Epistemology in Chinese Philosophy

First published Fri Sep 26, 2014; substantive revision Tue Feb 23, 2021

Chinese philosophy was developed on the basis of ontological, epistemological and metaphysical paradigms that differ from those of Western theoretical discourses. The concepts and categories used in Chinese philosophy cannot be easily transferred from one socio-cultural context into another, and it is often difficult to understand this philosophy through the lens of traditional Western thought. The exclusive application of Western methods can thus lead to severe misunderstandings and false interpretations of Chinese discourses. It is therefore important to use caution so as not to diminish the richness and depth of Chinese thought or turn it into a weak version of Western philosophical thought.

The epistemological dimensions of Chinese texts and their role in the context of Chinese thought has been developed increasingly successfully under the aegis of rediscovering and applying specific traditional Chinese methodological approaches and categories (Lenk and Paul 1993). The present entry similarly explores Chinese epistemology through the lens of conceptual and ideational assets created and developed in the Chinese tradition (Creller 2014: 196).

According to the prevailing traditional European epistemologies, knowledge has mainly been gained through observation and reasoning. However, in traditional Chinese thought, knowledge has been understood in a much broader sense, namely as something which also (or primarily) stems from moral contents and which cannot be separated from (social) practice. The method which determined most of the epistemological teachings found in the Chinese classics was based on a holistic world view, and was directed towards a comprehension which could be achieved through education and learning. The basic contents of these teachings were rooted in the premises of pragmatic and utilitarian ethics. Chinese epistemology was relational (Rošker 2012), meaning that it understood the external world to be ordered as a network of relations, forming a dynamic structure. The human mind was also structured in accordance with this cosmic all-embracing organic system (li 理). The relational cor­re­spon­dence and mutual compatibility between the cosmic and mental structures thus represents the basic precondition of human perception and comprehension.

This entry will provide a systematic overview of the special features, the central methods and the main developmental streams of classical Chinese epistemological discourses that were based on a structurally ordered holistic worldview and rooted in axiological premises.

1. Basic Categories

1.1 The Heart-Mind and the Things-Events

In classical Chinese philosophy the meaning of the Chinese word xin 心, which literally refers to the physical heart, is not limited to its common connotations. Unlike Western definitions, the Chinese metaphorical understanding of this notion not only denotes this organ as the center of emotions, but also as the center of perception, understanding, intuition and even rational thought. As ancient Chinese believed that the heart was the center of human cognition, the notion of xin is most commonly translated as “heart-mind” in philosophical discourses. This understanding was determined by the absence of the contrast between cognitive (representative ideas, reasoning, beliefs) and affective (sensation, feelings, desires, emotions) states.

In classical Chinese epistemologies, each person’s self-awareness was based upon a holistic understanding of the world, which was structured as an interactive relationship between human beings and nature (tianren heyi 天人合一). The unity of all cosmic beings was seen in terms of the organismic and dynamic wholeness of nature and society. Hence, self-awareness as the basis of any kind of comprehension originated with the awareness that one’s own being was organically embedded and interwoven with (rational) indeterminate, constitutive cosmic structures. The heart-mind which represents the crucial part of this self-awareness, is innately equipped with the basic structure of (moral) recognition.

The origins of this tradition reach far back into pre-Qin intellectual history. The human heart-mind was not only posited as the seat of the concept of mind or consciousness and thus the source of both emotions and reasoning, but was also perceived as a kind of sense organ by the ancient Chinese. Indeed, Mengzi (372–289 BC) sometimes even views it as the principal sense organ, responsible for selecting and interpreting the sensations transmitted to it by other sense organs (Mengzi CTP: Gaozi shang, 15). In other words, while the latter enabled perception, the heart-mind enabled the comprehension of external reality or that part of reality transmitted by the sense organs. In Guanzi, a philosophical work ascribed to the legalist politician Guan Zhong (7th century BC, although probably dating much later) the leading function of mind does not refer merely to the sense organs, but also to all other major organs as for instance intestines or bladder (Guanzi CTP: Jiu shou, 6). Later on, such an approach was typical of the legalist scholars, who set the concepts of Confucian hierarchy upon absolutist foundations. Such discourses also recall the relation between the (inferior) body and the (superior) spirit. However, in the early Chinese philosophical texts hearing and seeing seem to be regarded as the most important senses in that they play the most significant role in acquiring knowledge (Geaney 2002). In most ancient Chinese philosophical discourses the body-mind relationship was seen as an organic unity, determined by the principle of complementarity. This led to the establishment of bodily recognition (tiren 體認 or tiyan 體驗) that belongs to the fundamental methods of perception (Ni 2002: 287) in traditional Chinese epistemology.

Thus, with the exception of the Mohist school which elaborated some divisions regarding the problem of things as they are (shi 是) and things as they appear (ran 然) (Mozi CTP: Xiao qu, 8), the heart-mind as the inherent organ of perception was seen as continuously integrated with the phenomena of the external world that manifested themselves in the notion things-events (wu 物). Hence, instead of establishing a clear demarcation line between the subject and the object of comprehension, human perception and recognition of reality were mostly seen as a product of a coherent, structurally ordered and complementary interaction between the heart-mind and the things-events. This continuity of internal and external worlds prevailed in classical Chinese epistemology until the 11th century, i.e., till the earliest beginnings of Neo-Confucian philosophy, when it was further developed.

1.2 Names and Actualities, Language and Meaning

The harmonic regularity, which represents the elementary postulate for the comprehension process, has been linked to questions of language and its relation to the world. The realization of such regularity has therefore been preconditioned by language which was intended to provide a formal framework for social understanding. The standardization of language (and thus of cognitively reflected perception) had to be realized in accordance with the structural regularity of existence. According to most scholars, the elementary categorization which defined the essential and formal assumptions of classical Chinese epistemologies was therefore closely connected to issues concerning the regulation of the relationship between the structure of language and reality. This categorization has been expressed in the bipolar complementary relationship between names or concepts (ming 名) and actualities (shi 實).

The Confucian glorification of the perfect, harmonious and utopian society of the past was also reflected in the discourse on Proper Names (Lunyu CTP: Zi lu, 3), which envisioned a society in which everyone lived in accordance with the original meaning of that which expressed their social position. According to this approach, words in ideal, past society incorporated the core of the realities denoted by them, while the crisis of the Warring States period (475–221 BC) emerged from the growing discrepancies between the names (social positions) of individuals and their actual behavior. The ideal conditions for society could therefore only be established when everyone acted in accordance with their (social) name (Lunyu CTP: Yanyuan, 11).

In contrast to Confucius, Mo Di (ca 650–200 BC), the founder of the Mohist school, questioned the existence of an ideal language (the essence of the notion ming) to which (external) reality and society had to adapt. Instead of shaping social interactions according to language standards, which Confucians viewed as incorporating the essential structure of natural order and humaneness, the Mohists adopted the opposite approach, arguing that since language was a means for transmitting realities, it was language which had to adjust to such realities and not vice-versa. According to Mo Di, the criteria for such adjustment had to be based on actual social needs, and not on the idealized and alien models of a bygone era.

However, in both cases, the realization of a regulation that could provide a framework for a social understanding needed to be preconditioned by the standardization of language, which is a possible factor in the problem of the relation between actualities (shi) and proper naming (ming) became the basic epistemological question in ancient China. Naturally, the question as regards the normative criteria for such a relational structure arose at the very outset of this approach. The standardization or continuation (chang 常) of language had to be carried out in accordance with the formal premises of a binary structured (shi 是 : fei 非) valuation (bian 辨). Only when these conditions were met, was it possible to achieve the ultimate goal of pragmatically oriented epistemology in classical Chinese discourses: every linguistic expression, every name (ming) could (and should) therefore be applied in accordance to the principles that determined actuality (shi).

The adherents of the School of Names (ming jia 名家) believed that, with respect to the concrete situation to which language has been applied, each single thing could have a single meaning. Gongsun Long (ca 325–250 BC) understood this in a way in which mutual coverings of meanings could only exist on an abstract level. He attempted to eliminate semantic overlapping, or at least to reduce it to a level on which language could still be overseen and controlled.

