Chinese Philosophy and Chinese Medicine

First published Tue Apr 28, 2015; substantive revision Wed Oct 7, 2020

According to Zhang Xichun 張錫純 (1860–1933), one of the leading reformers of Chinese medicine in the early twentieth century:

Many recent medical journal reports take the view that [traditional Chinese] philosophy holds back the progress of medicine, but their authors do not understand the use of philosophy, nor do they understand that philosophy is actually the basis of medicine. (Zhang Xichun 1918–1934, 296).

At first glance, this assertion seems improbable to say the least. This essay addresses some of the connections between Chinese philosophy and Chinese medicine in both intellectual and social aspects.

The first section locates medicine among the Chinese sciences and introduces the intellectual shared common ground of Chinese philosophy and Chinese medicine, including shared theories of qi, yin-yang and “Five Agents” (wuxing) and their use in analogies between the human body and the state and cosmos, including the development of a systematic medical theory of the body. Section Two introduces the important medical contributions of “nurturing life” (yang sheng) traditions. Section Three takes up what has been represented as a long shared history of Daoism and medicine in the works of three great Daoist physicians. Section Four returns to the views of Zhang Xichun and his claims for an explicit link between Chinese Medicine and Chinese Philosophy.

1. Introduction: Shared Intellectual Contexts

Before addressing connections between Chinese philosophy and Chinese medicine it is necessary to make two clarifications on the meaning of the term Chinese medicine. Chinese medicine could in principle refer to: (1) the full range of medical systems used in contemporary China, including Western biomedicine; (2) the traditional indigenous Chinese medicine that is conventionally referred to as Traditional Chinese Medicine (TCM); and (3) other indigenous medical systems, distinct from but TCM, practiced by non-Chinese or minorities who live in areas that historically were part of China or are now part of the Peoples Republic of China, for example, Korean and Tibetan medicine. For purposes of this essay I use the term Chinese medicine only to refer to TCM, but including issues of the integration of TCM and Western medicine. Second, Chinese medicine, in the sense of TCM just discussed, includes a wider range of practices than does Western medicine. In particular it includes: (1) “medicine” in its conventional sense of practices that cure or prevent disease, treat disease and injury and assist in childbirth, etc.; (2) a range of practice to prevent disease in the broadest sense by maintaining health, including practices associated with the martial arts such as Taijiquan (also known as T’ai chi); and (3) a range of practices that extend health by seeking longevity. In particular, a clear account of Chinese medicine cannot confine itself to the first of these only.

Within a Chinese historical context, medicine (yi 醫) was one of several qualitative sciences. It included “nurturing life” (yang sheng 養生), a broad category that comprised a wide range of self-cultivation techniques. In later periods, medicine also included materia medica (bencao 本草) and internal (nei dan 內丹) and external (wai dan 外丹) alchemy. The early Chinese qualitative and quantitative sciences were specific, with no unified notion of science (Sivin 1982 and 1990).

Secondly, medical works, like other scientific works, were classified as technical specialties, distinct from generalist works, including the “Masters” texts associated with Chinese philosophy (Raphals 2008–2009, forthcoming). Medicine and its related disciplines appear in the last section of the Bibliographic Treatise (chapter 30) of the Standard History of the Han Dynasty (Han shu). This Treatise consists of six sections. The first two (“Six Classics” and “Masters”) contain philosophical works. The last two are technical: “Numbers and Techniques” (Shu shu 數術), and “Recipes and Methods” (Fang ji 方技). The latter includes works on medicine and longevity, including the categories of medical classics (yi jing 醫經), classical recipes (jing fang 經方), sexual arts (fang zhong 房中, also referred to as “arts of the bedchamber”), and immortality practices (shen xian 神仙). These chapters reflect the concerns and expertise of the technical and ritual specialists closely associated with the “Recipe Masters” (fang shi 方士) associated with the Han court. But their concerns also appear in early philosophical texts to such an extent that any separation of their philosophical from their religious and technical content is arbitrary and artificial (Harper 1998 and 1999; Kalinowski 2004).

Nonetheless, Chinese philosophy and Chinese medicine shared important intellectual contexts in their early development. The origins of science in China seem to lie in an amalgam of ideas from both philosophers and technical specialists, including physicians. According to Sivin (1988 and 1990) the basic Chinese sciences were established some time between the first century BCE and the first century CE through what he describes as a combination of Ru (“Confucian”) ideas and ideas from technical specialists, especially experts in yin-yang, Five Agents (wu xing) 五行, henceforward wuxing and technical expertise traditions associated with “Numbers and Techniques” (Shu shu) and “Recipes and Methods” (Fang ji, mentioned above).

