Tiantai Buddhism

First published Wed Nov 19, 2014; substantive revision Sun Nov 13, 2022

Tiantai is the name of a mountain and surrounding geographical location in China, literally meaning “platform of the sky”, but the term is traditionally used to denote a particular school of Mahāyāna Buddhism with historical connections to that locale. In this article, the term “Tiantai” will be used to refer to the philosophical ideas developed from the sixth to eleventh centuries by this school, as expounded in the writings of its three most representative figures: Tiantai Zhiyi (538–597), Jingxi Zhanran (711–782) and Siming Zhili (960–1028).

To translate Tiantai’s rather technical scholastic terminology and its typically Buddhist soteriological orientation into something approaching traditional philosophical categories, we can start by identifying a few hashtag themes that are characteristic of Tiantai thinking. Tiantai is a thoroughgoing contextualism, regarding the ontological status and identity of all entities as deriving entirely from their contexts, their relationships to other entities. It is a thoroughgoing holism, regarding these dispositive relationships as incapable of definitive limitation to any finite subset of what exists. It is a thoroughgoing monism, rejecting any notion of distinct ontological categories that are irreducible to one another. It is a theory of thoroughgoing immanence, rejecting any possibility of any independently existing transcendent realms entirely beyond what is present in immediate experience. This involves a commitment to the claims that all entities of any kind are impermanent, that what each entity ultimately is is constitutively ambiguous, and there exist no irreducible or primary substances. Epistemologically this entails thoroughgoing skepticism about all unconditional claims, and thoroughgoing anti-realism. Ethically it implies a thoroughgoing renunciation of all finite aims, as well as thoroughgoing repudiation of all determinate moral rules, moral consequences, and moral virtues.

But all of these descriptions are potentially very misleading, since our understanding of each of these points must be thoroughly modified by the most characteristic premise of Tiantai thought of all, which determines the meaning we intend for the term “thoroughgoing” here: the idea of “self-recontextualization”. As we’ll see in detail below, this is a thinking-through of the basic notion of universal contextualization itself and its constitutive role in the construction of all identities, to the point of seeing it to entail the ambiguating of the identity not only of the contextualized but also of the contextualizer. This notion brings with it a kind of turnaround whereby the full expression of any element of experience, indeed the thorough consideration of any determinate entity at all, intrinsically entails its self-overcoming and self-negation, amounting to its reversal: it is found to include just what it had initially appeared to exclude. This turn of thought may be termed dialectical, but in a way that differs from both Hegelian and Marxian notions of dialectics in that it is neither teleologically progressive nor hierarchical. It has roots in (1) indigenous Chinese interest in the “reversals” observed in the cycles of nature, conceptualized according to the naïve ancient generalization that when anything is pushed to its own extreme it will “reverse”, that an increase in a thing’s extension or intensity leads to its self-undermining (e,g., it keeps getting colder until it gets coldest, and then it starts getting warmer), and in (2) the sophisticated ruminations on the nature of conditionality developed in the Emptiness and Two Truths doctrines as expressed in Indian Buddhist logic. What this means is that “thoroughgoing contextualism” will in Tiantai reverse into an assertion of the self-validation of every entity without exception, that “thoroughgoing holism” will in Tiantai self-reverse also into thoroughgoing individualism, “thoroughgoing monism” also into thoroughgoing pluralism, “thoroughgoing immanentism” also into thoroughgoing transcendentalism, along with a claim that these two extremes are, when fully thought through, actually synonyms for one another. It will mean that for all finite conditional entities, exceptionless impermanence is seen to be also exceptionless eternalism, exceptionless anti-substantialism is seen to be also exceptionless substantialism, exceptionless anti-realism is seen to be also exceptionless realism, again supplemented by a claim about the interchangeability of these two seemingly opposed claims. Similarly, thoroughgoing skepticism about all claims is seen to be also a thoroughgoing “trivialism” (the claim that all possible claims are true), thoroughgoing anti-realism also a fanatically absolute realism even for the most fleeting appearances, thoroughgoing renunciation of finite aims, moral rules, moral consequences and moral virtues is seen to be also an exceptionless acceptance of all finite aims and the endorsement of all determinate moral rules, consequences and virtues.

When the dust from these turnarounds settles, Tiantai ends up with a unique view of the structure of reality: every event, function or characteristic occurring in any experience anywhere is the action of all sentient and insentient beings working together. Every instant of experience is the whole of reality manifesting in this particular form, as this particular entity or experience. Each such instant is however no mere accidental, dispensable form; rather, it is itself unconditional and ineradicable, is eternal and omnipresent. Moreover, this “whole of reality” is irreducibly multiple and irreducibly unified at once, in the following way: all possible conflicting, contrasted and axiologically varied aspects are irrevocably present—in the sense of “findable”—in and as each of these individual determinate totality-effects. Good and evil, delusion and enlightenment, Buddhahood and deviltry, are all “inherently entailed” in each and every event. These multiple entities are not “simply located” even virtually or conceptually: the “whole” which is the agent performing every experience is not a collection of these various “inherently entailed” entities or qualities arrayed side by side, like coins in a pocket. Rather, they are “intersubsumptive”. That is, any one of them subsumes all the others, and yet, because of the view of what “subsumption” actually is, each is subsumed by each of the others as well: all relation is subsumption, and all subsumption is intersubsumption. Each part is the whole, each quality subsumes all other qualities, and yet none are ever eradicable. A Buddha in the world makes the world all Buddha, saturated in every locus with the quality “Buddhahood”; a devil in the world makes the world all devil, permeated with “deviltry”. Both Buddha and devil are always in the world. So every event in the world is always both entirely Buddhahood and entirely deviltry. Every moment of experience is always completely delusion, evil and pain, through and through, and also completely enlightenment, goodness and joy, through and through.

Traditional Buddhism gives a rather commonsensical account of sentient experience: every moment of sentient experience is a sensory apparatus encountering an object, giving rise thereby to a particular moment of contentful awareness. But in the Tiantai view, each of these three—sense organ, object, this moment of consciousness—is itself the Absolute, the entirety of reality, expressed without remainder in the peculiar temporary form of sense organ, of object, of this consciousness. Hence each moment of every being’s experience is redescribed, to paraphrase a canonical early Tiantai work, as follows:

The absolute totality encounters the absolute totality, and the result is the arising of the absolute totality. (法界對法界起法界)

The Absolute, the whole of reality, is one and eternal, always the same and omnipresent, but it is also the kind of whole that divides from itself, encounters itself, arises anew each moment, engenders itself as the transient flux of each unique and individual moment of experience of every sentient being.

How this view is established, and what its consequences are, is what is to be explained in this article.

1. Contextualism and Ontological Ambiguity

The meta-level claim about self-recontextualization as self-reversal, which applies at all levels to all Tiantai doctrines, is itself the consequence of some considerations concerning contextualism, holism and conditionality, with which it is thus convenient to begin our exposition. The heart of the matter, the most fundamental and far-reaching renovation of Buddhism accomplished by the Tiantai School, is the move from the Two Truths model to a Three Truths one. The Two Truths is an epistemological and pedagogical heuristic in most Mahāyāna Buddhism, but in Tiantai the Three Truths are taken to be a necessary logical entailment of any proposed determinacy, and thus to apply equally to any possible ontological, epistemological and ethical entities. They can be summarized by the claim that no entity can be either the same as or different from any other entity. This relation of neither-sameness-nor-difference, a formula used by many Mahāyāna Buddhist schools but often interpreted as applying not to “Conventional Truth” but only to “Ultimate Truth” (on which see below), and thus understood simply as an instance of apophasis (i.e., the claim that only negations or silence are truly appropriate descriptions of ultimate reality, since no finite or relative predicates can be legitimately applied to what is infinite or absolute), is in Tiantai instead developed into what might be described as the “asness” relation, applying to all putative or real entities without exception, affecting even what is within the scope of Conventional Truth: each determinate thing is the totality of all other possible things as this thing. The non-sameness implies that the specific characteristics of all other things are in some sense discoverable in each thing, that all their manifold properties and functions will also be simultaneously operative there.

A simple thought experiment may draw out the implications of this idea. Imagine that you come upon what looks like a white marble lying on the ground. You experience it as round, as small, as white, and immediately you construct a lived attitude toward it—something that can be picked up, rolled, played with, pocketed. But then you go to pick it up, and find that it is stuck to the ground. You cannot lift it. You try to dig it out, and find that it extends downward, further than you can dig: it is the tip of a larger item. It appears to be a long rod or cylindrical pipe of some kind. But as you dig further, you find that after about five inches of narrow thinness it starts to expand outward; it is a spire on top of a cone. This cone expands outward as you keep digging down. When you get about twenty feet down, the cone ends, embedded in a soft, scaly material. Then the earth rumbles and an enormous two-horned monster emerges from underground; it is 500 feet tall, and each of its horns is twenty feet high, with a long sharp tip. You had been digging out one of the horns. What you had seen as a marble on the ground was in fact the very tip of one of the horns. Now look again at that tip. You had experienced it as round. But it turns out it was not round at all: it is sharp. Yet it has not changed at all: you are still seeing what you saw. It is not white either: the tip had looked white against the ground, but now, looking at the monster’s horn as whole, you see it as a pattern of mostly green spots interspersed here and there with white: looked at as a whole, the horn, including its tip, looks green. Nor is it movable, pocketable, playwithable—it is rather dangerous, razor sharp, to be avoided. And yet nothing of what you saw was taken away: it was just supplemented with further information, with its larger context.

Tiantai views all things this way. Normally you might make some qualifications in order to preserve your view that some facts are unambiguous (indeed, to some extent this process is precisely what philosophy traditionally is); you might say “the tip, considered in isolation, is indeed round”. The usual procedure is to interpose the distinction between “how it appears” and “how it really is”, some form of reality-appearance distinction. But the most important consequence of the transformation of the Two Truths into the Three Truths is the wholesale dismissal of the appearance-reality distinction. Tiantai would reject the privileging of either considering in isolation or considering in any single particular connection; any of these would be legitimate in some heuristic (upayic) contexts, but none could be non-arbitrarily assigned the role of representing what is the “really the case”, simpliciter. To see something is to see “not-all” of it. We are always seeing a little fragment of the world, but every bit of the world is changed by the fact that it is a part of the world, is recontextualized by the rest of the world, by the rest of space and the rest of time. In fact, if we ever saw all, we would see nothing. For to see, to take something as “there”, as “real”, is to place it within a context, to contrast it to something outside of itself, something which is not it. To see all is to see nothing. As in the case of “fire” and “water” above, if someone were to say that the entire universe is “round”, this would require changing the meaning of “round”. This round would not be round: for round requires a non-round outside it to be round. It would have to be bordered by something to shape it into roundness, but the universe would also include that outside-the-roundness part. If someone were to say the entire universe were sharp, this would also make no sense. This sharp would not be sharp; for sharp requires a non-sharp outside it to be sharp. To say the whole universe is sharp, then, means no more and no less than saying the whole universe is round. We can make no specific determinations about the whole, about the entire universe, for that outside of which nothing exists; for all particular specifications require a contrast to something outside of them. Everything we can say or think comes from the realm of the finite, and cannot be applied to the infinite. But the Tiantai point is that we cannot speak of anything finite without also involving some determination of the Whole, of the infinite. If we were to say this thing is sharp, we would have to be assuming that “the whole universe is such that this thing is sharp”. We cannot say that: the whole universe cannot be “such that this marble is sharp” any more than the whole universe can be “sharp”. But this also means we cannot say the whole universe is “such that this marble is not-sharp”. Either is equally legitimate, either is equally illegitimate. What we can say, then, is that this marble appears to be round, but round is such that it is always turning out also to be more than round, to be non-round, and vice versa. Roundness is moretoitive. Round and non-round intersubsume each other.

In short, roundness is present as every non-roundness, and as moretoitivity; moretoitivity is present as roundness, and as every non-roundness. This it means to say “roundness and non-roundness are neither same nor different.”

To clarify this, consider the following:

What is the following figure?


What is that “same” figure in the diagram below?

−2 −1 Ο  1  2

What is it now?

