Nixon was a crook] (*TS*, §199; cf.
§221, no.7; and, for another example of formal grounding, see
§226, no.5).

Bolzano maintains that there are truths that have no grounds, citing
the example [There is something]=[[Something] has objectuality]
(*TS*, § 214). He calls them *basic truths*
(*Grundwahrheiten*). He thinks that there must be more than one
basic truth, “for I cannot understand how from a single truth
all others would follow either as consequences, or consequences of
consequences, etc.” (§215). As in the
*Contributions*, Bolzano emphasizes that this is not an
epistemic notion: in particular, basic truths need not be evident, and
may require proof in the sense of a certification.

Associated with each non-basic truth is a structured collection of
supporting truths (grounds, grounds of grounds, and so on). Bolzano
depicts such collections as trees (*TS*, §220). In some
cases, dependence relations proceed *ad infinitum* , e.g., the
grounds of a truth describing a contingent state of a created
substance (*TS*, §216). In others, the branches terminate
in basic truths.

Bolzano’s discussion in Volume 2 of *TS* ends with a few
conjectures bearing especially on formal grounding relations among
purely conceptual truths like those of mathematics (*TS*,
§221). To begin with, he maintains that the grounds of non-basic
purely conceptual truths always lie in other purely conceptual truths.
When the consequence is deducible from the ground, there are no
redundant premises (a condition satisfied, as we saw above, in cases
of exact deducibility). In addition, the individual truths supporting
a purely conceptual truth are never more complex than it is. Each is,
moreover, the simplest among all propositions equivalent to it.
(Bolzano uses these claims to argue that the grounding trees for
purely conceptual truths are always finite.) They are also the most
general propositions from which the truth can be deduced.

Combining these criteria, he proposed the following as a sufficient condition for formal grounding: If the truth \(M\) is exactly deducible from truths \(A, B, C, \ldots\) with respect to \(i, j, \ldots\), and \(A, B, C, \ldots\) are the simplest of all propositions equivalent to them (presumably again wrt \(i, j, \ldots\)), and if none of \(A, B, C, \ldots\) is more complex than \(M\), then a relation of formal grounding holds between \(A, B, C, \ldots\) and \(M\) (§221, no.7).

When these conditions are met systematically in the ordering of truths belonging to a purely conceptual science, he conjectures further, deductive efficiency is also maximized (§221, no. 3). Indeed, at the end of §221, he entertains the thought that grounding might be defined in terms of deductive efficiency:

I occasionally doubt whether the concept of ground and consequence, which I have above claimed to be simple, is not complex after all; it may turn out to be none other than the concept of an ordering of truths which allows us to deduce from the smallest number of simple premises the largest possible number of the remaining truths as conclusions. (

TS, §221, 388 note)

Roski (2014: 370) sums up the general tendency of Bolzano’s reflections as follows:

[They are] partial answers to the question under what conditions a deductive argument is explanatory […] On what I took to be the most charitable reading of them, Bolzano’s principles essentially boil down to the claim that a logically valid argument is explanatory,

only ifthere is no argument with fewer premises, for none of the premises is there a logically equivalent proposition that is simpler, and none of the premises is more complex than the conclusion.[…] These principles, I have maintained, can be considered to be an explication of the idea that every premise and every concept in an explanatory argument is deductively relevant. More importantly, they can be considered to be an explication of the idea that explanation ought to go in hand with some kind of theoretical economy.

Commentators have drawn attention to a number of shortcomings of Bolzano’s proposals (see, e.g., Mancosu, 1999, Rumberg, 2013, Roski, 2017). This would not have surprised him, since he was himself aware that the above criteria could generate conflicts (see, e.g., 2004a, §17), and had frankly admitted that his remarks about grounding were tentative and incomplete, merely a first attempt to circumscribe the concept:

Almost everything I advance in this part is tinged with uncertainty, on many topics I have not reached any decision, and at best my inquiries are only fragments and suggestions which will have attained their goal if they provide others with the stimulus to reflect further on these matters” (

TSII: §195, 327–8).