Key to this amalgam were several concepts shared by both groups but deployed in very different ways. Early medical – and cosmological – thinking depicts a cosmos ultimately composed of qi 氣 (the energy that constitutes and organizes matter and causes growth and change) in processes of constant change, based on the interactions of yin and yang 陰陽 and the “Five Agents” or “Five Powers” (wuxing. See Graham 1986, Raphals 1998 and 2013).

Philosophers deployed these ideas in (1) the yin-yang cosmology of the Book of Changes or Yi jing, (2) theories of correlative correspondence between heaven, earth and humanity as a shared representation of cosmic order, and (3) the idea of a “classic” or “canon” as the founding text of a textual lineage. The authors of the first medical classic, the Yellow Emperor’s Classic of Internal Medicine (Huang Di neijing), also deployed these concepts, in particular in models of the human body as a yin-yang and Five Agent microcosm of the cosmos.

Finally, physicians and philosophers created textual lineages and accounts of textual authority. The most important medical works of this kind are the Yellow Emperor’s Classic of Internal Medicine and the Materia Medica of Shen Nong (Shen Nong bencao), ascribed to the “Divine Husbandmen” Shen Nong, who, according to legend, tested hundred of herbs and plants to ascertain their curative properties. By contrast, the evidence of recently excavated texts indicates that the Huang Di neijing derived from prior textual traditions that were subsequently lost (Harper 1998) and that the extant version is a composite of several earlier texts (Keegan 1988, Unschuld 2003, Unschuld and Tessenow 2011, Yamada 1979).

1.1 Yin-yang, Qi and Wuxing

Theories of qi and yin and yang also are importantly pursued in early philosophical works. Several Warring States texts contain references to the nature of qi, yin and yang, and their relation to health and longevity. The Zhuangzi clearly identifies qi as the basis of the physical constitution of the body: “Human birth is caused by the gathering together of qi” (22, 733, misleadingly translated by Watson (2013, 180) as “purity”). The Zhuangzi also describes harmonizing or taking charge of the six qi.

The qi of heaven is not in harmony, the qi of earth is tangled and snarled. The six qi are maladjusted, the four seasons are disordered. Now I want to harmonize the essences of the six qi in order to nurture life (Zhuangzi 11, 386, emphasis added, cf. Watson 2013, 80).

Similarly, the Springs and Autumns of Master Lü (Lüshi chunqiu) describes sages as making their numinous essences (jing shen 精神) tranquil, and preserving and increasing their longevity (3.2, pp. 3b-4a, trans. Knoblock and Riegel 2000, 3/2.1, 99).

In all these texts a sage or numinous person achieves that status through both meta-physical and physical means. This is the focus of Daoist “Nurturing Life” techniques (discussed in section 2).

We find a different account of these concepts in technical works. The apocryphal “founder” of scientific thought in China was Zou Yan 鄒衍 (305–240 BCE), who is credited with combining and systematizing yin-yang and wuxing theory. No works attributed to him survive. Sima Qian’s biography in Shi ji 76 describes him as a member of the Jixia 稷下 Academy, originally from the state of Qi in present day Shandong (Needham 1956: 231–34). By contrast, the Han shu describes him as a Recipe Master (fang shi). This is important because of the connection between fang shi and medicine.

Fang shi practiced medicine and divination and claimed to possess secret texts and formulae. They gained great influence during the earlier part of the Han dynasty, though their influence waned by the later Han. The fang shi used yin-yang and Five Agents cosmology. They seem to have originated from the Shandong peninsula, and were particularly associated with the mantic arts, including the use of the sexagenary cycle of stems and branches, the Yi jing, and divination by stars, dreams, physiognomy, the winds, and by the use of pitch pipes (Ngo 1976).

1.2 Body, State and Cosmos

It is almost impossible to separate Chinese ideas of body, state, cosmos from concepts of “nature,” though, as Nathan Sivin points out, there is no indigenous Chinese term for “nature” before the nineteenth century. Over the course of the last three centuries BCE, Chinese understandings of the physical world developed to reflect, and mirror, political consolidation (Sivin 1995, 2007). These new ideas of cosmic order—correspondence between microcosm (the body) and macrocosm (the cosmos)—appeared in new representations of the body, the state, and the cosmos that were based on systematic applications and correlations of the ideas of yin-yang and wuxing. They are prominent in Warring States politico-philosophical writings such as the Springs and Autumns of Master Lü (Lü Shi chunqiu) of Lü Buwei (291?-235 BCE) and the Luxuriant Dew of the Springs and Autumns (Chunqiu fanlü), attributed to Dong Zhongshu (179–104 BCE).