However, according to the Neo-Mohist school the semantic overlapping of different terms was a natural quality of human language which meant that the Neo-Mohist philosophers saw no need to eliminate it. They were far more interested in the question of language as a means for categorizing the natural and social worlds.

Semantic approaches occupied a privileged position within these models of thought. These proto-epistemological discourses would have a decisive impact on later developments in this specific area, most of which took place between 2nd and 6th centuries AD. This epistemological shift followed the debate on the nature of the relation between names (or concepts) and realities (ming and shi), which was later essentially upgraded within the so-called Neo-Daoist discourses on the relation between language and meaning (yan yi 言意), i.e., between com­pre­hen­sion and interpretation. However, these philosophers of the Wei Jin era (265–420) also began to investigate the structure of meaning in a way that was no longer limited to the sphere of the concrete, existing, objective, external actuality (Tang 1955: 68). The focus of the scholars from this period was no longer limited to responding to the questions concerning “proper” behavior, i.e., “proper” rituals, or formulating wise maxims that inspired people to a wiser, more ethical life, leading to a more harmonious society. Instead, they were interested in the question of expressions and in investigating the relations between these maxims or sayings and the reality to which they referred. This meant determining which names were suitable for denoting certain things and which were not and, conversely, which sort of realities could be designated by certain names, and which could not. Based on these investigations, they tried to establish a system, based on the semantic structure of names (mingli lun 名理論, see Tang 1955: 66) that divided specific concepts from one another, in order to be able to identify the errors and misapprehensions that resulted from the improper use of names. In effect, these scholars discovered the epistemological dimension of meta-language, which was certainly a higher level of thought than that of simple teachings that merely implied direct and one-dimensional reasoning about things and the external reality. According to Tang Junyi (1955: 66), teachings formulated at this level were more abstract and belonged to higher cognitive levels. They were teachings about “how teachings were made”. The principles derived from them were principles of “how principles were established”. This new dimension, in turn, would lead them to analyze the relation between human reasoning and their own cognitive concepts and, ultimately, these concepts as such.

In later, pre-modern critical approaches to philosophical thought, it was exposed that even though names do not comprise the meanings of an original Heavenly essence, they should not be regarded as arbitrary; the naming of reality has to be performed in accordance with the objective and generally valid principles. The prime innovation in this regard was Dai Zhen’s (1724–1777) emphasis on the concept of the “exhaustive comprehension of concrete facts (actualities) (jinqi shi 盡其實)” per­tain­ing to the reality we seek to comprehend (Xia 1996b: 417).

1.3 Knowledge and Action

In traditional China knowledge and the way in which it is obtained (method of comprehension) was viewed as an important element of human existence. The dispute as to which of the elements forming the binary categorical pair of knowledge and action (zhi, xing) had priority, constituted one of the crucial debates in traditional, as well as modern Chinese epistemology. In the context of the classical holistic worldview that was inherently permeated with ethical values, the recognition of reality was linked to the active involvement of humanity in their interactive relationship with their social and natural environment. Knowledge (zhi) was thus seen as a valuable factor, necessarily and inextricably linked to human activities and the implementation of social practice (xing): any separation of knowledge and (social) practice was equated with the separation of human beings from the world in which they have found themselves. The close proximity between knowledge and action was seen as the close proximity between an individual and the world, because action was a means for his/her self-transformation and the transformation of the world in the world. Hence, the unity or non-unity of knowledge and action was always a measure of the unity or non-unity of humanity and the world (Cheng 1989: 207).

The crucial aspect of the unity between knowledge and action (zhi xing heyi 知行合一) has been emphasized and upgraded in the developing course of Neo-Confucian philosophy during the Song and Ming dynasties by Wang Shouren (alias Wang Yangming,1472–1529). This holistic thesis not only defined the entire ethical foundation of the epistemology of the School of Heart-Mind (Xin xue 心學) but is also typical of most similar philosophical precepts. (Wang 1933: Xu Ai yinyan, 5)

In the 17th century, the Academy of the Eastern Forest (Donglin shuyuan 東林書院) and the materialist philosopher Wang Fuzhi (1619–1692) advocated the priority of action (xing). Since this position was in opposition to the views of the orthodox Neo-Confucians, and since it represented a new, predominantly materialistic opposition to the Neo-Confucian tradition, it set the stage for the ideological struggles which took place during the last Chinese dynasty. The contribution of scholars from the School of Practical Learning (shixue 實學) is especially valuable in the context of the further development of the binary category of knowledge and action. Due to their rediscovery of the orthodox classics and their unstinting emphasis on the significance of the practical applicability of ideas, they not only consistently placed the archaic connection between knowledge and action at the center of epistemological thought, but also gave it a more concrete emphasis, as in the relationship between thought and (political) practice. This rediscovered and somehow remodeled traditional connection would subsequently influence the great majority of later Chinese theories of knowledge, while also underpinning one of the crucial approaches to the specifically Chinese understanding of Marxist philosophy. In his essay “On Praxis” (Shijian lun), even Mao Zedong explicitly argued for a similar epistemological and axiological primacy of praxis over theory (2014: 8). It should be pointed out, however, that in their social theories, Chinese Marxists subscribed to the idea of the inseparability and dialectical relation of both categories, which in the context of Chinese ideational tradition had always been viewed in terms of complementary bipolarity. Although they considered social praxis as the element which imparted meaning to any (theoretical) reasoning, it was precisely this kind of renewed synthesis of knowledge and action which formed the epistemological bridge linking the classical Chinese tradition to the new ideas of Western Modernity.

2. Specific Features

2.1 Relational Epistemology

The naturalistic epistemologies that prevailed in Western discourses were dealing with the external world (or objective reality), which was to a great extent independent from the subject of comprehension. Chinese approaches to knowledge can be called relational epistemologies, because they refer to relations. This applies not only to radical holistic epistemologies, which denied the notion of substance, but also to a number of contemporary theories which advocate a strict division between the subject and object of comprehension (see Xia 2000: 4)

Chinese relational epistemology was based upon viewing the world as a complex structure composed of relations, intersections and interacting feedback loops. Specific Chinese models for investigating questions related to knowledge were thus premised upon a structurally ordered external reality; since natural (or cosmic) order is organic, it naturally follows the “flow” of structural patterns and operates in accordance with structural principles that regulate every existence and are manifested in the concept of li 理. In this worldview, the human mind is also structured in accordance with this all-embracing but open organic system. The axioms of our recognition and thought are therefore not coincidental or arbitrary, but follow this dynamic structure. In this view, the compatibility or correspondence of both the cosmic and mental structures is the basic precondition that enables human beings to perceive and recognize external reality (Rošker 2010: 79–82).

In most traditional discourses (with the exception of the Mohist school, The School of Names and certain representatives of the Neo-Confucianism), the focus upon relations was linked to the unity of the subject and object of comprehension. If we posit that the relation represents the object of comprehension, we must also specify that this object is not automatically to be seen as a counter-pole to the subject of comprehension. Relational epistemologies are not based upon a strict division between these entities, nor upon a strict (or necessary) demarcation of what, with respect to the subject of comprehension, we are accustomed to see as the external or internal world. Therefore, the methods used by certain philosophers in various currents of the Chinese tradition, are by no means decisive for defining the positions of the subject and the object of comprehension, or the nature of their mutual relations. The methods for exploring (external) reality (gewu 格物) and in­tro­spec­tive recognition (fanxing 反省) were both important as perceptive tools that primarily served to understand relations. However, these relations can be either continuous or discontinuous. This means that the relation between A and B can be changed into a relation between A and C. In Chinese epistemologies, such de-composition and changing of positions is in the nature of comprehension (Zhang 2002: 78). In this context, knowledge (zhi) was primarily understood as recognition (shi 識) of the structural principles (li) of the all-embracing Way (dao), which, among all other entities of being, was also expressed in linguistic terms.

