Robin George Collingwood
R. G. Collingwood (1889–1943) was a British philosopher and practising archaeologist best known for his work in aesthetics and the philosophy of history. During the 1950s and 1960s his philosophy of history, in particular, occupied centre stage in the debate concerning the nature of explanation in the social sciences and whether or not they are ultimately reducible to explanations in the natural sciences. Primarily through the interpretative efforts of W. H. Dray, Collingwood’s work in the philosophy of history came to be seen as providing a powerful antidote against Carl Hempel’s claim for methodological unity.
Collingwood is the author of two of the most important treatises in meta-philosophy written in the first half of the twentieth century, An Essay on Philosophical Method (1933), and An Essay on Metaphysics (1940). They both contain a sustained discussion of the role and character of philosophical analysis and why the method of philosophy is distinct from and irreducible to the methods of the natural and the exact sciences.
He is often described as one of the British Idealists, although the label fails to capture his distinctive kind of idealism, which is conceptual rather than metaphysical. In his correspondence with Gilbert Ryle, Collingwood himself explicitly rejected the label “idealist” because he did not endorse the arch-rationalist assumptions that shaped much British idealism at the end of the nineteenth and the early part of the twentieth century and consequently did not wish to be identified with it.
From the mid-thirties onwards Collingwood’s work increasingly engaged in a dialogue with the newly emerging school of analytic philosophy. In An Essay on Metaphysics (1940) he attacked the neo-empiricist assumptions prevalent in early analytic philosophy and advocated a logical transformation of metaphysics from a study of being or ontology to a study of the absolute presuppositions or heuristic principles which govern different forms of enquiry. Collingwood thus occupies a distinctive position in the history of British philosophy in the first half of the twentieth century. He rejects equally the neo-empiricist assumptions that prevailed in early analytic philosophy and the kind of metaphysics that the analytical school sought to overthrow. His logical reform of metaphysics also ensures a distinctive role and subject matter for philosophical enquiry and is thus far from advocating a merely therapeutic conception of philosophy or the dissolution of philosophical into linguistic analysis in the manner of ordinary language philosophy.
See the separate entry for a discussion of Collingwood’s aesthetics.
- 1. Biographical Sketch
- 2. Metaphilosophy
- 3. History and Science
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1. Biographical Sketch
R.G. Collingwood was born in 1889 at Cartmel Fell, Lancashire, at the southern tip of Windermere. His father, W.G. Collingwood, was an archaeologist, artist, and acted as John Ruskin’s private secretary in the final years of Ruskin’s life; his mother was also an artist and a talented pianist. When he was two years old the family moved to Lanehead, on the shore of Coniston Water, close to Ruskin’s house at Brantwood.
Collingwood was taught at home until the age of thirteen when he went to preparatory school and the following year to Rugby School. In 1908 he went up to University College, Oxford, to read Literae Humaniores. He was elected as a Fellow of Pembroke College, Oxford, while still taking his final examinations.
On beginning his philosophical studies in 1910 he came under the influence of the Oxford realists, especially E.F. Carritt and John Cook Wilson. Until around 1916 he was a professed realist; however, his realism was progressively undermined by his close engagement with continental philosophy, especially the work of Benedetto Croce and Giovanni Gentile. This was partly the result of his friendship with J.A. Smith, Waynflete Professor of Metaphysical Philosophy from 1910 to 1935. In 1913 he published an English translation of Croce’s The Philosophy of Giambattista Vico; he was later to translate many other works by both Croce and Guido de Ruggiero. Both Croce and de Ruggiero were personal as well as philosophical friends, although his relationship with de Ruggiero was closer.
Much of Collingwood’s early work was in theology and the philosophy of religion, under the influence of “The Group” or “Cumnor Circle”, a gathering of Church of England modernists. In 1916 he published an essay on “The Devil” in a collection produced by this group, and also his first book Religion and Philosophy.
At the same time Collingwood was engaged in practical archaeological work, spending his summers from 1912 onwards directing excavations of Roman sites in the north of England. Although he sometimes described his archaeology as a hobby, he nonetheless became an authority on the history and archaeology of Roman Britain, conducting many excavations, writing hundreds of papers, and systematically working his way around the country recording and transcribing Roman inscriptions.
During the First World War Collingwood applied for a commission in the army but was rejected because of his poor eyesight. Having been a keen cadet at Rugby School and an enthusiast for the National Service League, this came as a blow. From January 1916 onwards Collingwood spent most of his time living and working in London in the Intelligence Section of the Admiralty; although he continued to see pupils in Oxford weekly, he gave no lectures between 1916 and 1919. He left the Admiralty in June 1919 and resumed lecturing in January 1920. During his time at the Admiralty he was the main author of two book length reports: A Manual of Belgium and the Adjoining Territories (1918); and A Manual of Alsace-Lorraine (1919). A spin off from this work was his entry on Luxemburg in the Encyclopaedia Britannica (12th ed., 1921).
In late 1919 Collingwood wrote an extensive survey of the history of the ontological proof, together with an analysis of the argument. This survey was given as a series of lectures in the early 1920s. He drew on this material in some of his later work, especially in Faith and Reason (1928), An Essay on Philosophical Method (1933) and An Essay on Metaphysics (1940). In 1924 Collingwood wrote Speculum Mentis. This was a dialectic of what he termed “forms of experience”: art, religion, science, history, and philosophy. During this period he was also lecturing on ethics, Roman history, the philosophy of history, and aesthetics: his Outlines of a Philosophy of Art (based on his lectures) was published in 1925.
Throughout the 1920s and early 1930s Collingwood was also heavily engaged in historical and archaeological work, publishing The Archaeology of Roman Britain in 1930 and several editions of Roman Britain. The culmination of this work was his survey of Roman Britain in Roman Britain and the English Settlements (1936) and his contribution to Tenney Frank’s Economic Survey of Ancient Rome (1937). To add to his self-imposed burden of overwork, his abilities as a linguistically versatile polymath (he was able to read scholarly work in English, French, Spanish, Italian, German, Dutch, Latin, and Greek) were in great demand from 1928 onwards in his capacity as a Delegate to the Clarendon Press.
Partly as a result of serious overwork coupled with insomnia, Collingwood’s health went into decline from the early 1930s. In April 1931 he suffered complications arising from chicken pox and began to suffer from high blood pressure. He was granted leave of absence by the university; following his return, in the autumn of 1932, he began writing an important new book, regarded by many as the pinnacle of his philosophical achievement—An Essay on Philosophical Method (1933). This had its origins in the methodological introduction to the lectures on moral philosophy he had delivered annually throughout the preceding decade. The Essay was a sustained investigation of the nature of philosophical reasoning through an examination of the distinctive character of philosophical concepts. Following publication of the Essay, Collingwood focused his philosophical energies on the philosophy of history and the philosophy of nature. The lectures he delivered at this time later formed the basis of the posthumously published The Idea of History (1946) and The Idea of Nature (1945).
In 1935 Collingwood succeeded J.A. Smith as Waynflete Professor of Metaphysical Philosophy and moved from Pembroke to Magdalen College. He delivered his inaugural lecture on The Historical Imagination in October of that year. He had been elected as a Fellow of the British Academy in 1934 and delivered a lecture on Human Nature and Human History to the Academy in May 1936. These two lectures were later incorporated into The Idea of History.
In 1937 Collingwood wrote The Principles of Art (1938); whilst correcting the proofs he suffered a stroke, the first of many to come. From this time onwards he was conscious that he was writing on borrowed time. His An Autobiography (1939) records his determination to put on record an account of the work he hoped to do but might not live to complete. During a recuperative voyage to the Dutch East Indies in 1938–9 he wrote An Essay on Metaphysics (1940) and began work on what he regarded as his magnum opus, The Principles of History (not published until 1995). In 1939 he sailed around the Greek islands with a group of Rhodes scholars studying at Oxford—a journey memorably recollected and evoked in The First Mate’s Log (1940). On his return to Oxford Collingwood lectured on moral and political philosophy and worked at The New Leviathan (1942) which he saw as his contribution to the war effort. He wrote the book against a background of increasingly debilitating strokes.
R.G. Collingwood died in Coniston on 9 January 1943; he was nearly 54. He is buried in Coniston churchyard in an unassuming grave between his parents and John Ruskin. He was succeeded in the Waynflete Chair by Gilbert Ryle.
2.1 Philosophical distinctions and the overlap of classes
Collingwood’s first mature work, An Essay on Philosophical Method (1933), is a substantial treatise in metaphilosophy which seeks to delineate the subject matter and method of philosophical analysis. Here Collingwood says that the true work of philosophy is “the distinguishing of concepts …coexisting in their instances” (EPM 2005: 51). The moral philosopher, for example, distinguishes between different kinds of good: the pleasant, the expedient, and the right (EPM 2005: 41). When philosophers distinguish between the pleasant, the expedient, and the right as species of the good they are not sorting things into mutually exclusive classes. If this were their goal then the philosophical distinction between the pleasant, the expedient, and the right would imply that
whatever is pleasant must therefore be both inexpedient and wrong; that whatever is expedient must be both wrong and unpleasant, and that whatever is right must be both unpleasant and inexpedient. (EPM 2005: 41)
But this is clearly not the case because philosophers allow that one and the same action may be brought under different descriptions depending on whether it is motivated by desire (the pursuit of pleasure), by self-interest (expediency) or by duty (the right). Because philosophical distinctions bring objects under different descriptions rather than sorting them into classes, they defy the rules which apply to the relation between genera and species in the traditional theory of classification (EPM: 31). In the traditional theory of classification, the adjacent species of a genus tend to be mutually exclusive. Natural history, for example, classifies organisms into animals and vegetables, animals into vertebrates and invertebrates, vertebrates into mammals, birds, reptiles, and so on. These adjacent species tend to capture mutually exclusive classes (the class of vertebrates is different from the class of invertebrates; the class of animals is different from the class of vegetables). While there may be some overlap between adjacent species in this type of classification (the platypus is an animal that suckles its young like a mammal and lies eggs like a bird) these cases are “exceptional and limited” (EPM: 30). Overlap of classes, on the other hand, is a “regular” feature of philosophical distinctions. (EPM: 36). Philosophical distinctions allow for complete not merely partial overlap. It is not merely the case, for example, that some actions may exemplify both the concept of expediency and that of the right (in the way in which the platypus is both a mammal and a bird or amphibians are both aquatic and terrestrial animals), but that in principle any action which falls under one species of a philosophical genus could also fall under its adjacent concept: the class of actions which instantiate the principle of expediency could therefore in principle be the very same as the class of actions which instantiate the principle of duty. Collingwood’s point when claiming that the concepts of expediency and duty overlap goes beyond the epistemic consideration that it is difficult to know a person’s motive in acting, whether they were motivated by duty or by expediency; his point is rather that a philosophical distinction is “a distinction without a difference, that is, a distinction in the concepts without a difference in the instances” (EPM: 50). To say that philosophical distinctions are “distinctions without a difference” is not derogatively to dismiss them as insignificant pedantic distinctions, but to point out that philosophically to disambiguate concepts is not the same activity as sorting things into classes. To disambiguate the concept of love from that of jealousy, (not Collingwood’s example) is not the same as sorting partners into the separate classes of loving and jealous ones. By the same token to disambiguate the conception of the good into the pleasant, the expedient, and the right is not the same as sorting actions into those performed in the pursuit of pleasure, self-interest, or duty. The distinction between the pleasant, the expedient, and the right, (as with the distinction between love and jealousy) is a distinction that philosophers would want to make even if the world were such that actions motivated by duty necessarily benefitted the agent so that the class of actions motivated by self-interest or by duty would contain the very same members. Philosophical distinctions are purely intensional distinctions to which there may correspond no difference in the class of objects falling under the concepts that philosophical analysis disambiguates.
