Logical Pluralism

First published Wed Apr 17, 2013; substantive revision Thu Sep 14, 2023

Logical pluralism is the view that there is more than one correct logic. Logics are theories of validity: they tell us which argument forms are valid. Different logics disagree about which forms are valid.[1] For example, take ex falso quodlibet (EFQ):

\[ A, \neg A \vDash B \]

Classical and strong Kleene logics classify EFQ as valid, but relevant and paraconsistent logics say it is not. It is quite tempting to think that they cannot all be right. If EFQ is valid, then the relevant and paraconsistent logics are not correct theories of validity, or as we might put it: they are not correct logics. And if EFQ is not valid, then classical and strong Kleene logic are not correct logics. Logical pluralism takes many forms, but the most philosophically interesting and controversial versions hold that more than one logic can be correct, that is: logics \(L_1\) and \(L_2\) can disagree about which arguments are valid, and both can be getting things right. What exactly it takes for a version of logical pluralism to be philosophically interesting is addressed more fully below, especially in §6.

Much current work on the subject was sparked by a series of papers by JC Beall and Greg Restall (Beall & Restall 2000, 2001; Restall 2002), which culminated in a book (Beall & Restall 2006) on what we here call case-based logical pluralism. This work has generated a substantial literature, including papers arguing against pluralism, for logical monism—the view that there is only one correct logic—and more recently exploring logical nihilism—the view that there are no correct logics. Interest in this contemporary debate has also led to a re-examination of some older views, especially the question of whether Rudolf Carnap was a logical pluralist (Restall 2002; Kouri Kissel 2019), and similarly for the Scottish-French logician Hugh McColl (1837–1909) (Rahman & Redmond 2008). It has also resulted in the proposal of several additional kinds of logical pluralism, some of which are surveyed in §5.

1. Case-Based Logical Pluralism

How can two logics which disagree about which arguments are valid both be correct? One way would be if there were more than one property of validity (and so more than one interpretation of “valid”) where one of the logics captures validity in one sense, while its rival captures validity in another. Some pluralists elaborate on this by maintaining that natural language expressions like “follows from” are unsettled, vague, or ambiguous, and may be settled, made more precise, or disambiguated, in more than one way. The best-known version of this view is presented as the conjunction of two main theses (Beall & Restall 2006). First, the Generalised Tarski Thesis:

Generalised Tarski Thesis (GTT):
An argument is \(\textrm{valid}_x\) if and only if in every \(\textrm{case}_x\) in which the premises are true, so is the conclusion.

Second, the thesis that the expression “\(\textrm{case}_x\)” in the GTT can be made more precise in at least two, equally acceptable, ways, resulting in different extensions for “valid”. For example, by “case” we might mean a first-order model of the kind used to define classical first-order consequence or instead we might mean a possible situation. Other alternatives include incomplete or inconsistent models, of the sort used in the model theory of intuitionistic and paraconsistent logics. Different choices for the interpretation of “case” will result in different precisifications of the GTT analysis of logical consequence, which may in turn result in different consequence relations (Beall & Restall 2006: 29–31). Call this view “Case-Based Logical Pluralism”.

Case-based pluralists do not need to hold that every conceivable precisification of GTT defines a consequence relation. Beall and Restall, for example, think that the only admissible precisifications of the GTT yield relations with certain properties—necessity, normativity, and formality (Beall & Restall 2006: 26–35). Hence having its extension given by a precisification of the GTT is only a necessary condition on being a genuine consequence relation.

1.1 The Argument from Appearances

One argument for Case-Based Logical Pluralism is the argument from appearances (Beall & Restall 2006: 30–31). According to the argument, pluralism is just straightforwardly plausible—it appears to be true—and hence ought to be accepted in the absence of reasons not to believe it.

This might seem like a surprising approach, given the presumption of logical monism in the writings of most logicians of the past—presumably pluralism did not appear correct to them. But perhaps once one considers the GTT explicitly, accepts the underdetermination of “case”, and considers a few of the ways it can be made more precise to get different logics, it just seems clear that there will be several alternative ways to make it more specific, with none singled out as more correct than the others by current usage. The hardest thing about logical pluralism, one might think, was answering a kind of “how possibly?”-question: seeing how it could be a coherent view at all. But once the work of developing and laying out the case-based view has been done, the new position can strike one as quite reasonable.

One problem with this argument is that the plausibility of a view tends to vary with the onlooker’s ability to think up reasonable alternatives; if a particular view seems like the only reasonable way a certain thing can have happened, then we might shrug and accept it as our best working hypothesis. But if we can conceive of several different ways things could plausibly be, we might rationally withhold judgement pending more evidence.

More specifically, while Case-Based Logical Pluralism is not patently implausible, it does rest on a linguistic picture with two distinctive features: first, that the meaning of “case” is unsettled, and second, that given that it is unsettled, the discovery of more than one reasonable precisification should make us pluralists. But neither of these features is inevitable. Contemporary philosophy of language describes models in which the correctness of the application of some ordinary language expressions—such as “water”, “elm” or “star”—can turn on the presence or absence of a feature that ordinary speakers need not be able to distinguish, such as having a certain constitution or make-up. Why should “valid” not be similar? That is, though no a priori analysis of “valid” uncovers the single correct precisification of the GTT, there might nevertheless exist an account—perhaps making use of sophisticated mathematical techniques—that exactly captures the extension of “valid”. Rival accounts would then have the same status as rival accounts of stars or water. Though analysis of the word “star” will not tell us that stars are not holes in the fabric of the night, or the gods riding their chariots across the heavens, those accounts are still wrong. Similarly, though analysis of the expression “valid” might not tell us that intuitionist accounts are wrong, they might be wrong nonetheless. In such circumstances we might hold that the meaning of “valid” is not really underspecified.

Secondly, even if the meaning of the expression is underspecified, it needn’t be the case that any precisifications are correct, and hence pluralism is not an inevitable consequence of the underspecificity. Consider a paradigm underspecified word like “heap” and a thinker who presents themselves as a pluralist about the heap property. They hold that one may specify the meaning of “heap” different ways within certain parameters, and arrive at conflicting but equally correct definitions of “heap”. For example, the classical heapists might claim that a heap is any pile of items with more than 10 members, deviant heapists protest that a heap is any pile of items with more than 13 members and the heap pluralist holds that both are correct. But there are lots of alternatives to pluralism here. For example, one might think that anyone who interprets the English word “heap” as requiring a pile of n items for any specific n is wrong, since they are trying to import more specificity into the meaning of the word than can really be found there. Or one might be a skeptic about heaps, on the grounds that the word is too vague—it fails to specify a genuine meaning—or one might hold that the expression is context-sensitive: in some contexts it picks out the classical property, in some the deviant, but argue that that doesn’t make one a pluralist about heaps, anymore than acknowledging that “I” picks out different people in different contexts makes one a pluralist about oneself.

The mere possibility of these alternatives does not, by itself, argue against the pluralist view, but it does undermine the argument from appearances. The availability of alternatives makes it clear that the intriguing reasonableness of pluralism is not unique.

1.2 The Argument from Virtue

A different argument for logical pluralism invokes the view’s combined practical and theoretical virtues:

One virtue is that the plurality of the consequence relation comes at little or no cost. Another is that pluralism offers a more charitable interpretation of many important (but difficult) debates in philosophical logic than is otherwise available; we will argue that pluralism does more justice to the mix of insight and perplexity found in many of the debates in logic in the last century. (Beall & Restall 2006: 31)

Pluralists have also stressed that their view encourages innovation in logic (Carnap 1937: foreword), and allows one to study more mathematical theories, such as those that would be rendered trivial by classical logic (S. Shapiro 2014: Ch. 3).

Such claims can be quite difficult to assess. Some important distinctions need to be drawn between theoretical and practical reasons to endorse pluralism, and even once this has been done it can be difficult to decide whether the view over all really possesses a virtue—it may depend on substantive empirical claims for which the evidence has yet to be gathered. It can also be hard to determine whether or not the view possesses a greater weight of virtues than rival theories (is not logical monism a simpler theory, and simplicity a theoretical virtue too?), and finally whether or not that is a good reason to believe the view.

For example, one virtue claimed for logical pluralism is charity, but not all instances of charity are theoretically virtuous; no-one should think that deterministic physics is more likely to be correct because it allows a more charitable view of wrong-doers, or of Einstein. Charity can be misplaced. But one place where charity is taken seriously as a theoretical virtue is in the assessment of theories of meaning and translation—though even here it can be misplaced, since it is not a virtue if a theory interprets infants as uttering true claims about quantum mechanics (Davidson 1973 [1984]). Logical pluralism is not itself a thesis about translation or interpretation, but one about logics and how many there are. Nonetheless, the version outlined above rests on some substantive claims about the meaning of “valid” and “follows from” and it might be argued that it is proper to invoke charity in adjudicating between this theory and rival ones for that reason: we are deciding between theories which interpret “valid” and “follows from” differently. Perhaps one of these interpretations seems to make our informants (both ordinary language users and the experts who have written about logic) responsible for fewer false claims.