−2 −1 Ο  1  2

How about now:

−2 −1 Ο  1  2 Ο

When we looked at that round figure in isolation, it may have presented itself immediately and unreflectively in accordance with our habits or proximate mental acts; if we had been thinking about numbers a moment ago, it might appear simply and unambiguously as “zero”, if about letters as the letter “o”, if about shapes as a “circle”. When a single explicit context was added in the second diagram, it had a clear and definite identity: it was the number zero. But when we added another context at the same time, in the third diagram, the figure became ambiguous: it could now be read as either a zero or the letter O. As we keep adding more contexts, its identity becomes more and more ambiguous; in the final diagram above, we can point to the initial circular figure and say, validly, “This is a triangle”—for it is the vertex of a triangle formed with the two other, non-contiguous and non-proximate, circles. Who knows what other circles there are out in the world, and what other figures this thing right here is actually forming? When we consider all things in the universe at the same time, the initial identities we assigned to them are supplemented by more and more ambiguity. Looking at just the single series of letters, is was a zero: this is local coherence. When we see this cup simply as a cup, we are doing the same thing: ignoring a lot of other factors, contexts, points of view, ways of viewing, and narrowing down the relevant factors to allow it to appear as a single unambiguous something: a cup. If we consider the molecules of which it is made, or the energy it expresses, or the uses to which it might be put in the context of various narratives, or its deep past and deep future, its “cupness” becomes ambiguous: it is simultaneously lots of other things, part of many different stories. It is a blip on the screen of energy transformations, or a murder weapon, or an art object, or a doorstop. The same is true of yourself, and your actions right now. They are unambiguous only to the extent that we narrow our vision around them (one way we can narrow our vision, of course, is to do philosophy; one of the narratives in which we are contextualizing our experience might be a conceptual system presupposing the sorting out of essences, attributes, accidents, substantial forms or what have you, and distinguishing appearances from reality accordingly, so that it appears to be “essentially” a cup and only “accidentally” a murder weapon and only “appearing to be” a revelation from Baal). This is the meaning of Emptiness in Tiantai: ontological ambiguity. The term “ambiguity” usually refers only to how we see things. We assume that, in themselves, everything simply is what it is; but we may have an unclear view of it; we can’t yet tell if it’s this or that. We assume that, at least in principle, it must be one or the other. The idea of Emptiness is the idea that this is true “ontologically”: that is, it pertains to the very being of things. To say they are empty does not mean they are a blank—for that would be a definite something, a specific exclusion of all determinate content, which is, ipso facto, itself a determinate content. Emptiness here means rather that they are, in themselves, ambiguous. Again, this is also to say that everything is more than it seems to be, or rather constitutively more than it can seem to be, no matter what angles it is seen from, no matter how thoroughly it is known, no matter how comprehensive a sum of information is gathered about it. It has the character of being a “something” (a cup, a chair, an elephant), with a number of specifiable characteristics, but every “something”, just to be there as something, has the additional characteristic of “moretoitivity”—of always overflowing whatever is determined about it, of being more than what can be seen from any angle.

This “more” however, does not leave the original “known” part unchanged. Rather, it recontextualizes it. We are always seeing the tip of an iceberg. But even the “tip” is no longer what we thought it was before we knew it was a tip of something more. The key here is that there is no total decontextualization, that leaving one context is always simply entering another context; contextual relations do not require physical contiguity, and the empty space surrounding a given thing does not cut it off from further recontextualizations but rather is itself a context, and an illimitable one that opens into infinite alternate contexts.

2. The Three Truths: Emptiness, Provisional Positing and the Center (空假中 kong, jia, zhong)

These analogies, homely and somewhat goofy as they are, may start to give some sense of the intuitions that undergird Tiantai’s architectonic philosophical system, which may help orient us as we move into the actual technical arguments and commitments developed there. This is especially important in the Tiantai case, as the conclusions to which its theoretical edifice lead will initialy strike many if not most readers as wildly outlandish and counterintuitive; some attention to these everyday experiences—coming upon something in the world, having some tentative grasp of what it is but with a built-in incompletion clause pointed toward the future, finding out more about it, reinterpreting and recalibrating our understanding accordingly, adjusting our foregroundings and backgroundings, and so on—may help to spur some reflections on the concepts normally brought to bear in interpreting these experiences. It also helps us understand the Tiantai claim that its most shocking stipuations are nothing special, not the bizarro-world privileges of some remote ontological plane, but are rather inescapable entailments of everyday experience of all sentient beings—for this process of things appearing one way and turning out another is almost a definition of “experience” as such. Nevertheless, analogies are never perfect, always partially mirroring the structure they are intended to explicate but never doing so completely, and we must not allow the attractive accessibility of such examples to mislead us into resting content with only a loose sense of the logical entailments of this sort of thinking. For a more rigorous grasp of the reasoning on which so many of the outrageous epistemological, ontological and soteriological claims of this school rest, we must approach the meaning of “neither-same-nor-different” more systemtaically.

2.1 Outline of the Three Truths Argument: Getting to “Neither-Same-Nor-Different”

We can reconstruct the argument for this claim as follows:

  1. For anything to be what it is, it must be mutually exclusive with whatever it is not. If it has aspects or qualities in common with anything else, it is nonetheless stipulated to be specifically itself not insofar as it has these in common, and thus is indistinguishable from the other things that share them, but insofar as it is different from them.
  2. To be is to be determinate. To be determinate is to be finite, non-all. To be finite is to be conditional. Anything strictly unconditional would ipso facto be omnipresent (no particular place rather than another can be the “condition” for its existence) and always occurring (no particular time rather than another can be the “condition” for its existence), and thus indistinguishable from anything else. This would be equivalent to not being determinate at all, for it would be impossible for an unconditional entity to be mutually exclusive with anything, since that exclusion would then have to be a “condition” of its existence.
  3. Any entity must thus be copresent with some otherness; it must exist in a world that includes something that is not it, i.e., (by item #1), something that is mutually exclusive with it (even if just the empty space around it). Some form of copresence-with-otherness is an essential characteristic of the existence of all entities. All forms of relation, including relations of causality and of conceptual contrast, are instances of this necessary copresence-in-the-world.
  4. The conditions from which it must be different but related include not only immediately contiguous causally efficient factors, but also prior states of affairs. More searchingly, the constitutive copresent otherness cannot be to non-X in general, for this would merely be a repetition of the determination of X itself, in reverse; to the extent that there is no more in non-X than the negation of X, no new content is provided by the contrast, which therefore presupposes X. Rather, the exclusions that make up the determination of X must be specific other determinations, other exclusions; they must in principle include anything at all that the entity in question is different from: to be determinate as X is a specific exclusion of all specific non-X things and states. We have greater knowledge of what the essence of a dog is by learning more about each and every particular thing that the dog is not, how it differs specifically from a cat, from a hedgehog, from a table, from a towel…. (Our knowledge is thus always constitutively partial and in-process; knowing X is always being poised to know more about X. Knowledge per se is non-omniscience.)
  5. However, all copresence-in-the-world, all conditioning, all relation, all causality between two entities requires some overlap or interface between them. There must be some place, thing, time, medium or concept that simultaneously includes them both, or which they both include. Any two entities must have something in common to succeed in being copresent—to have a causal relation or to even be contrasted.
  6. But no genuinely distinct entities, insofar as they are distinct and thus determinate, have anything in common.
  7. Hence two genuinely mutually exclusive entities can have no relation of conditioning one another.
  8. Hence there are no genuinely mutually exclusive entities. Thus the nature of determination stipulated in item #1 must be supplemented. This rewrite of the nature of determination is the Three Truths.
  9. Whatever appears to be, i.e., to be just what it is and nothing else, cannot really be mutually exclusive with whatever it is not. X is “non-different” from non-X. This non-difference is called the Emptiness (空 kong, Śūnyatā) of X. For if X is non-different from non-X, it fails to fulfill the condition of being X stipulated in item #1, and thus X is not X; X is “empty”.
  10. But X is also “non-same” with non-X. Empirically, if it were the same, there would be no X to be called non-different: its presence is nothing other than its non-identity with all other states. Logically, the alternative to the Tiantai view is the default bivalent assumption that either some entities exist or that no entities exist; but both existing and non-existing require non-sameness—i.e., the non-sameness between existing and non-existing. Anything determinate is non-same with what is not itself, by item #1. This is why there is something rather than nothing: even total nothingness would still be determinate and non-same to what it is not, i.e., non-same to somethingness. Nothing would therefore still be something, so the question why there is something rather than nothing is actually moot. Non-sameness to what it is not is analytically necessary to any proposed entity. Even if no entity is posited, “no-entity-being-posited” will not obtain unless the positing of entities is thereby excluded, and non-sameness is necessary to succeed in excluding the positing of any entity. This is non-sameness to non-X is called the Provisional Positing or Conventional Truth (假 jia) of X.
  11. The non-sameness of X and non-X and the non-difference between X and non-X are themselves non-same as one another and non-different from one another. Non-same in spite of being non-different is Provisional Positing. Non-different in spite of being non-same is Emptiness. These are just reversed ways of saying the same thing, but the reversal is itself not negligible. They are two opposite and mutually exclusive senses given to a single identical referent. They are synonymous and yet contrasted. This is called the Center (中 zhong).
  12. X has to be an aspect or part of more than whatever it seems to be, and even as a part or aspect it cannot really be just the single selfsame (i.e., simply and bivalently same or different) part or aspect it appears to be.
  13. But it also does and must seem to be just this and nothing besides, and can appear only if initially appearing to be mutually exclusive with what it is not: to appear is to appear as something, which is to appear as finite. The whole of which any appearance is a part or aspect can never appear simpliciter, even in thought. It is always appearing as one specific thing (or concept, or thought) or another.
  14. To be present as X is to not be X, but such that this not-X is showing itself only as X. To be X is to exclude non-X but only in such a way as to necessarily involve non-X, which can only be done by showing itself exclusively as X.
  15. Thus the Three Truths are:
    1. Provisional Positing: Some X is always appearing.
    2. Emptiness: X is not (only) X.
    3. The Center (or Middle, or Mean): The simultaneity, inseparability, sameness-as-difference of X appearing and X not being only X (this is the Center in its simplest formulation, as “the exclusive Center” (但中 danzhong) which is itself neither Emptiness nor Provisional Positing, is beyond both and more ultimately real than both, but which can appear as either).
  16. A further implication of the Center, called the “Non-exclusive Center” (不但中 budan zhong): Any two putatively distinct things, Y and X, are also not-same-and-not different from one another. For the Center can never appear simpliciter; it always appears as some specific coherence showing itself, to which it is non-different. Provisional Positing is intrinsic to every instance of both Emptiness and the Center, and Provisional Positing is always some specific provisional posit (even the abstract concept “provisional positing”, or the abstract concept “emptiness” or “the center” is still a specific provisional posit.) Each provisional posit involves every other provisional posit, specifically. Y is an instantiation of X. X is an instantiation of Y. All other appearances are thus “intersubsumptive” with X. The Center is thus ultimately not beyond or more real than Emptiness or Provisional Positing, but is itself synonymous-as-contrasted with them, such that just to be Empty or to Provisionally Posited, or to be any provisional posit, is to be the Center, the subsumer and subsumed of all other provisional posits—and vice versa.

2.2 The Self-Overcoming of Holism into Omnireductionism

From this we can perhaps see in what way Tiantai is able to stipulate at once the self-preserving and the self-overcoming of both holism and apophasis. First, atomism of any kind—that is, any doctrine that stipulates basic indivisible buiding blocks exist whose identities are independent of the relations and wholes into which they may enter—is rejected as unintelligible, and a thorough contextualism asserted: things can only be determinate in relation to a context, and there can be no non-arbitrary limiting of the extent and multiplicity of contexts, since each context will itself be intelligible only with respect to a larger context. This would seem to lead to a holism of some sort: each apparently isolable thing is really an aspect or expression of some more inclusive whole, and each of these finite wholes must be an aspect or expression of a still more inclusive whole. The part is dependent on the whole, the conditional is dependent on the unconditional. But the unconditional can have no specific separate identity, not even as “the unconditional per se”. Any determination for the whole turns out to self-overturn into other determinations, precisely due to its success in being a determination for the exceptionless whole. For example, Thales says the world is made of water. This is stipulated after first isolating other lesser wholes: water, earth, fire, air. Each of these was already a finite whole, involving an alleged collapse from appearance to a deeper reality: what appeared to be trees and stones and pillars turned out to be part of the larger whole “earth”, ways in which earth appears or manifests; what appeared to be body-heat and flames and sunshine turned out to be part of the larger whole “fire”, ways in which fire appears or manifests. Now Thales says both of these are really parts of a larger whole “water”, ways in which it appears and manifests. But each of these generalizing claims involves a meaning-change for the term in question. “Water” initially meant “what is not fire, earth, wind, which excludes them, what is contrasted to them”. After Thales, “water” means also “what expresses itself sometimes as watery, sometimes as fiery, sometimes as earthy, sometimes as windy”. Along comes Heraclitus and claims that all is really “fire”. “Fire” now means also “what expresses itself sometimes as watery, sometimes as fiery, sometimes as earthy, sometimes as windy”. What is intended in claims of this type, allowing them to appear to be doing explanatory work, is the maintenance of a distinction between which of these expressions is primary and which secondary, which direct and indirect; but Tiantai would deny that this distinction can be meaningfully maintained once this totalization has been effected. Because each now means the whole, they lose their original meaning, for that meaning was entirely dependent on a contrast to what was excluded. If fire is everything, then fire is not fire. If water is everything, then water is not water. If fire is everything, then water is really fire. If water is everything, then fire is really water. If fire is really water, then water is really fire. Hence by going through the universalization of any determinate entity, we reach the overturning of that determination into something that expresses itself as all other determinations, and at the same time undermines its own privileged status as ultimate foundation, making all other possible determinations equally unconditional, all-pervasive, universal, absolute. To see the absoluteness of any one entity is thus to de-absolutize that entity and also to absolutize every other entity.