Concepts, Collingwood says, may be viewed from two perspectives, their extension and their intension. From the point of view of their extension a concept is “general” in so far as it gathers under itself “the plurality of its individual instances”. From the point of view of their intension a concept is generic in so far as it gathers “the plurality of its specific differentiations”:
Thus the concept of colour unites all the individual colours of all individual coloured things into a class of which they are members; but it also unites the specific colours red, orange, yellow, green, and so forth into a genus of which they are the species. It may be convenient to refer to the former unification by saying that the concept is general, to the latter by saying that it is generic. (EPM 2005: 28–29)
In the traditional doctrine of classification intensional distinctions piggyback on extensional ones:
The logical doctrine of classification, as it stands in the ordinary text-books, implies a certain definite connexion between these two characteristics of the concept: namely that if a genus is distinguished into a certain number of species, the class of its instances can be correspondingly divided into an equal number of sub-classes. Each sub-class will comprise the instances of one specific concept; the totality of the sub-classes will comprise that of the generic concept… (EPM 2005: 29)
Philosophical distinctions do not follow this logic because they do not presuppose that the concepts the philosopher disambiguates capture a specific set or class. The task of philosophical analysis precisely is to distinguish concepts which coincide in their instances. When two philosophical concepts coincide in their instances the thing which exemplifies them is not a hybrid, as amphibians or the platypus are. It is one thing seen from different perspective or brought under different descriptions. So, for example, a song exemplifies the concepts of music and poetry, but to say this is not the same as saying that it is part music and part poetry in the way in which a centaur is part man and part horse or the platypus is part mammal and part oviparous. Aesthetic distinctions between poetry and music, like moral ones, are distinctions which bring the whole of the object, not a part of it, under a different description. Philosophical distinctions are purely intensional distinctions between distinct concepts or genera. But they are not for this reason inconsequential. Just as those who fail to disambiguate the concept of love from that of jealousy will be not be able to comprehend how a loving partner need not be jealous so those who fail to disambiguate the concept of the good will not be able to comprehend how the pursuit of what is morally right may not be in one’s self-interest.
Collingwood’s account of the nature of overlap of classes in philosophical distinctions informs his philosophy of mind and his approach to the question concerning the nature of the relation holding between the mind and the body. The distinction between the concept of mind and the concept of body (or matter) is a philosophical distinction. The task of the philosopher of mind is to distinguish between concepts which coincide in their instances and to disambiguate what one means, for example, when speaking about the human being qua biological being and qua person. When philosophers so distinguish between mind and body, they do not do this in the manner of natural scientists who sort animals into the classes of mammals and oviparous. Minded beings are not hybrids who are part mind and part body in the way in which the minotaur is part man and part horse:
Man’s body and man’s mind are not two different things, but the same thing… as known in two different ways. Not a part of man, but the whole of man is body in so far as he approaches the problem of self-knowledge by the methods of natural science. Not a part of man, but the whole of man is mind, in so far as he approaches the problem of self-knowledge by expanding and clarifying the data of reflection. (NL 1992: 11)
The philosophical distinction between the concepts of mind and body is not to be confused with a real or metaphysical distinction as argued by Descartes. The claim that mind is a sui generis concept or category that is distinct from that of the body does not entail that it could exist apart from the body. Philosophical distinctions are intensional distinctions with no deep ontological implications. But the fact that they are not meant to cut reality at the joints does not mean that they do not carry any weight: those who fail to make the distinction between the concepts of mind and body are bound to fail to see a distinction between the normative/rationalizing explanations of actions and the descriptive/nomological explanation of events and espouse the view that the mind can be studied and understood in the same way as matter, by invoking causal laws. It is no surprise, therefore, that much of Collingwood’s later philosophy, his philosophy of history in particular, is devoted to defending the autonomy of the explanatory practices of history (which he took to be the science of mind) from those of natural science. Distinguishing the explanandum of history, i.e., (mind), from that of science (matter/nature) is the true task of philosophy, a task that, for Collingwood, has to be distinguished from what he takes to be the pseudo problem of an enquiry into the causal relation holding between the mind and the body. The true question concerning the relation between the mind and the body
… is the relation between the sciences of the body, or natural sciences, and the sciences of the mind; that is the relation enquiry into which ought to be substituted for the make-believe inquiry into the make-believe problem of “the relation between body and mind”. (NL 1992: 2.49/11)
An implication of the ubiquitous nature of the overlap of classes is that the justification for the employment of philosophical concepts cannot be based on empirical observation because philosophical distinctions cannot be empirically verified. A geologist’s classification of rocks into sedimentary and crystalline, for example, is based on the observable features of the two types of rocks and is empirically verifiable; by contrast philosophical distinctions such as those between the expedient and the right, mind and body, cannot be similarly justified precisely because they are distinctions in the concepts without differentiation in the instances. The justification for the deployment of philosophical concepts and distinctions lies in the fact that they enable us to bring reality under different descriptions and view it from different angles, that they enable one, for example, to judge a work of art to be aesthetically beautiful and yet morally reprehensible.
In his later philosophy Collingwood will abandon the terminology of the overlap of classes, but the commitment to the view that philosophical distinctions are “distinctions without a difference”, and that the task of philosophical analysis is to distinguish between concepts which coincide in their instances remains even after this terminology is left behind. In his second metaphilosophical treatise An Essay on Metaphysics (1940) he sets out to disambiguate the different senses of the term “cause”. The term cause can be used, in what he refers to as sense I to mean “reason” or “motive”. In sense I
that which is caused is the free and deliberate act of a conscious and responsible agent, and causing him to do it means affording him a motive for so doing. (EM 1998: 285)
This is the way in which the term is used in the historical sciences or sciences of the mind. The term “cause” is also used in what he refers to as sense II to denote an antecedent condition that agents have the power to produce or prevent. In this sense a cause is
an event or state of things by producing or preventing which we can produce or prevent that whose cause it is said to be. (EM 1998: 296–7)
The term cause is used in sense II in the practical sciences of nature, sciences such as medicine and engineering. Finally, the term cause is also employed in sense III in the theoretical sciences of nature where
that which is caused is an event or state of things and its cause is another event or state of things such that (a) if the cause happens or exists, the effect must happen or exist even if no further conditions are fulfilled (b) the effect cannot happen or exist unless the cause happens or exists. (EM 1998: 285–86)
The main difference between sense II and sense III of the term is that whereas in the practical sciences of nature the cause of an event is an antecedent state of affairs considered from the point of view of an interest in controlling and manipulating the natural environment, in the theoretical sciences of nature the causes of natural events are viewed independently of any impact that agents can have on the natural environment: a cause in sense III is unconditional. The key difference between sense I, on the one hand, and sense II and III on the other, is that in sense II and III a cause is an antecedent condition, whereas in sense I it is a logical ground. When one explains an agent’s intention in acting by ascribing the agent a motive or reason, the action is explained not by invoking something that went on before (an antecedent condition in the form of an inner psychological process) but the motive which rationalises it. Conflating sense I with either sense II or III is to conflate normative/rationalizing with causal explanations thereby also failing to grasp the distinction between their respective explananda: actions and events. The distinction between the different senses of causation, like the distinction between the expedient and the right, is not a distinction between separate classes of things; it is a distinction between concepts that may coincide in their instances.
2.2 Presuppositional analysis
Collingwood returned to the question of the role of philosophical analysis in his second metaphilosophical treatise, An Essay on Metaphysics (1940). While the commitment to the view that philosophy disambiguates concepts that coincide in their instances persists, Collingwood presents the role of philosophical analysis in a different way, by saying that philosophy’s task is to uncover the presuppositions of thought. This change of emphasis, as we shall see, is at least in part motivated by an attempt to present his metaphilosophical views in a language to which the emerging school of analytic philosophy would have been more receptive and to engage in a dialogue with A.J. Ayer’s logical positivist critique of metaphysics.
The task of philosophy, Collingwood claims in An Essay on Metaphysics, is not to assert propositions in answers to questions but to uncover presuppositions. Philosophy is therefore concerned not with propositions but with presuppositions. Propositions are answers to questions. For example, the proposition “This is a clothes line” answers the question “What is that thing for?” (EM 1998: 24). Presuppositions, on the other hand give rise to questions. When one asks, “What is that thing for?” one must presuppose “that it is ‘for’ something” (EM 1998: 26). Without any presuppositions the question would not arise.