Theories of qi, yin-yang and wuxing also inform medical works. New systematic medical theories based on these ideas were systematized in a cosmological framework in the Huang Di neijing, a complex and multi-layered text, probably compiled in the first century BCE (Keegan 1988, Unschuld 2003, Yamada 1979). It presents a systematic cosmology that analogizes the body, the state, and the cosmos in systems of “correlative cosmology” (Graham 1986b, Sivin 1995, Lloyd and Sivin 2002). It describes relations and analogies between the body (including the emotions), the state and the cosmos in terms of yin-yang and wuxing. For example, the Huang Di neijing describes correspondence between the articulations of the body and the cosmos, specifically between heaven and earth and the upper and lower parts of the body:

Heaven is round, earth is square; people’s heads are round, their feet are square and thereby correspond to them. Heaven has the sun and moon, people have two eyes; Earth has nine regions, people have nine orifices. Heaven has wind and rain, people have joy and anger; Heaven has thunder and lightning, people have the notes and sounds. Heaven has four seasons, people have four limbs. Heaven has five tones, people have the five depots; Heaven has six pitches, people have six palaces. Heaven has winter and summer, people have cold and hot [ailments]. Heaven has ten days, people have the hands’ ten fingers … Heaven has yin and yang; people have man and wife. The year has 365 days; the body has 360 joints (Huang Di neijing ling shu 71.2, 446, cf. Wong Ming 1987, 336–338 (French). There is no good English translation of this text.).

Theories of yin-yang, qi and wuxing also inform Warring States and Han astrocalendrics, observational astronomy and the study of astronomical portents, and in the so-called “correlative cosmologies” of many Han dynasty texts.

2. Nurturing Life (yang sheng)

Several Warring States texts express the need to preserve one’s person, self, or essential nature:

Therefore the sage puts his person last and it comes first, Treats it as extraneous and it is preserved. (Daode jing, chap. 7)

One way to do this was to maintain health by nurturing life (yang sheng), an area of common ground for speculative thinkers and practitioners of traditional medical arts. The term yang sheng first appears in the Zhuangzi and then throughout a range of second (BCE) century medical literature.

The third chapter of the Zhuangzi is titled “The Lord of Nurturing Life” (Yang sheng zhu 養生主). In it, the expert butcher Pao Ding instructs Duke Hui of Liang. Pao Ding describes the process of mastering his skill. His method is initially analytic; he begins by studying oxen as wholes, next as parts, and finally with faculties beyond ordinary vision. This discourse is presented as an instruction to the Lord Wenhui, who ends by saying that: “Pao Ding has taught me how to nurture life” (yang sheng, Zhuangzi 3, 124, cf. Watson 2013, 20).

Another passage in the Outer Chapters refers to some of these exercises. It contrasts “real sages” who follow the way of heaven and earth with (among others) practitioners of “nurturing life” traditions who:

blow out, breathe in, old out, new in, dormant like the bear, neck-stretched like the bird, their only care for longevity; these are the practitioners of “guide-and-pull” [dao yin 導引] and “nourishing the body” [yang xing 養形] who desire the longevity of Pengzu (Zhuangzi 15, 535, cf. Watson 2013, 119).

The passage continues. Real sages:

cultivate [their persons] without benevolence and righteousness, govern without merit or fame, are at ease without needing rivers and seas, attain longevity without “guiding and pulling,” forget everything but lack for nothing, placid without limit, things of value follow upon them (ch. 15, 537, cf. Graham 1986a, 265; Watson 2013, 119).

Since the whole point of the Zhuangzi passage is to oppose “guiding and pulling” and other longevity techniques to true sagehood, it does not dwell on their details. We can get a better idea of what he might have been talking about from other sources. Some of these ideas are elaborated in a chapter of the Guanzi titled “Inner Cultivation” (Nei ye), which describes the cultivation of qi, as well as vital essence (jing), and spirit (shen). It describes Dao as literally pervading the body or the person of a sage:

So long as the wellspring is not exhausted,
The passages of the nine apertures will remain clear.
Thus it is possible to explore the limits of Heaven and Earth, and cover the four seas. (Guanzi 16.3a8–3b1; trans. Rickett 1998, 48).