## 8. Conclusion

Bolzano’s *TS*, especially the Theory of Elements, is a
turning point not only in logic, but also in epistemology. According
to Cavaillès (2008: 35),

for the first time perhaps, science is not considered as only mediating between the human mind and being in itself, dependent on both and having no proper reality, but as an object

sui generis, original in its essence, autonomous in its movement.

Science is defined by its structure “which not only is
demonstration, but which merges together with demonstration”
(*ibid.*, 39). Stressing the fundamental role of demonstrations
in scientific knowledge, Bolzano presented a viable alternative to
Kant’s philosophy of mathematics based on constructions in pure
intuition.

A truly scientific proof should

groundthe theorem, i.e., integrate it into a scientific theory organised according to the “objective connection of truths”, starting with axioms and fundamental concepts.[…]. These ideas indicate the direction of future research: the notion of normal proofs in the sense of Gentzen, proof trees, König’s lemma (Šebestík 1992: 478).

While at least some of Bolzano’s mathematical work was influential
during the nineteenth century, his logic met mostly with indifference
and incomprehension. It was only towards the end of the century that
philosophers, notably Kerry, Twardowski, Meinong, and Husserl, began
to appreciate his achievements. Curiously, Frege, whose ideas were
often so close to those of Bolzano and who in his time was one of the
few logicians capable of understanding him, never mentions him in any
of his publications or surviving papers. He was confronted with
Bolzano’s ideas at least three times: in one of Kerry’s
articles, in correspondence with Husserl, and later in the controversy
with Korselt. We know of no evidence that he ever reacted to their
allusions, and it is quite possible that he never laid hands on any of
Bolzano’s works. Another interesting coincidence was noted by
Mancosu (1996, 110–117 and note 69, p. 234): in §530 of
*TS*, Bolzano argues that every indirect proof can be
transformed into a direct proof. Mancosu points out the striking
similarity of this claim with one to the same effect presented by
Frege in one of his posthumous writings (“Logic in
Mathematics”). In addition, Bolzano and Frege chose the very
same example (Euclid I.19) to illustrate their claims.

After Twardowski (1894), it was chiefly Husserl who drew
philosophers’ attention to Bolzano with his memorable words
about *TS* (1900 [1970], I: 222),

a work which, in its treatment of the logical ‘theory of elements’, far surpasses everything that the world-literature has to offer in the way of a systematic sketch of logic. Bolzano did not, of course, expressly discuss or support any independent demarcation of pure logic in our sense, but he provided one

de factoin the first two volumes of his work, in his discussion of what underlay aWissenschaftslehreor theory of science in the sense of his conception; he did so with such purity and scientific strictness, and with such a rich store of original, scientifically confirmed and ever fruitful thoughts, that we must count him as one of the greatest logicians of all time.

Nevertheless, he always insisted on the originality of his own
phenomenological method. Between the two wars, Bolzano’s logic
and philosophy of mathematics inspired Heinrich Scholz and Jean
Cavaillès. Also during this period, Tarski discovered the
concept of logical consequence independently of Bolzano, only becoming
aware of the affinity between his work and Bolzano’s after
Scholz (1937 [1961]) pointed it out. However, already in Twardowski
(1894), the founder of the Polish Lvov-Warsaw school, Bolzano’s
ideas were discussed and criticized at length, and some of them might
have become common lore in the Polish school. In 1920, Hans Hahn
edited the *Paradoxes of the infinite* with important critical
notes, comparing Bolzano with Cantor. Karl Menger might have taken
inspiration for his theory of dimension not only from Poincaré,
but also from the *Paradoxes*. Neurath praised Bolzano as one
of the ancestors of the Vienna Circle, because of the conciseness of
his style and the rejection of Kant’s philosophy. Some important
Bolzanian ideas are also found in the work of Quine. All these
currents are indebted to Bolzano for the lesson of intellectual rigour
and of analytic power. It is Bolzano who is the true founder of the
kind of analytical philosophy whose core is logic and which is
impregnated with science. His logic has archaic aspects, but he
introduced not only new concepts, methods and theories, new themes and
new problems, but above all a new spirit that has animated philosophy
ever since.

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- O’Connor, J.J. and E.F. Robertson, “Bernard Bolzano”, MacTutor History of Mathematics archive.
- Bernard Bolzano and the Theory of Science