The relation as a basis or a central object and goal of any recognition manifests itself on all levels of comprehension and transmission of being. Hence, the relational aspect as a core of comprehension was already apparent in the specific structure of Chinese cosmology, which was based upon the holistic unity of humanity and nature (tian ren heyi). The complexity and integrity of relations in nature and society therefore represent a basic aspect of Chinese epistemology. This aspect was expressed in all classical debates, which were based upon the elementary traditional epistemological categories of name (ming) and actualities (shi). Relations also formed the basic postulate of traditional thought which defined the nature of the central epistemological relation between knowledge (zhi) and action (xing). Primarily due to the impact of the Buddhist thought, the ancient holistic approach to perception and understanding reality through substance (ti 體) and functions (yong 用) was later replaced by the subject (neng 能) and object (suo 所) of com­pre­hen­sion. This kind of categorical demarcation that derived from the Indian tradition of thought would subsequently, in the 19th and especially the 20th centuries, help Chinese philosophers gain a better understanding of theories of knowledge in western philosophy, which were based on the ontology of dividing substance from phenomena.

2.2 The Axiology of Comprehension

While in the most influential European theories, knowledge has mainly been gained through reasoning, traditional Chinese thought understood this question in a much broader sense, namely as something which also (or primarily) stems from moral contents. Chinese epistemology also included teachings of wisdom and dealt with questions such as “how is metaphysics (or metaphysical wisdom) possible?” and “how can an ideal personality be cultivated?” Hence, Chinese epistemology focuses upon the internal relationship between good and truth, between virtue and reason; it needs morality to acquire knowledge, and regards epistemology and axiology as overlapping (Xu and Huang 2008: 42). Thus, traditional Chinese, and especially traditional Confucian epistemology, greatly emphasizes the concept of moral cultivation. Confucius believed that all genuine knowledge and comprehension arises from humaneness (ren 仁), and thus morality should be valued to gain knowledge (Lunyu CTP: Li Ren, 2, 7). Classical Chinese epistemological teachings of cultivation and theories of values both dealt with criteria and methods that evaluate proper attitudes, ways of thinking and feelings (Xu and Huang 2008: 39).

In contrast with the view that the human mind is defined merely by its cognitive potential and could thus not be autonomous, Mengzi introduced the concept of a moral Self which is incorporated in the original heart-mind (ben xin 本心, Mengzi CTP: Gaozi shang, 10) i.e., the heart-mind of goodness and morality. This presumption has been seen as utmost important and hence, exposed by several modern and contemporary Confucians. In his interpretation, Xu Fuguan (1902/03–1982) noted that the moral Self—at least in terms of its basic characteristics—was already present in the early Zhou Dynasty (10th century BC). When this moral consciousness is seated within a person, it will—according to this Modern Confucian interpreter (Xu 2005: 178)—naturally begin to direct his/her life and guide his/her desires through something s/he calls “moral reason” (daode lixing 道德理性). In this context, Lee Ming-huei exposes the importance of the Confucian humaneness (ren 仁), which he mostly analyses in the context of its embeddedness into the Mencian theory of inherent morality (renyi neizai 仁義內在), which is comparable to Kant’s apriorism (e.g. Lee 2018: 37–8).

This spirit was focused on subjectivity; its bodily desires were incorporated into its moral responsibility and they thus manifested themselves in rationality and autonomy (Xu 2005: 34). Modern interpretations also emphasize that this Mencian line of thought has later been developed further and elaborated upon within the scope of Neo-Confucian philosophy, especially Wang Yangming’s concept of innate moral knowledge (liang zhi 良知).

However, due to the specific economic and political factors that determined traditional Chinese culture, the traditional Chinese concept of moral Self could not provide (or, at least, formulate) the possibilities for gaining “objective” knowledge (i.e., knowledge not necessarily linked to morality) and exploring “natural” phenomena. For Mou Zongsan (1909–1995), this was the key ideological factor that explained why traditional Chinese culture did not develop discourses of science and democracy. He therefore argued that the traditional Confucian moral Self should (temporarily) negate itself (ziwo kanxian 自我坎陷), in order to make it possible for these discourses to develop.

A similar critique of classical Confucian moral epistemology was—although from a different perspective—formulated already by his teacher Xiong Shili (1885–1968). Based on his central thesis dealing with the inseparability of substance and function (Rošker 2009a: 377), Xiong created an ethical system rooted in the classical Confucian paradigm of the nobleman (junzi 君子), defined as someone who possesses the qualities of the “inner sage” and the “outer ruler.” The concept of the inner sage refers to spiritual adjustment, while the concept of the outer ruler has to do with that person’s social and political activities. While this moral directive, which was expressed in the ancient phrase nei sheng wai wang 內聖外王, was based on classical Confucian political studies, Xiong criticized classical Confucianism, especially the Neo-Confucianism of the Song and Ming dynasties, precisely in this regard, accusing them that their epistemologies exaggeratedly emphasized the principle of inwardness and ignored the social aspects of the binary category.

2.3 Onto-Epistemology

In the Chinese holistic tradition epistemology is inseparable from ontology, as in its view of the world every object of cognition is also cognition itself; the manner of its existence is thus linked to our understanding of it. Because this connection goes both ways, i.e., their relation is not a relation of single sided dependency and determination, but an interaction that includes mutual co-dependency, we cannot state that this is a solipsistic conceptualization of the world. The same as can be said for the perception of the existing world can also be said for its comprehension and interpretation. This cannot be separated from the wholesome, but changeable and totally individualized existence of objects of cognition; this is clearly manifested in the theoretical system of the so-called onto-hermeneutics (benti quanshi xue 本體詮釋學), which was developed by Chung-ying Cheng (Cheng Zhongying) (see Nelson 2011: 335; Cheng 2008).

In the work of the representatives belonging to the realist currents of Neo-Confucian philosophy, as well as in the later developments which took place during the 16th, 17th and 18th centuries, especially in the formation processes of new methodologies and the processes of incorporating the Buddhist thought, this unity of reality and comprehension was modified through a gradual constitution of a dualistic demarcation line manifesting itself in the differentiation between the subject (zhu主, neng 能) and the object (ke 客, suo 所) of recognition. This demarcation line has been additionally strengthened by the subsequent influence of Western philosophy from the 19th century onwards. The search for a synthesis between the classical Chinese paradigm of the unity of existence and (its) perception on one side, and the dualistic view, according to which both realms are mutually separated on the other, led to the modern debates on the priority of ontology and epistemology. These debates culminated in several attempts to revive, modernize and re-establish the classical Chinese view of structural, organic and dynamic links between ontology and epistemology.

3. Classical Approaches

In the pre-Han era, the most influential epistemological debates were conditioned by the question as regards the relations between language, thought and reality. Hence, according to Chad Hansen (1989: 107–120), the classical Chinese discussions on language offers new insights and a distinctive perspective on the developments of the central discourses within this field.

3.1 Language and Comprehension

These debates were determined by the conflict between classical Confucianism and orthodox Mohism, with the representatives of the former advocating traditionalist positions, while the latter argued for more utilitarian approaches (Hansen 1989: 108). In contrast to the classical Confucian position which had been formulated in the Discourse on proper names (see section 1.2) and follows the presumption that names imply the essence of realities, this utilitarian position derived from their awareness of the relativity of comprehension. Just as we can never know whether the things we perceive are identical to reality, we can also never be certain whether the meanings we express are actually understood in the same way as they were intended (see Mozi CTP: Jing xia,110).

The reaction to these traditionalistic and utilitarian positions within ancient Chinese epistemology expressed itself in two different epistemological viewpoints that can both be designated as “uniformist”. The foundations of the first approach were established by the Confucian Xunzi (ca 230–310 BC) while the central premises of the second were founded by his disciple and founder of the Legalist school (Fa jia 法家) Han Fei (280–233 BC).

