Supplement to Alonzo Church

B. Early Philosophy of Logic and Metaphysics

Absolutism about logic is the doctrine that classical logic is objective and correct for everyone and every kind of rational inquiry. Absolutism can be contrasted with pluralism, which is the doctrine that in addition to classical logic and its augmentations (such as modal logic) there are different alternative logics that are correct for different branches of rational inquiry (cf. the entry on logical pluralism). Church was a pluralist about logic and, in his early work, denied absolutism about both the Law of Excluded Middle (LEM) and the Distributive laws. For example, he writes:

In connection with geometry and other branches of mathematics it is commonly recognized that it is meaningless to ask about the absolute truth of a postulate and that the choice between one of two contrary postulates must be made on the basis of simplicity and serviceability. It seems reasonable to recognize the same thing with regard to the postulates of logic, in particular the law of excluded middle, and to say on this basis that it is meaningless to ask about the truth of the law of excluded middle. (1928 [BE: 44])

However, Church elsewhere distinguishes between intuitive logic and formal logic and argues against the absoluteness of the latter but not the former (1932 [BE: 53]). He gives a brief description of intuitive logic as encompassing the reasoning needed to define well-formed formulas inductively (cf. Hilbert 1926), as well as the reasoning described by basic quantification theory. Unlike Hilbert, Church does not insist that intuitive logic requires a quasi-concrete subject matter, such as surveyable strings of discrete symbols, in order to be reliable.

Church argues that intuitive logic cannot be learned and is a precondition of reasoning in formal logic. That is, one could not learn formal logic if one could not already reason with intuitive logic, because if one tried to do so, one would not understand the instructions for formulating and reasoning with formal logic (1932 [BE: 53–5, 58]; cf. Lewis Carroll [1895], which Church does not cite; Padró [2015], which contains an authoritative description of Kripke’s generalization of Carroll’s argument). Church does not comment on the possibility that since any rational discussion of logic must presuppose intuitive logic, intuitive logic is the objective and absolute part of logic—or, perhaps, simply logic as distinguished from its augmentations and applications. Elsewhere, he does seem to assume that intuitive logic is objective and absolute but also allows the reader to remain agnostic about this question (1934 [BE: 96]).

It is also worth noting that in regards to a paper in which he develops a formal system that dispenses with LEM (1935b), Church writes:

The denial of the law of excluded middle which is involved here is of a different sort from that which is associated with Intuitionism and has been embodied in the formalism of Heyting. It is not susceptible, so far as I am able to see at the present time, to anything like the Gödel-Gentzen treatment of the Heyting system. (1935e [BE: 996])

Gödel and Gentzen were (independently) able to provide a translation of classical logic (with LEM) into intuitionistic logic (without LEM) that allowed both classical and intuitionistic logic to be understood from a comprehensive point of view. (See the entries on Intuitionistic logic and Kurt Gödel, as well as the references therein, for more information.) Church appears to be saying that one cannot provide a translation of classical logic (with LEM) into his theory (without LEM) in an analogous manner, because his theory regards certain cases of formulas from which a contradiction can be derived as meaningless rather than false. It should be noted that Church is here talking about dispensing with LEM in formal logic not in intuitive logic. LEM is only abandoned in so far as it applies to symbols. Moreover, in so far as LEM does not apply to a formula, it expresses no proposition.

We now turn to the relationship between pluralism and empiricism about logic. Church aligns himself with the view that

the selection of one system of logic as against another with laws in part different is determined, not by a priori considerations, but partly by necessities of the intended application and partly by considerations of convenience and elegance. (1937c [BE: 44–5])

In the same work, he also notes that:

It is, of course, a corollary of this position that the advance of an experimental science may some day require revision of the system of logic on which the mathematical theory of the science is based. (ibid)

In particular, Church seems to consider it an open question whether quantum mechanics demands a revision of the distributive laws (see the entry on quantum logic). He writes:

Of course these proposals are at present tentative in character and may well in the end prove to be unacceptable. But it would seem to the reviewer that, as intended, they are of the same character as alterations of physical theory which have occurred in the past. (1945 [BE: 953])

Once more, Church does not comment on how this coheres with his earlier claim that there can be no rational discussion of a proposed revision of logic that does not presuppose intuitive logic.

Church, in subsequent writings, ceases to use the locution “intuitive logic” and instead adopts a distinction between informal and formalized languages (1956a, 1959). This is discussed in section 2 on the logistic method.

During the period in which he advocates pluralism about logic, Church also advocates views about ontology that are unabashedly instrumentalist. In particular, he writes approvingly of Russell’s view that classes are logical fictions and suggests that the view be applied to all entities of logic and mathematics, including propositions and propositional functions, which

are essentially, not a part of reality but fictions devised for their usefulness as instruments in understanding reality. (1928 [BE: 46])

However, a decade later, in reviews of Carnap’s (1939) and Quine’s (1939), Church advocates for a more pragmatic approach, according to which there is no absolute answer to the question of whether abstract entities are real, with the result they can be admitted into a theory as required:

The reviewer would prefer a still more liberal admission of abstract designata, not on any realistic ground, but on the basis that this is the most intelligible and useful way of arranging the matter—it would apparently be meaningless to ask whether abstract terms really have designata, but it is rather a matter of taste or convenience whether abstract designata shall be postulated. (1939a [BE: 161])

(See also the Church [1939c] discussion of Quine’s early paper on ontological commitment [1939]). The reason that this view is no longer the earlier instrumentalist view is that, according to the earlier view, the question is not regarded as meaningless; rather, it is one that receives either a negative or a positive answer depending on one’s view of fictional entities (1928b [BE: 46–7]). Church’s mature views on ontology are discussed in section 6 of the main text.

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