But an opponent might respond that interpreting ordinary speakers as uttering truths concerning logic can look similar to attributing true beliefs about quantum mechanics to infants. As the Wason selection task experiments have shown in psychology, even educated speakers will fail to act as if the argument form modus tollens is correct in certain circumstances (Wason 1966, 1968; Cosmides 1989). Though the most charitable interpretation of their behaviour might be that they do not mean by “follows from” what the experimenters meant by it, by far the most natural understanding of what is going on here is that the subjects make mistakes. To interpret them as meaning something different by “valid” misses what these experiments reveal about human reasoning, and fails to explain why the subjects later judge that their earlier answers were wrong.

The logical pluralist can agree with this, but distinguish between being charitable to ordinary speakers, and being charitable to expert logicians. It is expert logicians, they might maintain, that we should interpret charitably, including those experts who have proposed apparently incompatible systems. Relevant logicians have written “disjunctive syllogism is not valid”. Classical logicians have written “disjunctive syllogism is valid”. Intuitionist logicians say “double negation elimination is not valid”. Classical logicians have retorted “double negation elimination is so valid”. If logical monism is correct, at least two or more of these parties have claimed falsehoods. Logical pluralism would allow us to say that more than one, perhaps many more than one, have been writing truths.

But logical pluralism is also uncharitable in ways that logical monism is not, since it holds that the monist participants in debates over which logic is correct have been arguing based on a confusion. The upshot with respect to the argument from charity, and from virtue more generally, is that quite a lot remains to be done before it will be clear which virtues are desirable and the extent to which logical pluralism possesses them to a greater degree than its rivals.

2. Objections to Case-Based Logical Pluralism

2.1 The Generality Objection

2.1.1 The interpretation of “every” in the Generalised Tarski Thesis

One way to object to logical pluralism via cases is to agree that “case” is underspecified and admits of various interpretations, while rejecting the further step that those interpretations correspond to different relations of logical consequence. One way to do this is to insist on the largest domain for the quantifier “every” in the GTT. There is a tradition in logic that holds that for an argument to be logically valid, the conclusion must be true in unrestrictedly all cases in which the premises are true; if there are any cases at all—anywhere, of any kind—in which the premises are true and the conclusion not, then the argument is invalid. The One True Logic, then, is the one that describes the relation of truth-preservation over all cases—where “all” is construed as broadly as possible (Beall & Restall 2006: 92; Priest 2006: 202).[2] A monist might also put it this way: the pluralist’s real logic can be recovered from the various “logics” they accept by taking the intersection of the sets of valid forms (like EFQ) endorsed by each “logic”. (The monist uses scare-quotes here, though of course a pluralist would not.) An argument form is only really logically valid for the monist (as “logically valid” should be understood) if it is counted valid by all of the “logics” that the pluralist accepts.

Suppose we pursue this generalist strategy. One question is whether we will be left with any useful relation of logical consequence at all. Logics which are arrived at by quantifying over extra cases have a tendency to be weaker—to classify fewer arguments as valid—since the more cases we include, the better our chances of including one in which the premises of a particular argument are true and the conclusion not true. Dialetheists would include cases in which both a sentence and its negation are true, and this means we can have cases where P and \(\neg P\) are true, but \(Q\) is false, making both \(P \lor Q\) and \(\neg P\) true, even though \(Q\) is not, and thus providing a counterexample to disjunctive syllogism. If this is acceptable, one might think, why not allow cases where \(P \land Q\) is true, but P is not? Or worse. Perhaps if we construe “every case” broadly enough, we will find that there are no valid arguments left, and hence the result will not be logical monism, but a form of logical nihilism, or something close to it. Several pluralists have used this line of argument as a reductio on the idea that consequence must be defined over absolutely every case:

…we see no place to stop the process of generalisation and broadening of accounts of cases. For all we know, the only inference left in the intersection of (unrestricted) all logics might be the identity inference: From A to infer A. That identity is the only really valid argument is implausible and, we think, an unmotivated conclusion. (Beall & Restall 2006: 92, emphasis in original)[3]

Priest disagrees, and suggests that what will stop the slide down this slippery slope is the fact that certain key consequence relations hold in virtue of the meanings of the connectives:

I think it just false that all principles of inference fail in some situation. For example, any situation in which a conjunction holds, the conjuncts hold, simply in virtue of the meaning of ∧. (Priest 2006: 202–203)

But it is relatively common for logicians to claim that their own logical principles are valid in virtue of the meanings of the logical constants, while those who reject those same principles dispute this. It is difficult to adjudicate such disputes independently of a more substantial theory of the meanings of the connectives. This is yet another area where the dispute over logical pluralism runs into an older dispute in the philosophy of logic, and one that is ostensibly a question about meaning. The two key questions that remain for the success of this monist objection are (i) which, if any, argument forms are guaranteed to preserve truth (perhaps in virtue of meaning) in any case whatsoever, and (ii) if there are any such argument forms, are there enough of them to constitute a non-trivial logic? One recent view, logical nihilism, embraces the idea that the One True Logic might be the empty logic. We discuss this view separately in §3.

2.1.2 A response from polysemy

There is more than one plausible model for the underspecificity of “case” in the GTT. The version of pluralism we have been considering allows different kinds of things to count as cases. Sometimes a case may be a mathematical structure, sometimes a possible world (perhaps incomplete or inconsistent).[4] Given this, the underspecification of “case” in the GTT could be less like the indeterminacy that results from variation in the domain of quantification, and more like the variation that results from polysemy. Consider:

Every bank needs numerate staff.

This sentence has two readings because the word “bank”—even once we’re talking about money—has more than one meaning. It can mean a financial institution (such as HSBC), or the building where a such an institution offers its services (such as the bank five minutes from campus). Sometimes additional context can rule out one of the readings, for example:

Every bank needs numerate staff in all of its branches.

in which it is clear that bank-as-financial-institution is meant, and:

Every bank needs numerate staff and a large parking lot.

in which it is clear that bank-as-building is meant.

When we were assuming that the underspecificity in the GTT resulted from underspecificity about the domain of quantification for “every” there was a natural temptation to think that we would get a unique best interpretation by invoking an absolutely unrestricted domain. In the polysemy kind of case however, what can vary is not (just) the size of the domain of quantification but also which kind of object is being quantified over. The result is that we can allow the domain of quantification to be as large as we like, and still no object of the wrong kind can count as a counterexample, precisely because it is of the wrong kind. To illustrate with “bank”: if we mean bank-as-financial-institution, then no bank-as-building can serve as a counterexample to (1) (no matter how unrestricted the domain of quantification) since the sentence is not making a claim about such things. And conversely, if we mean bank-as-building, then no internet bank-as-financial institution can be a counterexample to sentence (3).

So suppose that “case” in the GTT is polysemous. Perhaps “case” sometimes means possible world, but it can also be used to mean first-order model. If the classical logician means first-order model by “case”, then it is illegitimate to complain that he has failed to take into account incomplete possible worlds, and hence has not considered every case. On the case-as-first-order-model disambiguation of “case”, the classical logician has considered every case, since incomplete possible worlds are not cases in that sense.

2.1.3 Choosing a best case?

Let’s continue to assume that “case” is polysemous. Just as there was room for someone to argue that only a single interpretation of “every” was appropriate in the GTT, so a monist might argue here that there is only one appropriate disambiguation of “case” in the GTT, and hence that there is only one relation of logical consequence.

We can develop that thought as follows. The logician’s task is to capture the consequence relation on natural language sentences, but it usually simplifies things to pay attention only to particular expressions in those sentences, such as conjunction, negation, and disjunction, say, or those expressions plus the universal quantifier and identity. Whichever set of symbols we select as our so-called logical constants, the meanings of all the other expressions in the sentences—the non-logical expressions—are determined by the interpretations (or, as we call them in the GTT, “cases”), and since we are quantifying over all such interpretations, in effect we are simply ignoring the meanings of all non-logical expressions.

So now consider what we might say about this argument:

\[\frac{a\text{ is red.}}{a\text{ is colored.}} \]

Normally we’d translate this into the language of first-order predicate logic as something like this:

\[ \begin{array}{l} Ra\\ \hline Ca\\ \end{array} \]

That formal argument is not valid, but one might still want to say that the original, natural language argument is. First-order logic which fails to treat words like “red” and “colored” as logical constants, one might think, falls short of capturing logical consequence.