Xunzi did not advocate the positions of pure traditionalism. And while he saw his epistemology as an elaboration of the traditional Confucian teachings, it can in qualitative terms be considered as a new reaction to traditional approaches. In this respect, Xunzi can be placed among the precursors of the new epistemology, which advocated universalistic positions. However, Xunzi’s own teachings were based upon relativistic approaches. Because language depended on social conventions, he knew how difficult it was to choose criteria for selecting names. However, despite these views, he sharply condemned the Mohist reformism, arguing that the Confucian system of standardization was still the best possible way to ensure a well-regulated and harmonious society. Contrary to the Confucian Analects, he did not believe in the primary mission of some ideal language which incorporated the essence of existing realities, but considered names and linguistic concepts as merely arbitrary means for expressing concrete (objective) social realities. Despite this fundamental difference, for purely pragmatic reasons he continued to advocate the Confucian Discourse on proper names, for he was convinced that names (ming) also transmitted values, thus serving the social order, and therefore had to be adequately standardized (Xunzi CTP: Zheng ming, 4). He also argued that the classification and categorization of names were not necessarily as difficult as it first appeared, for the human senses perceived different realities in a structurally similar way; this physiologically conditioned similarity therefore provided a basis for the formation of common linguistic conventions (Xunzi CTP: Zheng ming, 5). These standardized agreements made a functioning social coordination—including the connection between human acts and moral postulates—possible. Names therefore had to be regulated in such a way that they could serve the elite as a formal tool for restoring and preserving their political power: It was precisely these arguments which, in the works of his followers, would come to form the basis for the legalistic epistemology that shaped the doctrine of one of the most totalitarian governments in Chinese history.

Xunzi’s disciple Han Fei developed a philosophy that combined the basic concepts of the traditionalistic and utilitarian approaches. His epistemology, which was based upon the concepts of authority (wei 威) and advantage (li 利), represented a unified system founded on the idea of political absolutism (see Han CTP: Gui Shi, 1).

3.2 Neglecting Linguistic Positivism

The second basic approach can be seen as derived from the negation of the two positions we have just described, or their common features and, in fact, denied the positivistic functions of language. This approach also contained two different epistemological currents: the first was pre-linguistic and had its main representative in Laozi (ca 6th century BC), while the second current, which found its most famous exponent in the Confucian Mengzi, argued that language was not necessarily innate (Mengzi CTP: Gongsun Chou shang, 2.8, also see Hansen 1989: 110–111). Their moral epistemology was equally based solely upon introspection.

However, while Laozi represented a current that could be defined as pre-linguistic, and though the Daoist school differed from many of the basic premises of Mengzi’s teachings, Laozi’s negation of language closely resembles that of Mengzi. While Laozi suggests that the natural behavior generated by our natural constitution requires the abandonment of language, it is hardly coincidental that the declarative Confucian, Mengzi never mentions the Proper names discourse, which occupies such an important position in the Analects. They both accept the action or behavior generated by the natural human constitution. Although they disagree on how rich and extensive these natural dispositions are, both scholars share the common belief that behavior should primarily be guided through their use (Hansen 1989: 110–111).

While Laozi’s dao cannot be contained or inscribed within any kind of linguistic structure, it still represents the basic cosmic and moral force, creating and immanently governing everything that exists. He viewed knowledge (in the sense of learning virtues) as a kind of social pressure which impeded our natural spontaneity (Laozi CTP: 18). In Laozi’s view, every linguistic concept is determined by time and space, and can therefore represent only a partial, incomplete expression of reality, which he saw as integral, dynamic and holistically structured. Consequently, in order to preserve the naturalness of our existence, we must withdraw from all conventions, including that of language itself. Laozi thus sought a radically different process of comprehension: one of non-linguistic introspection (Laozi CTP: 47).

Mengzi believed that the inborn qualities of human beings (xing 性) are naturally disposed towards the good. If individuals are in touch with their true nature, their actions will inevitably tend towards the good (Allinson 1989: 17) without needing to rely on linguistic maxims. In this sense, he formulated the first anti-linguistic version of Confucian epistemology (Mengzi CTP: Wan zhang shang, 5; Jin xin shang, 1, 5, 15; Liang Hui wang shang, 6). With this approach, he wanted both to refute one of the central tenets of Mohist theory, while also resolving (or avoiding) the central problem of Confucian epistemology, i.e., the insertion of moral principles into behavior patterns through linguistic interpretations (Hansen 1989: 110).

According to Chad Hansen (1989: 111), Mengzi did not view language as being an innate system which contained the essence of proper social norms, and instead believed that all traditional Confucian conventions were ‘wired’ into the human heart-mind (xin). However, this view has been challenged by other sinologists (e.g., Shun 1997; Van Norden 2000; Ivanhoe 2002), who have pointed out that only the four ‘sprouts’ (si duan 四端) of essential moral qualities (Ivanhoe 2002: 43) were innate to heart-mind, and that these had to be properly cultivated in order to enable human beings to comprehend the world and act in accordance with moral virtues (Lee 2018: 36–9). But given that proper names (zheng ming) did not represent a system of (moral) recognition for Mengzi, such cultivation was not based on a shared linguistic system or consensus (Mengzi CTP: Jinxin shang, 15). This position allowed him to formulate a series of well-grounded arguments against the challenges presented by the Mohist school.

3.3 Proto-analytic Approaches

The next position which decisively influenced the further development of epistemological debates derived from certain analytical approaches based either upon isomorphic assumptions, as advocated by the representatives of the School of Names (Ming jia), especially by Gongsun Long, or upon linguistic relativism. The latter was elaborated by the followers of the so-called Neo-Mohist school (Houqi Mo jia 後期墨家) through a purely formal analytical method. However, the approach to the linguistic analysis of the two most important representatives of the School of Names, i.e., Gongsun Long and Hui Shi (ca 370–310 BC), sustained fundamentally divergent views regarding the relationship between names and actualities, with Gongsun Long arguing that the ideal construct of an accomplished language was still of crucial importance, and that language and social reality were inseparably linked and semantically overlapping (Xiang 2000: 52). His arguments were founded upon the Confucian premise that the ideal application of language was based upon a complete mutual congruency of the name and the object to which it referred (Gongsun Longzi CTP 2014: Bai ma lun, 4). Despite his idealistic stance, he believed language was not only a consecrated structure which embraced the essence of all existence, but that the crucial function of language remained that of denominating actualities (Gongsun Longzi CTP 2014: Ming shi lun, 13). This is the hypothesis which underpins his main arguments on this topic, entitled The Dispute on Names and Actualities (Ming shi lun).

Hui Shi instead believed names (ming) provided a basis for categorizing reality (Xiang 2000: 51), a position which placed him in direct opposition to Mohist approaches. His “constant” relativism was also a response to Neo-Mohist realism, which was founded upon formal distinctions as a necessary precondition for comprehension. As his 11th paradox (see Zhuangzi CTP: Tianxia, 7) indicates, the Neo-Mohist “obsession” with definitions of particular terms (or names) was likewise redundant.

In any case, this analytic epistemological current of the ancient Chinese tradition, which was rediscovered only in the latter half of the 20th century, helped dispel a number of prejudices concerning the methodological uniformity of classical Chinese thought (Allison 1989: 8). Certain similar “realist” currents within ancient Chinese discourses formulated additional epistemological questions related to binary oppositions of identity and difference (tong/yi 同/異), or the consistency and quality (jian/bai 堅/白) of the objects of comprehension.

Gongsun Long’s arguments were founded upon Confucius’ premise that the ideal application of language was based on a complete mutual congruency of the name and the object to which it referred. Despite his idealistic stance, he believed language was not only a consecrated structure which embraced the essence of all existence, but that the crucial function of language remained that of denominating actualities (Gongsun Longzi CTP: Bai ma lun, 4). This is the hypothesis which underpins his main arguments on this topic, entitled The Dispute on Names and Actualities (Ming shi lun). With respect to the concrete situation to which language has been applied, each single thing could have only one single meaning. Of course, this projection is in contrast with the usual application of language, for people tend to use different names for the same objects. In everyday language, the meanings of words usually overlap. Gongsun Long attempted to eliminate this semantic overlapping, or at least to reduce it to a level on which language could still be overseen and controlled. The famous ‘White horse not horse’ debate was an attempt to deal with these concerns.

For the Neo-Mohist philosophers, however, the semantic overlapping of different terms was a natural quality of human language and, consequently, they saw no need to eliminate it. They were far more interested in the question of language as a means for categorizing society.

However, given that the variegated complexity of language could not be molded into a reliable regulatory structure within the linguistic conventions (Mozi CTP: Jing xia, 140), they acknowledged the de facto unreliability of language, concluding that a general, valid standardization of language was impossible. In their view, the formal indefinableness of language was, to a degree, a part of its intrinsic structure (Mozi CTP: Jing xia, 168).

