Science and Chinese Philosophy

First published Tue Apr 28, 2015; substantive revision Wed Oct 7, 2020

At first glance, there may appear to be little connection between Chinese philosophy and science. Stereotypes of Chinese philosophy as consisting almost entirely of Confucianism and claims that Confucians were not interested in science add to this perception.

For example, in a recent correspondence in the journal Nature, Peng Gong, a research scientist at Tsinghua University and the University of California, Berkeley gives the following harsh assessment of the effect of Chinese philosophy on the development of science in China:

Two cultural genes have passed through generations of Chinese intellectuals for more than 2,000 years. The first is the thoughts of Confucius, who proposed that intellectuals should become loyal administrators. The second is the writings of Zhuang Zhou, who said that a harmonious society would come from isolating families so as to avoid exchange and conflict, and by shunning technology to avoid greed. Together, these cultures have encouraged small-scale and self-sufficient practices in Chinese society, but discouraged curiosity, commercialization and technology. They helped to produce a scientific void in Chinese society that persisted for millennia. And they continue to be relevant today (Gong 2012).

Is this a fair account? Is Chinese philosophy in some sense anti-science? Does it contribute to science in ways that constitute a “Chinese science” that is different from modern science. Or is the history of science in China part of a universal science?

This essay addresses relations between science and Chinese philosophy in several ways. It begins with a detailed argument by the influential historian of Chinese philosophy Fung Yu-lan almost one hundred years ago, claiming that there is no science in China because there is no need for any. The second section presents an opposing view from the history of science as presented by Joseph Needham and others, introducing a range of sciences that developed in China, with what might be called distinctive Chinese characteristics. The third section addresses the particular problem of Needham's representation of Chinese science as significantly Daoist.

The next two sections attempt to historicize and reconcile these two histories, one philosophical and one scientific, by turning to the intellectual and social contexts for the development of science in China. The fourth section focuses on concepts shared by the practitioners and texts of early philosophy and science. The fifth section turns to an intellectual divergence between generalist and technical specialist knowledge through the categorization of texts in a chapter of the dynastic history of the Han dynasty (Han shu). The sixth section takes up the social context of the practitioners of the early sciences and their relations to philosophical texts and traditions. The last section surveys the early sciences, with specific interest in areas of close relationship between the sciences and Chinese philosophy, especially in the areas of cosmology, astronomy, mathematics and medicine.

1. Fung Yu-lan's “Why China Has No Science”

In a paper titled “Why China Has No Science,” published in 1922, Fung Yu-lan [Feng Youlan] 馮友蘭 (1895–1990), then a student of John Dewey, argued that: “what keeps China back is that she has no science,” but that: “China has no science, because according to her own standard of value she does not need any.”(1922, 237 and 238). To make this argument, he introduces what he calls two tendencies in Chinese philosophy, which he calls “nature” and “art” or “human,” referring to the products of human artifice. On his account, the Warring States period (475–221 BCE) developed two philosophies, Daoism and Mohism respectively, which followed these two tendencies to extreme, and a third, Confucianism, which he represents as a compromise between them. On Fung's explanation, the Daoists considered nature perfect while the Mohists sought to improve on it (1922, 238–39). They valued utility above all else, and Fung considers them “scientific” in spirit, including their interest in logic and definition. Mohism, as he puts it, stood for art as over against nature (1922, 244–50). He does not explain how his “Confucianism” is a compromise between these two extremes, all the more so since he distinguishes the “nature” oriented Confucianism of Mencius (372–289 BCE) from the “art”-oriented Confucianism of Xunzi (313-238 BCE), who aspired to conquer nature instead of returning to it: “It is better to treat nature as a thing and regulate it than to consider it very great and always think of it. It is better to control nature and use it than to follow and admire it.” This, Fung remarks, is nearly the same as the Baconian conception of power (1922, 256, quoting from an unspecified passage in the “Discourse on Heaven” (Tian lun) chapter of the Xunzi. For a study of this chapter see Machle 1993).

Fung goes on to argue that, after the Qin dynasty (221–206 BCE) the “art” or scientific tendency within Chinese philosophy all but disappeared. Buddhism, like Daoism, was an extreme “nature” philosophy, and the interactions of Daoism, Buddhism and Confucianism did not produce interest in the understanding of the natural world. In the tenth century CE the Song Neo-Confucians combined Daoist, Confucian and Buddhist teachings into a new philosophy that has persisted to the present. According to the “Great Learning” (Da xue), the ancients who wished to enlighten their bright virtue “investigated things”:

Wishing to be sincere in their thoughts, they first extended to the utmost their knowledge. Such extension of knowledge lay in the investigation of things (zhi zhi zai ge wu 致知在格物). Things being investigated, knowledge became complete (Da xue, 412).