Generalising, we might think that if you are interested only in the truth about logical consequence, then it is never legitimate to ignore the meaning of some expression in an argument. If simplicity and conservativeness are of no concern, then you should not be appealing to Tarski-style interpretations in defining validity—since the whole point of such interpretations is to allow the meanings of certain expressions to vary, so that they don’t count. Better than any “interpretation” would be a complete possible world (perhaps we can argue about which things are included in “all possible worlds”, but there might also be a correct answer to that question). Hence many of the possible disambiguations of “case” give us different false theories of validity. Those might be useful because they are simple and they approximate the true account, but since the logics they capture are not correct, this is a view on which no pluralism threatens.

2.2 The Normativity Objection

A different objection to pluralism (sometimes also referred to as the Collapse Argument) starts from the premise that logic is normative, where this means that logics have consequences for how we ought to reason, i.e., for what we ought to believe, and for how we ought to update our beliefs when we learn new things. Many writers have thought that logic is normative, sometimes because they have thought that logic just is the science of good reasoning:

In Logic we do not want to know how the understanding is and thinks, and how it has hitherto proceeded in thinking, but how it ought to proceed in thinking. (Kant 1800 [1885: 4])

…logic is a normative subject: it is supposed to provide an account of correct reasoning. (Priest 1979: 297)

Sometimes, though, philosophers have taken the position that whether or not logic is about reasoning, its claims about logical consequence have normative consequences for reasoning:

Rules for asserting, thinking, judging, inferring, follow from the laws of truth. And thus one can very well speak of laws of thought too. (Frege 1918 [1956: 289–90])[5]

…logical consequence is normative. In an important sense, if an argument is valid, then you somehow go wrong if you accept the premises but reject the conclusion. (Beall & Restall 2006: 16)

Many critics have stressed an apparent tension between the alleged normativity of logic and the thesis of logical pluralism. Suppose, for example that if an argument form is valid, then some normative conclusion follows concerning what we ought to believe. (Perhaps it is that we ought to believe the conclusion of an instance of the argument form if we believe the premises, though much work on the normativity of logic suggests that it would need to be something substantially more complicated.) Now suppose that logical pluralism is correct. In particular logic 1, which says that disjunctive syllogism is valid, and logic 2, which says that disjunctive syllogism is not valid, are both correct. Ought we to believe what logic 1 tells us to believe? It is hard to see how we could escape this obligation, given that logic 1 tells us that the premises entail the conclusion, and logic 1 is correct. Yet if the normative consequence for belief does follow, then perhaps logic 2 is falling down in some respect—it fails to capture all of the obligations that follow from our logic. As Read puts it:

[S]uppose there really are two equally good accounts of deductive validity, \(K_1\) and \(K_2\), that \(\beta\) follows from \(\alpha\) according to \(K_1\) but not \(K_2\), and we know that \(\alpha\) is true… It follows \(K_1\)-ly that \(\beta\) is true, but not \(K_2\)-ly. Should we, or should we not conclude that \(\beta\) is true? The answer seems clear: \(K_1\) trumps \(K_2\) [because] … \(K_1\) answers a crucial question which \(K_2\) does not… [This] question is the central question of logic. (Read 2006: 194–195)

Versions of the objection can also be found in Priest (2006), Keefe (2014: 1385), and Steinberger (2019). For pluralist responses, see Caret (2017), Russell (2017), Blake-Turner & Russell (2021) and Blake-Turner (2021). Stei (2020b) argues that the problem can’t be resolved by rejecting the normativity of logic.

2.3 The Change-of-Meaning Objection

A different question is whether pluralists are correct to take rival logicians to be disagreeing. A classical logician accepts as a logical truth a principle which they write:

\[ A \lor \neg A\]

while the strong Kleene logician rejects (as a logical truth) a principle which they write in the same way:

\[ A \lor \neg A\]

But it only follows that they accept different logics if the symbols express the same principle in both cases, and in particular, if “\(\lor\)” and “\(\neg\)” mean the same in both.

In debate, monists have often been willing to allow that the pluralists’ different systems disagree, because they themselves have wanted to maintain that their preferred logic is right, the rival logic wrong. Still, the suggestion was famously made by Quine (1986: 81) that in a dispute between rival logicians “neither party knows what he is talking about” since they cease to talk about negation as soon as its core logical properties are seriously questioned.

Hjortland (2013) makes a useful distinction between two ways in which change of meaning might be thought to undermine the disagreement between rival logics. With A-variance the meaning of “valid” differs between the two logics, leading to a disagreement about which arguments ought to be called “valid”. With B-variance, it is the meaning of logical constants, like “\(\neg\)” or “\(\lor\)” that varies, so that the logics attribute (or fail to attribute) validity to different principles.

The result is allegedly that for two logical theories with the same formal language, say classical and intuitionistic logic, there is no genuine conflict between validity attributions. In the case of (A) because what is being attributed, i.e., validity, is not the same in the two theories. In the case of (B) because that to which validity is being attributed, i.e., the argument, is not the same in the two theories. (Hjortland 2013: 359)

The pluralist thus needs a way to exclude the possibility that each of their preferred systems is correct, but that pluralism itself is nonetheless false, because those logics don’t disagree about anything.

With respect to A-variance, case-based pluralists might choose to simply agree that the different correct logics capture different kinds of validity. They may well think that requiring that different incompatible logics were correct was always too strong a requirement on pluralism. Their goal was to show that they were different but not truly incompatible after all.

One variant of this approach takes “valid” to be a context-sensitive expression, perhaps with a character (like a Kaplanian indexical) which picks out different properties in different contexts. See, e.g., Caret (2017) for a positive defence of contextualism and Stei (2020a) for a critical appraisal.

Turning to the question of B-variance, one way for a pluralist to respond is by giving a theory of the meanings of the logical constants and then arguing on those grounds that the constants in two different systems mean the same thing. Proof theorists sometimes point to the introduction or elimination rules for a logical constant as giving its meaning, and on these grounds they argue that the same thing is meant by uses of it in two different systems. There is a nice example of this in Haack’s Deviant Logic:

But now consider Gentzen’s formulation of minimal logic, (\(L_J\)): it differs from classical logic, not in respect of the introduction and elimination rules for the connectives, but in respect of the structural rules for deducibility; namely, it results from restricting the rules for classical logic, (\(L_K\)), by disallowing multiple consequents. Since this restriction involves no essential reference to any connectives, it is hard to see how it could be explicable as arising from from divergence of meaning of connectives. (Haack 1974: 10)

Other authors take a more model-theoretic approach to connective-meanings, perhaps arguing that shared (or overlapping) truth-conditions are sufficient for sameness of meaning. Stei (2020a) provides a useful overview of the change-of-meaning issues as they threaten pluralism, and the question is also engaged with in Beall & Restall (2001: §3), Hjortland (2013), and Kouri Kissel (2021).

2.4 The Metalogic Objection

Recent critics have raised the question of which logic a pluralist should use for metalogic, i.e. for proving things or assessing arguments about logics, including in assessing arguments for pluralism itself. Suki Finn (2021) argues that pluralism must be constrained on the grounds that the metalogic must always contain both universal elimination and modus ponens. A new book by Griffiths and Paseau (2022: 50–55) argues that the pluralist can tell no coherent story about the metalogic at all.

Presumably the arguments for logical pluralism presuppose some logic according to which certain argumentative moves are legitimate, others not. But which logic is this?

Griffiths and Paseau’s argument proceeds by cases. They survey a list of answers a pluralist might give and argue that each is unsatisfactory. For example, one option for the pluralist is to say that an argument for pluralism should be acceptable in every correct logic. But for pluralists who accept a very large number of logics (so-called eclectic pluralists), there will be too few shared principles to support interesting arguments, and so the metalogic will be too weak to establish anything very much.

One might instead be a so-called modest pluralist and accept Beall and Restall’s restrictions on what would count as a logic: necessity, formality, and normativity. Such a modest pluralist could find themselves with a more restricted set of logics, and thus a larger set of shared principles, giving them a stronger metalogic on this approach. But Griffiths and Paseau argue that this overall position is under-motivated:

[Beall and Restall’s] test for whether a feature should be considered settled is historical… If we look to the tradition of writing about consequence we apparently find some features—necessity, formality, and normativity—settled, and others—axiomatizability, a priori knowability—unsettled. When we consider the tradition, however, no such picture emerges. Rather, we find a thoroughly unsettled picture that couldn’t possibly motivate a modest variety of pluralism. It would certainly be hard to argue that some feature is more part of the tradition than the idea of monism itself: so if anything is a settled feature, it’s the thought that there is one correct logic. (2022: 51)

A further option for the pluralist is to be to be a monist about the metalogic, though continuing to allow that other logics may be used when we are not doing metalogic. Griffiths and Paseau argue that this position is unstable. For suppose the pluralist accepts two logics, say LP and K3, as correct, but for the metalogic they accept only classical. Now we are presented with an argument (in the object language) that uses modus ponens:

\[P, P \rightarrow Q \vDash Q.\]

This is valid in K3 but not in LP. So now what about this argument:

“\(P\)” is true.
“\(P\rightarrow Q\)” is true.
“\(Q\)” is true.