Instead of the endless search for definitions of the semantic extensions of terms, the Neo-Mohists preferred to deal with questions that addressed causal connections. However, their approach to these questions differed greatly from that of formal logic in many respects. They were disinterested in the attempts to construct an ideal language, as expressed in the discourses on names; instead, they focused on linguistic analyses, which led them to conclusions that were diametrically opposed to Gongsun Long’s ideas and the early Confucian views on the relation between names and actualities.

More specifically, their analyses led them to conclude that the connections between certain individual names (ming), which were simply understood as arbitrary entities of language, were multi-layered and incoherent. While some compound terms could embrace semantic scopes that extended beyond all the partial meanings of the individual mings (i.e., the linguistic entities of which they were compounded), in other instances the exact opposite was true (Mozi CTP: Jing xia, 102).

However, the fragments of their analyses which have survived do not contain any substantial discovery that goes beyond the recognition or acknowledgment of the inconsistent nature of linguistic structures. Thus, in contrast to Gongsun Long, their investigations were not aimed at establishing a universal linguistic system that could unify divergent models of language application. A fundamental premise of their work was that the formal shapes of naming could not embrace the complex integrity of existence, as reflected in actualities. Language could never attain, let alone go beyond actual existence; consequently, the objective features of reality automatically determined and limited the structures of language, and thus our application of linguistic constructs and expressions (Mozi CTP: Da qu, 25).

However, this did not mean that language was exclusively a product of arbitrary social conventions. Despite its fundamental importance, the only Neo-Mohist attempt to establish a formal linguistic basis for this notion can be found in their analysis of the classical distinction between identity and difference (tong yi, Mozi CTP: Da qu, 22).

The issue here is the problem of the essential relativity of this distinction with respect to various contexts, for the difference between the two antipodes is by no means more constant than, for example, the difference between the notions of largeness and smallness, or length and shortness. From a realistic viewpoint, this can appear as paradoxical, and this paradox was formulated and analyzed by Hui Shi, a Nominalist philosopher who was the closest to Daoist discourses. By means of his apparently paradoxical suppositions, Hui Shi attempted to situate the problem of identity and difference within the context of holistic relativity. Through his exposition of contradictions, by which he showed the limits of the semantic extensions of certain attributes, he wished to demonstrate the relativity of time and space as expressed in the names (ming) applied in different contexts.

One of his most significant contributions to the classical epistemology of linguistic analysis can be found in his comment on the general problem of identity and difference which, as we have seen, the representatives of the Neo-Mohist school were unable to develop to a concise conclusion (Hui Shi in Zhuangzi CTP: Tianxia, 7). He claimed that any two things were always different in something, no matter how equivalent they were in all other respects (otherwise they could not represent two separate entities). Yet even two things that seemed to be completely different were likewise identical in at least one quality, since they were both parts of a unified structure (otherwise, it would not be possible to express, or even think of them in the framework of language).

Hui Shi’s “constant” relativism was, of course, a response to the Neo-Mohist realism, which was founded upon formal distinctions as a necessary precondition for comprehension. As his 11th paradox indicates, the Neo-Mohist obsession with definitions was likewise redundant (Hui Shi in Zhuangzi CTP: Tianxia, 7). His categorization of identity and difference, or of the radical relativity of objects, was thus based upon the impossibility of conceptual definitions of reality, since every linguistic comprehension was necessarily limited to a contextually determined meaning which was incapable of embracing all dimensions of the object of comprehension.

3.4 Egalitarian Epistemology

Although the Neo-Mohists were never able to formulate an exhaustive response to Hui Shi’s radical relativism, his contemporary Zhuangzi (4th century BC) clearly found it to be an important stimulus for his own thought, and was definitely influenced by him when elaborating his own epistemological system. Zhuangzi believed that because knowledge was infinite, the human capacity for comprehension was too limited to enable us to gain any true knowledge (Zhuangzi CTP: Yang sheng zhu, 1). Thus, he believed that comprehension is always something relative (Zhuangzi CTP: Qiwu lun, 11). As a result, we are lost in a labyrinth of real and false recognitions. But this apparently tragic situation is mitigated by the fact that we do not have to face it alone, we are always accompanied by other people who are just as blind as we are. All of us are busy dealing with questions of mastering our reality and thus with questions of the indefinite nature of our existence (Zhuangzi CTP: Qiwu lun, 3). Since we are determined by the limitations of our senses, we naturally tend to acknowledge the truth of those kinds of recognitions that happen to match our own value systems (Zhuangzi CTP: Yu yan, 1). Ultimately, human subjectivity determines what should be regarded as (true and universally valid) knowledge. The apparent objectivity and independence of the human mind has repeatedly been proven to be a false, illusory chimera, which only leads to self-deception. The quality, the features and the extent of our perception are always determined by the actual conditions of our existence. Hence, our perception—and the actions resulting from it—are always dependent upon external factors, even though ultimately, every form of dependence is actually a form of self-dependence. Of course, such dependence and determination are connected to our ignorance, to our incapacity to recognize our essence and the essence of our surroundings (Zhuangzi CTP: Qiwu lun, 13).

Zhuangzi believed that acknowledging the relative nature of all existence was still not sufficient in order to define equivalents and distinctions (Zhuangzi CTP: Qiwu lun, 10). In each concrete case, the structure of our cognition enables us to identify at least one common or different quality, which then allows us to make a distinction, no matter how atypical it might be.

This position of radical relativism was common to both Hui Shi and Zhuangzi. They also shared a skepticism concerning the idea that the categorical mechanism of identity and difference (tong/yi) could provide an adequate basis for a universal, permanently valid (chang) standardization of concepts or names (ming).

Following the tradition of classical Daoism, Zhuangzi also believed in the inherent inexpressibility of the holistic essence of all being. This led him to espouse the classical Daoist method of comprehension, i.e., introspection (Zhuangzi CTP: Qiwu lun, 5). Although he did not offer an instant solution to the eternal issues that form the heart of his philosophical discourse, he tried to create a new approach to the complex problem of human interactions. For him, the internalization of language is a process inherent to human nature, just like eating, drinking and breathing, or anything else that conditions our survival (Zhuangzi CTP: Qiwu lun, 9).

However, the uncertain connection between language and thought is not a one-way street (Allinson 1989: 11) and, in fact, the communicative potential of language was trapped on the narrow footbridge between speaker and hearer, between transmitter and receiver. Therefore, Zhuangzi believed that language was inseparably connected to comprehension; in essence, they share the same qualities (Zhaungzi CTP: Qiwu lun, 2). As a result, all linguistically determined boundaries within holistically structured reality are, in fact, false, since language cannot express itself (Zhuangzi CTP: Qiwu lun, 10).

Just like dao in its original function of the fundamental, all-embracing essence of all beings, and just like our recognition of this original path, language itself is also absolute in the sense of the unity of all relative contradictions of which it is composed (Zhuangzi CTP: Qiwu lun, 12).

Zhuangzi showed little interest in the problems that occupied the majority of philosophers of his time, i.e., problems of connecting different, individual minds into one comprehensible unity. He evidently believed that the problems of inter-subjectivity were not imposed upon us from outside; rather, he saw them as resulting from our being trapped in patterns of socially determined ambitions. We could never master our destinies by forceful interventions into the integrity of everything that exists, neither by artificial and false distinctions nor by absolute valuations. The reason for this was that human existence was not subordinated to any external, higher powers that could be controlled through comprehension (Zhuangzi CTP: Qiwu lun, 3).

In such an egalitarian epistemology, each type of understanding is equally possible. Zhuangzi’s correlativity does not provide an absolute perspective that could overrule the judgments or valuations of any method of comprehension.