But Neo-Confucian philosophers disagreed about what “things” to investigate. Some took “things” as external, but did not pursue the investigation of the empirical world. The other, prevailing view took “things” to refer to the mind. Fung points out that the Song dynasty (960–1279) corresponded to the period of the development of modern science in Europe, but Europeans developed techniques for understanding and controlling matter, while the Chinese Neo-Confucians developed techniques for understanding and controlling mind (1922, 256–58).

The point of this discussion of Fung's study is his argument that, ever since the disappearance of the “nature” tendency, Chinese philosophy has devoted itself to the cultivation of the mind (xin 心), at the expense of any interest in, or need for, science, or any inquiry into nature. (Because the meaning of xin – “mind,” or more properly “heart-mind” – is much broader than the English term mind, cultivating it refers to a much broader kind of cognitive, intellectual, physical and spiritual cultivation than the phrase “cultivation of the mind” suggests.) By contrast, he argues, the ancestors of modern European philosophy had two “uses” for science: according to Descartes, it provided certainty; according to Bacon, it offered power. But, Fung argues, China did not discover the scientific method because Chinese thought started from the mind, and did not require proof or logical or empirical demonstration. Instead, Chinese philosophers preferred the certainty of perception, and thus: “would not, and did not translate their concrete vision into the form of science. In one word China has no science, because of all philosophies the Chinese philosophy is the most human and the most practical” (1922, 260). Fung concludes: “it is because of the fact that the Chinese ideal prefers enjoyment to power that China has no need of science, even though science, according to Bacon, is for power. The Chinese philosophers, as I said just now, had no need of scientific certainty, because it was themselves that they wished to know; so in the same way they had no need of the power of science, because it was themselves that they wished to conquer” (1922, 261).

In summary, although Fung Yu-lan's account of Warring States philosophy is open to question, he gives a compelling version of a type of claim for philosophical reasons why science did not develop in China. I now turn to the opposite argument that science did develop – and flourish – in both early China and the Song “Neo-Confucian” period.

2. Joseph Needham's History of Science in China

The question of the relation of Chinese philosophy and science is complicated by several factors. One is the need to define what we mean by science in the context of early China and early Chinese philosophy. This question includes the relationship of “science” to “technology,” as well as the question of what disciplines were considered sciences, and where they stood in indigenous hierarchies of knowledge.

These questions partake of an ongoing debate on the nature of Chinese science, which initially arose from the pioneering work of Joseph Needham. This debate focuses on the problematic question of why (or whether) the revolution that transformed scientific disciplines in Europe did not take place in China. It has tended to focus on the mathematization of science and on the activities of court astronomical officials (Needham 1956b, 1979). But these debates do little to clarify the relations between the origins and development of the sciences in China and Chinese philosophy.

This debate about the nature of Chinese science, which has been referred to as the “Needham problem,” has focused on variants on the important question of why (or whether) the scientific revolution that transformed scientific disciplines in Europe did not take place in China. In Needham's terms, the answers lie in the history of Chinese science itself, but Fung Yu-lan's argument provides an answer of a very different kind, which Needham would probably not entertain at all. (Although Needham's (1956b) own account of the history of Chinese philosophy and science repeatedly cites the scholarship of Fung Yu-lan, especially Fung 1983, he makes no mention of Fung 1922.)

Needham, himself an eminent embryologist (Needham 1931, 1934) was the primary author of the multi-volume ongoing Science and Civilisation in China (1954- ). His approach to the problem of the history of science in China was to try to fit the Chinese scientific tradition into the categories of twentieth-century western science. On the one hand, this approach enabled Needham and his collaborators to engage the wealth and variety of the many Chinese sciences from a perspective that took them seriously as contributors to an ongoing and universal history of science. This approach also allowed Needham's group to consistently and coherently refute “orientalist” claims or prima facie assumptions that science was the sole property of a European tradition extending backward in time to ancient Greece, with little or no influence from any other cultural tradition. On the other hand, Needham's “universalist” approach to the history of science in China has been rejected as anachronistic and culturally inappropriate (Yates 2003, 658).

As Nathan Sivin (1990 and 1995) has argued, Chinese accounts focused on specific sciences, rather than on one unified notion of science. These Chinese sciences were both quantitative and qualitative. Sivin (1982 and 1990) breaks down the quantitative sciences into three disciplines: mathematics (suan 算), mathematical harmonics or acoustics ( 律 or lü lü 律呂) and mathematical astronomy (li 歷 or li fa 歷法), considered related to harmonics. Sivin describes the qualitative sciences as: astronomy or astrology (tian wen 天文), medicine (yi 醫) and siting (feng shui 風水). Tian wen included the observation of celestial and meteorological events whose proper reading could be used to rectify the political order. Medicine included “Nurturing Life” (yang sheng 養生), a broad category that included a wide range of self-cultivation techniques with important philosophical implications. In later periods, medicine also included materia medica (ben cao 本草) and internal (nei dan 內丹) and external (wai dan 外丹) alchemy.