Each premise states that one of the premises of the original instance of modus ponens is true, and the conclusion states that the conclusion of the instance of modus ponens is true. Unlike the original argument however, this one employs only metalinguistic sentences, and we might expect it to be a place where the hypothetical strategy tells us to use classical logic—the logic for the metalanguage—and hence that the current strand of pluralism would infer that the conclusion—“Q” is true—is true. But if so, why not just disquote and get Q? The metalogical monist seems to be able to get around their weak logic in the object language by ascending to the metalevel, making the argumentative step there, and then disquoting to get back to the object language.

The underlying issue is that the truth-values of sentences in the object language and metalanguage are not independent. The simplest relationship between them would be an unrestricted biconditional disquotation principle:

“\(P\)” is true if and only if \(P\)

Such principles are highly intuitive, though commonly restricted to avoid paradox. Yet even with the restrictions, a strong relationship between the truth-values of sentences in the object language and in the metalanguage remains. And since validity concerns patterns of truth-preservation over sentences, there is reason to suspect that the logic of the metalanguage can’t be completely independent from the logic of the object language. Griffiths and Paseau (2022: 54) use the same strategy to dismiss the idea that the metalogic for a pluralist might be an “arbitrary correct logic”, since (as they put it) “the true metalogic must be in harmony with the true object-level logics”.

The final option that Griffiths and Paseau consider on behalf of the logical pluralist is that there might be an argument for each accepted logic without there being a single argument which is valid according to all of those logics. There might be different arguments, as long as for each logic, \(L\), the pluralist accepts there is at least one valid\(_L\) argument for pluralism. Here the worry is again that the eclectic pluralist’s weakest logic is likely to be too weak to provide such an argument, and that the modest pluralist’s restriction to a set of stronger logics is unmotivated.

2.4.1 Breaking metalogical harmony

Let’s consider what a logical pluralist might say in response to questions about the metalogic. Griffiths and Paseau have tendency to write as if the only kinds of pluralist are (a) the eclectic, who embraces a plethora of non-standard logics—perhaps out of a spirit of generous inclusivity—and (b) the modest, who has found any desire to be inclusive constrained by their loyalty to the history of logic, which insists on logics being necessary, formal, and normative. But a different, quite realistic, kind of pluralist is motivated by a combination of different monists’ arguments, along with a desire not to be stuck with too weak a logic.

So suppose—for the sake of a concrete example—that deviant monist A argues that empty names make a sentence neither true nor false, and that we should accept the gappy logic K3 as the only logic for this reason. By contrast, deviant monist B argues from the semantic paradoxes to the view that a sentence can be both true and false, and moreover that we should accept the logic LP as the only logic on these grounds. Now consider someone who studies the views of both deviant monists A and B, and agrees that empty names and the semantic paradoxes give rise to sentences which are neither or both respectively. That person cannot be a K3-monist (because of the semantic paradoxes) but nor can they be an LP-monist (because of the empty names). Rather, they have two choices: accept only the entailments shared by both logics—perhaps accepting the very weak Logic of First Degree Entailment (FDE) or similar as the only logic—or instead relativise validity to the phenomena we are engaging with. Where you have a language with no empty names: use LP. In the absence of semantic paradoxes: use K3. Where both are in the offing, you are stuck with FDE. But when working in languages which have neither empty names nor the resources to formulate the semantic paradoxes, go ahead and use the full-resources of classical logic.

This last step resembles the move that is sometimes called “classical recapture”—something which is common among subclassical monists (see, e.g., Priest 2006: 198 and Rosenblatt 2022). For example, a monist intuitionist motivated by constructivism in mathematics may think that it is fine to use instances of the classical law of excluded middle when the topic is something other than infinite mental constructions. And a paraconsistent logician may think that it is fine to use instances of the classical principle EFQ when working in a language not rich enough to formulate the paradoxes. Neither accepts the principles as logically valid—on the grounds that they are not reliable in mathematics or when reasoning about the paradoxes. But that doesn’t mean that you can never make use of their safer instances. In fact, the situations in which they fail might be quite esoteric and rarely encountered in everyday life.

Though it is standard to refer to such work as “classical” recapture, it need not aim at recovering classical principles specifically; what is key is that it permits limited use of the principles from some stronger logic, and so here we will refer to it as strength recapture, or sometimes just recapture for short.

The pluralist response is slightly different: instead of saying that it is often fine to use invalid arguments (since they are often, though not universally, truth-preserving) they relativise validity itself to the phenomena which disrupt it. In our example, they say that: classical logic is valid on languages which lack empty names and without the resources to form paradoxes; whereas on languages with empty names but no paradoxes, K3 is valid (but LP and classical are not); on languages with no empty names but resources for paradox, LP is valid (but K3 and classical are not); and on the richest languages with both empty names and the resources for paradox, FDE (but not LP, K3 or classical) is valid. Here the pluralist’s motivation is not generous inclusiveness. Rather, they have been driven to their pluralism by the deviant monists’ arguments and by the desire to avoid being stuck with a logic that is too weak to be useful.

What should this logical pluralist say about the metalogic? Absent new reasons to adopt a weaker logic, they can at least allow the use of FDE, but even given their fairly modest pluralism, this leaves them with rather a weak logic. There would be no modus ponens or law of excluded middle, no disjunctive syllogism or EFQ. All those things can be quite useful for proving things and giving arguments. So it would be nice to have something stronger.

And the natural question for this kind of pluralist to ask is: is there any danger of semantic paradoxes, or of empty names, in the language in which they are doing their metatheoretical work? If there are no empty names, then they would seem to be free to use LP, and if there are no semantic paradoxes, then they would seem to be free to use K3. And if neither, then they would seem to be all the way back to using classical logic for their metatheory—even though they are a logical pluralist overall.

In the tradition that runs through Tarski’s (1944) “Semantic Conception of Truth” we usually expect a metalanguage to be at least as rich as its object language (and the metametalanguage at least as rich as the metalanguage and so on up the hierarchy). Tarski’s metalanguage, for example, contains all the expressions from the object language, as well as names for all those expressions, logical vocabulary, and a truth-predicate, all of which allow us to express instances of Tarski’s disquotation schema, such as: “Snow is white” is true if and only if snow is white.

If our metalanguage continued that Tarskian tradition, then it would contain empty names if the object language contained empty names, and the resources for constructing paradoxes if the object language contained those (of course, Tarski’s object language does not contain those resources but if our object language contained them, and our metalanguage contained our object language, then our metalanguage would have those resources too). But even if we assume that this feature of Tarski’s hierarchy holds generally—that is, that every metalanguage is at least as expressive as its object language—it might be that the part of the metalanguage we require for a certain proof, or a certain argument requires only a fragment (a sublanguage, as it were) of the metalanguage, and this sublanguage might not contain empty names or paradoxical sentences. We can formulate a language for talking about a language which contains empty names, where the (meta)language names all refer. For instance, all the terms in the metalanguage might be quotation names for expressions in the object language, and hence the metalanguage would have no empty names itself. Or the object language might have truth-predicates which apply to its own expressions, though the part of the metalanguage that we need for showing that this results in counterexamples to EFQ does not.

For this kind of pluralist, it is quite natural for the logic of the object language and the logic of the metalanguage to come apart in a principled way. It is also quite natural for them to maintain that they in fact continue to be a pluralist at the level of the metalanguage. For what is the logic of the metalanguage? Well, for the fragment of the language that contains no empty names and insufficient resources for paradox, it’s classical logic. And for the fragment that contains empty names but no resources for paradox it is K3. And for the fragment that contains resources for paradox without empty names, it is LP. And for the metalanguage as a whole it is FDE. Pluralism about the logic of the object language, and pluralism about the metalogic as well.

3. Logical Nihilism

The pluralist’s response to the generality objection has generated interest in a related view: logical nihilism—the view that there is no correct logic (Russell 2017, 2018a,b; Cotnoir 2018; see also predecessors in Estrada-Gonzáles 2012 and Mortensen 1989). Nihilism fits naturally into the spectrum that includes monism (exactly one correct logic) and pluralism (more than one correct logic). As with monism and pluralism, what nihilism amounts to will depend on what counts as a logic, and what it takes for one to be correct.

On the version most relevant here, the nihilist holds that the set of correct logical principles of the form \(\Gamma \vDash A\) is empty, so that there are no laws of logic (see Russell [2018a: 309–11] for a nihilism-focused discussion of the form taken by laws of logic).