4. Buddhist Influences and the Neo-Confucian Epistemology

4.1 General Overview

Epistemology was the leading field of progress in Song-ming Neo-Confucianism (Wen 2011: 271). Its systematic discussion began after the Buddhist philosophy reached its high point in China. The Buddhist distinction between the subjective perception (neng 能) and the objects of comprehension within external reality (suo 所) influenced already the ear­li­est precursors of this intellectual stream, such as for instance Shao Yong (1011–1077). However, in this context the most influential stream of thought was Chan-Buddhism (Chan 禪). In contrast to other schools of Chinese Buddhism, for example the School of Pure Consciousness (Wei shi zong 唯識宗), the Tiantai (Tian tai zong 天台宗 ) and the Huayan (Huayan zong 華嚴宗) schools, Chan discarded traditional Indian methods of realizing the Buddha-nature and proposed a teaching of enlightenment in accordance with Chinese philosophical sensibility. Its adherents, especially its last patriarch Hui Neng (638–713) exposed the possibility of enlightening humans without the use of words. The central topic of interest within this context shifted from trying to understand what the world was, to understanding the world and Buddha’s wisdom. Since the latter issue falls within the scope of understanding a certain kind of knowledge, this discourse represented an innovative shift from metaphysics to epistemology.

In this shift of philosophical paradigms, Chan Buddhism infused the relationship between heart-mind and things-events with a distinct sensibility that derived from classical Chinese discourses: the continuity of heart-mind and things-events (Wen 2011: 272). In this way, the Chan teachings synthesized earlier Buddhist and classical Chinese epistemology, which provided a starting point for the Neo-Confucian epistemology.

According to Wen Haiming (2011: 271), the general line of development in solipsistic epistemology could be drawn as follows: the epistemology of Chan Buddhism and Li Ao’s (772–841) study of “recovering human nature” (fu xing 復性) provided the foundations for Neo-Confucian epis­te­mol­o­gy; Zhou Dunyi’s (1017–1073) concept of creativity (cheng 誠) and his epistemological structure linking the Great Ultimate (taiji 太極) with the Great Ultimate of Humans (renji 人極), as well as Shao Yong’s teaching of observing things (guan wu 觀物) comprehensively raised the basic questions of this new discourse; Zhang Zai’s (1020–1077) paradigm of expanding one’s heart-mind to be continuous with things (da xin ti wu 大心體物) and Cheng Hao’s (1032–1085) elaborations on stilling the nature (ding xin 定性) served as the basic frameworks and major discourses for Neo-Confucian epistemology; Cheng Yi’s 程頤 (1033–1107) study of Heavenly patterns (tian li 天理) and Zhu Xi’s (1130–1200) Exploration of things (gewu) reached their first peak in this new epistemology of the Song and Ming periods; after them, another peak was reached in Lu Jiuyuan’s (1139–1192) and Wang Yangming’s agreement that nothing is outside one’s mind (wu xinwaizhi wu 無心外之物). The final stage of Neo-Confucian breakthroughs in the epistemology field can be found in Wang Ji’s (1498–1583) concept of intentional propensity (ji 幾) and Liu Zongzhou’s (1578–1645) teaching on intention as the root (yigen 意根) of the heart-mind.

4.2 Subjective and Objective Knowledge

This distinction which was most often expressed in later, 17th century epistemology with the binary category of the subject (neng) and the object (suo) of comprehension, also definitely reveals the influence of Buddhist thought upon the entire Neo-Confucian philosophy. In Chinese Buddhist terminology, the term neng has namely also been used to express the ability to perceive phenomena; the compound neng bie 能別, for instance, was placed in opposition to the term suobie 所別, whereas the first one was understood as “that which differentiates” and the latter as “that which is differentiated.” The two terms together (nengsuo) refer to active and passive ideas; neng indicates the ability to transform and suo the object that was transformed (Soothill and Hodous 2014: 337).

However, the earliest Neo-Confucian philosophers, such as Shao Yong, developed similar epistemological distinctions in order to differentiate between the subject (me, wo 我) and object (thing, wu) of comprehension, gradually leading to a direct definition of subjective and objective knowledge.

In his fictional dialogue between the woodcutter and his friend, the fisherman (Xingli da quan 1989: XIII, 3b, 932), Shao Yong elaborated the traditional distinctions between identity and difference into the fundamental epistemological division between subjective and objective comprehension. This development took place in a discourse on the nature of comprehension and the relation between ourselves and the things we perceive.

In the philosophy of the main exponent of the Neo-Confucian system of thought, Zhu Xi, these categories were developed so as to become crucial criteria for the proper method of comprehension (Zhu 1999: 14, 53). Similar to Shao Yong, he also argued for an objective epistemological method and tried to avoid subjective projections upon the object of comprehension (Zhu 1999: 11, 8). In this way, he tried to define the separation between the subject (zhu 主) and the object (ke 客) of com­pre­hen­sion (Zhu 1999: 45).

A few centuries later, Wang Fuzhi (1619–1692) elaborated these two basic categories from a realistic viewpoint, denied the classical concepts of non-existence and emphasized the objective reality that exists independently of human perception. Following the Buddhist terminology, Wang denoted them as the comprehensive potential (neng) and its material basis (suo). In the context of Buddhist teachings, both the term suo, which referred to the external reality and the object of comprehension, and the term neng, which referred to subjective perception and the subject of comprehension, were essentially empty (i.e., illusory), whereas Wang includes them in his materially determined world of comprehension and defines their relation as analogous to the relation between function or applicability (yong) and (physical) substance or essence (ti), with the latter as the primary and determinant factor (Wang 1982: V., 122).

4.3 The Structural Principle as the Leading Principle of Comprehension

Following the Chinese Middle Ages, the main Neo-Confucian ontological concept of structural pattern or principle (li 理), as opposed to vital creativity (qi 氣), gradually evolved into a new, crucial epistemological notion.

In the context of Neo-Confucian philosophy, things can generally be recognized or understood through their basic structural principles. Just as dao in classical Daoist cosmogony represents the all-embracing fundamental law which manifests itself simultaneously within every single entity of being, the Neo-Confucian li expresses itself on both, the level of cosmic unity, as well as on the level of its concrete manifestations. The nature of li is thus both holistic and binary, transcendent and immanent. According to this new aspect of being, knowledge can only be achieved by following these principles of the external world.

Although dao as the elementary metaphysical force is abstract and therefore cannot be apprehended directly, it can, in Neo-Confucian thought be recognized through both intuition and reason. The epistemological role of the concept li becomes even more salient, for li was developed not only as the structural principle that defines the concrete state of being of everything that exists, but also as the leading structural principle of human reason (see section 1.2).

After distinguishing between subjective and objective knowledge, Shao Yong warns against subjectivity, which is a consequence of our inability to recognize or understand structural principles underlying reality, making him one of the first philosophers to apply the term li in the Neo-Confucian sense. In this relatively new context, he often applied the term wu li 物理 (lit.: structural patterns or principles of things), which would, in modern Chinese, serve as the translation of the Western word physics (in the sense of physical science). Given his approach, it comes as no surprise to find him stressing the distinction between “true” recognition and false mysticisms. Zhu Xi also advocated comprehension in accordance with the principle li (Zhu 1999: 8, 25). Like Shao Yong, he was convinced that li was not only the structural principle that governs the existence of all external things, but also a necessary and inseparable part of the human heart-mind (Zhu 1999: 60, 6, 7). However, in Zhu Xi’s view the spiritual functions of li did not refer only to human reason, but also represented the human ability to perceive and comprehend the external world (Zhu 1999: 47). Following the priority of moral principles within Confucian (and Neo-Confucian) epistemologies, as the central and universal principle, Zhu Xi’s li also naturally incorporated ethical components (Zhu 1999: 8, 20).

4.4 Ultimate Knowledge and the Exploration of Things vs. Secluded Meditation

These new concepts led to a polarization of epistemology which also manifested itself in the methods of comprehension. Neo-Confucian philosophy presents two epistemological currents, which were named “realistic” and “idealistic” (or “intuitionistic”) by Western sinology. Both were based on the different portions of The Book of Rituals (Li ji 禮記 ), which is part of the classic Confucian canon.