2.3 From Two Truths to Three Truths: The Self-Overcoming of Apophasis into Trivialism

The Three Truths position of Tiantai derives from a particular understanding of the Two Truths doctrine advanced by Indian Buddhist philosophers of the Mādhyamaka school, interpreted as holding that any specific thing we could say about the world was at best a “Conventional Truth”, which served as a kind of “raft” to get beyond it to the “Ultimate Truth” of Emptiness—determinations of any kind were thus at best an indispensable means to get beyond themselves, to be discarded when their work is done. The stipulation of Emptiness (Śūnyatā) was itself a raft to get beyond not only all other determinate views but also Emptiness itself as a “view” or theory or concept. Ultimate Truth, true realization of Emptiness, was thus at best a celebratory term used to point to an ineffable experience of the liberation from all views, all definite conceptions of determinate “things”. The motivation for this was soteriological in a specific, pan-Buddhist sense: the goal of all human endeavor, including philosophy, including ethics, including epistemology, is assumed to be the reduction or elimination of suffering. Buddhism claims that this is what we’re always trying to do, but usually in a self-defeating, ignorant way; it claims to provide a more effective way. Note that this does not make any claim about what is valuable, but rather addresses what is assumed to be a necessary entailment of what it means to consider anything valuable, i.e., what structures desire qua desire. To desire is to value, and suffering is simply the non-satisfaction of our desire. Hence all endeavors are endeavors to eliminate some suffering, i.e., to satisfy a desire. The characteristic Buddhist contribution is then to note that desiring any conditional object or state is necessarily self-defeating. This is because to be conditional is to be brought into being by a qualitatively distinct, heterogeneous and extrinsic cause. But examined closely, this cannot be a single extrinsic cause, for if any effect were produced by a single cause, that cause and that effect would always be copresent—wherever and whenever that cause occurred, the effect would also occur. But that would mean that the cause would therefore no longer be extrinsic to the effect; they would be, rather, necessary and intrinsically conjoined, actually two aspects of a single irreducible entity, which would mean that no causal event actually ever occurs. This means that all conditional things require multiple causes, each of which itself requires multiple causes.

This introduces an intrinsic instability and inner conflict into whatever exists conditionally, that is, whatever is finite, whatever is determinate. The unconditional would have to be omnipresent and omnitemporal and indeterminate. But the nature of desire is to have specific conditions of satisfaction: to desire is to require some one state of affairs rather than, to the exclusion of, some other state of affairs—minimally, pleasure instead of pain. This means all desire qua desire is desire for something conditional; otherwise there would be no need for the desire, since the desired state would already always and everywhere be present. Desire desires a single effect to the exclusion of any other effect; but the denial of effectivity for any single cause also implies that what is produced by any causal process can never be only a single effect. For since what is produced is not dependent solely on any single cause, or indeed any finite set of causes considered as a unit, the production of a new event always requires the conjunction with some hitherto excluded condition. Since by hypothesis this new condition is not a consistent part of the original set, it will not always be the same, and thus the effect will not be one and the same; every conjunction will produce its own effects, and by hypothesis there is no limit to the set of conjunctions (for that would make them simply a single cause). Less rigorously, it is held that the cross-purposes and conflicting tendencies thus built into any effect make it impossible for it to be a stably homogenous entity consistently isolable from the opposite conditional states it means to exclude, such as is required by the exclusive structure of specific desires. Whatever is desired must be identifiably present at a particular time and place, and whatever is such is conditional, and whatever is conditional entails impermanence, and thus suffering.

The pan-Buddhist denial of the existence of a “self” rests on the same point: the impossibility of single-cause causal events. For the “self” rejected here is precisely the claimant to single-causality: the agent of actions which putatively requires no second condition to produce an effect, e.g., to will something, to do something, to want something, to experience something. The self never acts alone, has no independent effects, and thus actually is not a self-as-efficacious-agent. “Self” here essentially means “controller”. Because there is no single causality, there is no single controller, and thus no self. For this reason too, satisfaction of desire is not sustainable. For in doing what the self desires, other causes besides the activity of the self are always also involved; the effect is not in the self’s control, and thus will inevitably contravene its desires, its own causal contributions to the effect. Indeed, the early Buddhist analysis of the human condition amounts to the claim that all desire is really a proxy-version of this impossible desire for control, for single-agent causality, for pure autonomy, for selfhood; thus all desire is doomed.

The same considerations have serious epistemological consequences as well. The Buddhists viewed theoretical stances and philosophical positions as themselves objects of desire, of clinging. Since all such stances are themselves specific, determinate, they are ipso facto conditional. As conditional, they are ipso facto suffering. Hence attachment to views was seen as a form of suffering and an obstacle to liberation. All determinate metaphysical views about how or what things are were to be transcended and left behind.

In most of the dominant Indian theories, those ideas are granted temporary validity as conventional truths: they are to serve as “rafts”, to be clung to temporarily, but only because they are an effective means of passing beyond themselves. This includes both specific Buddhist doctrines and also ordinary conventional speech (necessary for even communicating Buddhist ideas). Whatever ideas do not lead to their own abandonment in this way (and hence do not lead to the end of suffering) do not count even as conventional truths—for example, 1) metaphysical and religious theories about the Absolute, or unconditional claims about the world as a whole and 2) non-conventional views of things in the world, claims that contravene ordinary language of the community. There tends to be a kind of hierarchy in the Indian Two Truths theory: first, plain falsehood, including all philosophical theories about reality and unconventional views. Then conventional truth, which includes ordinary daily life ideas about self and other, cause and effect and so on, and also Buddhist ideas about suffering, the Four Noble Truths, non-self, and even “Emptiness” considered as a concept. These ideas lead beyond themselves, instrumentally, to the experience of Emptiness, which is liberation from all views. The conventional truths had an instrumental value, but none were really “true” about things—Emptiness meant that all of them were, in the most ultimate sense, false. Also, there are really only one or two kinds of conventional truth: first, common sense daily speech, the correct general names for things as used in the daily life of your particular community, and second, Buddhist ideas. The reason these count as “truths” is because they are useful in leading us to liberation from suffering—and in leading us to liberation from these ideas themselves. “True” propositions are propositions that have the power to lead beyond themselves.

This led to a somewhat paradoxical situation, on several levels. There was always a problem in Emptiness theory: Emptiness was supposed to be not a “view” at all, to predicate nothing about reality. But if it does anything at all, if it negates or excludes any other view, it is, in the Tiantai view, still a kind of view. For to be something in particular is just to exclude something else in particular. That is all a “thing” is, that is all a “view” is. To be something just is to exclude something else; nothing more is required to count as a being. Pre-Tiantai Emptiness theory gets into an infinite regress, chasing its tail around the problem of the transcendence of Emptiness: no statement can represent it, even “all things are Empty”. It is purely and totally above and beyond anything that can be thought or said, all ordinary experience of identities in the world. It is a negation that is supposed to bear no relation at all to what it negates, to entirely escape the system of relations, of conditionality. Emptiness is supposed to be strictly “inconceivable”. In Tiantai, this problem disappears. Emptiness is still very important, but it is simply a conditional assertion of unconditionality. We do not have all the conditionality (specifiability, particularity) on one side and all the unconditionality (transcendence, inconceivability) on the other. Everything, every experience, every identity, every action, is in the same boat: they are all both conditional and unconditional, both conceivable and inconceivable. The thought, experience, concept “Emptiness” is also both conditional and unconditional, both conceivable and inconceivable, like “water” and “fire” in our example about. Emptiness is an especially efficient marker of self-exploded holism, the term that applies most easily everywhere and thus ultimately nowhere, allowing all other terms to do the same. It is Provisionally Posited, which means it is at least locally coherent (conditional, determinate, conceivable), but it itself is also Empty, which means it is globally incoherent (unconditional, indeterminate, inconceivable). It appears in experience as something in particular (locally coherent as precisely this word and this thought “Emptiness”), but this, like every other local coherence, is haunted by its own inseparable nimbus of infinite outsides, infinite contexts, each of which differently contextualizes it and thus bestows on it alternate identities: there is more to it than any single concept, including the concept “Emptiness”, can hold. Emptiness is, to use a word coined for just this Tiantai usage, “moretoitivity” (i.e., the quality of always constitutively having more-to-it): and moretoitivity is itself moretoitive. It appears not just as moretoitivity, but as specific identities, something more, above and beyond, simple moretoitivity as such. Ambiguity is itself ambiguous: fire is not just fire, it is ambiguous; but the ambiguity is not just ambiguity, it is also fire. This applies to everything else as well. Local coherence and global coherence (Provisional Positing and Emptiness) are just two ways of saying the same thing.

In the Tiantai “Three Truths” theory, instead of concluding that every particular view and thing is false, we conclude that all is, ultimately, true. Every possible view is equally a truth. There is no longer a hierarchy between the levels, and no category of plain falsehood. “Conventional Truth” in Tiantai is not something to be left behind when we reach enlightenment, but rather what is obtained and mastered and intensified there. Moreover, nothing is left out of it—all possible statements, viewpoints, ideas, concepts, positions are conventional truths. The criterion is still the same: all things can be used as “skillful means” to lead to Buddhahood. So now we have Three Truths, which are not a raft-like instrument to get beyond all statements and concepts, and a final higher truth that allows us to have no biased and particular view of things, but rather as three true ways of viewing any particular thing. It is not a raft to get beyond all rafts, but a raft that leads to the raft factory that makes and houses all rafts, and allows one to move at will from any raft to any other raft, including the initial one. However you may be viewing a particular part of the world or the world as a whole, it is “conventionally” true. There are not just a few conventional truths, but an infinite number of them, even when they are directly opposed and contradictory. So in Two Truths theory, we would say that “this is a cup” is conventionally true, and “this cup is empty” is a higher conventional truth, which finally leads us to a direct inconceivable experience of the emptiness of this cup, freedom from clinging to any view at all of this cup, which is the liberation from all suffering. If someone were to point to this “cup” and say, “This is an elephant”, however, that would not even be a conventional truth, because that is not how most people think of it, it is neither the ordinary speech of the language community, nor a Buddhist term designed to lead beyond itself. That would be a plain error. And if someone said, “This is an expression of the will of God”, that would also be an error, not even a conventional truth, since it tried to make a claim beyond that of conventional usage to an ultimate, universally applicable, absolute truth. But in Tiantai Three Truths theory, it is just as true to say, “This is an elephant” or “This is the Will of Baal” as to say “This is a cup”. And neither of these is less true than saying, “This is empty”, or indeed any less true than “experiencing” the emptiness of this cup/elephant. In both cases, what we have is a locally coherent way of viewing this thing—it just means that it looks that way from some perspective, within some set of parameters, for some length of time. It doesn’t matter anymore whether those parameters are shared by the common sense of a particular community or speech group; all that matters is that it is possible to make it look that way, that it looks that way from anywhere, for even one moment. In Two Truths and Emptiness theory, nothing is really true. In Tiantai Three Truths theory, everything is true. We don’t need an extra “Emptiness” outside of this locally coherent way of seeing things; Emptiness just means that whatever is locally coherent is also, ipso facto, globally incoherent. That is, when all factors are taken into consideration, the original way any thing appears is no longer unambiguously present, but it restored as a raft leading to all other rafts, including itself, as ineradicable aspects of all reality, of any reality.

3. Transformative Self-Recontextualization (開權顯實 kaiquanxianshi)

This strange “neither-same-nor-different” structure of the Three Truths is to be understood in accordance with another key Tiantai concept, “opening the provisional to reveal the real” (開權顯實 kaiquan xianshi). This is a way of further specifying the relation between local coherence and global incoherence, which are not only synonymous, but also irrevocably opposed, and indeed identical only by means of their opposition and mutual exclusivity. Provisional truth is the antecedent, the premise, and indeed in a distinctive sense the cause of ultimate truth, but only because it is the strict exclusion of ultimate truth.

3.1 The Setup-Punchline Structure of Reality

This can be compared to the structure of the relation between the set up and the punch line of a certain kind of joke. Consider the following:

Two strangers were chatting on a bus. One told the other he was on his way to a biology lab downtown to pick up his dog. “The scientists there are doing some research on him”, he said. “He was born with no nose”.
“Really?” said the other. “How does he smell?”

Let’s talk about that structure. When we hear the question “How does he smell?” it seems as if it is a serious query, an expression of serious curiosity about canine anatomy and its mutations. It has the quality of seriousness, of factuality, of non-ironic information. There is nothing funny about that statement. But, when the punch line comes, retrospectively, that set up is funny. That set up is funny because it has been recontextualized by the pun on the word “smell”, which is made to have more than one identity when put into a new context.

The interesting thing to note here is that it is precisely by not being funny that the setup was funny. In other words, if it was already funny, if you didn’t take it seriously for a second, the contrast between the two different meanings of this thing could never have clashed in the way that is necessary to make the laughter, to make it actually funny. We have a setup which is serious and a punch line which is funny, but when you look back at the setup from the vantage point of having heard the punchline, that setup is also funny. After all, we don’t say that just the punch line is funny. We say the whole joke is funny. The setup is funny in the mode of not being funny yet. It is only funny because it wasn’t funny. It is the same thing in the Lotus Sutra and it is the same thing in life really. You’re Enlightened! That is what Mahāyāna Buddhism says, everyone is Enlightened! Everybody is a Buddha! But the way in which you are a Buddha is the way in which the setup of a joke is funny, i.e., by not being a Buddha. By struggling toward buddhahood, toward something else, but by revisualizing or recontextualizing or expanding awareness, which has been the preferred technique in Buddhism all along, those very things which are the details of daily life, of the struggles to interact, to deal with conditions and suffering and lack of control are not just a means to buddhahood. They are themselves buddhahood as the life of a sentient being.