In the next subsection, we will look at one argument for logical nihilism, but before doing that, we should address the fact that many people’s initial reaction to nihilism is that there is no point in considering arguments for it, because the view is manifestly absurd, or because it is somehow self-defeating.

People sometimes think that nihilism is absurd because it appears to conflict with obvious truths about logic, things that students learn when they are first introduced to the subject. For example, it might be suggested that the following simple argument is just obviously truth-preserving and hence any view on which this is not the case is not worth further consideration:

If snow is white, then grass is green.
Snow is white.
Grass is green.

But it’s important to realise that the nihilist has no need to reject this simple instance of modus ponens. Their view is that modus ponens is not a law of logic, which would require that every instance of the argument form modus ponens is truth-preserving. That’s a much stronger and more general claim. Like other proponents of weaker logics, the nihilist can reject the validity of a putative law based on some quite rare and unusual cases, and then—following the intuitionists and dialetheists discussed in the section on breaking metalogical harmony above—engage in a project of strength recapture that allows them to employ the principles of a stronger logic in circumstances where the esoteric counterexamples don’t threaten. The nihilist thinks that arguments needn’t be logically valid to be good—in part because the requirement of logical validity is so strong.

A second reason people sometimes think that nihilism deserves no further thought is that they regard it as self-defeating. After all, people sometimes say, if the nihilist were right, there would be no good arguments. Nihilism therefore undermines any argument for itself, and so there is no need to consider arguments for it.

But, as we have already seen, a nihilist needn’t think that there are no good arguments, only that there are no logically valid arguments. This leaves open three kinds of argument that a nihilist can employ. First, an argument might be useful merely because it is valid according to their opponents; that at least permits an argument for nihilism that the opponents should accept by their own lights. Second, there can be good arguments which don’t even pretend to be logically valid; perhaps they employ inference to the best explanation instead. Anti-exceptionalists, for example, often expect the correct logic to be justified abductively, and so would not expect the argument for the correct logic to be a logically valid one (Hjortland 2017). And third—and most crucially for understanding the nihilist’s position—the argument form employed might be not be truth-preserving over all cases (and so not logically valid) but still be truth-preserving in the case under consideration.

With these preliminaries out of the way, we examine one argument for logical nihilism.

3.1 Logical Nihilism via the Generality Objection

The pluralist, as we explained in §2.1.1, can use a reductio to respond to the Generality Objection: if we insist (with the monist) that complete generality is a constraint on being a logical law, then it will turn out that there are no logical laws, and that—the argument assumes—is absurd. So we should reject complete generality. But the nihilist thinks this is too fast. Why couldn’t nihilism be true? Then the pluralist’s reductio could be repurposed as a positive argument for the view:

A principle of the form \(\Gamma \vDash A\) is logically valid iff \(A\) is true in all cases in which each \(\gamma \in \Gamma\) is true.
Every principle of the form \(\Gamma \vDash A\) is such that there are some cases where \(A\) is not true but each \(\gamma \in \Gamma\) is true.
No principle of the form \(\Gamma \vDash A\) is logically valid.

This naturally draws attention to P2. Why think that all putative logical laws fail in some cases? The pluralist didn’t need to worry too much about P2. As we saw in section §2.1.1, their embrace of multiple rival logics tends to lead to a view on which counterexamples to logical principles are relatively common and so the insistence on P1 leads quickly to either logical nihilism, or at least a logic that is too weak to be the One True Logic (what we might call logical minimalism). In fact, it’s common for pluralists rehearsing the argument to first suggest it leads to nihilism as a sort of rhetorical hyperbole, and then back off to a logic that is merely unappealingly weak: perhaps the only law is identity,

\(A \vDash A\)

For a pluralist employing the argument as a reductio, it doesn’t really matter whether P2 is true, or only very nearly true; either is sufficiently absurd or unattractive (on their view) for the reductio to function.

But if we want to argue that nihilism is literally true, we need to argue for the truth of P2. So why think that for any set of premises, Γ, and conclusion, A, there is always some case in which the premises are true but the conclusion is not?

One argument notes that we can think of cases as interpretations for the non-logical expressions of the language, and that the ones permitted by classical logic are quite constraining and idealised: there are no empty names, indeterminate or overdeterminate predicates, sentences that take multiple or no truth-values, or ways to model context-sensitive expressions. Natural language might be thought to contain expressions which have all these different kinds of interpretation, so that some arguments expressible in natural language are not well modelled by classical logic. Once we start enriching logical languages to include these “non-ideal” kinds of expression, the logic has a tendency to weaken (though the details depend on one’s substantive philosophical views).

To take a few examples, some people think that natural languages contain empty names, that sentences with empty names are neither true nor false, that the truth-values of complex sentences containing subsentences which are neither true nor false are determined according to the Strong Kleene tables, and as a result that no form is true on every interpretation: atomic sentences, like \(Fa\) are always neither when the term is interpreted as empty, and any compound sentence constructed from such an atomic sentence (including \(Fa \lor \neg Fa\)) is neither too. Hence there are interpretations on which the law of excluded middle (LEM: \(A\lor \neg A\)) fails to be true (because it is neither) and so LEM is not logically valid. On some views vagueness and future-contingents can also give rise to sentences that don’t have one of the classical truth-values. Some hold that the universality of natural languages allows the expression of sentences (like the Liar) that are both truth and false, and from here we can implement the truth-table for LP (taking true and both as designated values) to get a logic in which EFQ, modus ponens, and disjunctive syllogism all fail. Still, it can be hard to see on these familiar grounds alone how some of the safest logical laws, things like ∧-introduction or ID, fail:

\[ \begin{array}{c} A\\ B\\ \hline A\land B\\ \end{array} \] \[ \begin{array}{c} A\\\hline A\\ \end{array} \]

One move the nihilist can make here is to exploit context-sensitive expressions whose extension varies with syntactic context (see Russell (2017; 2018a) for a more formal presentation). If we have a sentence SOLO which is true any time it appears as an atomic sentence but false when embedded in more complex constructions, then the following instance of ∧-introduction will take us from true premises to a false conclusion:

\[ \begin{array}{l} \textit{SOLO}\\ B\\ \hline \textit{SOLO} \land B\\ \end{array} \]

Similarly, if we have an atomic sentence PREM whose truth-value is true when it features in the premises of an argument, but false when it appears in the conclusion, then the following instance of ID will take us from a true premise to a conclusion which is not true:

\[ \begin{array}{c} \textit{PREM}\\ \hline \textit{PREM}\\ \end{array} \]

The nihilist argues that once we have seen ∧-introduction and ID fall to these kinds of non-standard interpretation, it is plausible that no entailment will hold quite generally.

3.2 Responses to Logical Nihilism

Despite its recent provenance, there are already several interesting responses to logical nihilism. Dicher (2021) raises the question of whether PREM and SOLO should be treated as logical constants, rather than as non-logical expressions. He points out that if they were, their inclusion in a language would instead give us new kinds of valid argument, such as:

\[ \begin{array}{c} A\\ \hline \neg \textit{PREM}\\ \end{array} \]


\[ \begin{array}{c} \textit{SOLO}\\ \hline \neg \textit{SOLO}\\ \end{array} \]

(See also Russell (2018a: fn. 15) for related discussion of \(\top\), \(\perp\) and logical minimalism.) Fjellstad (2021) argues that PREM can have a place in non-nihilist logics. Haze (2022) argues that the counterexamples using PREM and SOLO commit a version of the fallacy of equivocation and hence are not really instances of ID and ∧-introduction respectively. And N. Wyatt and Payette (2021) reject P1 of the argument from generality in order to endorse a view they call logical particularism (see also Payette and Wyatt (2018) as well as the last section of Russell (2018a), which proposes a constraint on logical generality based on Lakatos’s idea of lemma incorporation).

4. Logical Pluralism via Linguistic Pluralism

The contemporary debate over case-based logical pluralism has lead to a revival of interest in an older form of pluralism advocated by the famous logical positivist, Rudolf Carnap (1937: §17; 1950 [1958]; see also Restall 2002; Cook 2010; Field 2009; Kouri Kissel 2019; Varzi 2002; Eklund 2012).