Presuppositions differ from propositions in one fundamental respect: propositions have truth-values. They are asserted as either true or false. Presuppositions, on the other hand lack truth values; they are neither true nor false. This is because they do not fulfil their role (that of giving rise to questions) in virtue of being true or false. Just as the validity of an inference does not depend on whether the premises from which the inference is drawn are true or false, so the “logical efficacy” (EM 1998: 27) of a presupposition, i.e., its power to give rise to a question, does not depend on the presupposition being either true or false, or even on being believed to be true or false. This consideration, Collingwood says,
is a matter of common knowledge in scientific thinking; where it is common and even profitable to argue from suppositions we know to be false, or which we believe to be false, or concerning which we have neither knowledge nor belief as to whether we are false or true. These doubts or negations in no way affect the validity of the argument. (EM 1998: 28)
Whether a statement is a “proposition” or a “presupposition” is determined not by its content but by the role that the statement plays in the logic of question and answer. If its role is to answer a question, then it is a proposition and it has a truth-value. If its role is to give rise to a question, then it is a presupposition and it does not have a truth-value. Some statements can play different roles. They may be both propositional answers to questions and presuppositions which give rise to questions. For example, that an object is for something, that it has a function may be a presupposition which gives rise to the question “what is that thing for?”, but it may also be an answer to a question if the statement has the role of an assertion. Philosophical analysis is concerned with a special kind of presupposition, one which has only one role in the logic of question and answer, namely that of giving rise to questions. Collingwood calls these presuppositions “absolute”. Absolute presuppositions are foundational assumptions that enable certain lines of questioning but are not themselves open to scrutiny. The three senses of causation discussed above are examples of absolute presuppositions which structure different forms of inquiry. A physician, for example, absolutely presupposes sense II of causation, according which a cause is
an event or state of things by producing or preventing which we can produce or prevent that whose cause it is said to be. (EM 1998: 296–7)
Qua practical scientist of nature, the physician absolutely presupposes a handle or manipulability conception of causation which makes it possible to intervene in nature to achieve certain intended results, i.e., to restore health. This sense of causation is at work in statement such as “The cause of malaria is the bite of a mosquito” (EM 1998: 299) or “the cause of a man’s sweating is a dose of aspirin” (EM 1998: 299). The presupposition is absolute because it could not be questioned without at the same time undermining the kind of inquiry it makes possible. Absolute presuppositions in this respect differ from relative presuppositions. A physician prescribes a dose of aspirin on the assumption it will cause a patient to break into a sweat. This presupposition is relative because it could potentially be overthrown by future research. But the underlying conception of causation is a condition sine qua non for practising medicine. It is these absolute presuppositions that philosophy seeks to uncover by regressing from propositional answers to the questions they are answers to, and from the questions to the presuppositions which must be made for the questions to arise.
Collingwood’s denial that absolute presuppositions have truth values informs a commitment to a kind of explanatory pluralism according to which the choice between different kinds of explanation does not depend on whether they capture pure being but on whether they are fit for purpose. He illustrates this explanatory pluralism by imagining a scenario in which a car stops while driving up a steep hill. As the driver stands by the side of the road a passerby, who happens to be a theoretical physicist offers his help. The car, he explains, has stopped because
the top of a hill is farther removed from the earth’s centre than its bottom and … consequently more power is needed to take the car uphill than to take her along the level. (EM 1998: 302)
A second passerby (who happens to be an Automobile Association man) proffers a different explanation: he holds up a loose cable and says “Look here, Sir, you are running on three cylinders” (EM 1998: 303). The first explanation invokes the sense of causation that belongs to the theoretical sciences of nature, sense III. The second explanation invokes the sense of causation that belongs to the practical sciences of nature, sense II. The choice between these explanations, for Collingwood is determined by the nature of the question asked. As he puts it:
If I had been a person who could flatten out hills by stamping on them the passerby would have been right to call my attention to the hill as the cause of the stoppage; not because the hill was a hill but because I was able to flatten it out. (EM 1998: 303)
This scenario illustrates that there are different explanations, corresponding to different senses of causation, each answering a different kind of question. When the different senses of causation are disambiguated, then it becomes clear that there is no conflict between the explanation of the theoretical physicist and that of the car mechanic, because they answer different kinds of questions, questions which differ because they are entailed by different absolute presuppositions. Explanations genuinely conflict with one another only if they provide answers to the same question, but they do not if they are answering different questions. The task of presuppositional analysis is to undo the conceptual knots in which our thoughts get tangled when we mix and match answers of one kind with questions of another by failing to see the entailment relations which hold between presuppositions, the question to which they give rise, and the sort of propositional answers which address those questions:
In unscientific thinking our thoughts are coagulated into knots and tangles; we fish up a thought out of our minds like an anchor foul of its own cable, hanging upside-down and draped in seaweed with shellfish sticking to it and dump the whole thing on deck quite pleased with ourselves for having got it up at all. Thinking scientifically means disentangling all this mess, and reducing a knot of thoughts in which everything sticks together anyhow to a system or series of thoughts in which thinking the thoughts is at the same time thinking the connexions between them. (EM 1998: 22–23)
The logical inquiry into the connections holding between presuppositions, questions and answers is the true task of conceptual analysis in metaphysics, a task that must replace metaphysics traditionally understood as the study of pure being. There is no such thing as knowledge of pure being because there can be no presuppositionless knowledge and there can be no presuppositionless knowledge because all knowledge is pursued in answer to questions and no question could arise if no presuppositions were made. The study of reality under the different aspects enabled by the adoption of different presuppositions is not an ontological but a logical enquiry and metaphysics, so understood is, a “metaphysics without ontology” (EM 1998: 18).
Failure to recognise that knowledge rests on presuppositions encourages the belief that pure being is a possible object of knowledge. Traditionally it was metaphysics that was deemed to be the science of pure being. In the aftermath of the scientific revolution this role was increasingly claimed by the most fundamental of the sciences: physics. If Collingwood’s claim that metaphysics should take the form of a logical enquiry into presuppositions is right, then there is no contest between metaphysics and physics or more generally between philosophy and (natural) science because no form of knowledge can claim the title of science of pure being. Philosophy does not conflict with natural science because it does not advance claims about the nature of reality but about the presuppositions under which all sciences, including natural science, operate. Nor is there conflict between (natural) science and other forms of knowledge because different forms of knowledge answer different kinds of questions, questions which arise from different presuppositions. In reminding philosophers that all knowledge, including scientific knowledge, rests on presuppositions, Collingwood rehabilitates the older, Latin sense of the term scientia which is not synonymous with natural science but with “a body of systematic or orderly thinking about a determinate subject-matter” (EM 1998: 4). The use of “science” to mean “natural science” is a slang use of the term (EM 1998: 4) that has that is symptomatic of the prevalence of scientism, the belief that only scientific knowledge is a form of knowledge and that science can answer all questions.
Collingwood’s account of absolute presuppositions generates an interesting angle on the question of scepticism concerning induction. Hume had argued that inductive inferences rely on the principle of the uniformity of nature. If it is true that the future resembles the past, then inferences such as “the sun will rise tomorrow” are inductively justified. However, since the principle is neither a proposition about matters of fact nor one about relations of ideas the proposition “nature is uniform” is an illegitimate metaphysical proposition and inductive inferences lack justification. The principle of the uniformity of nature, Collingwood argues, is not a proposition, but an absolute presupposition, one which cannot be denied without undermining empirical science. As it is an absolute presupposition the notion of verifiability does not apply to it because it does its job not in so far as it is true, or even believed to be true, but in so far as it is presupposed. The demand that it should be verified is nonsensical and the question that Hume ask does not therefore arise:
…any question involving the presupposition that an absolute presupposition is a proposition, such as the question “Is it true?” “What evidence is there for it?” “How can it be demonstrated?” “What right have we to presuppose it if it can’t?”, is a nonsense question. (EM 1998: 33)
Similar considerations, as we shall see later, are invoked by Collingwood against Ayer’s principle of verifiability.
2.3 The “radical conversion” hypothesis
There is clearly continuity between Collingwood’s account of the nature of philosophical distinctions, as developed in An Essay on Philosophical Method and his later claim in An Essay on Metaphysics that the role of presuppositional analysis is to undo the conceptual knots in which unsystematic thinking gets tangled. His attempt to disambiguate the different senses of causation in An Essay on Metaphysics seems to be engaging in a task akin to what in An Essay on Philosophical Method he described as the distinguishing of concepts that coincide in their instances. Yet a major issue of contention in Collingwood scholarship concerns whether Collingwood’s later work, beginning with An Essay on Metaphysics, historicized his earlier conception of the role of philosophical analysis. This is because An Essay on Metaphysics contains a fundamental ambiguity. On the one hand it presents presuppositional analysis as the task of regressing from propositional answers to questions and from questions to presuppositions. This is a logical task aimed at putting order in our thoughts and getting rid of conceptual confusions. On the other hand, it presents presuppositions as historical beliefs thereby suggesting that the goal of presuppositional analysis is not so much to get rid of conceptual confusion as to describe what certain people believed in different periods of time. Metaphysics, Collingwood says
is the attempt to find out what absolute presuppositions have been made by this or that person or group of persons, on this or that occasion or group of occasions, in the course of this or that occasion or group of occasions, in the course of this or that piece of thinking. (EM 1998: 47)
Statements such as these have a strong historicist flavour. This ambiguity exposes a tension between two different conceptions of the role of philosophical analysis. On the first conception the task of philosophy is to delineate the subject matters of different forms of knowledge and denounce the encroachment of one form of knowledge on the subject matter of another. The emphasis is on explanatory pluralism, not historical relativism. The defence of the autonomy of historical explanation in The Idea of History, for example, implies that the role of philosophical analysis is to identify the distinctive presuppositions of history and to distinguish them from those of natural science with a view to combating scientism. The second conception, by contrast, places the emphasis on historical relativism rather than explanatory pluralism. It is this second conception of the role of philosophical analysis in An Essay on Metaphysics that has led to the view that Collingwood’s later metaphilosophy differs substantially from his earlier view of the role of philosophical analysis, a view sometimes referred to as “the radical conversion hypothesis”. The hypothesis of a historicist turn was first advanced by Malcolm Knox in the editorial introduction to the posthumously published The Idea of History. It was also endorsed by early commentators such as A. Donagan (1962 and 1972), Toulmin (1972) and N. Rotenstreich (1972). The expression “radical conversion hypothesis”, however, was actually coined by Rubinoff (1966) who alongside Mink (1969) rejected it as an inadequate description of Collingwood’s position. This is still a live debate in Collingwood scholarship, although more recent studies (Martin 1989; Modood 1989; Connelly 1990; Oldfield 1995; Beaney 2005; D’Oro 2002, 2010) tend to emphasise the unity rather than discontinuity in Collingwood’s metaphilosophical approach.