The “provisional”, conventional truth, local coherence, is the set-up. The “ultimate truth”, Emptiness, global incoherence, ontological ambiguity, is the punch line. What is important here is to preserve both the contrast between the two and their ultimate identity in sharing the quality of humorousness which belongs to every atom of the joke considered as a whole, once the punch line has been revealed. The setup is serious, while the punchline is funny. The funniness of the punchline depends on the seriousness of the setup, and on the contrast and difference between the two. However, once the punchline has occurred, it is also the case that the setup is, retrospectively, funny. This also means that the original contrast between the two is both preserved and annulled: neither funniness nor seriousness means the same thing after the punchline dawns, for their original meanings depended on the mutually exclusive nature of their defining contrast. Is the setup serious or funny? It is both: it is funny as serious, and serious as funny. Is the punchline serious or funny? It is both, but in an interestingly different way. It is obviously funny, but is it also serious? Yes. Why? Because now that the setup has occurred, both “funny” and “serious” have a different meaning. Originally, we thought that “funny” meant “what I laugh at when I hear it” or something like that, and “serious” meant “what gives me non-funny information” or something similar. But now we see that “funny” can also mean: What I take to be serious, what I am not laughing about, what I am earnestly considering, or crying over, or bewailing even.

But this means also that “serious” means “what can turn out to be either funny or serious”. So both “funny” and “serious” now both mean “funny-and-serious, what can appear as both funny and serious”. Each is now a center that subsumes of the other; they are intersubsumptive. As a consequence, the old pragmatic standard of truth is applied more liberally here: all claims, statements and positions are true in the sense that all can, if properly recontextualized, lead to liberation—which is to say, to their own self-overcoming. Conversely, none will lead to liberation if not properly contextualized.

3.2 Tiantai Teachings about Teachings: “Impermanence” as both Opposite and Synonym of “Permanence” (In Four Steps)

This contextualism is applied intricately and thoroughgoingly to Buddhist teachings themselves, including especially its most foundational teachings about the basic character of existence: impermanence, suffering, and non-self—and also about the solutions to those conditions: enlightenment and Buddhahood. Are all things permament or impermanent? Are there selves or no selves? Can we end suffering or can’t we? For Tiantai the right question to be asked for understanding and applying doctrine is not “is it true?”—since all doctrines are “true” in this sense of “liberating” in some contexts, and not in others—but rather “in what sense, and in what context, is it true, i.e., liberating?” It is in this connection that we must understand the Tiantai “classification of teachings.” Among the many rubrics used for this purpose in traditional Tiantai, the most philosophically important is the classification of the four types of contents of the Buddha’s teaching (化法四教), called the Four Teachings, namely, Tripitaka, Shared, Separate, and Perfect 藏,通,別,圓).

These four types of content are viewed by Tiantai thinkers not as four different teachings, but as really increasingly subtle explications of one and the same content, the basic Buddhist teaching, via more and more expansive recontextualizations. Tiantai classifies all the teachings found in the Mahāyāna Buddhist scriptures into these four general types, according to the degree to which they have developed the understanding of the basic Buddhist concepts of universal conditionality, i.e., of Impermanence, Suffering, and Non-Self. It should be noted again that all four of these types are regarded as “true teachings” of the Buddha—true in the sense of validly propounded as a way of liberating sentient beings from suffering in some particular context—and that all are equally also not considered uniquely true descriptions of reality. Moreover, in keeping with the general Tiantai approach to interpretation, they are not really different teachings at all: they are viewed as alternate expositions of the same idea as it is recontextualized, to varying degrees of thoroughness as appropriate, even though—as we shall see—they appear prima facie to be in direct contradiction to one another. As such, this schema provides us with a strong general model of the Tiantai conception of the self-overcoming of suffering, impermanence and non-self, wherein they are overcome by remaining exactly as they were, indeed even more so, and thereby are revealed to also be their own opposites.

Zhiyi takes an obscure passage from a Chinese translation of the Mahāyāna Mahāparinirvāna Sūtra as one of his models for these four expositions.

Literally, the passage reads as follows:

(Reality) cannot be described in terms of the arising of what arises.
It cannot be described in terms of the non-arising of what arises.
It cannot be described in terms of the arising of non-arising.
It cannot be described in terms of the non-arising of non-arising.
It cannot be described in terms of arising or non-arising [in any of these ways].
Yet under the right circumstances it can be validly described in terms of any of these.

The passage can be somewhat more venturesomely translated as follows:

The generated generates: that cannot be said.
The generated is ungenerated: that cannot be said.
The ungenerated generates: that cannot be said.
The ungenerated ungenerates: that cannot be said.
It cannot be said that there is either generation or the ungenerated in any of these ways.
Although all four of these cannot be said, yet any of them can be said under the right circumstances [i.e., none is literally or absolutely valid, but all are conventionally valid—i.e., pragmatically effective in leading to liberation—in certain situations].
生生 不可說,生不生亦不可說,不生生亦不可說,不生不生亦不可說,生亦不可說,不生亦不可說,以有因緣故可得說

For Zhiyi this passage gives more than a standard Buddhist negation of the tetralemma followed by its provisional affirmation. Instead, he links these four positions to the following four general categories, each with its own distinct way of understanding the Four Noble Truths, and therefore its own way of understanding the nature of all things, the nature of all conditional events, of both the arising and perishing of suffering (i.e., of all ordinary experience), of both suffering and liberation from suffering, and of how they are related:

1. Tripitaka Teaching 藏教: “The Generated Generates” 生生, or literally, “The arising of what arises.”

The things described by the Four Noble Truths – i.e., all conditional experience of suffering as well as the experience of the Unconditioned which is liberation from suffering—actually arise and perish. (shengmie sidi 生滅四諦)

All things are empty in that they are impermanent, and vanish without remainder when analyzed and dissolved into their parts (“analytic emptiness” xikong析空).

2. Shared Teaching 通教:: The [Apparently] Generated [Actually] is Ungenerated 生不生, or literally, “the non-arising of what arises.”

The things described by the Four Noble Truths—i,e., all conditional experiences of suffering as well as the experience of the Unconditioned which is liberation from suffering—do not arise [or perish]. (wusheng sidi 無生四諦)

All things are empty in their very nature from the beginning (whether literally impermanent and dissolved into parts or not) (“emptiness embodied right in the thing,” tikong 體空).

3. Separate Teaching 別教: The [Previously Established] Ungenerated Generates [Infinitely] 不生生, or literally, “the arisings of what does not arise”

The things described by the Four Noble Truths – i.e., all conditional experiences of suffering as well as the experience of the Unconditioned which is liberation from suffering—can be validly described not only as “really” empty of any determinations of their own and thus neither arising nor perishing, but also, because they are also aspects of the compassionate liberative work of a bodhisattva, in an infinity of alternate ways. (wuliang sidi 無量四諦)

The previous characterizations of things as empty or as non-empty were both one-sided, as things are in reality neither empty nor non-empty. Rather, both Emptiness and all non-empty things are manifestations “the Center,” a tertium quid which is beyond but also includes both the ungenerated aspect and the generated aspect, at once both form and formless, the constant infinite productions of forms by the formless, formlessness present only as the infinity of forms. It is the collapsing of emptiness and non-emptiness into something that is immediately both: their unity, which is the real source of both: this is the Buddha-nature as “Exclusive Center” danzhong foxing 但中佛性, hidden beneath the two extremes, the inner kernel of all phenomena, as their source and ultimate reality.

4. Perfect Teaching 圓教: The (infinite things generated by the) Ungenerated (are also) Ungenerated 不生不生, or literally, “the non-arisings of the non-arising.”

The things described by the Four Noble Truths – i.e., all conditional experiences of suffering as well as the experience of liberation from suffering—in all those infinite alternate forms, are [actually, in their very infinite production,] unmade and unbegun (and unfinishable). (wuzuo sidi 無作四諦)

Each thing is empty, non-empty, and the Center. Each thing is neither empty, non-empty, nor the Center. Each thing is entirely and only empty. Each thing is entirely and only non-empty. Each thing is entirely and only the Center. Each thing subsumes all the others. Each thing is subsumed by all the others. Each of the previous sentences in this paragraph are synonyms. Not only each thing: the aspect of emptiness itself is empty, non-empty, and Center, and considered purely on its own terms is not only the negation of all things but also, when fully thought through, the positing of all things (non-empty) and the identity of positing and negation (Center). The same is true for the aspect of non-emptiness, and Center: each one alone is all three. This is the “Non-Exclusive Center.” budanzhong 不但中佛性 Because it is what a Buddha lives and realizes, it is also called “the Buddha-nature”. Each thing is the center of the universe, the substance of which all other things are attributes. Each is the source generating all things, but also inherently contains all things within itself so that it generates nothing, and likewise being generated by, and contained by, any other thing. Each thing is readable equally as any other thing. Each thing is also the end toward which all other things tend, the telos of all things. A more detailed exposition of these four positions, and their relation to each other, is given in the following supplementary document:

Four Teachings

3.3 Time and Facts

The Three Truths, then, are actually three different but mutually implicative ways of looking at any object or state. Each implies the other two, and each is one way to describe the whole of that object, including its other two aspects. To be established is to be negated. To be begun is to be constitutively incomplete; to be determinate is to be ambiguous, to be anything is to be more than that thing. If it were not more—other—than X, it would not even be X. We may think about this in terms of the status of a “fact”. Emerson says in his essay, “History” (1841):

Time dissipates to shining ether the solid angularity of facts. No anchor, no cable, no fences avail to keep a fact a fact.

He meant that every historical fact registers “at a distance”, in other times and places, taking on the role of an ever-ramifying metaphor that applies to more and more individual cases, with more and more diverse and rich implications. With a few small modifications, this brings us close to the Tiantai view: all we need to do is specify that “time” and “fact” are not really two different things, with the former acting to ambiguate the solidity of the latter, but are in reality two sides of the same thing, two aspects of a single process, in fact are ultimately synonyms. Time is just the addition of other facts. New facts are just the presence of additional time. In the Tiantai view these new facts are not imposed on the initial fact from without, but are posited as the context which alone made it a fact in the first place, made it determinate as just this fact. “Time” just means the self-positing of both itself and other facts by any fact. Time makes facts facts, and unmakes facts by making more facts, all of which are intrinsic to the first fact: history is the positing and transcending, the self-establishment and self-recontextualization of any given fact.

Put another way, let us stipulate that a fact—any determination about what is so—is something that is in principle knowable, and that knowability implies a subject-object relation, and therefore a “distance” or separation, some space away from the fact-to-be-known. That means that a fact is only a fact if there is something outside of it, another fact, another time, a place to view it from; it doesn’t count as a fact unless it can impact on some other site, unless it relates to some otherness. But that means that its journey out beyond itself to otherness is intrinsic to its very facticity, and it is this journey out beyond itself that Emerson denotes with the word “time”. To be thus and so, a fact must be viewable from elsewhere, and elsewhere, whether in physical or in conceptual space, implies the illimitable positing of still other alternate perspectives from which to be seen, facts to impact, viewpoints to interpret and metaphorically internalize the initial fact. Determinacy implies limit, limit implies space, space implies infinity of other spaces, of other perspectives, of other contexts. For something to be a fact is for it to intrinsically posit distances from itself, and thus to be viewable otherwise.

Most simply, we can say that for Tiantai time itself simply is the continual “opening of the provisional to reveal the real”: an unceasing process of self-recontexualization where the past on the one hand remains unchangeable and on the other is constantly changing with each recontextualization. A moment of time is a recontextualization of the all the past. This also implies that the Tiantai notion of interpervasion of past, present and future, and of the “inherent inclusion” of all entities in each, is very far from resulting in a static picture of the universe devoid of any genuine creativity. For in Tiantai, each moment of time brings with it not only a new set of actual occasions, but a new set of “eternal principles”—categorical obligations, eternal objects, laws, universals. Each moment is effectively the creation of a new God who determines anew the character of the rest of the universe and of all the past and future.

A moment, to be a moment, must be surrounded by other moments, from which it differs. “Now” must be different from “then”. But that means “now” must relate to “then”. The “then” is part of the world of the “now”, against which it defines itself, to which it stands in necessary contrast. This contrast cannot be either internal or external to the “now” and to the “then”. “Now” is really “now-then”, and “then” is really “then-now”. This is easy to understand if we consider the state of the entire totality of being at moment M and at moment M+1. The state of things at M is thought to have the power to cause the arising of the state of things at M+1. But if M is gone when M+1 arrives, it cannot “reach” M+1 to do anything to it; it is already gone, non-existent, and thus can do nothing. If the state of things at M continues to exist when M+1 arrives, however, time has failed to move ahead, or we must admit the coexistence of two alternate total states of being at the same time. If the appearance of M+1 does not necessitate the disappearance of M (which by our hypothesis possesses the power to bring about M+1), M would then continue to generate precisely M+1 repeatedly forever. In either case, time would not be possible, and no real entities could arise. Moments of time are neither same nor different; they are present as one another, the past as present as future, the future as past and present, the present as past and future. The past is not yet over—every moment of the present and future reveals more about the past and its infinite changes, for they are non-different from it, though allowing it to appear as these new moments. The present never begins—however far back you look, you will always be able to find all the characteristics of the present there, unchanged though appearing as some former moment. The present never ends—all future moments are further disclosures about this present moment of experience happening right now.