4.1 The Principle of Tolerance

In §17 of The Logical Syntax of Language, Carnap writes:

In logic there are no morals. Everyone is at liberty to build his own logic, i.e. his own language, as he wishes. All that is required of him is that, if he wishes to discuss it, he must state his methods clearly, and give syntactical rules instead of philosophical arguments. (Carnap 1937: §17)

Two kinds of tolerance are expressed in this passage. The more famous is Carnap’s tolerance for different languages, and it is motivated both by the thought that verbal disputes are not really theoretical disputes about the domain we are describing. At best they are practical disputes about the most useful and efficient ways to use words, given our goals, and by the thought that such practical matters are best left to those working in the relevant field. As Carnap wrote later,

Let us grant to those who work in any special fields of investigation the freedom to use any form of expression which seems useful to them. The work in the field will sooner or later lead to the elimination of those forms which have no useful function. Let us be cautious in making assertions and critical in examining them, but tolerant in permitting linguistic forms. (Carnap 1950 [1958: 221], emphasis in original)

The second kind of tolerance is a tolerance for different logics, something that is naturally construed as a kind of logical pluralism. The phrase “everyone is at liberty to build his own logic” suggests that no-one would be making a mistake in so doing. And it seems clear from the phrase that immediately follows—“i.e., his own language”—that Carnap takes the two kinds of toleration to be extremely close, perhaps he even thinks that linguistic tolerance and logical tolerance amount to the same thing.

It might not be obvious to a modern reader why that is the case. Why could we not be tolerant of alternative languages, which seems only sensible, without thereby committing ourselves to being tolerant of alternative logics? Moreover, logicians who disagree about which sentential logic is correct (e.g., classical or intuitionist) seem to be able to use the same language (containing ∧, →, ¬, etc.) even while they suppose that one logic is right for that language, and one logic wrong. If that position is coherent, then one side must have made a mistake after all, implying they were not really “at liberty to build their own logic”.

That view seems at least an open possibility, though whether two rival logicians are really advocating different logics for the same language can be difficult to determine. It will not be sufficient that they are using the same symbols, since they might each be using the symbols with different meanings in which case they will be using different languages. But what more, beyond using the same expressions, is required?

This is a question to which there are many rival answers, even for the most basic logical constants. Perhaps the expressions must denote the same truth-function, or have the same intension, or share a mode of presentation, or a character, or a conceptual role. But The Logical Syntax of Language was published (in German) in 1934, before the innovations of Grice, Gentzen, Montague, Kaplan, Lewis, Putnam or Kripke, (and, moreover before Tarski’s (1936 [1956]) “On the Concept of Logical Consequence” (Schurz 1999)) and in an environment in which Wittgenstein’s Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus was a powerful influence. Carnap has quite definite and explicit ideas about both meaning and logic, and these help to explain why he thinks linguistic tolerance leads straight to logical tolerance. In the foreword to The Logical Syntax of Language he writes:

Up to now, in constructing a language, the procedure has usually been, first to assign a meaning to the fundamental mathematico-logical symbols, and then to consider what sentences and inferences are seen to be logically correct in accordance with this meaning. Since the assignment of the meaning is expressed in words, and is, in consequence, inexact, no conclusion arrived at in this way can very well be otherwise than inexact and ambiguous. The connection will only become clear when approached from the opposite direction: let any postulates and any rules of inference be chosen arbitrarily; then this choice, whatever it may be, will determine what meaning is to be assigned to the fundamental logical symbols. (Carnap 1937: xv)

According to Carnap then, the right way to specify a language is to pick some expressions, and then give the rules of inference for them. It is this specification which gives the expressions their meanings, and so, first, there is no question of their being the wrong rules for the expressions—everybody is at liberty to build his own logic, to choose whatever rules he likes—and second, to be tolerant about language choice is already to be tolerant about choice of logic—for languages so-conceived come with different logics already “built in”.

One of Carnap’s reasons for accepting logical pluralism is that he saw it as making space for innovation in logic. In the foreword to The Logical Syntax of Language he writes:

Up to the present, there has been only a very slight deviation, in a few points here and there, from the form of language developed by Russell which has already become classical. For instance, certain sentential forms (such as unlimited existential sentences) and rules of inference (such as the law of excluded middle), have been eliminated by certain authors. On the other hand, a number of extensions have been attempted, and several interesting, many-valued calculi analogous to the two-valued calculus of sentences have been evolved, and have resulted finally in a logic of probability. Likewise, so-called intensional sentences have been introduced and, with their aid a logic of modality developed. The fact that no attempts have been made to venture still further from the classical forms is perhaps due to the widely held opinion that any such deviations must be justified—that is, the new language-form must be proved to be “correct” and to constitute a faithful rendering of “the true logic”.

To eliminate this standpoint, together with the pseudo-problems and wearisome controversies with arise as a result of it, is one of the chief tasks of this book. (Carnap 1937: xiv–xv)

This passage highlights several features of Carnap’s logical pluralism and philosophy of logic more generally. It seems clear that he intended his logical pluralism to be both “horizontal”—that is, to allow for different logics at the same level, such as classical and intuitionist sentential logics—as well as “vertical”—allowing for logics for new kinds of expression, such as intensional logics and second-order logic (the terminology is from Eklund 2012). Furthermore the passage expresses a “logic-first” approach, and rejects a “philosophy-first” approach, suggesting that rather than trying to figure out which is the best logic a priori from first principles (the “philosophy-first” approach), we should let logicians develop languages as they like, and then make our judgements based on how things turn out.

The most obvious contrast here is with W. V. O. Quine, who criticised second-order logic as “set-theory in sheep’s clothing” and rejected tense and modal logics on philosophical grounds (Quine 1986: ch. 5; 1953a; 1953b [1966]; Burgess 1997; 2009). Such a stand-off is quite intriguing, given Quine’s rejection of such “philosophy-first” approaches in epistemology more generally.

4.2 Issues for Carnap’s Pluralism

A number of contemporary writers have been happy to endorse Carnap’s approach to pluralism (see, e.g., Varzi 2002: 199), and Restall argues that it is less radical than his and JC Beall’s case-based version (Restall 2002). Nonetheless there are several issues that someone who wanted to defend Carnap’s position today would need to address. A first concern about the view is that while we are working within the various languages we invent, we could be missing the “correct” rules—the ones that were out there, in effect, before we invented anything. In the words of Paul Boghossian,

Are we really to suppose that, prior to our stipulating a meaning for the sentence “Either snow is white or it isn’t” it wasn’t the case that either snow was white or it wasn’t? Isn’t it overwhelmingly obvious that this claim was true before such an act of meaning, and that it would have been true even if no one had thought about it, or chosen it to be expressed by one of our sentences? (Boghossian 1996: 365, emphasis in original)

Carnap would perhaps not have taken this objection seriously, since, like the Wittgenstein of the Tractatus (e.g., §§4.26, 4.461–4.465), he does not believe that logical truths and rules are “out there”, waiting to be discovered:

The so-called “real” sentences, constitute the core of the science; the mathematico-logical sentences are analytic, with no real content, and are merely formal auxiliaries. (Carnap 1937: xiv)

Nonetheless, such a “conventionalist” view of logical truth (and along with it, analytic truth) has been argued against by, for example, Quine, Yablo, Boghossian, and Sober, and it no longer enjoys the popularity that it had in Carnap’s time (Quine 1936; Yablo 1992; Boghossian 1996; Sober 2000). It also highlights the extent to which it is odd to call Carnap a logical pluralist, since in a way his view is not that there is more than one correct logic, but that there is nothing for logic to be correct about (Cook 2010: 498). Perhaps it would be more illuminating to call Carnap a logical constructivist.

Another issue is whether Carnap’s conception of meaning is correct. These days there are many alternative approaches to meaning and lively debate about them. Field writes:

On some readings of “differ in meaning”, any big difference in theory generates a difference in meaning. On such readings, the connectives do indeed differ in meaning between advocates of the different all-purpose logics, just as “electron” differs in meaning between Thomson’s theory and Rutherford’s; but Rutherford’s theory disagrees with Thomson’s despite this difference in meaning, and it is unclear why we shouldn’t say the same thing about alternative all-purpose logics. (Field 2009: 345)

Field concludes that “the notion of difference of meaning is unhelpful in the context” and that Carnap’s view of the meanings of the logical contexts is therefore hard to defend.

But proponents of particular alternative views about the meanings of the logical constants might instead hold that they can make good sense of difference in meaning in these contexts, and that Carnap has simply endorsed the wrong theory of meaning and as a result drawn the wrong conclusions for logic. One specific issue that they might point to is associated with Prior’s 1960 paper “The Runabout Inference Ticket”, in which he provides rules for a new connective, tonk. The connective quickly leads to triviality, suggesting that Prior was not quite “at liberty to build his own logic” by introducing rules for his expressions.

Another issue is the fact that one can generate different logics, not by varying the rules governing any particular expression, but rather by varying the more general structural rules of the logic, which govern things like whether or not one is allowed multiple conclusions, and whether or not a premise can be used more than once in a proof (Restall 2000; Paoli 2003). This suggests that even if the meanings of the logical expressions are governed by the rules that tell you how they can be used in proofs (as Carnap suggests) two logics can agree on those rules, whilst disagreeing on the relation of logical consequence. Hence even if you have successfully chosen a language, it seems that you might not yet have determined a logic.