2.4 The ontological argument and the correspondence with Ryle
The question concerning the relation between Collingwood’s two metaphilosophical treatises and whether the conception of the role of philosophical analysis articulated in An Essay on Metaphysics is continuous with that described in An Essay on Philosophical Method is further complicated by the fact that An Essay on Philosophical Method contains a defence of the ontological argument that appears to be at odds with Collingwood’s later claim that metaphysics is a logical, not an ontological inquiry and with the assertion that presuppositional analysis is a form of “metaphysics without ontology”. The ontological proof is normally regarded as the pinnacle of metaphysical knowledge, knowledge that is both necessary (as a priori knowledge) and has existential import (as empirical knowledge). Collingwood’s allegiance to the ontological proof in An Essay on Philosophical Method would therefore seem to provide further evidence for the hypothesis of a rift between Collingwood’s earlier and later conception of philosophical analysis because it seems to be advancing the sort of robust metaphysical claims which Collingwood’s later conception of metaphysics is keen to leave behind. However, the detail of Collingwood’s discussion of the ontological proof suggests that he had a rather unorthodox understanding of what the ontological proof establishes (D’Oro 2002). Paradoxical as this might sound, he did not seem to think that the ontological proof establishes any substantive ontological conclusions and that it yields the sort of metaphysical knowledge he later explicitly claimed to be impossible. His concern with the ontological proof was intricately connected with an attempt to delineate the subject matter of philosophical analysis, not the existence of metaphysical entities. God, for Collingwood, is “that which we are thinking about when we are thinking philosophically” (Collingwood’s 1935 private letter to Ryle, published in the 2005 edition of An Essay on Philosophical Method, EPM 2005: 257). This claim may be clarified by saying that philosophical concepts are not contingently instantiated in an empirical class of objects (as we have seen, they do not sort things into classes); they are necessarily instantiated in the forms of judgement or inference which they make possible. For example, the concept of the good, qua expediency, is necessarily instantiated in hypothetical or instrumental imperatives and the concept of mind is necessarily instantiated in judgements which explain actions qua expression of thought. This is the kernel of truth that, according to Collingwood, is worth restating in the ontological argument.
Collingwood’s discussion of the ontological argument in An Essay on Philosophical Method gave rise to a lively epistolary exchange with Ryle (the exchange is published in the 2005 edition of An Essay on Philosophical Method). The correspondence was triggered by the publication of an article in Mind by Ryle (1935) which attacked Collingwood’s sympathetic appraisal of the ontological proof on the grounds that there are no such things as propositions which are both necessary and existential, i.e., no such things as metaphysical propositions, like the one asserting the necessary existence of God. Collingwood replied to Ryle in a private letter by claiming that that there is a third kind of proposition, philosophical propositions, which feature philosophical concepts, propositions such as “Mind exists” or “Matter exists”. Such propositions are necessary but not merely hypothetical because the philosophical concepts whose existence they assert are necessarily instantiated in the judgements employed by the practitioners of a given science. “Mind exists” in so far as one explains actions by means of rationalisations, rather than nomological explanations; the concept of mind is embedded in the kind of judgement or inference that it makes possible. The main bone of contention in the correspondence between Ryle and Collingwood was therefore not the ontological argument in its traditional form, but whether or not philosophy has an autonomous domain of inquiry, i.e., whether there are distinctive philosophical concepts, (concepts which allow for complete extensional overlap). As we have seen Collingwood later revisited the claim that philosophy has an autonomous domain of inquiry in An Essay on Metaphysics, where he reformulated it by saying that philosophy is not an ontological but a logical enquiry into the presuppositions which govern thought.
In spite of Collingwood’s attempts to qualify his commitment to the ontological argument Ryle continued to read Collingwood’s defence of the ontological proof at face value refusing to accept that the ontological proof could properly be interpreted as anything other than what it states on the label, i.e., an argument for the existence of God. Collingwood, for his part, insisted on illustrating what the subject matter of philosophy is, by defending a highly controversial interpretation of what the ontological proof establishes. Be this as it may, the misunderstandings between Collingwood and Ryle show how very difficult it must have been for Collingwood to translate his insights in the language of the burgeoning school of analytic philosophy. In spite of the misunderstandings it involves, the Collingwood-Ryle correspondence reveals some of the issues which truly troubled philosophers in the first half of the twentieth century and offers a fascinating window onto the origins of analytic philosophy (D’Oro 2000; Vrijen 2006).
2.5 The metaphilosophical battle with Ayer
In the debate with Ryle which unfolded on the pages of Mind and in the private correspondence Collingwood had tried to defend the claim that there is a distinctive kind of proposition which captures the subject matter of philosophy, but his attempt to capture the distinctive subject matter of philosophical analysis was dismissed by Ryle as being of a piece with a dusty old metaphysics. The drastic change of terminology in An Essay on Metaphysics is at least in part an attempt to defend the claim that philosophy has a distinctive subject matter different from both that of the exact and the natural sciences, but to do so in a way that would not lend itself to the kind of misunderstanding that led Ryle to dismiss Collingwood’s metaphilosophical vision as belonging to an idealist metaphysics of the sort that analytic philosophy wanted to leave behind. This terminological change put Collingwood in a better position to engage with the revival of empiricism at the hands of A.J. Ayer. In Language Truth and Logic (1936) Ayer revitalised Hume’s critique of metaphysics by invoking the principle of verifiability, according to which propositions are meaningful insofar as they are empirically verifiable. Propositions which are not empirically verifiable are nonsense unless they are tautologies. As far as Collingwood was concerned Ayer’s revival of the Humean fork had unpalatable metaphilosophical implications because it entailed that to be meaningful the claims of philosophy must be either empirically verifiable, as the propositions of natural science, or analytic truths, as the propositions of exact science. An Essay on Metaphysics is a pointed attack on the metaphilosophical implications of this claim. Ayer’s commitment to the view that there are only two types of legitimate propositions, empirical and analytic, was, for Collingwood, based on a failure to acknowledge that statements can play different roles in the logic of question and answer. Some statements are answers to questions and, in so far as their role is to answer questions, they are truth evaluable. But some statements have a different role, namely, to give rise to questions and they perform this role not in so far as they are true or false, but in so far as they are presupposed. As such they are not truth evaluable, because they are not asserted as propositional answers to questions. Statements such as “a cause is an event by producing or preventing which one can produce or prevent that whose cause it is said to be” (sense II of causation) is not asserted by the philosopher as a proposition. What the philosopher asserts is not “causes in sense II exist or are true of an inquiry independent reality” (which would be an illegitimate metaphysical proposition) but rather “causes in sense II are absolutely presupposed in the practical sciences of nature”. Philosophy yields not first order knowledge but second order knowledge or understanding of the presuppositions on which knowledge rests. Ayer’s classification of propositions along the lines of the Human fork conflates presuppositions with propositions and, as a result, fails to acknowledge that philosophy has a distinctive subject matter, namely absolute presuppositions, and a distinctive role, to detect presuppositions. Absolute presuppositions are not reducible either to the propositions of the exact or those of the natural sciences. Nor are they ruled out as meaningless propositions by the principle of verifiability because, since they are not propositions, the notion of verifiability does not apply to them.
2.6 Realism and idealism
Collingwood is often referred to as a British idealist, but his allegiance to idealism was in large measure a response to the Oxford realism he had imbibed as a student and continued to profess until around 1916. Hence he tended to be rather wary of the label “idealist”, and in his correspondence with Gilbert Ryle he explicitly rejected it (EPM 2005: 256). However, in his lectures on Central Problems of Metaphysics (1935) he tentatively propounded a form of what he termed “objective idealism.” But, nonetheless, as in his response to Ryle, he continued to rail against those who sought to pin his position down to an “ism”, once remarking that "I am not going to be pigeon-holed into one of your neat categories. Philosophy is a process of inquiry, not dogmatic positions" (Hector 2000).
This reluctance is probably due to the fact that idealism is most often identified with immaterialism and he would not have wished his criticism of realism to be interpreted as resting on a commitment to the claim that the real is ideal or that mind is causally responsible for the existence of reality. If the contrast between idealism and realism is understood as one between two metaphysical views concerning the ontological constitution of reality (is it mental? Is it material?) Collingwood had nothing to contribute to the debate between realists and idealists; he would have regarded it as belonging to metaphysics as the study of pure being, not as metaphysics understood as a form of presuppositional analysis. In An Autobiography (1939) he contrasted realism not with immaterialism but with the commitment to presuppositionless knowledge or the realist view propounded by Cook Wilson and Prichard that “knowing makes no difference to what is known” (AA 2013: 44). Denying realism, so understood, is to deny that there can be any such thing as knowledge of pure being. Since all knowledge takes the form of answers to questions, and all questions rest on presuppositions, knowledge necessarily has presuppositions. Collingwood’s critique of realism therefore takes Kant’s criticism of the possibility of knowing things as they are in themselves a step further. Kant did not deny that talk about knowledge of things as they are in themselves is coherent; he simply claimed that this sort of knowledge is unavailable to us. Collingwood’s critique of realism, by contrast, denies that there is any such thing as presuppositionless knowledge. Presuppositionless knowledge is not a kind of knowledge that it is not possible for us to acquire but may be available to another being, such as God: the idea of presuppositionless knowledge involves an oxymoron because all knowing involves presuppositions.
3. History and Science
3.1 The historical past and the presuppositions of historical inquiry
An Essay on Metaphysics contains a general statement of Collingwood’s metaphilosophy and his view that metaphysics is not an ontological inquiry into pure being but a logical inquiry that takes the form of presuppositional analysis. While An Essay on Metaphysics explained, in the most general terms, what presuppositional analysis is, The Idea of History (1946) and The Principles of History (1999) seek to uncover the presuppositions governing historical inquiry into the past. Collingwood’s philosophy of history asks the question: “what are the presuppositions that govern the historical understanding of the past?” and “what does it mean to understand the past historically?” The nature of Collingwood’s concern with the past is not metaphysical. He is not advancing a theory concerning the nature of time, whether, for example, it is ever-present or a growing block. Nor is it primarily an epistemological concern with the question of how one acquires knowledge of the past, given that it is not available for observation, although he does address some epistemological questions. The nature of his concern with the nature of the past is first and foremost a conceptual concern with the question “What is the historical past? What does it mean to understand the past historically?”