The epistemology of the “realistic” current followed the paradigms of the Great learning (Da xue 大學), which postulates the exploration of things (gewu) for the purpose of attaining ultimate knowledge (zhi zhi 致知 ). These approaches were previously advocated by Han Yu (768–824), a precursor of Neo-Confucianism, and by most of the above mentioned Neo-Confucians such as Zhou Dunyi, Cheng Yi and especially Zhu Xi (Zhu 1999: 14, 48). However, in Zhu Xi’s understanding the exploration of things (gewu) was not limited to the process of investigation. In order to explore a thing one should exhaustively recognize all of its qualities (Zhu 1999: 15, 3). For him, exploring things (gewu) and attaining ultimate knowledge (zhizhi) form a unity (Zhu 1999: 15, 17).

The “idealistic” or “intuitive” studies of knowledge of Neo-Confucian epistemology was derived primarily from the Doctrine of the Mean (Zhong yong 中庸) and sought to achieve recognition of reality based upon the practice of secluded meditation or concentration (shendu 慎獨). The main Neo-Confucian exponents of this epistemological current were Li Ao and Cheng Hao. According to them, the indeterminable cosmic force dao represented the only true base of comprehension. The main goal of the introspection in the sense of secluded meditation was thus to understand dao (Cheng and Cheng 1981: I, Yi Shu, 13, 221).

4.5 Innate Knowledge

During the Ming Dynasty (1368–1644) this epistemological split in Neo-Confucian philosophy manifested itself in the establishment of two divergent streams of thought, represented by the “realist” current of the School of the Structural Principle (Li xue 理學) on one side, and the “idealist” School of the Heart-Mind (Xin xue 心學) on the other. Wang Yangming, the most influential representative of the latter, provided a crucial node in the inextricable link between Chinese epistemology and ethics, something that is especially evident in the main concepts of his epistemological system: the ideas of heart-mind (xin), the unity of knowledge and action (zhi xing heyi) and innate knowledge (liangzhi). The latter notion represents an original, natural truth in the sense of the basic recognition of the most profound structure of existence. Innate knowledge is inborn and thus necessarily implied in every person, forming an inseparable part of the human heart-mind. In the same way as the heart-mind, of which it is a part, innate knowledge also contains the basic structure of natural principles (li) (Wang 1933: II, 57). This basic epistemological concept also forms the foundation of Wang’s ethic in the sense of moral recognition, or the distinction between good and evil (Wang 1933: III, 26). Thus, innate knowledge represents the basic criterion for the recognition and evaluation of individual comprehension, as well as social interactions. Since Neo-Confucian ideology is based on the Mencian interpretation of ancient Confucianism, this unity of innate knowledge and moral goodness is quite unsurprising. Therefore, Wang pointed out that Mengzi, in contrast to Xunzi, stressed the goodness of human nature. However, innate knowledge is not merely a passive substance of ethical comprehension. Through the process of “successful” introspection, it also automatically leads to “proper” (and, thus, morally good) action, and can therefore provide a criterion for our behavior. Here, Wang, obviously influenced by Chan Buddhism, tried to expand upon Mengzi’s teachings, stressing that the notions of good and evil are not absolute concepts, since all that exists is regulated in accordance with the all-embracing and all-encompassing structure of the natural order of cosmic reason, and thus with the system of the structural, absolutely valid principles of nature (li) (Wang 1929: II, 29a).

According to Wang Yangming, good and evil cannot be separated from human “intention” (yinian 意念). Hence, human action can only be evaluated in the context of specific concrete situations. The impulse which tells us what is right (shi) or wrong (fei) in a particular situation is, once again, the concept of innate knowledge (liangzhi). As we have seen, the binary category of knowledge and action and the question of the relation between these two concepts represented one of the fundamental problems of Chinese epistemology. Hence, “innate knowledge”, the inborn capacity in which the boundary between knowledge and action apparently disappeared, was of utmost importance.

5. Later Conceptual Developments and Modern Chinese Epistemology

5.1 Pre-modern Methodologies

At the threshold of the 18th century, Chinese epistemologists sought to establish a new analytical and critical methodology for “exploring things (gewu).” Similar tendencies could be observed already in Wang Fuzhi’s and Gu Yanwu’s (1613–1682) notion of evidence (kaozheng 考證). Gradually, they acquired greater importance within the framework of new practice-oriented approaches.

Wang and Gu profoundly influenced the epistemology of the School of Practical Learning (Xi zhai) which consisted of two main currents; the most important representatives of the first, Yan Yuan (1635–1704) and Li Gong (1659–1746), followed the essential approaches of Huang Zongxi (1610–1695) and Wang Fuzhi, while the chief proponent of the second, the philosopher Dai Zhen, founded his epistemological system upon Gu Yanwu’s methodology. Their emphasis on the practical, physical aspects of knowledge and the significance of sensations led them to rehabilitate human feelings, inclinations and desires as a driving force that motivated human beings to seek knowledge. By so doing, they unknowingly prepared the terrain for the later Chinese understanding of the European notion of the individual as the subject of comprehension.

Dai Zhen is widely considered to be the first Chinese philosopher to have described the relation between the subject and object of comprehension by defining the subject’s potential for comprehension as a tool, which can be compared to light that makes objects visible. Xia Zhentao (1996b: 405) especially indicates his elaboration of the notions of the potential for comprehension (xin zhi shenming 心之神明), elucidation, exposure and illumination (zhao 照). Xia stresses that Dai’s reflective method, by which reality is perceived through its reflection (fanying 反映) in the human mind, pertains to basic theories of materialistic epistemology, given that the objective reality (which is external to the subject of comprehension) is seen as a necessary precondition of reflection (Xia 1996b: 405).

At this point we should mention China’s first encounter with Western thought, which slowly began to seep into the Middle Kingdom at that time. During the 18th century, the Jesuit influence on the Chinese academic world grew steadily.

Hence, Tan Sitong (1865–1898) believed that the central Confucian virtue of humaneness (ren) is not merely an ethical, but also an epistemological term that determines the social function of the basic stuff of which everything is composed, namely of ether, which makes it possible for people to experience circulation (tong 通), i.e., one of the principal components in the process of comprehension. In accordance with this mechanistic understanding of concrete reality, circulation provides both the inner and external conditions of perceiving, comprehending and transmitting reality. In terms of inwardness, circulation makes the harmonic, coordinated operation of the senses (wu guan 五官), brain (nao 腦) and nervous system (nao qi jin 腦氣筋) possible. Tan Sitong was one of the first Chinese scholars who accepted the Western notion that mind and consciousness arise from the brain and not from the heart (xin), as was widely believed in traditional China.

5.2 Syntheses of Methods and Disciplines

The majority of 20th century Chinese epistemologists advocated the conceptual divisions between the subjectivity and objectivity of comprehension. While analytical and/or Marxist scholars (such as Jin Yuelin) gave absolute priority to the rational method, most Modern Confucians (principally Xiong Shili and Mou Zongsan) applied the intuitive one. He Lin drew attention to the traditional complementary comprehension of reason and intuition (He 1982: 27). In this context, the two methods are not only inseparably connected to each other, but are also connected to the method of reasoning itself, which is based upon distinctions. In his view, philosophers who apply the method of intuition, simultaneously apply methods of formal logic and dual differentiations; others, who apply the rational method, also use the intuitive method, as well as dual distinctions. All three methods, the formal analysis and inferences, as well as methods of dual distinctions and intuition, are necessary compounds for any philosophical activity (Zhang 2000: 75).

The epistemological discourses of the 20th century current of the so-called Modern or New Confucianism (Xin ruxue 新儒學) were rooted in the specific features of traditional Chinese epistemological thought and defined by a search for fruitful amalgamation with contemporary Western theories of knowledge. In this field, they were most interested in the relation between reason and intuition, for the latter concept belongs to principle traditional epistemological notions, and the former to the concepts that are crucial for the establishment of modernization theories. The Western notion of intuition came to China in close connection and with many connotations arising from Henri Bergson’s vitalism, was translated by the neologism zhijue 直覺.