3. Chinese Science as “Daoist”?

The “Needham” problem overlaps, but is distinct from two other issues. One is the Chinese philosophical attitudes towards “nature.” Geoffrey Lloyd and Nathan Sivin (2002) note that “nature” was not a conceptual category in early China. Derk Bodde (1991) distinguished at least seven premodern Chinese attitudes toward what contemporary philosophy and science call nature, ranging from antagonistic and indifferent to wholly receptive. Nonetheless, Bodde – for slightly different reasons than Fung – argued that a wide range of obstacles hindered the development of science in China. These included: a written language ill adapted to the expression of scientific ideas, attitudes toward space and time that were out of step with the facts of nature (1991, 133), and the combined influence of an authoritarian imperial government, a conservative academic elite and a philosophical tradition preoccupied with morals and burdened by “organicist” thinking. Robin Yates (2003) has also noted the importance of the lack of an ex nihilo creator deity and the “non-privileged” status of humans in the cosmos of early Chinese philosophy. Humans were not distinct from other natural phenomena, and were part of a dao that was ultimately mysterious and incomprehensible.

The other is the topic of this essay: the problem of the specific engagement between science and early Chinese philosophy, and whether Chinese philosophy was in some way inimical to scientific inquiry. To answer the latter questions it is necessary to consider both the intellectual and social contexts of Chinese philosophy and Chinese science. Which sciences are relevant to Chinese philosophy? Using Sivin's categorization, the quantitative sciences are largely separate from the engagement between science and early Chinese philosophy. The greatest degree of engagement between philosophy and science comes from the qualitative sciences of astronomy (or astrology) and medicine.

How do we reconcile these two entirely different accounts, one by a Chinese philosopher and the other by several eminent historians of science in China? Part of the answer lies in clarifying several shared intellectual contexts for the origins of science in China, as well as several intellectual and social contexts that fostered their complete divergence, probably by the end of the Han dynasty (206 BCE-220 CE).

Chinese philosophy is often identified with “Confucianism,” understood to include both the teachings of the historical Confucius, his immediate intellectual descendants in the Warring States and Han periods, and later developments known as Neo-Confucianism in the Song, Ming and Qing dynasties and the present day. One source of this view is the explicit adoption of Confucian ideologies by the rulers of most but not all dynasties. Another is the intellectual sympathies of many generations of Chinese commentators, and also of particularly Anglophone Sinologists who have tended to focus on Confucian philosophies. Confucian philosophers – as distinct from rulers of a broadly Confucian persuasion – were often portrayed as humanists in the sense that they were more interested in problems of ethics and society than in the investigation of the natural world. This is very much the picture presented by Bodde in his negative assessment of the potential for science in premodern China.

But a perception that the history of engagement between philosophy and science is limited to “Confucianism,” would present only a partial picture. It is widely recognized that the earliest of what we would call scientific studies were conducted by the early Mohists, who wrote treatises on logic, optics and mechanics (Graham 1978, Needham 1956b, Fung 1922). Mohism did not persist beyond the Han dynasty as a textual lineage, but at least some Mohist texts are preserved in the Daoist Canon (discussed below). As such, while Mohism is fundamentally important to any history of science in China, it is not central to an account of the engagement between science and Chinese philosophy.

Needham – in complete contrast to Fung Yu-lan – represents the Daoists as both naturalistic and interested in natural phenomena. He described Daoism as “religious and poetical, yes; but it was also at least as strongly magical, scientific, democratic, and politically revolutionary” (1956a, 32). On this reading, the history of Daoism also presents a very different picture of science and medicine, especially.

But there are several problems with this picture. An initial problem is anachronistic understandings of the nature of early Daoism. These include an oversimplified emphasis on the schools and legendary authors of Daoist texts. There is also a problematic distinction between the so-called “philosophical” Daoism (Dao jia 道家) of the Daode jing, Zhuangzi, and Huainanzi and the so-called “religious” Daoism (Dao jiao 道教) of longevity practices, popular religion, and organized Daoist churches. As Sivin (1978, 1995b) pointed out in a series of article begun over thirty years ago, simplistic stereotypes of Daoism as mystical or naturalistic obscure understanding of the relations between Daoism and science.

Sivin (1995a) points to important differences between popular religion and specifically Daoist religious movements that had little conection to either philosophy or the study of nature. His point is that most scientific and technical expertise arose from popular sources and not from Daoist schools; and once this key distinction is made, we no longer need to mis-classify all or most Chinese science as Daoist (as did Needham). This move also allows us to clarify that some Daoist masters, whose objective was union with divinity, were not pursuing the study of rational inquiry or systematic experimentation. Rather, they were making use of existing technical knowledge and practices, and adapting them to their own ends, but not generally improving on them in any way. However, the important point is that the Daoist schools kept written records, which the artisans who developed the original expertise, did not. As a result, historians of science have tended to credit the Daoists with innovations that they probably recorded, rather than developed.