The historical past is the past understood historically, i.e., from the perspective of certain presuppositions, presuppositions that give rise to certain kinds of questions, questions that are distinctive of historical inquiry and differ from those of natural science. The past in so far as it is understood historically (the historical past) is therefore not the same thing as the past as it is studied by a natural scientist. Just as the term “cause” needs to be disambiguated to avoid conceptual confusion, so does the term “past” because it means different things to the humanistically oriented historiographer as it does, for example, to a geologist:
There is a certain analogy between the archaeologist’s interpretation of a stratified site and a geologist’s interpretation of rock-horizons with their associated fossils; but the difference is no less clear than the similarity. The archaeologist’s use of his stratified relics depends on his conceiving them as artifacts serving human purposes and thus expressing a particular way in which men have thought of their own life; and from his point of view the palaeontologist, arranging his fossils in a time-series, is not working as an historian, but only as a scientist thinking in a way which can at most be described as quasi-historical. (IH 1993: 212)
While both the geologist and the historian are concerned with the past, the questions that they ask and the presuppositions which give rise to those questions are different. Scientific inquiry rests on the presupposition of the uniformity of nature. This principle is required to formulate the inductive hypotheses which enable empirical scientists to predict what will happen in the future and retrodict what happened in the past. Empirically minded scientists presuppose that everything that happens is subject to natural laws which are invariant over time, for example, that water freezes at 0° Celsius under the reign of Queen Victoria as well as the time of Henry VIII. But while this presupposition is well suited to serve the explanatory goals of natural science, it is of limited use to historians who are concerned not with what is invariant throughout history, but with what is distinctive about different periods of time. It would not help an Egyptologist to understand the rituals of the ancient Egyptian to ascribe them the mindset of a medieval feudal baron. As Collingwood puts it:
Types of behaviour do, no doubt, recur, so long as minds of the same kind are placed in the same kind of situations. The behaviour-patterns characteristic of a feudal baron were no doubt fairly constant so long as there were feudal barons living in a feudal society. But they will be sought in vain (except by an inquirer content with the loosest and most fanciful analogies) in a world whose social structure is of another kind. In order that behaviour-patterns may be constant, there must be in existence a social order which recurrently produces situations of a certain kind. But social orders are historical facts, and subject to inevitable change, fast or slow. A positive science of mind will, no doubt, be able to establish uniformities and recurrences, but it can have no guarantee that the laws it establishes will hold good beyond the historical period from which its facts are drawn. (IH 1993: 223–224)
Collingwood is critical of those philosophers who, like Bradley (1874), bring the presuppositions of natural science to bear upon the study of the historical past. It is not the role of historians to dismiss as false the testimony of historical agents who attest to the occurrence of miracles on the grounds that since nature is uniform and its laws do not change, the miracles past agents attested to could not have happened because their occurrence contravenes the laws of nature. This “positivistic spirit” (IH 1993: 135–36) encourages a judgmental attitude towards the historical sources rather than an attempt to understand their meaning. This is not to say that historians need to believe that miracles happened in order to understand the sources, but rather that understanding the role that belief in the supernatural had for the agents who witnessed to them is more important for the historian than assessing whether belief in the supernatural is true or false:
If the reasons why it is hard for a man to cross the mountains is because he is frightened of the devils in them, it is folly for the historian, preaching at him across a gulf of centuries, to say “This is sheer superstition, there are no devils at all. Face facts, and realize there are no dangers in the mountains except rocks and water and snow, wolves perhaps, and bad men perhaps, but no devils.” The historian says that these are the facts because that is the way in which he has been taught to think. But the devil-fearer says that the presence of devils is a fact, because that is the way in which he has been taught to think. The historian thinks it a wrong way; but wrong ways of thinking are just as much historical facts as right ones, and, no less than they, determine the situation (always a thought-situation) in which the man who shares them is placed. (IH 1993: 317)
The important question concerning any statement contained in an historical source “is not whether it is true or false, but what it means” (IH 1993: 260). Ignoring this advice leads to writing “scissors-and-paste” histories where the sources are treated as worthwhile historical material and admitted into the historian’s narrative only if they are deemed to be believable by the historian’s own standards of evidence. To understand the past historically is to understand the “context of thought” (IH 1993: 299) of past agents, their frame of mind. What makes an investigation historical, therefore, is not simply the fact that it is focused on the past, but the kind of concerns by which it is guided when investigating the past. To understand past agents is to understand the way in which they reasoned, the inferences that they drew, the conceptual connections which they made, the symbolic significance they attached to certain events. Understanding a past occurrence, such as Caesar’s crossing of the Rubicon historically, for example, is to understand the significance that it had for a contemporary Roman who knew what Roman law permitted and proscribed. This is what differentiates a concern with the historical past from a concern with the natural past:
The historian, investigating an event in the past, makes a distinction between what may be called the outside and the inside of an event. By the outside of the event I mean everything belonging to it which can be described in terms of bodies and their movements: the passage of Caesar, accompanied by certain men, across a river called the Rubicon at one date, or the spilling of his blood across the floor of the senate-house at another. By the inside of the event I mean that in it which can only be described in terms of thought: Caesar’s defiance of Republican law, or the clash of constitutional policy between himself and his assassins. The historian is never concerned with either of these to the exclusion of the other. He is investigating not mere events (where by a mere event I mean one which has only an outside and no inside) but actions, and an action is the unity of the outside and the inside of an event. He is interested in the crossing of the Rubicon only in its relation to Republican law, and in the spilling of Caesar’s blood only in relation to a constitutional conflict. (IH 1993: 213)
To understand Caesar’s crossing of the Rubicon against the background of Republican law is to understand the crossing as transgressing not a law of nature (natural laws apply uniformly to the present, past, and future), but a military norm which banned armed generals from crossing a border (norms, unlike natural laws, change from time to time). Understanding actions historically requires understanding them more like responses to commands that may be followed or disregarded, than as instances (or counter instances) of empirical laws. When understood historically, therefore, the actions of past agents are explained more in the manner in which one understands the action of a motorist who stops at a traffic light (i.e., as abiding by a traffic regulation) than they are in the way in which an astronomer retrodicts the death of a star. The mindset of past agents cannot be investigated under the presupposition which governs empirical science, i.e., the uniformity of nature, because the study of mind, is a “normative or criteriological enquiry” (PA: 171, footnote).
The distinction between the historical past and the natural past corresponds to the distinction between the subject matters of the sciences of mind and nature: the former study actions, in so far as they explain what happens as an expression of thought, the latter study events insofar as they approach their subject matter as instantiating certain observable patterns. As such “actions” and “events” are the correlatives of different kinds inferences. Collingwood captured the distinction between actions and events by claiming that the former have an inside which the latter lack (IH 1993: 118). The point of this claim was to draw attention to the fact that the meaning or significance of an action eludes nomological explanations which account for what happens by subsuming their explanandum under general laws. A historian might, for example, observe certain empirical regularities (in the past every time that white smoke emanated from the Sistine chapel in Rome, large crowds of people cheered), without understanding “why” in a particular sense of “why” the crowds cheered. If a social scientist suggested that the crowds cheered because white smoke emanated from the Sistine Chapel, this kind of “because” would singularly fail to address the question that the historian wants answered. The kind of explanation that would satisfy the curiosity of the historian is one which states something along the lines of “the crowds cheered because a new pope was elected” but such an explanation would not be possible without invoking the “context of thought” within which alone one can understand the symbolic significance of the white smoke. Words like “cause” or “because”, Collingwood claims, are not necessarily
out of place in reference to history; it only means that they are used there in a special sense. When a scientist asks: “Why did that piece of litmus paper turn pink?” he means “On what kinds of occasions do pieces of litmus paper turn pink?” When an historian asks “Why did Brutus stab Caesar?” he means “What did Brutus think, which made him decide to stab Caesar?” The cause of the event, for him, means the thought in the mind of the person by whose agency the event came about: and this is not something other than the event, it is the inside of the event itself. (IH 1993: 214–215)
The inside/outside distinction that Collingwood often invokes to explicate the differences between the subject matters of history and science is a highly metaphorical way of defending a commitment to explanatory pluralism and the irreducibility of historical to scientific explanations. This metaphor has unfortunately sometimes been read literally, leading to Collingwood being unfairly attacked for defending the view that the subject matter of history is an internal, unobservable psychological process and for putting forward an equally implausible method for accessing it: re-enactment.
One of the most discussed aspects of Collingwood’s philosophy of history is his claim that the historical past is not retrodicted but re-enacted. The task of historians is not to establish that a past event had to happen in the past, in a way analogous to that in which a scientist predicts that a solar eclipse will happen in the future, but to re-enact the thoughts of historical agents. Collingwood claims that when historians re-enact the thought of an historical agent, they do not re-enact a thought of a similar kind but the very same thought as the agent. This claim has often been regarded as counterintuitive because to say that the thought of the agent and that of the historian are one and the same appears to presuppose that there is only one rather than two numerically distinct acts of thought: that of the historian and that of the agent. Collingwood’s point, however, is that, since what the historian re-enacts, i.e., the propositional content of thought (he refers to this simply as thought) is distinct from the acts of thinking (he refers to these as sensations/feelings), the criterion of identity that is normally applied to individuate acts of thinking does not apply to thought (IH 1993: 287). Acts of thinking are individuated and distinguished from one another by adopting spatial criteria. By contrast thoughts (i.e., propositional contents) are individuated on the basis of purely qualitative criteria, so that if there are two people entertaining the (qualitatively) same thought, there is (numerically) only one thought since there is only one propositional content. For Collingwood, if Jane and Jim recite the practical syllogism “All men are mortal, Socrates is a man, therefore Socrates is mortal” they entertain one and the same thought. By the same token, a historian who re-enacts the thought of a past agent entertains the very same thought as the historical agent:
… in its immediacy, as an actual experience of his own, Plato’s argument must undoubtedly have grown up out of a discussion of some sort, though I do not know what it was, and been closely connected to such a discussion. Yet if I not only read his argument but understand it, follow it in my own mind re-enacting it with and for myself, the process of argument which I go through is not a process resembling Plato’s, it is actually Plato’s so far as I understand him correctly. (IH 1993: 301)
As the last clause in the quotation makes clear, Collingwood’s account of re-enactment aims to establish a conceptual point about what exactly it is that historians re-enact (the thought as opposed to the acts of thinking) and what the criteria for identifying and distinguishing thoughts are. It is not meant to prescribe to historians an empathetic method for the recovery of inner psychological processes which are not accessible from a third person perspective (Saari 1984 and 1989; Van der Dussen 1981 and 1995; D’Oro 2000). Unfortunately the doctrine of re-enactment has been widely read not as attempting to identify the subject matter of history (thought, rather than acts of thinking), but as seeking to articulate a method by which historian can recover hidden psychological processes that are not accessible from the third person perspective. In the aftermath of the publication of The Idea of History, the re-enactment doctrine was widely associated with Dilthey’s account of empathetic understanding and accused of ascribing to the historian implausible telepathic powers of access to other minds (Gardiner 1952a and 1952b).