An important notion in Modern Confucian epistemologies is the advanced concept of the traditional moral self, which in the new global philosophies was intended to assume the function of a “truly” autonomous cognitive subject. While this subject acts and perceives the world as an individual, necessarily forming a part of the social community, it is also ennobled by an infinite heart-mind, which enables it to be aware of its unity with the universe. This new, moral and infinite, limitless subject represents an elaboration of the “traditional” Confucian concept of the moral self, and thus may also be the active personality that can sustain the idea of modernization. In the Confucian framework, this self is autonomous precisely due to its rational and structural (li 理) connection with all aspects of its natural and social environment. Further, because this connection is also dynamic and organic, it is capable of infinite forms of communication and cooperation. For a Chinese model of modernity, i.e. for a modernity permeated with humanism or mutuality (ren 仁), these forms of communication and cooperation are much more important than formal laws of economy and official politics.

Modern Confucian epistemological notions, e.g. Mou Zongsan’s intellectual intuition, Tang Junyi’s (1909–1978) concept of sensual compatibility, Xiong Shili’s and Liang Shuming’s (1893–1988) sinization of reason and intuition, all represent the various Modern Confucian responses to the global questions of the contemporary epistemology. These questions are linked to the dilemmas of the modern subject, who is trapped within the complex technologies of the profit-seeking world and has thus forgotten the ethical dimensions that define their humanity.

Within the framework of his structurally ordered system of thought, Zhang Dongsun decidedly rejected the Modern Confucian paradigm expressed in the glorification of intuition as the most objective mystical method for innate knowledge. Zhang believed that reason was the only reliable and unequivocal method of comprehension; because it led us to knowledge that was not only logically consistent but also applicable, there was no need to search for any other, more reliable method. However, the rational method was not one-dimensional and undiversified, for it not only functioned in accordance to the pure formal structure, but also with the aid of the so-called intuitive insight (touzhi 透智), which represented an inseparable and complementary part of intuitive methods. Thus, by proceeding from ratio centrism, Zhang Dongsun finally managed to overcome the boundary between reason and intuition (Zhang 1924: 76). However, according to him, the thing we are directly confronted with, is neither reason nor intuition, but knowledge itself. Knowledge is a result of reason, but it implies intuition on an unconscious level. Intuition is not mysterious. It merely represents a process of applying a philosophical “method of counter-investigation”, by which we peel away from the image of knowledge the ultimate, most intimate thing. And this thing is the pure, completely unregulated “that.” (Zhang 1924: 64–65)

The Taiwanese Modern Confucian philosopher Mou Zongsan tried to define the position of reason within traditional Chinese thought by comparing Western and Chinese culture, arguing that they were based on different representational forms of human reason. He called the Chinese form “functional or intensive” (lixingzhi yunyong biaoxian 理性之運用表現) and the Western “constructive or extensive” (lixingzhijiagou biaoxian 理性之架構表現) (Mou 1995: 544–553). This distinction could be compared to the Kantian differentiation between practical and theoretical reason. The “reason” which appears in the functional representation is a practical one. It is not abstract, but concrete, connected to actual life. This reason can thus be equated with morality within the personality (Mou 1995: 544–545). However, Mou endows functional reason with intellectual intuition (zhide zhijue 智的直覺) which is—in contrast to Kant’s epistemology—a potential implied not only in Divine consciousness, but also in the human heart-mind.

In his treatise on Kant’s philosophy, Jin Yuelin established a clear and insuperable demarcation between synthetic and analytical propositions: if a certain proposition is synthetic, it cannot be at the same time necessary or a priori; and if it is necessary or a priori, it cannot be synthetic (Jin 1996: 46). This difference is clearly of great importance for the elementary framework of Jin’s theory of knowledge. Modern Confucian epistemology criticized a similar division, since ethics and their pragmatic social implications were still at the heart of their theoretical efforts. Feng Youlan also encountered many difficulties related to analytic and universal (synthetic) propositions: on one hand, he did not wish to abandon the universality of the metaphysical statements, because in this way he could express the ideal of every single thing, but, on the other hand, he tried to respond to the attacks against synthetic propositions carried out by the Viennese circle (Jin 1996: 78).

Zhang Dongsun maintained that a pure form of either proposition did not exist in reality. The absence of distinctions between analytic and synthetic propositions implies the abolition of the demarcation between (posterior) experience and (a priori) knowledge and, consequently, between metaphysics and the (natural) sciences. Most Chinese scholars from the latter half of the 20th century argued that the reason for this demarcation was to be found in the fact that metaphysics only referred to the formal regulation of experiences, while science also explained their contents (Feng 1986: 166–167). However, some recent Chinese epistemological theories likewise reject the reasoning behind such demarcations and criticize the existence or methods of the discourses based upon them. For them, both science and metaphysics explain experience; in addition, both represent a formal kind of explanation. Hence, Zhang Dongsun transcended the boundary between science and metaphysics, while Feng was convinced that it was insuperable. In Zhang Dongsun’s view, the only difference between metaphysics and science lay in the fact that science applied the postulate of relations, while metaphysics applied the postulates of being and existence (Zhang 2002: 77).

This all-embracing, specifically Chinese tendency towards transcending abstract demarcations ultimately also manifested itself on the level of heuristics, with respect to the question of the nature of creating theories. In the context of the neo-holistic research, which was, in the field of epistemology, founded by Zhang Dongsun, and further elaborated primarily by Zhang Yaonan, the demarcation between the concepts of discovery (faxian 發現) and invention (faming 發明) was also considered to be artificial. This assumption was developed as a negation of Jin Yuelin’s paradigm which stated that theories could not be created (or “invented”), but only discovered. Zhang Dongsun denied this affirmation, declaring that there was no qualitative difference between these two concepts (or methods), given that science was not a reflection, but an explanation or interpretation of the world. He argued that scientific discourses were a method of selection, that is, they selected and isolated specific entities in (originally chaotic) reality or nature, defining them as facts, even though they only represented a kind of abstract reality. By “discovering” facts in this way, science simultaneously created them. Thus, the existence of facts co-existed with the results of science. Although facts as such were not separated from nature, they could not be a part of “pure” nature either, for in Zhang’s view, pure forms that would be separated from our awareness, perception and apprehension, did not exist. However, since Zhang Dongsun cannot be considered a solipsist, for whom mind or consciousness is the sole “creator” of reality, there had to be something apart from humans (or living beings), despite the non-existence of substance. Of course, this “something” was an (at least potentially) all-connecting and all-embracing structure, which was neither material nor ideal in its essence. In fact, this structure represented a concretization of manifold relations. It was precisely here that contemporary Chinese theories of knowledge once again revealed their traditional connotation.


In the above, “CTP” refers to the Chinese Text Project

Chinese Text Project

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Other Internet Resources

  • Epistemology Page, maintained by Keith De Rose (Yale University), [A general introduction of /Western/ epistemology.]
  • Chinese Philosophical Etext Archive, an excellent collection of original Chinese texts on classical Chinese philosophy from the pre-Qin till the Republican era, mostly containing Confucian or Confucian-inspired texts.]
  • Internet Guide for Chinese Studies, (Philosophy and Religion), edited by Hanno E. Lecher (Leiden University); a list of websites on Chinese and East Asian thought and literature.
  • Chinese Classics, a collection of classical Chinese literature, including pre-Qin philosophy.
  • Essential Readings on Chinese Philosophy, maintained by Bryan Van Norden (Vassar College); secondary texts in English on Chinese philosophy.
  • Chad Hansen’s Chinese philosophy pages, edited by Chad Hansen (University of Hong Kong); contains segments of an interpretive theory of Classical Chinese philosophy that takes Daoism as the philosophical center, but also including the Mohist and Legalist school and the School of Names.
  • Chinese philosophy links, edited by Chris Fraser (University of Hong Kong); selected links pertaining to Chinese philosophy.
  • Chinese Text Project, Donald Sturgeon (University of Hong Kong), author and administrator; a wide range of texts, particularly those relating to Chinese philosophy, especially from pre-Qin and Han dynasty sources, but also including crucial texts from the post-Han era. In addition, it implies a dictionary search for each character. English and modern Chinese translations are also provided wherever copyright allows.
  • Soothill, Edward and Lewis Hodous, 2014, A Dictionary of Chinese Buddhist Terms, edited by Charles Muller.
  • Zhu Xi, “Zhuzi yulei,” in Chinese Philosophical Etext Archive – Song through Qing Texts, Stephen C. Angle (ed.), 2014.

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