Sivin’s account usefully explains why the fact that many records of scientific innovation appear only in the Daoist Canon does not make them inherently Daoist. The Daoist Canon (Dao zang 道藏) was first printed in about 1477, and was reprinted in a commercial edition in 1924–1926. The original edition consisted of some 5,305 volumes, on a wide range of subjects, including astronomy and cosmology, biology and botany, medicine and pharmacology, chemistry and mineralogy, and mathematics and physics. Much of the engagement with science after the Han dynasty is relegated the “non-philosophical” texts classified as Dao jiao, and often in ways that obscure the relation between philosophy and science in early China.

4. Shared Intellectual Contexts

There were important differences between the social and institutional contexts of early philosophy and science, as well as important differences between sciences. The authors of philosophical or “Masters” texts (discussed below) were private individuals who often sought, but rarely achieved political influence. By contrast, astronomy and calendrics in particular were closely linked to government and court patronage, and from Han times on, located in the Bureau of Astronomy (Loewe 1994, Pankenier 2013, Raphals 2013, Sivin 2009).

The origins of science in China seem to lie in an amalgam of ideas from both Masters textualists (philosophers) and technical specialists. According to Sivin (1988 and 1990) the basic Chinese sciences were established some time between the first century BCE and the first century CE through what he describes as a combination of Ru (“Confucian”) ideas and ideas from technical specialists, especially experts in yin-yang, Five Agents (wu xing) and technical expertise traditions associated with “Numbers and Techniques” (shu shu) and “Recipes and Methods” (fang ji, both discussed below.)

Key to this amalgam were several concepts shared by both groups but deployed in very different ways. Early cosmological thinking depicts a cosmos ultimately composed of qi 氣 (the energy that constitutes and organizes matter and causes growth and change) in processes of constant change, based on the interactions of yin and yang 陰陽 and the Five Agents (wu xing 五行, Graham 1986, Raphals 1998 and 2013).

Philosophers deployed these ideas in (1) the yin-yang cosmology of the Yi jing, (2) theories of correlative correspondence between Heaven, Earth and Humanity as a shared representation of cosmic order, and (3) the idea of a “classic” or “canon” as the founding text of a textual lineage. Practitioners of several sciences also deployed these concepts, in particular in models of the human body and of the movements of the sun, moon and stars.

Finally, both groups created textual lineages and accounts of textual authority. In a scientific context, authoritative texts were nominally attributed to a culture hero or divine source. Examples include the medical “classic” The Yellow Emperor's Classic of Internal Medicine (Huang Di nei jing, Unschuld 2003, Unschuld and Tessenow 2011) and the Zhou [dynasty] Classic of Gnomon Calculation (Zhou bi suan jing, Cullen 1976 and 1996). By contrast, the evidence of recently excavated texts indicates that such texts derived from prior textual traditions that were subsequently lost (Harper 1998). Other Masters created their own texts and apocryphal lineages, but did not appear to have debated each other extensively or to have taken self-consciously critical stances toward their human or textual predecessors (Lloyd 1996, Lloyd and Sivin 2002).

5. Generalist versus Specialist Knowledge

No one account categorizes the sciences of early China, but we find some account of them in the last two sections of the Bibliographic Treatise of the Han Dynastic History (Han shu, chapter 30). We see in the categorizations and authorship of the Treatise a polarization between two groups whom can be called Masters textualists and technical experts.

The Han shu Bibliographic Treatise consists of six sections: (1) the Six Arts (liu yi 六藝) or Classics (liu jing 六經), (2) Masters (zhu zi 諸子) texts of Warring States philosophy, (3) Poetry (shi fu 詩賦), (4) Military works (bing shu 兵書), (5) Numbers and Techniques (shu shu 數術), and (6) Recipes and Methods (fang ji 方技).

The “Numbers and Techniques” (shu shu) section includes the names of texts on astronomy, and cosmology in the sections titled Patterns of Heaven (tian wen 天文) and Calendars and Chronologies (li pu 歷譜). Additional information appears under sections titled Five Agents (wu xing 五行), and morphoscopy. Patterns of Heaven includes texts on divination by stars and weather phenomena (clouds, mists, qi configurations), and mapping the constellations. Calendars and Chronologies includes texts on calendric computations and movements of the heavenly bodies. Five Agents also contains mantic texts concerning prognostication by yin and yang and the Five Agents, including portents, hemerology, calendric astrology. A subsection titled Turtle and Yarrow (shi gui 蓍龜) contains texts on turtle-shell and yarrow divination, including the Zhou yi (Zhou Changes), the original text of the Yi jing or Book of Changes. Two other subsections address Miscellaneous Divination (za zhan 雜占) and Morphoscopy (xing fa 刑法), including works on geography, physiognomy, and topomancy.

Information on medicine and pharmacology appears in the sixth section, Recipes and Methods. It includes works on medicine and longevity, including medical classics, classical recipes, sexual arts, and immortality practices. These chapters reflect the concerns and expertise of the technical and ritual specialists closely associated with the “Recipe Masters” (fang shi 方士) associated with the Han court. But their concerns also appear in early philosophical texts, and the separation of philosophy from the categories of religion and science is artificial and problematic (Harper 1998 and 1999; Kalinowski 2004). Recipes and Methods (fang ji 方技) includes: Medical Classics (yi jing 醫經), Classical Recipes (jing fang 經方), Sexual arts (fang zhong 房中) and Immortality practices (shen xian 神仙).