5. Further Kinds of Logical Pluralism

Several other varieties of logical pluralism have been proposed since Beall and Restall’s early work, and five are outlined in this section. A useful way to classify these different views—including Beall and Restall’s case-based pluralism—is as each taking logical consequence to be relative to a different feature—e.g., precisifications of “case” (for Beall and Restall), sets of logical constants (for Varzi), kinds of truth-bearer (for Russell), goals (for Cook’s less radical approach), and epistemic norms (for Field’s).[6]

Occasionally it is objected that one or more of these views does not constitute a “real” logical pluralism, on the grounds that it merely relativises consequence to some new parameter, and (the objection continues) this would make the view a form of relativism, rather than a form of pluralism.[7] We take up the question of what makes for a “real” or substantive logical pluralism in more fully in §6. But it is worth remembering that not just some but most of the views standardly discussed under the heading of logical pluralism—including the most central case-based versions—can be understood as relativising logical consequence to something distinctive. They are standardly described as logical pluralisms anyway, presumably because they are views on which it can reasonably be claimed that more than one logic is correct. The literature is thus easier to follow if one doesn’t assume that the words “pluralism” and “relativism” mark an important or widely agreed-upon distinction (S. Shapiro 2014: 1).

5.1 Pluralism Regarding the Set of Logical Constants

Achille Varzi (2002) points out that one way to generate competing relations of logical consequence is to vary the set of expressions that we treat as logical constants. If we take “=” to be a logical constant, then the following argument will be valid:

\[ \begin{array}{l} Fa\\ a=b\\ \hline Fb\\ \end{array} \]

But if the set of logical constants does not include “=” then it will not be valid, since our models will now include those that assign non-reflexive relations to “=”, and these can generate counter-examples.

Should “=” be treated as a logical constant? Tarski himself endorsed the view that any expression in the language might be taken to be logical:

The division of all terms of the language discussed into logical and extra-logical… is certainly not quite arbitrary. If, for example, we were to include among the extra-logical signs the implication sign, or the universal quantifier, then our definition of the concept of consequence would lead to results which obviously contradict ordinary usage. On the other hand no objective grounds are known to me which permit us to draw a sharp boundary between the two groups of terms. It seems to me possible to include among the logical terms some which are usually regarded by logicians as extra-logical without running into consequences which stand in sharp contrast to ordinary usage… In the extreme case we could regard all terms of the language as logical. (Tarski 1936 [1956: 418–419])

Varzi is inclined to endorse Tarski’s liberalism with respect to the choice of logical constants:

The relevant claim is that all (or any) terms of the language could in principle be regarded “as logical”—and I agree with that. (Varzi 2002: 200)

The result is that on his view there is more than one correct relation of logical consequence, since that relation is relative to the choice of logical constants, and there is more than one equally correct set of these, resulting in different, equally correct logics.

The Tarksi/Varzi view is controversial. Varzi defends it in his paper of 2002 and there is useful discussion in the entry on logical constants.

5.2 Pluralism About the Objects of Logical Consequence

Another variety of logical pluralism results if we consider that there might be different correct logics for different kinds of truth-bearer, as is argued in Russell (2008). Suppose that logical consequence is indeed a matter of truth-preservation over cases. Then we could coherently talk of truth-preservation relations on (sets of) sentences, on (sets of) propositions, or on (sets of) characters (as in Kaplan 1989), and ultimately on any truth-bearer whatsoever. This would not be very exciting if those logics all turned out to determine a single “parallel” consequence relation, so that, for example, a sentence, \(S_1\), had a sentence, \(S_{2}\), as a logical consequence if and only if the proposition \(S_1\) expressed (namely, \(P_{1}\)) had the proposition expressed by \(S_{2}\) (namely, \(P_{2}\)) as a logical consequence. Russell uses various examples involving names, rigidity, direct reference, and indexicals to argue that this is not always the case. To take just one, on the assumption that the sentence \(a=b\) contains two different, directly referential names, \(a=b\) and \(a=a\) express the same proposition. Given the minimal assumption that the relation of logical consequence is reflexive, that means that proposition expressed by \(a=b\) is a logical consequence of the proposition expressed by \(a=a\), even though the sentence \(a=b\) is not a logical consequence of the sentence \(a = a\). Hence the relation of logical consequence on sentences is interestingly different from that of the relation of logical consequence on propositions, and there are at least two different, correct relations of logical consequence.

5.3 Pluralism about Modelling

Shapiro and Cook have suggested that the job of a formal logic is to model a natural language (S. Shapiro 2006, 2014; Cook 2010). Since models are simplified structures intended to exhibit some but not all of the features of the phenomenon being modelled, there may be several rival models of the same language, each capturing different aspects of that language. As Shapiro writes:

…with mathematical models generally, there is typically no question of “getting it exactly right”. For a given purpose, there may be bad models—models that are clearly incorrect—and there may be good models, but it is unlikely that one can speak of one and only one correct model. (S. Shapiro 2006: 49–50, emphasis in original)

This sounds like it might support a species of logical nihilism—a view on which there is no correct logic (see §3)—but Cook prefers to think of it as offering two different kinds of pluralism. The first, less controversial, kind holds that which logic is the correct one is relative to one’s goal. If one wants to study vagueness, the correct logic might be one that allows for intermediate truth-values, whereas if one wants to study identity, perhaps first-order classical logic with identity is to be preferred. Since the correct model is goal-relative, so is the correct logic.

But Cook wonders whether his and Shapiro’s logic-as-modelling view could also support a more radical pluralism, since it seems possible that even relative to a specific purpose, there could be two rival logics, each clearly better than all the rest relative to that purpose, yet neither of which is better than the other. Under such circumstances Cook thinks we might want to say that both are correct, and hence that there is more than one correct logic. However one could also hold that in such circumstances there are two equally good logics, neither of which counts as correct.

5.4 Pluralism about Epistemic Normativity

Hartry Field proposes another kind of logical pluralism (Field 2009). The view rests on the thesis that logic is normative (see §2.2) along with a pluralism about epistemic normativity. Field holds that there are many possible epistemic norms, and that we might think of agents as endorsing one, or—more likely—different norms at different times, and as having views about how good different possible epistemic norms are. We use these epistemic norms to evaluate themselves, and other norms (think of using numerical induction to evaluate both induction and counter-induction). Some norms do well by their own lights, in which case we feel no tension. Some do badly even by their own lights, in which case we feel pressure to change them. There’s no sense, on Field’s view, in regarding any of these norms as correct or incorrect, but he does think that it makes sense to call them better or worse, so long as we recognize that these evaluations are relative to our epistemic goals. Still, though this makes norms criticizable and evaluable, it doesn’t mean that there will be a uniquely best norm.

For instance, there might be a sequence of better and better norms for achieving the goals; in addition, there might be ties and/or incomparabilities “arbitrarily far up”. (Field 2009: 355)

Hence we have an epistemic normative pluralism.

Similarly, we can use our epistemic norms—including deductive logics—to evaluate how well various deductive logics perform in achieving epistemic goals we have, e.g., resolving the semantic paradoxes. And again

…it isn’t obvious that there need be a uniquely best logic for a given goal, much less that we should think of one logic as “uniquely correct” in some goal independent sense. (Field 2009: 356)

The result then, is a kind of logical pluralism: logics are better or worse relative to different goals, but even relative to a particular goal, it might be that no single logic is the unique best one.

5.5 Pluralism by Restriction

Finally, Hjortland explores another kind of logical pluralism in defending sub-classical logics from Williamson’s abductive argument that classical logic is the One True Logic (Hjortland 2017: 652–657; Williamson 2017; see Blake-Turner 2020 and L. Shapiro 2022 for discussion). Consider the claim that the ubiquitous use of classical logic (rather than other weaker logics) in mathematics is a strong point in its favour. If we had to give up classical logic, we might be worried about losing a lot of elegant, simple and otherwise virtuous mathematical theories. But preserving virtuous theories, and letting go of ad hoc and otherwise vicious theories, is what the abductive approach in logic is all about.

However, the move from the importance of classical logic in mathematics to the truth of classical logic is much too fast. It is one thing to say that classical logic, including say, instances of the principles of Double Negation Elimination (DNE) and Disjunctive Syllogism (DS), are widely used in mathematics. But mathematics does not require any principles with the full strength and generality of classical logic’s DNE and DS—it only uses some of the instances of those principles, the instances that employ mathematical language. When we say that DNE and DS are logically valid we are saying that they are valid no matter what expressions we substitute for the non-logical expressions in them—including extra-mathematical vague predicates like “heap” or “red”, and notoriously troublesome metalinguistic predicates like “true” and “heterological”.