Collingwood’s account of re-enactment could be criticised for over-rationalizing the subject matter of history. His identification of the object of re-enactment with “thought”, and of history as a criteriological or normative inquiry into thought, to the exclusion of “feelings” or “sensations”, might seem too restrictive since a great deal of action is not rational, and irrationality has been the driving force behind much that has happened in history. When considering this objection, one must bear in mind that “history” understood as a form of inquiry distinct from natural science should not be conflated with “history” as an academic discipline practised in university departments. Practising historians will inevitably be concerned with much more than “thought” and the specific norms by which past agents led their lives. They will inevitably mention irrational factors, just as they mention arational natural forces (earthquakes, floods and other natural phenomena that impact on historical agents). Collingwood’s goal was not to tell historians what they can and cannot say about what happened in the past, but to distinguish between two very different ways in which the past can be approached: under the assumption of the uniformity of nature and under the assumption that the deeds of historical agents are responses to norms rather than instances of natural laws.
Collingwood’s account of re-enactment certainly implies that the historical past is in principle knowable, that it is possible to mediate reality through the conceptual framework, for example, of the ancient Egyptians or the ancient Greeks. This is not to say that the past can be known in itself, or independently of any conceptual mediation, but that it can be seen from the perspective of past agents, through the categorial framework that mediated their conception of reality. While there are additional epistemic obstacles in the way of understanding agents from a distant past, agents who we cannot engage in a live conversation, knowledge of the past is in principle achievable because understanding past agents is not a radically different task from that of understanding the thoughts of our contemporaries. Historical knowledge, Collingwood says
is not concerned only with a remote past. It is by historical thinking that we re-think and so rediscover the thoughts of Hammurabi or Solon, it is in the same way that we discover the thought of a friend who writes us a letter, or a friend who crosses the street. (IH 1993: 219)
In so far as Collingwood’s account of re-enactment defends the possibility of knowing the past as it always was for historical agents (the historian, as we have seen, seeks to establish what crossing the Rubicon meant to a Roman cognizant of Republican law) it goes against a view that became dominant in the latter part of the twentieth century, according to which the past cannot be known as it always was because it is constantly and necessarily revised from the perspective of the present. This view was endorsed with varying degrees of emphasis in the philosophical hermeneutics of H-G. Gadamer, in the philosophy of history, and the philosophy of language. Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics claimed that the past “is understood only if it is understood in a different way every time” (1960 [1975: 275]) because the meaning of a text is the result of a fusion of the horizons of the text to be interpreted and the horizon of the interpreter. In the philosophy of history narrativists such as Hayden White (1973), Frank Ankersmit (1983) and Keith Jenkins (1991) emphasised the cultural endowment of the historian as the lens through which the past is accessed. Even the philosophy of language was not immune from this trend. Quine (1960) famously denied that it is possible to achieve determinacy in translation in direct opposition to Collingwood’s claim that it is at least in principle possible to re-enact the very same thought as the historical agent. This revisionary view of the past goes against Collingwood’s conception of what it means to understand the past historically. The task of the historian, as he saw it, is to transport us to another world by immersing oneself in the historical agent’s own context of thought.
3.3 The argument against methodological unity
Collingwood’s philosophy of history is a sustained attempt to delineate the subject matter of history and why this subject matter cannot be captured by adopting the methods of natural science. He is critical of the argument, advanced by John Stuart Mill that the distinction between the human and the natural sciences is merely a distinction in the degree of accuracy that can be reached in their respective domains of inquiry. In his System of Logic (1843), Mill argued that the subject matter of psychology differs from that of the natural sciences because psychology studies human actions. Yet the method by which the psychologist studies human actions is the same (inductive) method that is operative in natural science. Psychologists predict human behaviour in the same way in which natural scientists predict natural events, by inferring it from certain antecedent conditions and empirical generalisations. While the generalisations of psychologists invoke psychological rather than natural laws, the method is the same. The difference between psychology and natural science lies in the fact that the predictions of psychologists unlike, say, those of astronomers are imprecise. Such a difference, for Mill, is insufficiently robust to support the claim for disunity in the sciences. The most accurate way of drawing the distinction between psychology and astronomy is not to deny that psychology is a (natural) science, but to acknowledge that there are two kinds of natural sciences, those which are precise (like astronomy) and those which are imprecise (like psychology). According to Mill’s way of drawing the distinction psychology is, like tidology and meteorology, an inexact (natural) science. The contrast (for Mill) is therefore not between two kinds of sciences in the Latin sense of scientia, meaning two distinct kinds of knowledge, but between different kinds of natural sciences: exact and inexact. Collingwood rejected Mill’s suggestion that the reconstruction of the thoughts of historical agents is a past-directed empirical psychology. The study of mind is, as we saw earlier, a normative or criteriological endeavour because to understand past agents historically is to understand the conceptual connections they made by reconstructing their thought-context. The subject matter of history, Collingwood claims, is not merely human actions but res gestae. These
are not the actions, in the widest sense of that word, which are done by animals of the species called human; they are actions in another sense of the same word, equally familiar but narrower, actions done by reasonable agents in pursuit of ends determined by their reason. (PH: 46)
Psychology, as understood by Mill, is what in An Essay on Metaphysics Collingwood calls a “pseudo-science of thought” (EM 1998: 142) because it fails to acknowledge that the concept of mind is, in the words of Gallie (1956), an essentially contested concept that (like “cause”, “action”, “science”, and “the past”) needs to be disambiguated. This is not to say that empirical psychology is not a legitimate scientific pursuit, but that the subject matter of empirical psychology and that of history are not the same and that the attempt to capture the mind by the methods of empirical science should be denounced as the attempt by one form of knowledge to trespass on the territory of another.
The distinction between the method of history and that of science is not a distinction between the explanations of psychology understood as an empirical science of the mind and those of physics or astronomy. It is a distinction between two different forms of knowing with distinctive explananda: actions and events. The action/event distinction designates therefore not a distinction between inner/private psychological processes and outward/observable phenomena, but between two different ways of knowing the past: qua actions or qua events. The description of the past qua actions is the correlative of a certain kind of (historical) explanation; the description of the past qua events is the correlative of a certain kind of scientific/nomological explanation. The action/event distinction is, in the vocabulary of An Essay on Philosophical Method a philosophical distinction which does not capture two separate classes of things, but brings the past under different descriptions, qua natural and qua historical past.
The relevance of Collingwood’s defence of the autonomy of history to debates concerning the unity/disunity of science was brought to the attention of a wider audience by W. H. Dray during the 1950s and 60s. Dray (1958, 1963) located Collingwood’s action/event distinction within the context of contemporary debates in the philosophy of social science and drew on the work of Collingwood to reject the claim for methodological unity advanced by Hempel in his influential 1942 article: “The Function of General Laws in History”. Hempel claimed that explanations in history are covertly nomological explanations because historians, just as natural scientists, rely upon general laws, even if they do not explicitly mention them. Dray argued that Hempel failed to see that what distinguishes action from event explanations is the nature of the connection between the explanans and the explanandum. In naturalistic explanations the explanans is an antecedent condition, a state of affairs which precedes in time the event whose cause it is said to be; in the historical explanation of action the explanans is the logical ground of an action, the thought that renders the action intelligible. Whilst in the 1950s and 60s Collingwood played an important role in the debate concerning the logical form of action explanation and how it differs from the causal explanation of events, his work became less influential in the second half of the twentieth century. The neglect into which Collingwood’s account of action and its explanation has fallen is linked to a change in metaphilosophical assumptions and the return of the kind of metaphysics which he had sought to replace with the presuppositional analysis described in An Essay on Metaphysics.
As we saw, according to Collingwood the distinction between the explanation of action and of events was a distinction between different forms of inferences or, as he put it in An Essay on Metaphysics, between the different senses that the term “cause” or “because” has in different explanatory contexts. Collingwood’s metaphysics of absolute presuppositions committed him to a form of explanatory pluralism in which different kinds of explanations do not compete because they answer different questions, which arise because of different presuppositions; the choice between one kind of explanation and another depends on whether they are fit for purpose, i.e., whether they satisfy the curiosity of the person who is asking the question. With the return of a more robust form of metaphysics, the suggestion that the choice between one type of explanation and another could be resolved by disambiguating which sense of causation needs to be invoked in order to satisfy the curiosity of the questioner came to be dismissed as an attempt to get away with ontologically light weight solutions to the problem of the relation between the science of mind and nature. The predominant problem in the philosophy of mind and action became that of how the mind can fit in the natural world, a question which presupposes the kind of metaphysics that Collingwood sought to leave behind.
Much philosophy of history tends to be governed by an epistemological concern with how historical knowledge is possible beginning from the assumption that historical knowledge is knowledge of the past. The primary task of a philosophy of history is consequently taken to be that of explaining how the past can be known given that, unlike the present, it is not available for observation, nor can it be reproduced under experimental conditions. Collingwood’s approach to the philosophy of history is quite different. He denied that a mere concern with the past is sufficient to identify a distinctive subject matter for historical inquiry, one which justifies considering history as a science, in the Latin sense of scientia, i.e., a form of knowing. The past after all is studied by geologists, as well as historians so if history is a distinctive form of knowing it must do more than merely study the past. He therefore took the primary task of a philosophy of history to be that of articulating not an epistemological theory accounting for how the past can be known, but that of disambiguating the subject matter of history from that of natural science by applying the presuppositional analysis that he had expounded in An Essay on Metaphysics to historical knowledge. The application of this presuppositional analysis yields the claim that the presuppositions of history are different from those of natural science because reenacting the thoughts of past agents involves re-thinking conceptual connections. Historians presuppose that past agents are responsive to norms, not that their behaviour conforms to natural laws. The task of philosophical analysis is to uncover these different presuppositions with a view to showing that there is no conflict between the claims of history and those of science, not because historical explanations are incomplete nomological explanations, but because they are complete explanations of a different kind, which answer different kinds of questions. This of course is not to deny that there are important epistemological questions concerning the past but rather that the distinctive epistemology of historical knowing can be articulated only once the kind of past with which history is concerned is clearly identified:
… a great many things which deeply concern human beings are not, and never have been, traditionally included in the subject-matter of history. People are born, eat and breathe and sleep, and beget children and become ill and recover again, and die; and these things interest them, most of them at any rate, far more than art and science, industry and politics and war. Yet none of these things have been traditionally regarded as possessing historical interest. Most of them have given rise to institutions like dining and marrying and the various rituals that surround birth and death, sickness and recovery; and of these rituals and institutions people write histories; but the history of dining is not the history of eating, and the history of death-rituals is not the history of death. (PH: 46).