The Zhuangzi and other texts refer to the figure of the spirit person or shen ren 神人 as someone who has effectively transformed the physical body and the qi that constitutes it. The Zhuangzi describes spirit person of Guye, who concentrates his spirit (shen), avoids the five grains, rides the clouds, and, through the concentration of his shen protects others against sicknesses and epidemics and makes the harvest ripen (Zhuangzi 1, 28; cf. Graham, 1986a, 46). This passage suggests that a sage can have a nurturing effect on the world by acting at a distance, possibly as an unintended by-product of self-cultivation practices.

Other passages in the Zhuangzi extol the abilities of specialized craftsmen who possess highly technical skills. These stories liken mastery of the Way to mastery of a craft. They also emphasize the technical skills of commoners. Commoners, rather than rulers, are presented as sage-like figures. These technical experts include arrow makers, bell-stand carvers, boatmen, butchers, cicada catchers, potters, sword makers, and wheelwrights (Raphals 2005). It is curious that these passages never include physicians.

In the Han dynasty, “nurturing life” techniques became a major concern of the Recipe Masters (fang shi) of the Han court (Ngo 1976). Texts on nurturing life include methods for absorbing and circulating qi in the body—for example, breathing and meditation exercises, diet, drugs and sexual techniques.

Medical and mantic texts excavated from tombs make it clear that a wide range of longevity techniques had been developed before the Han dynasty (Harper 1998, 33). Most important is a corpus of medical manuscripts excavated from Mawangdui 馬王堆 (Changsha, Hubei), dated to 169 BCE. This tomb is best known for its two versions of the Daode jing, but it is meaningful to locate those texts among other texts of a scientific provenance found in the tomb (Harper 1998 and 2000, Ma Jixing 1992, Zhou Yimou 1994, Zhou Yimou and Xiao Zuotai 1987).

Six of the medical manuscripts are concerned with nurturing life in various ways. “Harmonizing Yin and Yang” (He yin yang 合陰陽) and “Discussion of the Realized Way of All Under Heaven” (Tianxia zhi dao tan 天下至道談) are concerned with sexual cultivation. They refer to the movements and postures of animals as whole-body metaphors for sexual techniques. An example is the description of ten postures in “Harmonizing Yin and Yang”:

The ten postures: the first is “tiger roving”; the second is “cicada clinging”; the third is “measuring worm”; the fourth is “river deer butting”; the fifth is “locust splayed”; the sixth is “gibbon grabbing”; the seventh is “toad”; the eighth is “rabbit bolting”; the ninth is “dragonfly”; the tenth is “fish gobbling.” (Harper 1998, 418)

These texts emphasize that sexual activity is a natural process, but one that must be regulated. As the “Realized Way of All Under Heaven” puts it, people know by nature how to breathe and how to eat, but everything else is a matter of learning and habit. “What assists life is eating; what injures life is lust. Therefore the sage when conjoining male and female invariably possesses a model” (Zhou and Xiao 1989, 431; Harper 1998, 432).

“Recipes for Nurturing Life” (Yang sheng fang 養生方) consists of eighty-seven recipes, including food, drugs, and beverages, along with several sexual cultivation exercises. “Eliminating Grain and Eating Vapor” (Que gu shi qi 卻榖食氣) specifies diet and breathing exercises to be performed in the morning and evening, and a seasonal regimen of breath cultivation through consuming six qi and avoiding another five (Harper 1998, 25–30). Another text, the “Ten Questions” (Shi wen 十問) gives advice on techniques for nurturing life (Harper 1998, 22–30), for example:

Yao asked Shun: “In Under-heaven what is most valuable?”

Shun replied: “Life is most valuable.”

Yao said: “How can life be cultivated?” Shun said: “Investigate yin and yang.” (Zhou Yimou and Xiao Zuotao 1989, 379; Harper 1998, 399)

Finally, the “Drawings of Guiding and Pulling” (Daoyin tu 導引圖) is a series of forty-four drawings of human figures performing exercises, some with captions. Some are described in another excavated text from tomb no. 247, Zhangjiashan 張家山 (Jiangling, Hubei). The “Pulling Book” (Yin shu 引書) from Zhangjiashan describes exercises that refer to or are named after animals, including inchworms, snakes, mantises, wild ducks, owls, tigers, chickens, bears, frogs, deer, and dragons. Both exemplify a tradition of exercise for both therapy and health known as daoyin (pulling and guiding).