Several things are striking about this categorization. The first is the relative confinement of “Chinese philosophy” to the first two (or arguably three) sections of the Treatise, particularly the Masters section. The eight sections of the Masters category include most of the texts of early Chinese philosophy. They are grouped under the rubrics of: “Ru” (Ru jia 儒家, often mistranslated as “Confucian”), Daoists (Dao jia 道家), Yin-yang (Yin-yang jia 陰陽家), Legalists (Fa jia 法家), Names (Ming jia 名家) Mohists (Mo jia 墨家), vertical and horizontal alliances (Zong heng jia 縱橫家, also known as “Militarists”), Miscellaneous (Za jia 雜家), the school of Shen Nong (Shen Nong jia 神農家) and Smaller Teachings (Xiao Shuo 小說). But it is important to note that these are the “schools” of Han anthologists and commentators. Recent scholarship and the evidence of texts excavated from tombs has shown the arbitrariness of these classifications. For example, texts excavated from Guodian 郭店 and the so-called Shanghai Museum texts resist classification as Ru or Daoist (Shi ji, 130, 3288–92; Csikszentmihalyi and Nylan 2003, Smith 2003).

A second important point is the very different preservation and authorship of the first and second half of the Treatise. While the first three sections contain many titles that are no longer extant, they all contain significant numbers of extant texts. By contrast, the last three sections consist almost entirely of the titles of lost texts.

The two halves of the treatise also differ in their authorship. The first three sections were compiled by Liu Xiang. The last three, by contrast, were compiled by technical experts. The fourth “Military Works” section of the Bibliographic Treatise was compiled by Ren Hong 任宏, a Colonel of Foot Soldiers under Han Chengdi (Yates 1988). The “Shu shu” category was compiled by an astronomical official: the Taishi 太史 Yin Xian 尹咸 (Han shu, 30, 1775). The Recipes and Methods section was compiled by the imperial physician Li Zhuguo 李柱國. This distinction between what appear to be three generalist and three specialist categories of the Treatise can be seen as a continuation of Warring States claims for the superiority of a flexible and general intellect over specific and technical arts. In this kind of Warring States argumentation, claims for comprehensive wisdom and universality sought to establish sole possession of way of the sage kings of antiquity, of which competing traditions possessed only part. Such claims appear in the Zhuangzi and in attacks on competing schools by Xunzi and Han Fei (Lewis 1999, Raphals 2008–2009). Thus the authors of Han collectanea privileged generalists in their comprehensive syntheses of competing traditions (Lewis 1999). In this way, the organization of the Treatise asserted the superiority of general and universal knowledge over military, mantic, and medical knowledge, deliberately framed as technical and limited in nature.

Finally, Masters texts suggest active competition between the textual specialists of the Masters schools and the technical experts whose knowledge and expertise is reflected in the last three sections of the Treatise. This competition involved career choice, patronage, students and the status of genres and modes of knowledge. For example, Michael Puett (2002) argues for an interwoven history of interactions between fang shi and the court officials in which court sponsored interpretations of ancient philosophical texts were in part a response to the fang shi.

Late Warring States claims for the superiority of a flexible and general intellect over specific and technical arts continued into the Han dynasty. In particular, claims for universal and comprehensive wisdom sought to establish sole possession of way of the sage kings of antiquity, of which competing traditions possessed only part. This attitude is reflected in the structure of Han collectanea, which also privileged general and universal knowledge over any specialist expertise, including science. The result is the formation and propagation of two distinct and sometimes competing intellectual communities of “philosophical” literary elites and technical experts.

6. Social Contexts of Practitioners

There were important differences between the social and institutional contexts of early philosophy and science, as well as important differences between sciences. Masters textualists were private individuals who often sought, but rarely achieved political influence. By contrast, astronomy and calendrics in particular were closely linked to government and court patronage, and from Han times on, located in the Bureau of Astronomy (Loewe 1994, Raphals 2013, Sivin 2009).

A closer examination of what we know of some of the early “scientists” shows close links to philosophical traditions. The apocryphal founder of scientific thought in China was Zou Yan 鄒衍 (305–240 BCE), who is associated with the so-called “Yin-Yang school” (Yin-yang jia). Zou Yan is credited with combining and systematizing yin-yang and the theory of Five Agents (Needham 1956b: 231–34), but none of his works survive. Sima Qian’s biography in Shi ji 76 describes Zou Yan as a member of the Jixia 稷下 Academy, originally from the state of Qi (in present day Shandong). The Jixia Academy is also associated with Warring States philosophers. Figures associated with it include Mencius, Xunzi, the Mohist philosopher Song Xing, as well as Tian Pian, Shen Dao, Peng Meng, and possibly Zhuangzi (Needham 1956a, 93; Sato 2003, 75–77). The Jixia Academy is also associated with the growth of Huang-Lao Daoism (Graziani 2008). According to the Shi ji biography of Zou Yan:

he examined deeply into the phenomena of the increase and decrease of yin and yang, and wrote essays totaling more than 100,000 words about their strange permutations, and about the cycles of the great sages from beginning to end. His sayings were vast and far-reaching, and not in accord with the accepted beliefs of the classics. First he had to examine small objects, and from these he drew conclusions about large ones, until he reached what was without limit. First he spoke about modern times, and from this he went back to the time of Huang Di. The scholars all studied his arts. Moreover he followed the great events in the rise and fall of ages, and by means of their omens and (an examination into their systems), extended his survey (still further) backwards to the time when the heavens and the earth had not yet been born, (in fact) to what was profound and abstruse and impossible to investigate.

He began by classifying China’s notable mountains, great rivers and connecting valleys; its birds and beasts; the fruitfulness of its water and soils, and its rare products; and from this extended his survey to what is beyond the seas, and men are unable to observe. Then starting from the time of the separation of the Heavens and the Earth, and coming down, he made citations of the revolutions and transmutations of the Five Powers (Virtues), arranging them until each found its proper place and was confirmed (by history). (Shi ji ch 76, slightly modified from Needham 1956b, 232–33).

On this account, Zou Yan's interests included both the “classical” learning of the Masters traditions and direct inquiry into natural phenomena, large and small. While this account gives no indication of specific direct contact between Zou and Masters textualists, it does suggest that the Jixia Academy patronized a range of thinkers who included what we would today call both philosophers and practitioners of the early sciences.

The Han shu describes Zou Yan as a “Recipe Master” or fang shi 方士. This term was applied to a wide range of practitioners of medical, mantic and technical arts. (The titles of their mostly lost works are listed in the shu shu and fang ji sections of the Han shu Bibliographic Treatise, discussed above.) Fang shi practiced divination and claimed to possess secret texts and formulae. They gained great influence during the earlier part of the Han dynasty, though their influence waned by the later Han (Kalinowski 2010; Ngo 1976). They used yin-yang and Five Agents cosmology, and seem to have originated from the Shandong peninsula. They were particularly associated with the mantic arts, including the use of the sexagenary cycle of stems and branches, the Yi jing, and divination by stars, dreams, physiognomy, the winds, and by the use of pitch pipes (Li Ling 1993, 2000). The fang shi became an important force in the Han court during the reign of Han Wu Di (r. 141–29 BCE), but their origins are probably much older. Practices attributed to them have clear antecedents in Warring States philosophical texts such as the Zhuangzi and the “Inner Cultivation” (Nei ye) chapter of the Guanzi.

References to their presence in the court of Qin Shi Huang秦始皇 (259–210 BCE), who ruled Qin from 246 to 221. They remained influential to the early part of the Six Dynasties (to the fourth century CE). Most came from outlying regions, and gained influence for their skills in medicine, astronomical prediction and omen interpretation, all of which were linked to the growth of science in early China. They used magico-medical practices on behalf of the health and vitality of the emperor, but also introduced standardized measurement of time, space, weight, and musical pitch.

An important source for our knowledge of their interests and expertise is the collected biographies of fang shi are recorded in the Standard History of the Later Han (Hou Han shu) under the heading “Fang Techniques” (fang shu 方術). The preface lists their expertise and interests as: fate calculation and prognostication, including astrology and the prediction of eclipses), medicine and a variety of magical practices. Over half of the fifty-seven specialists listed in the collected biography (twenty-nine) practiced some form of astrology (biographies 1, 11, 12,16, 18–20, 22, 23, 26, 27, 30–33, 35, 38–41, 43–46, 49, 51–53 and 55, as listed in Kalinowski 2010, 359–66). But they were also credited with expertise in classical texts and in Huang-Lao and Daoist lore. (Hou Han shu 82A and 82B. Most of these techniques date from the late Zhou. See Li Ling 1995 and Kalinowski 2010, especially Appendix 2.)

In summary, although Masters textualists and fang shi had some areas of overlapping expertise and interest, their practices and textual lineages diverged in very different directions.

7. The Early Science(s)

I conclude with a brief account of areas of relation between Chinese philosophy and the Chinese sciences, remembering that Chinese accounts focused on specific sciences, rather than on one unified notion of science. We find these primarily in the qualitative sciences of astronomy and astrology and medicine.

An important area of overlap between philosophy and science occurred in cosmology, mathematics and calendrics. An important aspect of cosmological interest is observational astronomy or astrology (tian wen). In an important recent study of Chinese archaeo-astronomy, David Pankenier (2013, 5) traces the Chinese coordination of human activities with the observation and positions of the sun, moon, and stars as far back as the Neolithic cultures of the fifth millennium BCE. Written evidence of royal interest in stars and winds clearly dates back to the Shang oracle bone inscriptions. As Nathan Sivin (1990, 181) puts it: “The difference between astronomy and astrology was a contrast of emphasis on the quantitative as opposed to the qualitative and on objective motions as opposed to the correlation between celestial and political events.”