If Collingwood’s philosophy of history is an attempt to identify the distinctive subject matter of history and the logical form of historical judgements, then his metaphilosophy should be understood as defending a form of explanatory pluralism, not a form of historical relativism (D’Oro 2018b). The latter claims that belief systems are beyond criticism because truth and falsity are relative to what certain people, at certain times, believe to be true. The former, by contrast, claims that different kinds of explanations are answers to different kinds of questions and that the task of philosophical analysis is to undo the conceptual knots in which we get tangled when we fail to order our thoughts with due care. This of course is an interpretative claim that advocates of the radical conversion hypothesis (see section 2.3 above) are likely to deny insofar as they tend to read Collingwood’s metaphilosophy as articulating not a defence of the autonomy of philosophy, but as dissolving philosophy into a descriptive study of the belief systems that different people had through time.
A. Primary literature
A.1 Collingwood’s published works
- [RP] Religion and Philosophy, London: Macmillan Press, 1916.
- [SM] Speculum Mentis, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1924.
- [EPM] An Essay on Philosophical Method, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1933; revised edition, with an introduction by James Connelly and Giuseppina D’Oro, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005.
- [PA] The Principles of Art, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1938.
- [AA] An Autobiography, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1939; revised edition, R.G. Collingwood: An Autobiography and other writings, with essays on Collingwood’s life and work, edited by David Boucher and Teresa Smith, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2013.
- [EM] An Essay on Metaphysics, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1940; revised edition, with an introduction by Rex Martin, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998.
- [NL] The New Leviathan, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1942; revised edition, edited and introduced by David Boucher, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1992.
- [IN] The Idea of Nature, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1945.
- [IH] The Idea of History, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1946; revised edition, with an introduction by Jan Van der Dussen, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1993.
- [EPA] Essays in the Philosophy of Art, edited and introduced by A. Donagan, Bloomington: University of Indiana Press, 1964.
- [EPH] Essays in the Philosophy of History, edited and introduced by W. Debbins, Austin: University of Texas Press, 1965.
- [FR] Faith and Reason: Essays in the Philosophy of Religion, edited and introduced by L. Rubinoff, Chicago: Quadrangle Books, 1968.
- [EPP] Essays in Political Philosophy, D. Boucher (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989.
- [PH] The Principles of History, W. H. Dray and Jan Van der Dussen (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999.
- [PE] The Philosophy of Enchantment, David Boucher, Wendy James and Philip Smallwood (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005.
- Connelly, J., Johnson, P. and Leach, S., 2014, R. G. Collingwood: A Research Companion, London: Bloomsbury. [Comprehensive bibliography of works by Collingwood as well as bibliographies of secondary literature, together with a chronology and details of correspondence.]
A.3 Collingwood’s unpublished manuscripts
Several of Collingwood’s manuscripts have been published alongside new or recent re-editions of his work, notably, The Idea of History (edited by J. Van der Dussen), The Principles of History (edited by W.H. Dray and J. Van der Dussen), The New Leviathan (edited by D. Boucher), An Essay on Metaphysics (edited by R. Martin), An Essay on Philosophical Method (edited by J. Connelly and G. D’Oro) and The Philosophy of Enchantment (edited by David Boucher, Wendy James and Philip Smallwood). However, a significant number of Collingwood’s manuscripts are still unpublished. They are deposited in the Bodleian library where copies of the originals can be viewed on microfilm. The originals can also be consulted with the permission of R.G. Collingwood’s daughter, Teresa Smith. Of particular relevance amongst the unpublished materials are the 1919 Lectures on the Ontological Proof, the Central Problems of Metaphysics and the Lectures on Moral Philosophy. The first is a substantial and quite polished discussion of the ontological argument (almost 100 pages), the second is also a very substantial piece dealing with the realism/idealism antinomy. The material on moral philosophy is very extensive. Collingwood wrote and rewrote the Lectures on Moral Philosophy through the 1920s and very early 30s. Each time he added a methodological introduction. The methodological introductions eventually took on a life of their own and they were eventually published as An Essay on Philosophical Method in 1933. The 1929 and 1932 versions of the methodological introductions deserve a special mention as they shed a great deal of light on Collingwood’s conception of philosophical method.
For a complete list of the unpublished manuscripts by R. G. Collingwood, see Connelly, Johnson and Leach (eds.) 2014. The following is a very selective list of material which is still unpublished and is currently available in the Bodleian library.
- 1919 Lectures on the Ontological Proof of the Existence of God, Bodleian library, Collingwood dep. 2.
- 1923 Lectures on Moral Philosophy Collingwood dep 3.
- 1928? Commentary on the preface to the Critique of Pure Reason, Bodleian library, Collingwood dep. 22/4.
- 1929 Lectures on Moral Philosophy, Bodleian library, Collingwood dep. 10.
- 1932 Lectures on Moral Philosophy, Bodleian library, Collingwood dep. 10.
- 1933 Lectures on Moral Philosophy, Bodleian library, Collingwood dep. 8.
- 1935 The Central Problems of Metaphysics: Realism and Idealism, Bodleian library, Collingwood dep. 20/1.
2000 Hector, L.J. Correspondence with D. Boucher.
B. Secondary literature
B.1 Main commentaries
- Boucher, David, 1989, The Social and Political Thought of R. G. Collingwood, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511624698
- Browning, Gary K., 2004, Rethinking R. G. Collingwood: Philosophy, Politics and the Unity of Theory and Practice, London: Palgrave Macmillan UK. doi:10.1057/9780230005754
- Connelly, James, 2003, Metaphysics, Method and Politics: The Political Philosophy of R.G. Collingwood, Exeter: Imprint Academic.
- Donagan, Alan, 1962, The Later Philosophy of R. G. Collingwood, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- D’Oro, Giuseppina, 2002, Collingwood and the Metaphysics of Experience, London and New York: Routledge.
- Dray, William H., 1957, Laws and Explanation in History, London: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 1995, History as Re-Enactment: R. G. Collingwood’s Idea of History, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198238812.001.0001
- Martin, Rex, 1977, Historical Explanation: Re-enactment and Practical Inference, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
- Mink, Louis O., 1969 , Mind, History and Dialectic: The Philosophy of R. G. Collingwood, Bloomington, IN: University of Indiana Press, 1969; republished Middletown, Conn: Wesleyan University Press.
- Rubinoff, Lionel, 1970, Collingwood and the Reform of Metaphysics: A Study in the Philosophy of Mind, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
- Saari, Heikki, 1984, Re-Enactment: A Study in R.G. Collingwood’s Philosophy of History, (Acta Academiae Aboensis, Ser. A, Vol. 63, No. 2), Abo: Abo Akademi.
- Van der Dussen, Jan, 1981 , History as a Science: the Philosophy of R. G. Collingwood, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff publishers; revised edition, Dordrecht: Springer, 2012.
B.2 Other secondary sources
- Ankersmit, Frank, 1983, Narrative Logic: A Semantic Analysis of the Historian’s Language, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff Publishers.
- Ayer, A. J., 1936, Language, Truth and Logic, London: Victor Gollancz Ltd.; reprinted London: Penguin Books, 1990.
- Beaney, Michael, 2005, “Collingwood’s Conception of Presuppositional Analysis”, Collingwood and British Idealism Studies, 11(2): 41–114.
- Botros, Sophie, 2017, Truth, Time and History: A Philosophical Inquiry, London: Bloomsbury.
- Boucher, David, 1987, “The Two Leviathans : R. G. Collingwood and Thomas Hobbes”, Political Studies, 35(3): 443–460. doi:10.1111/j.1467-9248.1987.tb00199.x
- –––, 1993, “Human Conduct, History and Social Science in the Works of R. G. Collingwood and Michael Oakeshott”, New Literary History, 24(3): 697–717. doi:10.2307/469432
- –––, 1995, “The Principles of History and the Cosmology Conclusion to The Idea of Nature”, Collingwood Studies, 2: 140–170.
- –––, 1997, “The Significance of R. G. Collingwood’s ‘Principles of History’”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 58(2): 309–330. doi:10.2307/3653871
- –––, 2002, “Collingwood and Anthropology as a Philosophical Science”, History of Political Thought, 23(2): 303–325.
- Boucher, David, James Connelly, and Tariq Modood (eds), 1995, Philosophy, History and Civilization: Interdisciplinary Perspectives on R. G. Collingwood, Cardiff: University of Wales Press.
- Bradley, Francis Herbert, 1874 , The Presuppositions of Critical History, Oxford: James Parker. Reprinted with Guy Stock (ed.), Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 1993.
- Cebik, Leroy B., 1970, “Collingwood: Action, Re-enactment and Evidence”, Philosophical Forum, 2: 68–90.
- Connelly, James, 1990, “Metaphysics and Method: A Necessary Unity in the Philosophy of R.G. Collingwood”, Storia, Antropogia e Scienze del Linguaggio, 5(1–2): 33–156 (Rome: Bulzoni editore).
- –––, 1995, “Art Thou the Man? Croce, Gentile or De Ruggiero”, in Boucher, Connelly, and Modood 1995: 92–114.
- –––, 1997, “Bradley, Collingwood and the ‘Other Metaphysics’”, Bradley Studies, 3(2): 89–112. doi:10.5840/bradley19973214
- –––, 1998, “Natural Science, History and Christianity: the Origins of Collingwood’s Later Metaphysics”, Collingwood Studies, 4: 101–132.
- –––, 2005, “The Hesitant Hegelian: Collingwood, Hegel, and Inter-War Oxford”, Hegel Bulletin, 26(1–2): 57–73 (or Bulletin of the Hegel Society of Great Britain, 51/53: 57–73). doi:10.1017/S0263523200002196
- –––, 2008, “R.G. Collingwood, Analytical Philosophy And Logical Positivism”, Baltic International Yearbook of Cognition, Logic and Communication, 4. doi:10.4148/biyclc.v4i0.126 [Connelly 20088 available online]
- –––, 2018, “Thinking in Circles: The Strata of R.G. Collingwood’s Intellectual Life”, Collingwood and British Idealism Studies, 24(2): 171–198.
- Connelly, James and Alan Costall, 2000, “R.G. Collingwood and the Idea of a Historical Psychology”, Theory & Psychology, 10(2): 147–170. doi:10.1177/0959354300102001
- Davidson, Donald, 1963, “Actions, Reasons and Causes”, Journal of Philosophy, 60(23): 685–700. Reprinted in his Essays on Actions and Events, Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press, 1980, 3–20.
- –––, 1973 , “Radical Interpretation”, Dialectica, 27: 313–328. Reprinted in his Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2001, pp. 125–139.
- Dharamsi, Karim, Giuseppina D’Oro, and Stephen Leach (eds), 2018, Collingwood on Philosophical Methodology, London: Palgrave Macmillan.