The “yang sheng culture” of these texts emphasized control over physiological and mental processes, both understood as self-cultivation, through the transformation of qi. “Self-cultivation” in this context included moral excellence, health, and longevity (V. Lo 2001).

We can get a broader notion of what these techniques were like if we turn to the list of titles from the “Recipes and Methods” section of the Han shu Bibliographic Treatise, mentioned above. One of the few extant texts it lists is the Huang Di neijing, along with the titles of lost medical works on nurturing life, health, and longevity. The “Classical Recipes” (jing fang) section includes titles such as “Recipes for Married Women and Infants” (Furen ying er fang 婦人嬰兒方) and “Food Prohibitions of Shen Nong and Huang Di” (Shen Nong Huang Di shi jin 神農黃帝食禁). The sexual arts section includes “Recipes of Huang Di and the Three Sage-Kings for Nurturing Yang” (Huang Di san wang yang yang fang 黃帝三王養陽方) and “Inner Chamber Recipes of the Three Schools for Having Children” (San jia nei ju you zi fang 三家內房有子方). Other sections describe physical exercises and therapeutic techniques, such as the “Stepping and Pulling Book of Huang Di and Other Masters” (Huang Di za zi bu yin 黃帝雜子步引 (Han shu 30, 1778–79).

Another medical text from Mawangdui is a recipe (fang 方) manual titled Recipes for Fifty-Two Ailments (Wushier bing fang 五十二病方, translated and discussed in Harper 1998). Recipe texts also have been excavated from Zhangjiashan (Li Ling 1993 and 2000). In addition, the Mawangdui tombs also contained hexagram divination texts and charts and diagrams on cloud divination and physiognomy, including the oldest known representation of a comet (Li Ling 1993).

In summary, most of these texts can be described as part of a yang sheng culture, which offered and emphasized control over physiological processes of the body and mind that were understood as transformations of qi. What is the relation of these detailed technical texts to philosophy? These technical arts form a continuum with philosophy because their transformations were understood as self-cultivation in the coterminous senses of moral excellence, health, and longevity (rather than medical pathology), and physiological transformation through the manipulation of qi (V. Lo 2001).

Mark Csikszentmihalyi (2004) describes them as part of an “embodied virtue” tradition of self-cultivation practices. They structured much of early Daoist philosophy and medical theory, and also had profound effects on early Chinese ethics and metaphysics (V. Lo 2005). Such “material virtue” traditions held that the body-mind was constructed of qi and that embodied self-cultivation practices could transform qi. These views informed Warring States accounts of dietary practices, exercise regimens, breath meditation, sexual cultivation techniques, and other technical traditions associated with fang shi. Material virtue traditions also had important links with Daoist texts, southern schools, and the “moralization” of health in traditions that culminated in the Huang Di neijing. Accounts of these practices appear in passing in the texts of the received tradition. Many more come from texts excavated from tombs.

3. Daoist Medical Traditions and Physicians

3.1 Ge Hong

Ge Hong 葛洪 (283–343 or 363 CE, a physician and Daoist from of the Eastern Jin (317–420 CE), was the first of several explicitly Daoist physicians to write about the practice of alchemy. He was the author of the Teachings of the Master Who Embraces Simplicity (Baopuzi 抱樸子). The Baopuzi consists of seventy chapters (pian 篇): twenty “Inner Chapters” (Baopuzi neipian 抱樸子内篇) and fifty “Outer Chapters” (Baopuzi waipian 抱樸子外篇). The two were effectively different books that were not combined under one title until a thousand years after Ge Hong’s time (Sivin1969, 389. For a partial translation of the waipian see Sailey 1978). Ge Hong was also the author of the Collected Life Stories of Immortals (Shen xian zhuan 神仙傳, trans. Campany 2002) and Biographies of Recluses (Yin yi zhuan 隱逸傳).

According to his autobiography (Baopuzi waipian, ch. 50; Sailey 1978, 242–272; Ware (1966, 6–21), in his youth he studied the Confucian classics, but at the same time, became interested in quasi-medical techniques for nourishing the body with the goal of achieving immortality. He became a student of the alchemical master Zheng Yin 鄭隱 (c.215-c.302 CE), and remained his disciple for some fifteen years. After brief success, he abandoned a military career to go to the capital at Luoyang to search for books on immortals. After difficulties during the political unrest in the south, Ge Hong entirely gave up political life and devoted himself to immortality practices. In 316 he returned to the north and was named a marquis by the Eastern Jin court and took up an administrative post. On learning that cinnabar had been discovered in the south (in present day North Vietnam), he secured a position as magistrate in the south in Guangxi, where he settled at Mt. Luofu 羅浮 and began the study of alchemy, remaining there until his death (Sailey 1978, 277–78; Ware 1981; Wells 2003).