3.4 Self-Overcoming of the Whole into Any Upayic Part

We can say all things are impermanent, as in early Buddhism—but now we know this is just a situationally attachment-undermining way of saying “impermanent-permanent”. We can say all things are permanent—meaning “permanent-impermanent”. We can say some things are permanent and others are impermanent—meaning “some-all are permanent-impermanent” and “all-some are impermanent-permanent”. But note too that this does not mean “permanent-impermanent” is the real truth, while “permanent” and “impermanent” are both one-sided distortions. That would be what Tiantai critiques as the “exclusive Center”. Rather, just as “permanent” really means “impermanent-permanent”, “impermanent-permanent” really means “permanent”, or really means “impermanent”. For impermanent-permanent appears as permanence and as impermanence, and each of these is the entirety, not a mere part, of the whole. To be permanent is already to also be impermanent—there is no other permanence. To be impermanent is already to also be permanent—there is no other impermanence. All is funny, all is serious, all is funny-serious. Each is a perfectly equal synonym for all three. Each is an equally adequate-inadequate description of the truth.

The same applies in all other cases. We can say all is suffering—meaning “suffering-bliss”. We can say all is bliss—meaning “bliss-suffering”. We can say all is mind—meaning “mind-matter”. We can say all is matter—meaning “matter-mind”. We can say there is a God—meaning “God-Godless”. We can say there is no God—meaning “Godless-God”. We can say all is illusion—meaning “illusion-reality”. We can say all is reality—meaning “reality-illusion”. We can say some things are true and some things are false—meaning “some-all is true-false and all-some is false-true”. We can say there is historical progress—meaning “progress-stagnation”. We can say there is historical stagnation—meaning “stagnation-progress”. We can say society is evil—meaning “evil-good”. We can say society is good—meaning “good-evil”. We can say we are sometimes happy and sometimes sad—meaning “we-everyone are sometimes-always happy-sad and sometimes-always sad-happy”. And so on. How should we choose which will we say at any time? If all things are sayable in some sense, what should we say right now? We should say whatever is most conducive to liberation from suffering, from one-sided attachments, in this particular situation and context.

4. The Ultimate Reality of All Appearances (諸法實相 zhufashixiang)

The same method underlies all of Tiantai’s shocking slogans, such as the claim that “all moments are permanent”, as we have seen, or “all appearances are the ultimate reality”, or “evil is ineradicable from the highest good, Buddhahood”. They mean what they say, of course: no moment ever ends, and however anything appears to anyone for however long is the ultimate reality that all things emerge from, all things return to, that explains and supports and sustains all things. True enough. The opposite would also be true. But these particular claims are emphasized in classical Tiantai writings to offset the more common one-sided prejudices that tend the other way. Because the impermanence of things and the illusoriness of appearances is stressed in the rest of Buddhism, it is assumed that anyone getting to Tiantai will already be aware of this side of reality, and indeed may be in danger of clinging to it. So Tiantai asserts the opposite, which is equally true.

All appearances are the ultimate reality: how is that true? Normally, we believe that in some kind of appearance versus reality contrast: “I thought that was a snake, but upon closer inspection it turned out to be a rope”. This is what most of Buddhism also says: “I thought there was a self, but it turned out to be a bunch of impermanent aggregates”. Or, “I thought there was a world, but it turned out to be all mind, or Buddha-nature, or illusion”. Common sense assumes this too: the rim of my glass looks oval, but in fact we know that, “really”, it is round—it’s just that we’re seeing it from an angle that foreshortens it. The rainbow is a mere appearance—when we go to touch it, we find nothing there. But the clouds and sunlight are real, they are what it really is, what it turns out to really be. Tiantai, however, makes the preposterous claim that the oval and the circle are both true—in fact, both are the ultimate reality, are findable in all things and at all times and places, are the Absolute. The rainbow and the cloudy sunlight—both true, both absolutely true, both the Absolute. The “self” and the impermanent aggregates—both true, both absolutely true, both the Absolute. The snake and the rope—both true, both absolutely true, both the Absolute. All is illusion. All is reality. Time is not an illusion. Time is the illusoriness of every possible thing. Time is a word that means “whatever you think is so is already not so”. What is real? What you can go back to, look at again, check up on, verify, re-examine. But there is literally no experience that you can go back to, so there is none that is real. What is illusion? Something that turns out to be otherwise than it appears. There is no thing of which this is not the case. The horn “appeared” to be round, but “turned out” to be “sharp”. But both roundness and sharpness are equally unreal, equally real. Each is determined by the context in which it is seen. Taking the unnameable whole into account, they too are unnameable, neither sharp nor round. Roundness and sharpness are two names for the same thing, which is round, sharp, and neither round nor sharp, and both round and sharp.

4.1 Inherent Evil Ineradicable In Buddhahood and the Buddha-nature of Insentient Beings

The same goes for the famous Tiantai claim that “evil is inherently included in Buddhahod”. Future Buddhahood lives in past delusion, so delusion is “Buddhahood-delusion”. Past delusion lives in future Buddhahood, so Buddhahood is “delusion-Buddhahood”. The same goes also for the famous Tiantai claim that “insentient beings have the Buddha-nature”—i.e., that rocks and stones and all other things with no awareness have the all-pervasive unconditional nature of awareness: awareness is always nonawareness-awareness (all awareness exists-with nonawareness, e.g., the objects of awareness, which are not themselves aware), nonawareness is always awareness-nonawareness (i.e., nonawareness is determinately nonawareness only as contrasted by awareness to awareness itself, and is intrinsically inseparable from whatever awareness might exist in the universe, simply by virtue of the inseparability of all existence).

The controversial idea of “the Buddha-nature of insentient beings” is developed by Zhanran in his Jingangpi using a slightly different approach to the Three Truths, focusing on the trope of space as advanced as a metaphor for Buddha-nature in the Mahāyāna Nirvana Sutra, in its character of all-pervasiveness, ineradicability, and indivisibility, and the non-different/non-identical relation of all regions of space to each other and of each region of space to whatever possible object can occupy it. But here too the central argument is the inseparable intersubsumption of the two opposite terms: sentience is always insentience-sentience, insentience is always sentience-insentience.

One way to think about this is to consider a magnet. It has a north and a south “pole” to it. If we wanted to separate the north from the south pole, we might try cutting it in half. But when we do so, we find that each half still has both a north and a south pole. No matter how many times we slice it, the total set of different characteristics pertaining to the whole are also found in that separate part: northness and southness are, in their entirety, found in what was formerly, in the context of the whole magnet, purely the north part, and also in the former south part. This is how it is in the Tiantai universe: the universe is one big magnet, but instead of just a north and a south, it has 3000 different characteristic aspects: meness, youness, trains, oceans, dogs, soups, historical incidents, smiles, tears, delusion, enlightenment. If we try to isolate any of these, however, what we end up with is another entire “magnet”, which also has all 3000 aspects to it: this meness, it turns out, also has its youness part, its train part, its ocean part, its dog part, and so on. When I face you, it is you-and-me facing you-and-me. It is me-and-all-worlds facing all-worlds-and-me. It is the entire universe facing the entire universe. We are always different, because wherever we go, there is a you and a me, two different aspects, never merging into a blank indifferent mush of a single quality. But since me-and-you is contrasted to me-and-you, there is really no contrast at all: the same thing is found on both sides of the contrast. We are neither the same nor different. We are divided from ourselves, impossible to unify into a simple unity, but for that very reason we are impossible to separate from one another. Each of us, at each moment, are, in a word, absolute, the Center as which all appears, and which is appearing in and as all things. All things are our transformation bodies, we are the transformation body of all things.

4.2 Buddhahood as Full Realization of Dung Beetlehood et alia

This also means that, the more fully one realizes that one is any particular being, the more one realizes that he or she is also all other, contrasted, things as well. This is how traditional Buddhist “non-self” doctrine comes to play out in Tiantai. I think I am already this self, Brook, but in reality, Buddhism tells me, I am not yet really any such self—for to be a self is to be unconditional, and that is impossible for “me”, a conditional determinate being. Also, I am not yet enlightened—for enlightenment is unconditionality, the only freedom from suffering. To become unconditioned, as I’d thought I was when I thought I was a self, is to become enlightened. This non-self is the only thing that really fulfills my previous lust to be a self, to actually be me. I cannot become this by being me as a determinate being to the exclusion of all other beings, nor other beings to the exclusion of me. Rather, by the Three Truths, I can only become more and more me by becoming more and more everything else, and that is what it means to become more and more enlightened, and to become more me, more unconditionally this specific me. To “become what I am”, to be a more fully realized version of myself, is to see myself, Brook specifically, as unconditional, which means as omnipresent and eternal, which means as expressing itself in and as all things, which also means, conversely, intersubsumed, i.e., as an expression of all other things, as something as which all other things are appearing. I cannot be myself until I am a Buddha, but I cannot be a Buddha until I can be more fully (i.e., more unconditionally, more all-pervasively) myself, and that means being more fully a devil, a fool, a table, a spaceship, or, in Siming Zhili’s example, a dung beetle. Buddhist practice is the progressively fuller manifestation of my latent Buddhahood—which means also the progressively fuller manifestation of my latent Dung-Beetlehood, and indeed, my allegedly long ago already actual but really hitherto merely latent Brookhood.

5. Practice and Doctrinal Diversity

Tiantai is encyclopedic in its approach to Buddhist practice; as one might expect in light of its view of “exclusion” in general, it excludes nothing. Hence in Tiantai works we find extensive, detailed cataloging of a huge diversity of traditional Buddhist practices, from rituals and devotions to meditations and contemplations of all kinds, derived from all strata of previous Buddhist culture. This accords not only with the philosophical objection to the possibility of any final mutual exclusion of entities rehearsed above, but also to the Lotus Sutra notion of upāya, and the expansion of the range of Conventional Truth in the Three Truths: the diversity of sentient beings is limitless, their specific delusions and attachments and sufferings are of limitless specific types, and thus the appropriate remedial practices and doctrines for them are limitless. This is also the justification for the “trivialist” position that all possible claims are true, for “true” in the Tiantai context meansonly a remedial upāya serving as a raft to overcome itself, but doing so by totalization of itself, thereby undermining itself, expressing itself in and as all other things, intersubsuming all other truth-claims, thereby become all the more present as all the more absent.

5.1 Self-Overcoming of Doctrinal Hierarchy into Omniultimacy

Tiantai takes the non-dualistic ideas suggested by the Lotus Sutra in fables and unexplained narrative hints, and adapts the resources of Emptiness and the Two Truths to give them a full philosophical explanation and practical application for Buddhist practice. The Lotus Sutra had made upāya the centerpiece of Buddhism, and asserted a unity of all practices in the One Vehicle, all leading toward Buddhahood. Tiantai follows this lead and constructs a vast and complex system for accounting for and integrating all known forms of Buddhist and even non-Buddhist practice, all of which are acceptable skillful means appropriate and wholesome for different persons and times. It rejects nothing, but it organizes all known teachings and practices into an interconnected system. The system has an interesting double structure: the first time through, it appears to be hierarchical, putting the Mahāyāna above the Hinayana and the Lotus above the rest of the Mahāyāna. But the idea of redefinition of identity through recontextualization is applied here, and when the hierarchical crown of the Lotus has done its work, it has the retroactive effect of making all the other parts equal as aspects of the One Vehicle. That is, no teaching, practice or behavior has only a single meaning: its meaning is determined by the context in which it is viewed. So any given doctrine or practice can be seen as both the ultimate truth and as a more partial and only locally relevant, or lesser, truth. The Tiantai system of integrating all the various teachings and ideas and perspectives in the world provides a system for seeing everything twice, three times, infinite times, reassessing and developing the meanings of each item as it comes into broader and broader relations. The Hinayana teaching is, in the narrower context, a “lesser” truth. But in the context of the One Vehicle, it is itself an instantiation of the One Vehicle, and even gives unique expression to it: hence the claim (based on a clever strong misreading of a line from Kumārajīva’s translation of the Lotus: 決了聲聞法 為諸經之王) that the Hinayana doctrine (rather than the Lotus itself) is itself the Highest of All Teachings. The same goes for all other particular ideas, beliefs, practices. Since nothing has only one meaning, everything can mean anything. The interesting question about any proposition is not whether it is true (it always is), but how. The Tiantai “classification of teachings” is an intricate and complex way of spelling out in what context and in what way each doctrine means each of the many things it means.