These areas have only slight links to philosophy. Astronomical and astrological observation was an important part of court ritual, since they were used to determine auspicious times for a wide variety of events. It could be said that textualists approved of them as an aspect of the conduct of ritual, but there was little philosophical engagement with their details. (There are also slight but important connections between philosophy and mathematics. This question has been in many ways obscured by focus on the idea of mathematical or logical proof and its presence or absence in China (Chemla 2012, Chemla and Guo 2004).

During the Han dynasty, questions about the nature of the heavens were pursued by the fang shi (discussed in section 2). Fang expertise also included divination by the heavens, both by the stars, and by interpreting sub-celestial phenomena, including weather, clouds, mists, and winds (Ngo 1976, Li Ling 1993).

These activities were not invented by the fang shi. The Han shu Bibliographic Treatise also provides evidence of fang activity through the titles of lost books. Other evidence comes from late Warring States and Han texts such as the Lü Shi chunqiu and Huainanzi. The Huainanzi contains several chapters of astronomical interest (Major 1993). One passage describes the technical interests of the sage emperor Yu, who ordered his officials to measure the distances to the ends of the earth by pacing the distance to the eastern, western, northern and southern extremities of the earth (Huainanzi 4, 56). The exact numbers given are problematic to say the least, but the point is that the sage rulers of antiquity, in legendary accounts, interested themselves in the physical observation of the earth.

The third chapter of the Huainanzi ends with a section on the use of the measurements cast by shadows (gnomons) to calculate distances. This passage is probably a later addition, but for our purposes, its inclusion in the Huainanzi is indicative of the scientific concerns of the text. It gives directions for a series of measurements, including how to determine the directions of sunrise, sunset, and the cardinal directions. It also explains how to measure the “breadth and length of east, west, north, and south”:

If you wish to know the figures for the breadth and length of east, west, north, and south set up four gnomons to make a right-angled figure one li square. More than ten days before the spring or autumn equinox sight along the northern gnomons of the square on the sun from its first appearance to its rise above the horizon. Wait for [the day when] they coincide. When they coincide they are in line with the sun. Each time take a sight on it [the sun] with the southern gnomons, and take the amount by which it is within the forward gnomons as the divisor. Divide the whole width and divide the length [between] the standing gnomons in order to know the measurements east and west from here (Huainanzi 3, 53–54, translation after Cullen 1976, 116).

Another area of potential Ru interest in astronomy is calendrics, based on detailed observation of seasonal changes. One example is the Monthly Ordinance (Yueling 月令) calendars of the Huainanzi. Monthly Ordinances use Five Agents correlations to specify the correct social, ritual, and agricultural activities for each season. Rulers could use these texts to regulate state ritual activities over the course of the year. The ordinances cover such topics as state activities (fortification, planting, etc.) and the consequences of performing activities at incorrect times. These are the first texts in the received tradition to link the twenty-eight Lunar Lodges to the months of the year, associating each month with a lodge, which indicates the position of the sun among the stars for that month. (Ancient Chinese astronomers divided the celestial equator around the pole star into twenty-eight “lodges” (xiu 宿), each named by a star within it and each comprising some 13 degrees (du 度) of the circle.) The calendric tables list the days of the year in stem-branch sexagenary order, with annotations on the nature of different kinds of days, and which days were auspicious or inauspicious for particular activities. (Such calendars also appear in almost identical form in the Guanzi and Shi chunqiu, and were incorporated into the Li ji in the Later Han dynasty. See Guanzi, chs. 3.8 and 3.9, Rickett 1985, 148–192) They also included monthly and seasonal correlates. For example, the lodges were associated with the position of the sun, and dusk and dawn correlated to the five pentatonic tones, pitch pipe notes, numbers, tastes, smells, color of the emperor’s clothing, presiding deity, and yin and yang sacrificial organs, all described in terms of the Five Agents (Major 1993, 220–225).

It is almost impossible to separate Chinese ideas of body, state, cosmos and “nature.” Nathan Sivin (1995, 3n1) points out that there is no indigenous term for “nature” in China before the nineteenth century. Over the course of the last three centuries BCE, Chinese understandings of the physical world developed to reflect, and mirror, political consolidation (Sivin 1995). These new ideas of cosmic order—correspondence between microcosm (the body) and macrocosm (the cosmos)—appeared in new representations of the body, the state, and the cosmos that were based on systematic applications and correlations of the ideas of yin and yang and of the Five Agents (wuxing). They appear in medical texts such as the Huang Di neijing, in calendrics, in observational astronomy and the study of astronomical portents with political implications, and in the “correlative cosmologies” of many Han dynasty texts (Lloyd 1996, Lloyd and Sivin 2002).