Ge Hong was the first to systematically describe the history and theory of Daoist immortality techniques such as “preserving unity” (shou yi 守一), circulating energy (xing qi 行氣), “guiding and pulling” (dao yin), and sexual longevity techniques (fang zhong房中, Baopuzi neipian, ch. 2; Lai Chi-tim 1998, 203-204). But his accounts of these techniques clearly reflect an interest in self-cultivation according to broadly Confucian principles. For example, he considered moral self-cultivation a precondition for the search for immortality; self-cultivation included such Confucian virtues as benevolence (ren), trustworthiness (xin), loyalty (zhong) and filiality (xiao). Ge Hong criticized Daoist “pure conversation” (qing tan) and emphasized the importance of both moral virtue and Daoist study. His specifically Daoist writings emphasize the importance of both “mystery” (xuan 玄) and emptiness (xu 虛), and all-embracing unity, which the Daoist must actively preserve by meditation practices, techniques of “preserving the essence” (bao jing 保精) and consuming medicinal herbs (fu yao 服藥).

As an alchemist, Ge Hong experimented with drugs and minerals. The “Gold Elixir” (Jin dan 金丹) and “Yellow and White” (Huang bai 黄白) chapters of the Baopuzi neipian survey the history of alchemy and describe in detail a method for “alloying cinnabar,” quoting from ancient recipes and “cinnabar methods.” The “Immortal Herbs” (Xian yao 仙藥) chapter gives information on medical herbs (Gao 1996, Qing 1994, Theobald 2013).

Although Robinet (1997) insists that Ge Hong was only interested in pharmacology as an adjunct to alchemy, the Baopuzi also includes important material on medicine and pharmacology. Other pharmacological treatises attributed to him are no longer extant: Prescriptions for Rescuing the Dying after the Pulse-taking (Zhou hou jiu zu Fang 肘後救卒方), Prescriptions from the Jade Box (玉函方 Yu han fang), Herbal Recipes from the Gold Cabinet (Jin gui yaofang 金匱藥方), and Prescriptions for Emergencies after Taking the Pulses (Zhou hou bei ji fang 肘后備急方), which is said to be the first Chinese text to mention smallpox (tian hua bing 天花病). Thirteen texts attributed to Ge Hong are preserved in the Daoist Canon (Dao zang 道藏), but most are probably later works (Robinet 1997, 78–113, Theobald 2013).

In summary, Ge Hong’s writings combine interests in Confucian ethics, Daoist self-cultivation and alchemical techniques, and the details of medicine and pharmacology.

3.2 Tao Hongjing

Tao Hongjing陶弘景 (456–536) was the effective founder of Shangqing 上清 (Highest Clarity) Daoism. He held several court positions under the Liu Song and Qi dynasties. In 492 he retired to Mount Mao (Maoshan 茅山), where he became interested in the so-called Shangqing revelations to Yang Xi a century before his time. He set himself to collect and edit the original manuscripts connected with these revelations. The result was the Declarations of the Perfected (Zhen gao 真誥). When the Liang dynasty came to power in 502, he joined the court of Emperor Wu (r. 502–549), on whom he had considerable influence.

Tao was educated in Daoist traditions associated with the Daode jing, Zhuangzi, and the works of Ge Hong; and was initiated in the Linbao school at the age of thirty. He was also actively engaged in mostly unsuccessful attempts to produce alchemical elixirs (Strickman 1979, 152).

Tao’s father and grandfather were experts in medicinal drugs, and he shared their interests in materia medica and medicine. Shortly after compiling the Zhen gao he wrote a major work of pharmacology: the Collected Commentaries to the Canonical Pharmacopoeia (Bencao jing jizhu 本草經集注), a commentary and re-edition of the Shen Nong bencao, a Han work of pharmacology attributed to Shen Nong, the legendary inventor of materia medica. Tao doubled the account of 365 drugs in the original and also rearranged the material (502–557), (Predagio 2013, 968–71; Robinet 1993; Strickman 1979).

Tao Hongjing is thus another clear case of overlapping interests between philosophy and medicine. His interests clearly included Daoist philosophy and practice, medicine, pharmacology and alchemy.