- Donagan, Alan, 1964 , “Historical Explanation: The Popper-Hempel Theory Reconsidered”, History and Theory, 4(1): 3–26. Reprinted with some slight alterations as “The Popper-Hempel Theory Reconsidered” in Dray 1966: 127–159. doi:10.2307/2504200
- –––, 1972, “Collingwood and Philosophical Method”, in Krausz 1972: 1–19.
- D’Oro, Giuseppina, 2000, “Collingwood on Re-Enactment and The Identity of Thought”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 38(1): 87–101. doi:10.1353/hph.2005.0091
- –––, 2004, “Re-Enactment and Radical Interpretation”, History and Theory, 43(2): 198–208. doi:10.1111/j.1468-2303.2004.00275.x
- –––, 2010, “The Myth of Collingwood’s Historicism”, Inquiry, 53(6): 627–641. doi:10.1080/0020174X.2010.526326
- –––, 2013, “Understanding Others: Cultural Anthropology with Collingwood and Quine”, Journal of the Philosophy of History, 7(3): 326–345. doi:10.1163/18722636-12341256
- –––, 2015, “History and Idealism: Collingwood and Oakeshott”, in The Routledge Companion to Hermeneutics, Jeff Malpas (ed.), London: Routledge, pp. 191–204.
- –––, 2018a, “The Touch of King Midas: Collingwood on Why Actions Are Not Events”, Philosophical Explorations, 21(1): 160–169. doi:10.1080/13869795.2017.1421697
- –––, 2018b, “Why Epistemic Pluralism Does Not Entail Relativism: Collingwood’s Hinge Epistemology”, in Dharamsi, D’Oro, and Leach 2018: 151–176.
- Dray, William H., 1958, “Historical Understanding as Rethinking”, University of Toronto Quarterly, 27(2): 200–215.
- –––, 1960, “Historical Causation and Human Free Will”, University of Toronto Quarterly, 29(3): 357–369.
- –––, 1963, “The Historical Explanation of Actions Reconsidered”, in Philosophy and History: A Symposium, Sidney Hook (ed.), New York: New York University Press, pp. 105–135.
- –––, 1964, Philosophy of History, London: Prentice-Hall Inc..
- ––– (ed.), 1966, Philosophical Analysis and History, New York and London: Harper and Row.
- –––, 1980a, “Collingwood’s Historical Individualism”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 10(1): 1–20. doi:10.1080/00455091.1980.10716280
- –––, 1980b, “R. G. Collingwood and the Understanding of Actions in History”, in his Perspectives on History, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 9–26.
- –––, 1994, “Was Collingwood an Historical Constructionist?”, Collingwood Studies, 1: 59–75.
- –––, 1995, History as Re-Enactment: R. G. Collingwood’s Idea of History, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198238812.001.0001
- Gadamer, Hans-Georg, 1960 , Wahrheit und Methode: Grundzüge einer philosophischen Hermeneutik, Tübingen: Mohr. Translated as Truth and Method, . William Glen-Doepel (trans.), ed. John Cumming and Garret Barden, New York: Crossroad, 1975.
- Gallie, W.B., 1956, “Essentially Contested Concepts”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, New Series, 56: 167–198. doi:10.1093/aristotelian/56.1.167
- Gardiner, Parick, 1952a, The Nature of Historical Explanation, London: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 1952b, “The ‘Objects’ Of Historical Knowledge”, Philosophy, 27(102): 211–220. doi:10.1017/S0031819100033957
- Gellner, Ernest, 1974, “Thought and Time, or the Reluctant Relativist”, in The Devil in Modern Philosophy, I. C. Jarvie and J. Agassi (eds.), London: Routledge, pp. 151–165.
- Goldstein, Leon J., 1970, “Collingwood’s Theory of Historical Knowing”, History and Theory, 9(1): 3–36. doi:10.2307/2504500
- –––, 1976, Historical Knowing, Austin, TX: University of Texas Press.
- –––, 1977, “History and the Primacy of Knowing”, History and Theory, 16(4): 29–52. doi:10.2307/2504806
- Haddock, B., 1995, “Vico, Collingwood and the Character of a Historical Philosophy”, in Boucher, Connelly, and Modood 1995: 130–151.
- Harris, E. E., 1936, “Mr. Ryle and the Ontological Argument”, Mind, 45(180): 474–480. doi:10.1093/mind/XLV.180.474
- Hempel, Carl G., 1942, “The Function of General Laws in History”, The Journal of Philosophy, 39(2): 35–48. doi:10.2307/2017635
- Hick, John and Arthur C. McGill (eds), 1968, The Many-Faced Argument: Recent Studies on the Ontological Argument for the Existence of God, London and Melbourne: Macmillan.
- Jenkins, Keith, 1991, Re-thinking History. London: Routledge.
- Johnson, Peter, 1998, R. G. Collingwood: An Introduction, Bristol: Thoemmes Press.
- –––, 2013, Collingwood’s The Idea of History, A Reader’s Guide, London: Bloomsbury.
- Kobayashi, Chinatsu and Mathieu Marion, 2006, “On the Unity of Collingwood’s Philosophy: From Process to Self-Creation”, Collingwood and British Idealism Studies, 12(2): 125–157.
- –––, 2011, “Gadamer and Collingwood on Temporal Distance and Understanding”, History and Theory, 50(4): 81–103. doi:10.1111/j.1468-2303.2011.00605.x
- Krausz, Michael (ed.), 1972, Critical Essays on the Philosophy of R. G. Collingwood, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Kripke, S. A., 2017, “History and Idealism: The Theory of R.G. Collingwood”, Collingwood and British Idealism Studies, 23(1): 9–29
- Leach, Stephen, 2016, “Collingwood and the Problem of Consciousness”, in Consciousness and the Great Philosophers, Stephen Leach and James Tartaglia (eds), Oxford: Routledge, pp. 192–198.
- –––, 2017, “L. S. Klejn and R. G. Collingwood on History, Archaeology, and Detection”, Journal of the Philosophy of History, 11(3): 391–407. doi:10.1163/18722636-12341381
- Martin, Rex, 1989, “Collingwood’s Claim that Metaphysics is a Historical Discipline”, Monist, 72(4): 489–525. Reprinted in Boucher, Connelly, and Modood 1995: 203–245. doi:10.5840/monist198972431
- –––, 1991, “Collingwood on Reasons, Causes, and the Explanation of Action”, International Studies in Philosophy, 23(3): 47–62. doi:10.5840/intstudphil199123374
- –––, 1998, “Editor’s Introduction”, in Collingwood’s EM: xv–xcv.
- Mill, John Stuart Mill, 1843 [1963–91], A System of Logic, Rationative and Inductive, 2 volumes, London: John W. Parker. Reprinted in The Collected Works of John Stuart Mill, volumes 7 and 8, John M. Robson (ed.), Toronto: University of Toronto Press, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1963–91.
- Mink, Louis O., 1966, “The Autonomy of Historical Understanding”, History and Theory, 5(1): 24–47. Reprinted with minor changes in 1966: 160–192. doi:10.2307/2504434
- Modood, Tariq, 1989, “The Later Collingwood’s Alleged Historicism and Relativism”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 27(1): 101–125. doi:10.1353/hph.1989.0004
- Nielsen, Margit Hurup, 1981, “Re-Enactment and Reconstruction in Collingwood’s Philosophy of History”, History and Theory, 20(1): 1–31. doi:10.2307/2504642
- Nowell-Smith, P. H., 1977, “The Constructionist Theory of History”, History and Theory, 16(4): 1–28. doi:10.2307/2504805
- Oldfield, A., 1995, “Metaphysics and History in Collingwood’s Thought”, in Boucher, Connelly, and Modood 1995: 182–202.
- Peters, Rik, 2013, History as Thought and Action: The Philosophies of Croce, Gentile, de Ruggiero, Exeter: Imprint Academic.
- Pompa, Leon, 1981, “Truth and Fact in History”, in Substance and Form in History, Leon Pompa and William H. Dray (eds.), Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, pp. 171–186.
- –––, 1990, Human Nature and Historical Knowledge: Hume, Hegel and Vico, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511597930
- Quine, Willard Van Orman, 1960, “Translation and Meaning”, in his Word and Object, Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press, chapter 2.
- Retz, Tyson, 2018 Empathy and History: Historical Understanding in Re-enactment, hermeneutics and Education, New York: Bergahn.
- Ridley, Aaron, 1998a, R.G.Collingwood: a Philosophy of Art, London: Orion Books.
- –––, 1998, “Collingwood’s Commitments: A Reply to Hausman and Dilworth”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 56(4): 396–398. doi:10.2307/432131
- –––, 2002, “Congratulations, It’s a Tragedy: Collingwood’s Remarks on Genre”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 42(1): 52–63. doi:10.1093/bjaesthetics/42.1.52
- –––, 2003, “R.G. Collingwood (1889–1943)”, in Key Writers on Art: The Twentieth Century, Chris Murray (ed.), London: Routledge, pp. 64–68.
- Rotenstreich, Nathan, 1972, “Metaphysics and Historicism”, in Krausz 1972: 179–200.
- Rubinoff, Lionel, 1966, “Collingwood and the Radical Conversion Hypothesis”, Dialogue, 5(1): 71–83. doi:10.1017/S0012217300036246
- –––, 1996, “The Autonomy of History: Collingwood’s Critique of F. H. Bradley’s Copernican Revolution in Historical Knowledge”, in Philosophy After F. H. Bradley, James Bradley (ed.), Bristol: Thoemmes Press, pp. 127–145.
- Russell, Bertrand, 1918–1919, “The Philosophy of Logical Atomism”, Monist, 28(4): 495–527, 29(1): 32–63, 29(2): 190–222, 29(3): 345–380. Reprinted La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1985. doi:10.5840/monist19182843 doi:10.5840/monist19192912 doi:10.5840/monist19192922 doi:10.5840/monist19192937
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- –––, 1935 [1968, 1990], “Mr. Collingwood and the Ontological Argument”, Mind, 44(174): 137–151. Reprinted in Hick and McGill 1968: 246–260. Also reprinted in Ryle 1990: 105–119. doi:10.1093/mind/XLIV.174.137
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- –––, 1990, Collected Papers, volume 2, Bristol: Thoemmes Press.
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- –––, 1991, “Some Aspects of R. G. Collingwood’s Doctrine of Absolute Presuppositions”, International Studies in Philosophy, 23(1): 61–73. doi:10.5840/intstudphil19912315
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In this coauthored entry, Section 1 (Biographical Sketch) was contributed by James Connelly, while the rest of the entry was written by Giuseppina D’Oro.