Another important area of engagement between philosophy and medicine was in the theory and practice of “nurturing life” (yang sheng 養生). Fang shi medical practices and ideas included “recipes” for “Nurturing Life.” This broad category included a wide range of self-cultivation techniques.

References to yang sheng techniques appear in both accounts of self-cultivation in Masters texts and in the titles of (lost) recipes in the Han shu Bibliographic Treatise. Mark Csikzentmihalyi has argued that “material virtue” traditions drawing on yang sheng techniques appear prominently in the Mencius and in two versions of the Wu xing 五行 or “Five Kinds of Action” recovered from Guodian and Mawangdui. These texts provide “a detailed moral psychology describing the process of the cultivation of the virtues” (Csikszentmihalyi 2004, 7). Mencius (2A2) famously refers to “cultivating flood-like qi” and the third chapter of the Zhuangzi is titled “The Lord of Nurturing Life” (Yang sheng zhu). By contrast, references to yang sheng in popular culture and in the recipes in the “Recipes and Methods” section of the Treatise seem directly concerned with health and longevity (V. Lo 2001 and 2005, Raphals 2008–2009).

Yin-yang, qi and the Five Agents also informed medical theories, which were systematized in a cosmological framework in the Yellow Emperor’s Classic of Internal Medicine or Huang Di neijing (Veith 1972, Unschuld and Tessenow 2011). This complex and multi-layered text, probably compiled in the first century BCE, presents a systematic cosmology that analogizes the body, the state, and the cosmos in complex systems of “correlative cosmology” (Graham 1986; Sivin 1995; Lloyd and Sivin 2002). For example, the Huang Di neijing describes correspondence between the articulations of the body and the cosmos, specifically between heaven and earth and the upper and lower parts of the body, including relations and analogies between body, state and the cosmos, all expressed in terms of yin-yang and the Five Agents (Huang Di neijing lingshu, 71.2, 446). Such correlations seem a far cry from either cosmological speculation or empirical science in any modern sense. Between those extremes stand the mostly lost arts of technical traditions described in the Han shu Bibliographic Treatise: astronomy, medical, pharmacological, and mantic arts, whose practitioners were the counterparts and potential competitors of the Masters textualists or philosophers (Lloyd and Sivin 2002). Expertise initially developed by diviners and technical specialists became part of the Daode jing, Zhuangzi, and Huainanzi. It was also incorporated into the systematic cosmology and medicine of the Han (Lloyd 1996, Lloyd and Sivin 2002). The Huang Di neijing is listed (and first appears) in the Recipes and Methods section of the Han shu Bibliographic Treatise under the heading of Medical Classics (Han shu 30, 1776).

A particular problem raised by the application of yin-yang theory to medicine was the implications of yin-yang theories for accounts of gender (Furth 1986, Raphals 1998, Yates 2005), including the problem of the androgyny of what Charlotte Furth calls “the Yellow Emperor’s body.” Furth argues that the human body is understood as androgynous before the development of gynecology in the Song dynasty. These models of the body inform the early history of yin-yang theory, and the gender analogies that form part of that discourse. A central text to these analogies is the Huang Di neijing, which is striking for its overall androgyny. Overall, women are not specified as medically distinct from men, and where they do occur, discussions of sexual difference are usually linked to specific questions of fertility and reproduction (e.g., Huang Di neijing suwen 1.3.8 and 7.2.26).

Of more interest for a consideration of science and philosophy are a group of analogies in medical and philosophical texts between yin and yang and male and female. They describe the conditions of men and women by analogy with yin and yang, heaven and earth, and sometimes right and left. For example, the statement that women and men have opposite pulse patterns: “In women the right [pulse] manifests opposition, the left manifests obedience; in men the left [pulse] manifests opposition, the right manifests obedience” (Huang Di neijing suwen, 15.2.45).

Theories of yin-yang, qi and Five Agents were applied to the diagnosis and treatment of disease, using techniques such as acumoxa and herbal medicine. These theories were also applied to longevity practices designed to extend health and life and in some cases to produce literal, physical immortality.

Another very important area of overlap between philosophy and medicine is the significant number of important explicitly Daoist thinkers who were also practicing physicians and authors of important medical texts. (For more information on all these topics, see the entry “Chinese Medicine and Chinese Philosophy”.)


In conclusion, this brief account addresses important issues in the complex relations between philosophy and the early history of science in China, especially as they informed the qualitative sciences of medicine and astronomy, and their relations with early Chinese philosophy overall. It shows that the harsh assessment of Chinese philosophy quoted at the beginning of this essay over-simplifies several complex questions. The work of Joseph Needham, Nathan Sivin and others demonstrates that Chinese philosophy is not inherently “anti-science.” But it could be argued – and persuasively in the view of this author – that the priorities associated with the vexed term “Confucianism” have often (though not always) steered Chinese philosophy away from scientific concerns. A second question raised here is whether Chinese philosophy contributes to science in ways that constitute a culturally specific “Chinese science” that is different from modern science. This point remains a locus of strong disagreement among historians of science in China.


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