3.3 Sun Simiao

Sun Simiao 孫思邈 (581–682) was the author of two major works on medical practice and a work on Daoist longevity prescriptions. He has been worshiped as the “Medicine Buddha,” and as the “King of Medicine” (yao wang). Sun is said to have taken up medicine to strengthen his own health after childhood illnesses. He also treated relatives and neighbors, and practiced medicine near the Tang capital of Chang’an. He also traveled widely to learn new prescription recipes. After completing his first book, he lived in seclusion on Mt. Wubai (Wubai shan, later known, after him, as Yao wang Shan), where he followed Daoist principles. He refused several official positions at the Sui and Tang courts, preferring to treat ordinary people in the countryside.

His biography (in both of the two Standard Histories of the Tang Dynasty, trans. Sivin 1968, 81–144) emphasizes his interests in philosophy, noting his particular study of the Yi jing, Daode jing, works concerned with yin-yang theory, and shu shu numerical calculations. His work reflected these interests in yin-yang and wuxing theory and macrocosm-microcosm correspondences between the body and cosmos. He is also the first Chinese physician to write extensively on medical ethics.

Sun Simiao is the author of two major medical works. Prescriptions Worth a Thousand Gold (Qian jin fang 千金方, printed in 652 CE) was a comprehensive treatise on the practice of medicine in thirty chapters. It contained herbal remedies and reviewed the history of medicine since the Han Dynasty, starting with the Huang Di neijing.

The introduction to the Qianjin fang (ch. 1) describes the characteristics of a great physician and describes inappropriate conduct, especially the desire for wealth or reputation. According to Sun, a great physician should not pay attention to status, wealth or age; he should not care whether a person is attractive, a friend or enemy, or whether the person is (Han) Chinese or educated. He should meet everyone on equal grounds and should always act as if he were thinking of a close relative (ch.1. For translation see Unschuld 1979, 29–33).

The Qian jin fang also includes chapters on diet (ch. 26), nurturing life (yang xing, ch. 27), pulse diagnosis (ch. 28), acumoxa (chs. 29–30, the combination of acupuncture and moxibustion), massage, and exercise. His interests also included the treatment of women (ch. 2–4) and children (ch. 5). May chapters are concerned with herbal recipes. Sun Simiao emphasized that the effectiveness of herbal recipes depended on correct identification and preparation, including gathering herbs at the right time and drying them correctly. His formulas came from both famous physicians of the past and his own contemporaries, including minorities and foreigners. He also edited formulas to eliminate non-essential ingredients.

The second book is a supplement to the first. The supplement (Qian jin yi fang 千金翼方, printed in 682) records some thirty years of Sun’s own experience with special attention to folk remedies. It adds some eight hundred recipes, with details on collection and preparation for two hundred. Some are new herbs, including herbs from India. It also refers to many mystical and magical practices, including exorcisms, talismans, incantations and descriptions of acumoxa points effective against demons.

Sun was also the author of several works on Daoist alchemy, which he is believed to have practiced (he died at the age of 101). These include the Essential Instructions from the Scripture of the Elixirs of Great Clarity (Taiqing Danjing Yaojue, ca. 640), an anthology of some thirty selected methods (Sivin 1968, 262–264). His “Essay on Preserving and Nourishing Life” (Sheyang lun 攝養論) gives monthly advice on food, sleeping habits and action of good and ill auspice (Predagio 2013,928).

In summary, Sun Simiao, like Ge Hong and Tao Honjing combines explicit interests in Daoist philosophy, medicine, materia medica and alchemy. These physicians were informed by the yin-yang theory and cosmology of the Yi jing and the philosophical concepts of the Zhuangzi and Daode jing. But, despite their strong philosophical interests, the major contributions of their writings lie in the areas of medicine, pharmacology and alchemy.

4. Zhang Xichun on Chinese Philosophy and Chinese Medicine

The views of the physician Zhang Xichun (1860–1933) provide an important testimony to the complex relations between Chinese medicine and Chinese philosophy. Zhang’s life coincided with the transition of China from the Qing dynasty to the modern era, a period in which major Chinese intellectuals were preoccupied by questions of the relative merits of indigenous philosophical and scientific traditions as compared to foreign knowledge, especially of science and medicine.

The medical context for these debates was the differences between Chinese and Western medicine, and the best role for traditional Chinese medicine in modern times. Zhang was a major contributor to these debates. Zhang Xichun was trained by his father in traditional medicine from youth, but he was also educated in the classics of Chinese philosophy. He became a leading proponent of the “school of converging and connecting” Chinese and Western medicine (hui tong xue pai 匯衕學派. For the life of Zhang Xichun see Scheid 1995, 5–6).