5.2 The Contemplation of Mind as the Three Thousand (觀心 guanxin, 一念三千 yiniansanqian)

The way in which each and any of these alternate methods or doctrines is recontextualized to promote the desired Tiantai implication is through the supplementation of the Three Truths view of any and every possible content. Tiantai meditation most centrally applies a method called “the contemplation of mind”, (觀心 guanxin) given its most famous formulation in Zhiyi’s unfolding of 一念三千 yiniansanqian (Japanese: ichinensanzen), which means something like: “One Moment of Experience as Three Thousand Worlds”. The “three thousand” is of course a way of saying “everything”, but it is really something a bit more than that. For of course, as Zhiyi himself points out, any number would be an equally accurate possible way to talk about the totality of all things, from none to infinity. This number, “three thousand”, is concocted specifically with meditational practice in mind. Here’s how it’s derived:

Ten Realms × Ten Realms × Ten Suchnesses × Three Worlds=3000
Buddhahood Buddhahood Appearance Five Aggregates
Bodhisattva Bodhisattva Nature
Pratyekabuddha[1] Pratyekabuddha Components
Sravaka[2] Sravaka Capability
Gods Gods Action Sentient Beings
Humans Humans Causes
Asuras[3] Asuras Conditions
Animals Animals Effects
Hungry Ghosts Hungry Ghosts Consequences Environment
Purgatories Purgatories Ultimate Equality and Equal Ultimacy

Please note a few peculiarities of this way of listing “what exists”. First, special care is taken here to include both “purgatories” (i.e., the demonic thoughts, practices and consequences of extreme subjective delusion and suffering) on the one hand, and “Buddhas”, (the enlightened thoughts, practices and consequences of the greatest wisdom and liberation) on the other hand. This is important, because it cautions us against viewing these subjective states, good or evil, as mere epiphenenomena that are somehow outside the ultimate reality. They are themselves included in the ultimate reality. By including these terms, Tiantai guards against a vague notion of “everything” which might lend itself to thinking that only a pure or neutral substance—mind, matter, energy—is what is real, or that the values and perspectives, good and bad, painful and pleasant, that living beings experience are not part of the “everything”. The “everything” that is included in each moment of experience, and which is eternally ineradicable, includes all those good and bad subjective states as well.

Second, we have two important reduplications. The ten realms are all the states in which a sentient being might find him or herself in the Buddhist universe, from the lowest ignorance and suffering to the highest bliss and enlightenment. They are often interpreted symbolically: Buddhahood representing a moment of enlightened experience, Bodhisattvahood a moment of compassion, Sravakahood a moment of quiescence or renunciation of the worldly, Godhood a moment of great worldly bliss and power, Asurahood a moment of egoistic rage and combativeness, animals ignorance, purgatories suffering. One reason to read these as states that any being might undergo is that each of the ten realms is listed twice. This is because each realm “includes” or “instantiates” all the other ten realms. That is, each can appear “as” any of the others, and in fact nothing appears which is not always “as” something else. A human-bodhisattva, an animal-god, a Buddha-demon, an Asura-Sravaka, etc. A bodhisattva appears as a human, or an animal, or a Buddha, or an Asura. But as we’ve seen, this also means a human appears as a bodhisattva, or a demon as an animal, or a Sravaka as a hungry ghost, etc. Of course this goes on ad infinitum: each of these included realms further includes all ten realms, and so on. The 10 times 10 is just to point to this factor of mutual inclusion, and make sure it is accounted for in our meditative contemplation of “what exists”.

The other duplication comes in the “Three Worlds”. We have “the five aggregates” but also “sentient beings”. Actually, these are two ways of looking at the same thing. Early Buddhism taught that what we call a sentient being—you, me, Bill, Dave—is actually a set of five aggregates, momentarily arising and perishing impersonal processes of form, sensation, perception, volition and consciousness. One (the aggregates) was real, the other (the alleged “self”) was a pernicious illusion. The Three Thousand includes both. In other words, it does not exclude the illusions about things among the totality of “what exists”—as we’ve seen, all things are equally illusions and equally true. The view of you as Bill is one item in the list; the view of you as five impersonal aggregate processes is another item on the list. Here too we have a shorthand way of pointing to a larger principle, and a goad to keep it in mind in our contemplation of “all that exists”. We are not to think of a set of real entities lined up side by side, mutually exclusive, of which there may be some additional erroneous views. Rather, the erroneous view are part of all that exists, indeed all that exists is some erroneous (i.e., one-sided, locally coherent) view. There is no “thing” as such: a thing is just a way of appearing, and comes with a viewpoint upon it. Tiantai insists further that to have a single viewpoint requires at least one additional viewpoint, and so ad infinitum. Normally we drain off the ambiguity and call it “subjectivity” or “free will” or “the unknown future” to one side and leave the “reality” on the other side, calling it “objectivity” or “determinate fact” or “the settled past”. In Tiantai, these are inseparable, merely aspects artificially separated off from the whole, which is always both fixed and open, locally coherent and globally incoherent.

The locus classicus of the above enumeration is Zhiyi’s definitive work on meditation, Mohezhiguan (摩訶止觀), where it is presented as a description of “the realm of what is conceivable.” The text walks us through all possible objects of experience this way, one by one, almost in the manner of a list out of Walt Whitman’s Leaves of Grass, while also adducing these multiperspectival reduplications that result from their mutual subsumptions, a consequence of the ontological ambiguity attributed to all entities on the theoretical level by Zhiyi’s doctrine of the Three Truths. His reason for presenting the exposition in this manner, he tells us, is because the real topic of interest here, which he calls “the realm of the Inconceivable,” the proposed object of the central Tiantai contemplation, is difficult to present directly in theoretical terms: it can be disclosed only through first describing the contrasting realm of the “conceivable” as a foil. Once this enumeration of what is conceivable is completed, the actual referent of the term “the realm of the Inconceivable” is at last presented. It turns out to be any single instant of experience, fleetingly arising through the conditional conjunction of cognitive organ and cognitive object—that is, what every sentient being is experiencing at every moment. Why does Zhiyi suddenly direct us to consider a momentary mental event, an instant of experience that arises and perishes in the blink of an eye, at this particular juncture? The neither-same-nor-different ontological ambiguity of the Three Truths applies to this entity as well, but now the task is to realize this in meditational practice rather than only in theory. To describe what this involves, Zhiyi then asserts, rather abruptly, that if there is the arising of the slightest wisp of any experience at all, all the above enumerated Three Thousand are at once both inherently entailed in it 具 and also, as he goes on to explain, strictly identical to it 即—a way of saying “are neither the same nor different from it” (若無心而己,介爾有心,即具三千). For an English translation of the passage in question, see Swanson 2018, Volume 2, pp. 795—836, especially pp. 815–6.

To see what this means and how it is to be actually experienced requires careful unpacking. Tiantai meditation practice represents a surprising and innovative repurposing of certain earlier Buddhist motifs, just as the Tiantai doctrinal positions do. In this case, the key motif to be repurposed is the pan-Buddhist emphasis on the impermanence of mental states. Here this view is pushed to the extreme, also found in many earlier schools, of regarding apparent all mental continuity as a misperception of what is really a succession of radically distinct and extremely brief moments of mental activity. The traditional Buddhist emphasis on the sole reality of the present instant of experience is also radicalized in this move and, in a typical Tiantai manner that by now should seem familiar, both of these familiar Buddhist claims are thereby repurposed and even reversed, as we shall see.

The procedure boils down to fomenting a direct phenomenological experience of the meaning of “neither same nor different” with respect to any fleeting moment of experience. The great Song dynasty Tiantai thinker Siming Zhili puts it well, summarizing the mechanism of the Tiantai “contemplation of mind” procedure while also dispelling the idealist misunderstanding that takes it to imply a special ontological status for mind as opposed to matter: “We must understand that it is because all [the many elements of experience] share the same nature that they can together dwell in one single instant of experience. Their dwelling together as one single instant of experience is used to reveal this shared nature. This does not mean we are pointing to the moment of experience [i.e., mental activity, as opposed to material things] itself as their true nature.” (須知同一性故。方能同居一念故。 以同居一念用顯同一真性。非謂便將一念名為真性. — 知禮,「十不二門指要鈔」,卷一) The “shared nature” of all phenomena referred to here, revealed by their dwelling together in a single instant, is not the nature of mind, or impermanence, or momentariness: it is the Three Truths, Emptiness qua Provisional Positing qua Centrality, local coherence qua global incoherence qua intersubsumption, which amounts to the apprehension of all elements of experience as “neither same nor different.” Here we are to directly observe what “neither same nor different,” which is the nature of all phenomena, means as manifest in every single moment of experience, for it is their ability to “dwell together” in (or as) a single moment that reveals this nature.

To accomplish this, according to the account given in Tiantai texts, we must first apprehend the instant of experience itself as a single whole. That means to see all the elements of this moment’s experience as mental experience, but specifically as a single mental experience, in which all these elements are simultaneously present, related to one another in a specific instantaneous structure. This requires some training in attentiveness to all elements of a single moment equally; the normally neglected aspects of a single moment’s experience, its peripheral or indistinct elements, are laid out in the above enumeration of every possible state one can think of, as a way of trying to reach into every nook and cranny of what one means by “everything that I can think of right now.” This includes both the knower and the known, as well as whatever way the division between them presents itself. For although the knower is not present in the same way other objects of experience are, its presence is felt in some form; whatever is apprehensible as the presence of the agent of this mentation, the activity that separates itself off from the objective contents, the knower as opposed to the known, as well as the act of opposition itself, is also to be included as an aspect or part of the world as I know it and imagine it. Also to be included is the imagined as well as the perceived, the possible as well as the actual. Also included must be the moment’s sense of its own transitoriness, the sense of being situated between a gone past and yet to come future, however these may manifest in the experience. All elements perceived or conceived are to be taken in and noted. The next step will be to apprehend these all as felt aspects of a single mental event, a single entity with all these many characteristics in their specific relations of this moment appearing at once, and all disappearing at once, such that not one can be changed or replaced. It must be experienced as a specific total structure of just these elements, in just these relations, and none other.

This endeavor to see the total manifold of contents as a single mental event is meant as a direct way of dispelling the premises of ordinary “deluded” experience. For our ordinary experience is, we may say, premised on a mistaken application of categories derived from a conception of durational mental and physical objects to fleeting experienced moments themselves, the latter being on this view the real contents of all experience. To be more precise, it must be noted that categories such as “same” and “different,” and “whole” and “part,” and “necessary” and “contingent,” and “actual” and “possible,” and “essential properties” and “accidental properties,” actually apply only to durational objects, whether physical or mental. All of these categories require the comparison of one entity with another, which cannot be done in the span of an instantaneous upsurge of undivided experience.

How so? Let us start with the most comprehensive of these categories, as applied to these single whole moments: are these moments “the same as” or “different from” one another? Considered purely as moments, the answer is “neither.” For it must be noted that the conception of a series of moments laid out in a neutral timeline, seen as a set of derivative entities called moments which are somehow laid out in a more basic element (“time,” perhaps, or “nature”) which is not itself a moment, is no longer possible here. If there is no other substratum in which anything can exist besides moments of experience, this applies to the apprehension of “other” moments as well: these apprehensions of other moments can only exist in some moment. So we now must slightly amend the above claim about the basic constituents, and say instead that the most basic elements are not moments, plural, as if these were an array of genuinely distinct entities that could somehow be viewed from outside, but simply speak of “this one moment.” Their plurality exists only from within some specific single moment. This is why moments cannot be said to simply “different” from one another. Yet this impermanent moment is not the same as anything else either; it is of the essence of being a present moment qua moment to be non-identical to other moments, i.e., to not-be the past and future moments, and it is the essence of experiencable contents to require contrast to what they are not. Indeed, for me to experience the moment as presently occurring at all, I must also be experiencing the difference between present and not-present in the present; the pastness and futureness to which it has to be contrasted to have the quality of being present must in some manner also be present to me. So because we have no durational things, we are radicalizing impermanence, the absolute transitoriness of moments, which points to an absolute difference between them; but because moments are not like mutually exclusive objects laid side by side in a neutral medium, we have no plurality of moments; their alleged difference is really only each moment reappearing in a new form as a component in all other moments, which might be described as each moment’s unceasing transforming continuance, its radical permanence. Moments are neither the same nor different from one another, and thus neither impermanent nor permanent, or if we prefer, both impermanent and permanent. It is this paradoxical nature of every possible moment of experience that is the “the inconceivable” to be directly realized in Tiantai contemplation.