Mathematical proofs do contain an abundance of instances of classical principles: applications of classical reductio ad absurdum, conditional proof, disjunctive syllogism, the law of absorption, etc. The emphasis, however, should be on the fact that these are instances of classical principles. The mathematical proofs do not rely on any of these principles being unrestricted generalisations of the form that Williamson defends. They do at most rely on the principles holding restrictedly for mathematical discourse, which does not entail that the principles of reasoning hold universally. Put differently, mathematical practice is consistent with these reasoning steps being instances of mathematical principles of reasoning, not generalisable to all other discourses. A fortiori, they may very well be principles of reasoning that are permissible for mathematics, but not for theorizing about truth. (Hjortland 2017: 652–653)

That leaves space for a kind of pluralism that holds that some of the stronger logical principles are correct only when they are restricted to particular kinds of linguistic expression (such as those that feature in the language of Peano Arithmetic); if we don’t restrict them in this way, there will be counterexamples. Other logical principles (perhaps conjunction elimination is on this list) do not need to be restricted to the language of Peano Arithmetic. This leaves us with a sense in which we have different correct logics, depending on which language we are assuming.

6. What’s at Stake in the Debate about Logical Pluralism?

We’ve seen that there’s a vibrant debate about logical pluralism. But there is also an undercurrent of skepticism about whether the debate is worth having. Such suspicion has long been deployed by monists to criticise pluralists of various kinds: if that’s what pluralism is, then it’s true, but uninteresting (Goddu 2002: 222–6; Priest 2006: ch. 12; see also Stei 2020a). But more recently it’s been pointed out that it is incumbent on the monist no less than the pluralist to answer the question of what’s at stake in the debate about how many logics are correct (Eklund 2020; Clarke-Doane manuscript [Other Internet Resources]). In this final section, we tackle some of these issues, which have been implicit in the preceding discussion.

Any pluralism that relativises logics to different domains (§5.3) or otherwise restricts pluralism to different areas of discourse (§5.5) needs to explain how it conflicts with monism. A monist can agree that, given background assumptions about a domain, it may be appropriate to deploy a different logic than the one they endorse. As we’ve seen (§2.4.1), the subclassical monist allows strength recapture in the right domain. For instance, a proponent of LP can allow that, when reasoning about a consistent domain, one can use classical logic, rather than a paraconsistent logic. So what is it about domain-relative pluralism that makes it different from monism? One strategy is to appeal to the practices of those working in the relevant domains. Stewart Shapiro (2014: ch. 3), for instance, derives a pluralism from the practices of mathematicians working in areas that deploy nonclassical logics, such as Smooth Infinitesimal Analysis. Shapiro’s argument depends on controversial assumptions in the philosophy of mathematics, but perhaps it can be made independently of such commitments (Caret 2021). Even so, the challenge remains of defending the pluralist’s interpretation of the data over the monist’s. Why think that there really are two different correct logics rather than that for the purposes of, say, doing Smooth Infinitesimal Analysis, it’s useful to reason according to an intuitionist logic, rather than classical logic?

Perhaps a domain-neutral pluralism, such as Beall and Restall’s Case-Based Logical Pluralism (§1), which holds that different logics are correct of the very same domain, is a more promising candidate for a substantive thesis. There are at least two versions of such a pluralism: semantic and telic.[8] The semantic version has it that some logical term or concept is unsettled, vague, or ambiguous. Let’s take it to be the term “valid” for concreteness’s sake. Then the semantic version of domain-neutral pluralism holds that—even keeping fixed the domain—“valid” has different referents, or admits of different precisifications, all of which are correct. Even setting aside the worries about background commitments in philosophy of language canvased in §1.1, the onus on the pluralist is to explain why the claim of semantic indeterminacy is a philosophically, rather than merely a linguistically, substantive thesis. The worry is that the monism-pluralism debate is about how many (and which) logics are correct, not how many are picked out by our terms. So even if “valid” does admit of different precifisications, as Beall and Restall suggest, the pluralist needs further argument to get the conclusion that the different referents of “valid” are correct logics. Otherwise the monist can object that, if “valid” in English is indeterminate or ambiguous, so much the worse for English. There is only one correct logic, even if speakers of English don’t always manage to pick it out. To meet this objection, domain-neutral pluralists are often better understood as offering a telic version of pluralism (see Eklund 2020: 440–443 for discussion).

The telic version of domain-neutral pluralism consists in two claims. First, there is at least one telos or goal that a logic must meet in order to be correct. Second, more than one logic meets that goal or goals. The second claim might be held either because there is a single telos and more than one logic meets it, or because there is more than one goal that multiple logics meet. Field’s (2009) pluralism about epistemic normativity (§5.4) is an explicit version of telic pluralism. But even Case-Based Logical Pluralism, which is officially about the unsettledness of various terms, might be better interpreted as telic pluralism. This is in part because of the concerns of the previous paragraph, about imbuing semantic versions of pluralism with substantive content. But case-based pluralists themselves sometimes write as if they’re more interested in a telic project. For instance, in responding to a version of the normativity objection (§2.2), Beall & Restall (2006: 94–97) suggest that the goal of a correct logic is to preserve epistemic entitlement or warrant.

Regardless of how particular authors understand their construals of pluralism, telic interpretations of logical pluralism seem to deliver philosophically substantive and interesting theses, not least because many monists agree that there is a goal that a logic must meet in order to be correct. (Let’s suppose that there is only one such goal, to keep things tractable.) Priest (2006: 196), for instance, takes the goal of logic to be providing an analysis of reasoning and argues that only a paraconsistent logic best meets that goal. So it looks like we have substantive room for disagreement: there’s some goal that a logic must meet to be correct; the pluralist claims that more than one logic does that equally well, the monist that only one logic best meets the goal. A problem arises if we have pluralism about what it is for logic to meet a goal, however (see Clarke-Doane manuscript: 17–19 [Other Internet Resources], for a similar argument in a slightly different context). A monist who endorses only classical logic might agree that intuitionist logic best meets\(_I\) the goal of logic, where meeting\(_I\) the goal of logic takes into account considerations that motivate truth-value gaps. But the classical monist might nonetheless insist that the correct logic must meet the goal of logic in some other sense.

So the challenge is to articulate the monism-pluralism debate in a way that is substantive. There are several ways this might be done. Perhaps, after getting clearer about what it takes to meet the goal of logic, the telic pluralist and the monist will find some common ground from which to conduct their debate. Or perhaps we can interpret disagreements between pluralists and monists as involving metalinguistic negotiation. Very roughly, a disagreement involves metalinguistic negotiation if it is conducted at a first-order level, but is best interpreted metalinguistically (Plunkett & Sundell 2013). For instance, a disagreement about whether there is more than one correct logic might best be interpreted about how we should use some of the terms in the disagreement, such as “valid”. Kouri Kissel (2021) deploys this strategy to argue that domain-relative pluralism can allow for substantive disagreement across domains. Perhaps the broader debate about logical pluralism can also be understood in this way.

A final word on monism. One might think that the monist can avoid these vexed issues about what it is for a logic to be correct by just denying pluralism and claiming that it is not the case that there is more than one correct logic.

But this won’t do, for two reasons. First, the monist will need to say which logic is correct. That will involve similar issues to those raised above. If the claim that a certain logic is correct is given a semantic interpretation, then the philosophical upshot of that needs drawing out. If the monist’s claim is given a telic interpretation, then there will need to be careful articulation of, and agreement about, both what the goal of logic is and also of what it would be for a logic to best meet that goal.

Second, denying that there is more than one correct logic is compatible with both logical monism (there is one and only one correct logic) and logical nihilism (there are no correct logics).[9] In order to be distinguished from nihilism, monism needs to be interpreted in a way that is philosophically substantive. That will require the monist to say what it is for a logic to be correct in a way that the nihilist will disagree with. For instance, the nihilist might grant that some logic is best suited for a given purpose, like analysing certain kinds of electrical circuit, but deny that that suffices for the logic’s being correct. Or the nihilist might allow strength recapture under certain conditions (§2.4.1). One option available to the monist is to interpret the claim that there is one and only one correct logic noncognitively. Clarke-Doane (manuscript [Other Internet Resources]), after finding no satisfying factualist construal of monism, interprets the claim as expressing an attitude. Perhaps this strategy could be extended to the debate between monists and pluralists more broadly.

To sum up this section, it’s surprisingly difficult to interpret logical pluralism in a way that is clearly philosophically substantive. That does not mean the debate about logical pluralism is fruitless, not least because it is similarly difficult to interpret monism in a philosophically substantive way. Thus monists and pluralists alike would do well to be clearer both about their views and the philosophical import of them. But the debate about logical pluralism is also worth having because it brings into relief other issues in the philosophy of logic. As we’ve seen, these include issues to do with meaning, normativity, and metalogic. Furthermore, by asking whether there is more than one correct logic, logical pluralism urges us to pay closer attention to what it is for a logic to be correct, and to consider whether nonclassical logics might meet that standard.


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