Zhang’s book contains an essay explicitly titled “Concerning The Relation of Philosophy and Medicine.” It is so central to the topic of this essay that it is worth quoting at length. Zhang begins by remarking that recent (Chinese) medical journals accuse traditional Chinese philosophy of holding back the progress of medicine. He responds: “their authors do not understand the use of philosophy, nor do they understand that philosophy is actually the basis of medicine.” He quotes a passage from the Book of Songs (Shi jing) says: “he is intelligent and wise, and protects his own person” (Shi jing, “Zheng min” 烝民, Mao 260). The passage refers to a certain Zhong Shanfu 仲山甫, a virtuous minister of King Xuan of Zhou (r. 827–782 BCE). The point is that “protecting one’s person means not only protecting oneself from attach by thieves or robbers but also protecting one’s person from being beset by disease and illness. But, Zhang continues, the point of the quotation is that people must possess an inherent aptitude for intelligence and wisdom. They must also make a systematic study of wisdom and virtue, and only then can we protect our persons.

He next identifies the combination of inherent aptitude and systematic study behind ”being intelligent and wise and protecting one’s own person“ with what the recluse-hermits of antiquity called ”the dao of nurturing life (yang sheng zhi dao 養生之道). In his view, the nurturing life (yang sheng) practices of antiquity are what we now call philosophy.

He goes on to argue that those who had the benevolent disposition of a junzi and themselves understood nurturing life practices wanted to enable others to be able to nurture their own lives. However, for people who do not use understanding and wisdom to protect their persons, the way of nurturing life was not sufficient, and they themselves could not help falling ill: “therefore they promulgated the principles of philosophy and originated the disciplines of medicine and pharmacology (materia medica) in order to offer assistance to those who themselves were unable to engage in nurturing life practices.”

He then goes on to identify specific physicians with this derivation of medicine from philosophy, including Ge Hong, Tao Hongjing and Sun Simiao. All these great physicians, he argues, were really philosophers who wrote important philosophical works.

He then turns to the Huang Di neijing, which begins with a chapter titled “Discourse on the True [Qi Endowed by] Heaven in High Antiquity” (Shang Gu Tian Zhen Lun). It says: “In highest antiquity there were true men (zhen ren) who upheld [the patterns of] heaven and earth and grasped yin and yang, exhaled and inhaled essence qi (jing qi), stood alone and guarded their spirit (shen), and their muscles and flesh were like one, and thus they were able to achieve longevity in correspondence with heaven and earth” (Huang Di neijing 1, trans. after Unschuld 2011, 42).

Zhang argues that, according to the neijing, these realized persons were able to use these techniques to transform their temperament and disposition and to achieved achieve an infinite life expectancy. He thus identifies a clear link from the realized persons of high antiquity to the great schools of Chinese philosophy through the methods and theories attributed to the Yellow Emperor.

His point is that, although the neijing is an exposition of medicine: “it necessarily begins with philosophy and takes philosophy as the study of how to safeguard one’s person. People must first be able themselves to protect their own persons; only then can they represent to others how to protect their persons. Taking philosophy as the way to protect one’s person, it is by means of the principles of philosophy that we are able to preserve our bodies by transforming our qi. Taking medicine is the way to protect other people’s bodies, it is by first completely understanding the transformation of qi in one’s own person that [the physician] is able to represent to others how to adjust the transformation of qi in their own bodies.” He concludes: “from this we understand that philosophy is the true source of medicine, or rather that medicine is the natural outcome of philosophy. This is why the Neijing states explicitly that the study of medicine must start from philosophy.” How, he concludes, could philosophy obstruct medicine? (Zhang Xichun 1918–1934, 296–98).

5. Conclusion

In conclusion, this brief account addresses important issues in the connections between Chinese philosophy and the development of Chinese medicine. Philosophical texts clearly influenced medicine in several ways. First, both are grounded in theories of qi, yin-yang and wuxing and microcosm-macrocosm analogies based on them. However, as in the case of science more generally, philosophical textualists emerged as a distinct social group from the fang shi, especially. Nonetheless, we can trace philosophical concerns in several areas of medical interest, especially the ongoing history of “nurturing life” (yang sheng) practices, first described in philosophical texts but elaborated in great and practical detail by physicians and alchemists such as Ge Hong, Tao Hongjing and Sun Simiao. This linkage is made explicit by one of the greatest of China’s twentieth-century physicians and medical reformers, Zhang Xichun, who unequivocally describes philosophy as the basis of medicine.


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