What about the multifarious contents within any one of these neither-same-nor-different moments then, the long list of very diverse experienced components of any given moment? These too are neither-same-nor-different from one another, within that very moment. We have seen that these single moments of experience are to be viewed as indivisible wholes, and that they have no external limits dividing them from other moments that can be observed in a neutral substratum, from outside the moments themselves. It should be noted that neither can such limits between moments be observed from within any moment, for whatever is observed in a moment is ipso facto within its limits. But what is more surprising is that there are no definite limits even between the various contents that constitute these moments. They have what might initially be described as diverse manifold contents—first, the multiple objects of sensory observation that are included (chairs and tables, sky and earth, cups and plates, people and trees), but, observing more closely, also “subject” and “object,” “actual” and “possible,” as well as “center and periphery, (possible) hope and (actual) fear, (possible) pleasure and (actual) pain, water and mountain” and so on. But properly speaking, these elements are only genuinely “diverse” if they are viewed through the categorial obligations that apply to durational objects, whether physical or mental. These durational things, however, are now to be understood as abstract derivatives of moments of experience, rather than the ultimate constituents of reality of which moments of experience are partial apprehensions, as we usually tend to believe. When viewed on their own terms as moments, the manifold contents are indivisibly present as the moment they constitute, not losing their specific experiential qualities, but not separable into distinct elements that are merely limited “parts” or even “aspects” of the momentary experience. For we are able to identify distinct “parts” or “aspects” in an experienced object only if those parts or aspects can be experienced as “the same” object apart from the whole in which they appear, either as isolated entities or as parts or aspects of other wholes. This cannot happen with any putative part or aspect of a given moment, for any subsequent appearance of the part or aspect in question would have to be compared with the part or aspect as it appeared in the original moment; but this can only happen in yet another moment, of which both of these instances would in fact be parts or aspects. Both moment 1 and moment 2 are now experienced only as parts or aspects of moment 3, and the constituent parts or aspects of moments 1 and 2 are thus actually component parts or aspects of moment 3. If “part A” of 1 appears unchanged as “part A” also in moment 2, this tells us only about two aspects of the indivisible totality of moment 3, nothing about the relation of part A to other parts of moments 1 and 2. For again, there is no neutral medium of comparison between two moments.

To see what is at stake here, we must further consider the derivation and entailments of our notion of “different parts or aspects of a thing” in ordinary consciousness. As I lift my coffee mug to take a sip, my normal consciousness will be tracking certain continuities, shaped usually by my practical intentions and more occasionally by more abstract theoretical considerations. I may see this mug as one in a series of drinking vessels experienced in the past; I may think of it as an instance of the general category “drinking vessel.” I may evaluate its effectiveness in containing the amount of coffee I want to have in one sitting and how smoothly it facilitates delivery of that coffee to my mouth, linking it to past and prospective actions and experiences. I may simply think of it as a single physical object, an individual substance unifying a manifold of properties such as solidity, color, smoothness, shape. In each of these cases, I am making sense of this experienced perception of the mug by forefronting its connection with certain other perceptions and conceptions, together with which it seems to belong: other mugs, the universal concept of drinking vessel, the intention to drink coffee in a few minutes, the properties of solidity and the like that also instantiate in other objects. I will want to distinguish between which of these connections are necessary and which merely contingent, and my sense-making will be largely dependent on how and how well I do this. If I shift into Tiantai meditation mode, however, I am to direct my attention instead to the connection of this perception of the mug with everything else going on within this moment of experience. This may include any or all of the above, but viewed as aspects of this moment, alongside everything else in its perceived spatial and temporal surroundings. Viewing that moment as a single indivisible event, I will no longer be able to make a distinction between necessary and contingent: the moment as a whole and every one of its elements are exactly what they are, and cannot be any different—for any difference would by definition simply be another moment of experience. To imagine it with any part removed, added or repositioned is simply to be having another moment of experience, not this one. It cannot be compared to another moment to see which parts are permanent and which transitory, which are necessary and essential to its being what it is and which are merely adventitious or contingent, for any such comparison would again be the occurrence of a different moment. All of it is transitory and every connection equally contingent, but all of it is equally necessarily just as it is, none of it can be otherwise than it is. It will definitely be internally articulated, with what would normally be described as portions that are qualitatively distinct from one another, since experienced contrast is necessary to any and all perception of qualities, or of any moment occurring at all. But none of these elements can be regarded as actually divided into genuinely “different portions” of the moment, since none can be experienced without at the same instant experiencing all the others—any act of zeroing in on and “visiting” one will simply be an additional moment of experience, one that appears as an entirely different moment (though of course in the end it too is to be seen as neither-same-nor-different, as already noted); to be visiting one portion is to visit them all.

This has interesting consequences that pertain also to the devotional and ritual aspects of Tiantai practice. Let’s imagine that I am thinking about, say, a Buddha; my one instant of experience includes an apprehension of both the poor suffering being I am now, along with whatever objects— the tables and chairs and ceiling and floor, possible and actuals, pasts and futures—are within my present purview, and also a beatific Buddha somewhere else whom I am not, or the possible existence of such a Buddha, or the Buddha I will be in the future, or even one I might be in the future. As in the case of past, present and future, even to experience myself specifically as not a Buddha is also to be apprehending Buddhahood in some mode or form. To see myself as deluded and suffering is to also be experiencing the absence of some contrasting state; in our example, if part of what I think about is how very not a Buddha I presently am (perhaps in the context of a repentance ritual, but also in simply noting the magnitude of my own greed, anger and delusion), then my apprehension also includes this Buddhahood in the mode of its not-presence, internal to this present moment just as the sense of contrasting pastness and futureness in general always are. But the copresence of both my delusion and suffering and the imagined bliss and wisdom of an imagined Buddha whom I am not, both present in this single instant of experience, is not to be imaged like the case of a durational object with two distinct and opposed qualities to it, like, for example, a piece of pastry with both a sweet portion and a bitter portion (due to a baking mishap, perhaps!). If I bite into this pastry and happen to take in both the sweet and the bitter at once, I can conceive of these as genuinely separate because I can compare to other pieces of pastry which are either completely sweet or completely bitter, or the sweetness and bitterness separated out from all pastry and present in other foods, and I can resolve to henceforth, in my next bite, take only the sweet and not the bitter, for the pastry will persist through time, waits for me to relate to it in another moment in a potentially different way. Alternate ways of experiencing the pastry, or of zeroing in on one portion rather than another, or comparisons to other experiences, are available due to the fact that a durational object is something other than the moments of its existence; the different moments of its existence exist in a neutral shared medium, either space and time for a physical object or, even in the case of a purely mental object, at least time. As we have seen, this is not true for the instant of experience, which shares no neutral medium with other moments; again, precisely because they are themselves nothing but time, two moments of time cannot be compared except in a third moment which differs from both (although this difference is immanent to all three moments, and therefore the two differing terms is immanent to all three moments—and in that sense they do not differ, as we shall see in more detail below). I cannot revisit this moment, and I cannot compare it, and I cannot abstract from it. There is never even the possibility of an instance of encountering one of these without also encountering the other. If I experience both the sweet and the bitter once, however fleetingly, though they are both instantly gone in the next moment, in another sense they are eternally together, indeed they are aspects of a single thing, always and exceptionless encountered together. For in general, when we judge two things to be “the same” we mean that they it is impossible to encounter or even consider one without considering the other; they are inalienably and always together. When I say “water is the same as H2O,” I mean that these are two names for the same thing: whenever anyone encounters water they are encountering H2O, whenever anyone encounters H2O they are encountering water. They would be distinct entities only if it is at least conceivable that they can in fact be separated, that one might occur without the other. This also applies to different “aspects” of a single fact which are always encountered together—for example, the pitch and the volume of a musical note. We might think that, although every pitch has a volume and every volume has a pitch, so they are always encountered together, they are still meaningfully said to be different aspects because I can distinguish between them, enumerating different parameters and characteristics of each. But again, this distinguishing of aspects happens only after the initial apprehension of them together—in a subsequent moment—and depends entirely on the possibility that the pitch and the volume can change in different ways, i.e., that the pitch might remain constant while the volume changes or vice versa. This is not possible when the two are apprehended only as existing together in a single moment: there is no possibility of any change in either of them. The distinguishing of different “aspects” requires hypostasizing the note as an entity with some kind of existence independent of its momentary appearance, a durational object of contemplation. The thought about the different aspects of the note belongs to another moment, and is a new object in its own right which belongs inalienably to its moment, just as the initial apprehension of the total note, with its exact pitch and volume and none other, belonged to the first moment. They can only be considered different if they are in principle separable in some way, and that is not the case for the elements of the moment. They are therefore not different from one another.

Yet, though I must experience both the Buddhahood and the non-Buddhahood as indivisible components of a single moment, never to be repeated in isolation, it is also true that both are non-different from every other instance of both Buddhahood and non-Buddahood in all other moments. Each is constantly extending itself in an infinity of forms, including in the forms of each other. For, as touched on briefly above, to be experienced as “occurring” at all, a present moment must also include within it some sense of the contrast to a gone past and a coming future, which thus must also be apprehended within it somehow. “Other” moments are present even in this moment itself “as” the sense of surpassed pastness and to-come futurity that are the necessary contrasts that constitute its own sense of presentness. The experienced pastness and futureness are thus necessary components of the present qua present, but like any other components, they are not genuinely distinct parts or aspects that can be detached from the total moment. This means not only that the present sense of pastness and futureness, like all the other components of the present moment, can only be experienced at the same time as all the other components of this single moment, and thus are absolutely non-same with anything in any past or future moment. But this also means, conversely, that they are non-different from the contents of every other moment, for the same reasons that the moments as wholes are non-different: there is no neutral medium in which to compare them. The distinctness of my present vague intimation of tomorrow and the actual events that come to take place tomorrow is as immanent to tomorrow as it is to the present: tomorrow’s experience of disconfirmation of today’s expectation is immanent to that moment tomorrow, and experience of this disparity necessarily includes both of the two disparate terms: yesterday’s expectation of the future is thus also an inalienable component of tomorrow’s single whole moment in which it is disconfirmed. Future moments when they do occur are neither the same nor different from the vague representation of the future in the previous moment; they might be seen as absolutely distinct (as in commonsensical views of an “imagined” as opposed to a “real” future), or conversely as further articulations of the previous vague intimation; but in fact the “vague intimation of future” in question has no fixed nature to be same as or different from, precisely because this element of the present moment, like all the other elements, is not really a distinct part or aspect existing beyond the moment in which it occurs, is not a durational entity at all, but merely an unrepeatable and indivisible component of a particular moment, neither same nor different from the other components of that moment. So we must say the future is neither completely different from the imagined future contributing to the composition of a past moment, nor completely identical to that imagined future—or if we prefer, both. Thus do we speak of the permanence-impermanence, the impermanence-permanence, not only of every moment, but of every component of every moment.

A moment is intrinsically fleeting, gone as soon as it arises. I cannot prolong it or remain in it. But note also that, if this moment is not characterizable as “different” from any other moment, I also can never actually leave this moment: whatever subsequent moments may appear, they are non-different from this one. This non-difference is apprehended in the single upsurge of the unchangeable moment as its own internal sense of its difference from past and future moments: they are present there, in some form or other, precisely however vaguely or distinctly they are within that one experience, as inalienable aspects of that moment itself. The next moment, when new contents appear, will be experienced as more of or other expressions of the same moment. That moment, though radically impermanent, is thus also experienced as permanent and necessary, just like a “substance” in Spinoza’s sense: it can be conceived only as existing, since it just is its being conceived; and it can only be conceived as existing exactly as it does exist; it is infinite and indivisible, since whatever appears as its limit or divider is ipso facto internal to it, one more component of it, and the conception of only a “part” of it will simply be by definition a different moment; and by the same token, it cannot be acted upon by anything external to it, it is infinitely productive, and everything it produces is more of itself. The moment is both radically impermanent and radically eternal. More to the point, its impermanence is its permanence, its permanence is its impermanence—exactly the claims of Tiantai’s theoretical conclusions. I experience the eternity-temporality of this moment continuing to show itself in and as the neither-same-nor-different array of all other possible experiences, beings, ideas, moments. This is mode in which we find the direct experience of Buddhahood-as-all-sentient-beings, and all-sentient-beings-as-Buddahood.

So it is that after gaining some facility in this sort of reduction of all time to the present moment and of all concrete and abstract objects as well as subjective states to the single instant of experience, we are to notice how this instantiates, in an immediate experiential way, the “inconceivable” character of all phenomenon, which was independently asserted on theoretical grounds in doctrinal writings: we are to notice that neither sameness nor difference applies to the relation between any of the contents of this experience as apprehended above. This applies to the relation of one moment to another, to the relation of the knowing activity and the known objects, and also to the relations among all the many component objects themselves: none are the same as each other, none are different from one another. As such, this is a direct experience of the Ultimate Reality of all Phenomena, precisely in the experience of the phenomena themselves in all their distinctness. And in as much as this is simply what is in fact going on in all actual temporal experience, all experience is discovered to be the Ultimate Reality of all Phenomena.

The above gives us a roadmap of the agenda for Tiantai meditation: to experience the Three Thousand as a single moment of experience and thus as neither-same-nor-difference both with each other and with that moment as a whole. But how is all of the above actually to be realized, not just conceptually or theoretically, but experientially? Zhiyi does, in that same work, lay out ritual procedures for inducing a direct experience of a single moment as the totality of existence, brilliantly expounding the salvifically paradoxical effects this would have, in terms quite resonant to what we’ve explored above—for example in the section on the first of the Four Samadhis, the “One-Practice Samadhi.” (See Ziporyn, 2016, pp. 273–275 for an English translation of this passage; for an alternate translation, see Swanson 2018, Volume 1, pp. 252–261). Another procedure for isolating the moment, through introspection and analysis, freeze-framing it so that one sees “no motion or turning, no source or destination, nowhere it comes from and nowhere it goes to” (行者心數起時,返照觀察,不見動轉、根源終末、來處去處), and then discovering through analysis that no coherent boundaries can be found between this frozen moment and its excluded past and future, is offered in the “Samadhi of Awareness of One’s Own Thoughts,” described in the fourth of the Four Samadhis (see Swanson 2018, pp. 323–386). But in the practice under discussion here, singled out by later tradition as the most central and distinctive form of specifically Tiantai meditation, crucially, we are instead not instructed to try to get this done by directly thinking about it or willing it, by attempting to expand our conception of mentation to include all these contents, to overstep the habitual subject-object divide by fiat, or by the application of the by-now-familiar dialectical refutation of the categories of sameness and difference as found in the doctrine of the Three Truths. All of these are here regarded as futile; they would still land us in the merely theoretical territory of the “conceivable,” where the habitual categories would automatically reimpose themselves. The attempt to unravel these categories deliberately ends up further entangling us in them, for it means trying to attain a new kind of experience or conceptualization that is simply “different” from the ordinary ones—as we found to be unavoidable in the description of these desiderata given in theoretical terms above. These categories of same and different are as deeply embedded in the attempt to dispel them as in that which it attempts to dispel. Rather, the practical application of these ideas is done in precisely the opposite way from what one might expect: it is done not by deciding to expand our apprehension of the mind or moment to include all, to view all encountered contents as constituents of a single moment of experience, and then succeeding in doing so. Rather, it is done precisely by trying to exclude all other experiences from this moment of experience, to dispel them, and then failing to do so. It is done by tracing out and thinking about what the moment includes, but merely by settling our attention on the moment qua moment, on the momentariness of the moment as an instantaneous and unchangeable and unrepeatable single flash of experience: on the infinitesimal smallness of its duration, how little is within its expanse, its utter failure to occupy almost all of time and all of reality. For it is only thus that one directly experiences all external time and reality making themselves impossible to exclude, experiencing first-hand the necessity of their inclusion. How so?

All the various characteristics and relations of things are here to be apprehended, as we’ve said, as “dwelling together in (or as) a single moment of mentation” (同居一念). So far this resembles a perhaps familiar “phenomenological reduction” of all experience to their manner of appearing to the subject. But it is not “the subject” as such that is at issue in this Buddhist context. Rather, the traditional Buddhist stress on momentariness is to be remembered: it is a reduction of all objects to subjective experience, but subjective experience itself is understood as a temporal series of putatively discrete instantaneous mental events. So we are aiming at a phenomenological reduction of all moments of experience to a single present moment. On the theoretical level, however, Mahāyāna philosophy had already long exploded the viability of taking this pre-Mahāyāna Buddhist concept of momentary experience literally as ultimate truth, as if these moments were actual entities that were simply “different” from one another, showing instead that these moments stipulated by earlier Buddhist philosophers are “empty” of self-nature: no consistent metaphysical unpacking of this idea of discrete moments is possible. This refutation certainly was always understood to mean that in ultimate truth there could be no such entities as moments with predicates of “same” or “different” legitimately applied to them. For not being actual entities at all, and thus certainly not different, they also could not be said to be the same, nor could any other predicates be validly attached to them; what does not exist cannot have any predicates. But where does that leave us? It might be taken simply as a call to free ourselves from all conceptualization, all metaphysical views, and to deal instead with reality just as it is appears to us in our practical everyday experience. But in practical terms, this “just as it is appears” too often reverts to seeing experienced time in the same old way, or even in the pre-Buddhist way: not as instantaneous moments which are simply and absolutely different from one another, to be sure, but reified as discrete clumps of experienced time which are simply and absolutely different from one another, a past experience that is an entirely different entity from the present experience, a present that is different from the future. Unfortunately, this is precisely the presupposition that underwrites all of our delusive desires and attachments: the idea that past experience and the future experience are mutually exclusive, structured just like metaphysically constituted “things” in that they have consistent self-identities, such that one can move from suffering experience to non-suffering experience in a non-ambiguous way—another view demolished by the very same Mahāyāna philosophy of Emptiness. This preservation of the conventional is of course essential to Buddhist practice, and for some Buddhist schools the impossibility of giving any consistent metaphysical explanation of this conventional experience of progressive time is therefore a feature rather than a bug. It safeguards the necessary conventional apprehension of progressive time and the possible achievement of truly continent and disparate states at different times that must be assumed for the practice of the Buddhist path, and blocks any temptation for an alternative model of temporality, which on this view would be just be one more metaphysical distraction and distortion of the practical soteriological realities involved. The Tiantai position is also strenuously committed to preserving the viability of this conventional model of progressive time for purposes of Buddhist practice, but only in closest tandem with the most robust possible understanding of the contrary side of the Mahāyāna theoretical apparatus: the non-difference of samsāra and nirvāna, of affliction and wisdom, of suffering and the end of suffering. The practice focusing on “all dwelling together as a single moment” is designed to bring these two sides of Buddhist philosophy together in practice, as they are brought together in theory in the doctrine of the Three Truths. Phenomenologically as well as theoretically, this means seeing that both the early Buddhist view of “momentariness” (the idea that all experience takes place only in the instantaneous “now”) and the alleged alternatives to this, for example the perhaps more commonsensical “specious present” of Jamesian psychology (i.e., that there are no experiences that can take place in an instantaneous moment, because mental reality always comes with an experienced fringe of past and future, a short span of discernible and certainly finite duration to be strummed through), are seen equally as one-sided distortions, because both are equally true. Both momentariness and duration are incoherent explanations of experience, although both are unavoidable: they are locally coherent but globally incoherent. The first is impossible because experience requires contrast, and contrast requires a simultaneously present multiplicity of moments to strum through. The latter merely pushes the problem back one step, positing a new slightly larger oneness, and stipulating that its boundaries are vague without trying to work out how a boundary that is vague can still function as a real boundary, thus setting up an infinite regress, abandoning the possibility of determining precisely where a single experience begins or ends but continuing to treat it practically as finite, i.e., as mutually exclusive with other experiences (as is the premise of all ordinary sense of identity and motivated action); the component parts of the specious present, in spite of their constituent bleed-over into one another, remain trackable as qualitatively distinct parts, and the specious present as a whole continues to function as an unproblematically distinct though extended unit, a particular specious present that is different from all the other specious presents experienced by oneself and others at other times and places. The former stresses the “one,” the latter stresses the “many,” but in reality experience is neither one nor many, both one and many; neither same nor different, both same and different. All experience is instantaneous, and yet all experience extends beyond itself into past and future—and this now applies as much to a specious present as to an instantaneous present. Rather than seeing one of these views as true and the other as a pernicious distortion (for example, because the surreptitious application of objective or spatial categories is distorting what is actually observed phenomenologically), both are admitted as precise and unavoidable aspects of what it is for an experience to be an experience. The alternative between them is thus viewed as a case of aspect-change, as in the Wittgensteinian duck-rabbit; we can switch from seeing the moment of experience as instantaneous or as extended and enduring to make sense of its manifold content, but normally cannot see both, or grasp the necessary connection between these mutually exclusive ways of apprehending it. Tiantai meditation is aimed at experiencing both of these aspects at once, a flat picture that is also three-dimensional, a flash of an instant which is also extended without any definite limits, for their necessary though paradoxical relationship reveals the true nature of all the contents of experience as neither-same-nor-different.

The method amounts to a deliberate experience of the necessary failure of the phenomenological reduction to either one of the two aspects, but generally focusing on the necessity and failure of the aspect of momentariness: one tries to shrink the experience of time down to a single point, to isolate the moment, and thereby discovers that even when maximally compressed in this way, the entire expanse of contents, of places and times outside this point, resurges in full irreducible splendor, but now as the inalienable and indivisible halo of this instant. The necessary failure of the reduction is the reverse revelation of the Inherent Entailment of all the Three Thousand, all of which, however peripheral or modal, are now seen to be just as much as inalienable components of its present manifestation as more central and distinct ones; the same goes for the unequal focus that makes some central and some peripheral—it too is to be equally included as an inalienable component of the manifestation just as it is. As if by squeezing a spring down to its minimal extent, one discovers the irrepressibility and immensity of its expansive power. By attempting in all good faith to isolate the moment as sharply as possible, one discovers that even when sliced away from all the rest of existence, all the rest of existence ineluctably springs back, now as an undetachable and unchangeable nimbus which is experienced at once as internal and external to that moment, and in which all contents are necessarily present exactly as they are, such that none can be removed or repositioned, and yet all are equally extending infinitely into past and future in an infinity of transformations. Having enumerated all that exists, all that one is not, all that is future and past, all that is merely possible rather than actual, all that is imagined rather than real, one tries with all one’s might to exclude it from the bare reality of this moment, staring fixedly only at the here and now. One fails: the totality of the Three Thousand floods back right here in and as this moment, albeit now bracingly transformed into a single boundaryless cloud of surrounding contents simultaneously flashing forth, in as it were a glorified form—a single flash of a specifically structured instantaneous unit wherein each of the variegated components is neither same as nor different from each of the others, indeed where none is same as or different from the moment as a whole. By concentrating only on the rabbit in an attempt to make the duck completely disappear from consciousness, one discovers that the duck comes back with a vengeance, and with a new adamantine vividness concomitant to the power revealed by its unexcludability. That Mobius strip of separation as inclusion and inclusion as separation is the Three Truths in their constantly available lived form, the phenomenological revelation of their nature as neither-same-nor-different going on in every moment of every sentient being’s experience.

So to summarize: we start by mulling over all that we can think of as possible states of experience, enumerating all these Three Thousand states of conceivable entities and all their interrelations, pausing to visualize whatever is possible or actual, in part and in whole, what I am and what I am not. But this mulling over requires some time to go through. When we have finished thinking of all we can think of, we are asked to pause and consider the present moment of consciousness, which is now in a position to recall all that thinking as having happened in the very recent past—i.e., at “another” time. We try to isolate this single moment of looking back at the long process of mulling, squeezing it down to a single flash to which all the previously recalled contents are external—“the slightest wisp of mental activity” (介爾有心), as Zhiyi calls it in that key passage, arising in the instant when the organ of cognition first takes notice of its object of cognition. In focusing on the instantaneousness of the flash of cognition engaged in recalling the process of mulling through the list of all that could exist, considering that mulling as past, one is attempting to locate and focus on a moment that excludes those moments when the mulling was going on. But in the very act of excluding them, we find all these contents present to us, precisely as contents to be excluded. At once consciousness is squeezed down to the tiniest possible flash and simultaneously experiences the upsurge of all its excluded contents extending to infinity. The rabbitness of the duck and the duckness of the rabbit surge forth at once. Are the previous moments spent mulling over all conceivable being the same as or different from the present one looking back on them? Neither. All those other moments are present here as this moment of excluding them—neither same nor different. Are the Three Thousandfold contents within this moment the same as or different from each other, from the moment as a whole, or from the contents of putatively other moments also included among its contents? Neither, as we’ve explored at length above. But this is now present to us directly in the singularity of the temporal moment and its indistinguishability from its multiple contents.

When this consciousness next turns toward the external world, moving on from recollecting the past to encountering the future, reinitiating contact with unpredictable circumstances, it finds all of these new experiences to be in the same relation to that single moment of meditative recollection as the contents of the recollection had been. Every content encountered has already been present, “non-differently,” in that moment of recollection contemplated in the meditation, though of course its new details and surprising contents ensure that it is also, as expected, “non-same.” All other experiences present themselves as this moment of experience, in its very isolation from them. On the one hand, nothing about this moment can ever be changed; on the other hand, none of its elements has a definite self-nature that could remain the same. Endless versions of its (non-different) self extend into infinite (non-same) other moments. They are inalienable components and not merely parts of those other moments, and they exist nowhere other than in those non-same moments, and as nothing but inalienable non-repeatable components of those non-same moments, neither same nor different from each new moment as a whole and from all its other components. All subsequent moments are in this way experienced as versions of this moment, endless (non-same) transformations and extensions of its (non-different) self for all eternity, but by the same token, this moment itself is experienced as a version of all other moments, existing only as the (non-same) transformation and extension of the very (non-different) self of every other moment past and future. As Zhiyi is quoted as saying, “As each mental act, itself ultimae reality, connects to each content, itself ultimate reality, conditional states, each being ultimate reality, arise one after another. Ultimate reality and ultimate reality pour into each other one after another: such is the effortless entrance into the principle of ultimate reality” (實心繫實境,實緣次第生,實實迭相注,自然入實理). Zhanran explains, “As each mental act connects to its contents, the contents also necessarily connect to the mental act. This interconnection of mental act and contents is what is meant by a conditional state that is itself ultimate reality. Subsequent mental acts arise one after another, here described as ‘pouring into each other’: mental act pours into contents, contents pour into contents, contents pour into mental act. Every mental act and every content pour into each other with each moment of experience, continuing with never a gap or pause in every instant, naturally and effortlessly bringing about every stage of realization.” (心若繫境,境必繫心。心境相繫,名為實緣。復油後心,心心相續,名迭相注。即是心注於境,境注於心,境注於境,境注於心,心心境境,念念相注,如是次第,剎那無間,自然從於觀行、相似以入分證,故云入實 。 (湛然,「止觀義例」,卷一)) Such is the vista to be realized in Tiantai meditational practice, and the manner in which it then extends into all the diverse experiences one may go on to encounter as one arises from meditation and enters the world—the permanence-impermanence of Buddhahood-delusion that arises and perishes in an instant and goes on forever.


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Brook Ziporyn <ziporyn@uchicago.edu>

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