Donald (Herbert) Davidson was one of the most important philosophers of the latter half of the twentieth century whose reception and influence is matched, among American philosophers, perhaps only by that of his teacher, W. V. O. Quine. Davidson’s ideas, presented in a series of essays (and one posthumous monograph) from the 1960s onwards, have had an impact in a range of areas from semantic theory through to epistemology and ethics. His work exhibits a breadth of approach, as well as a unitary and systematic character, that is unusual within twentieth century analytic philosophy. Although he acknowledged an important debt to Quine, Davidson’s thought amalgamates influences from a wide range of sources within philosophy as well as outside. And whilst often developed separately, Davidson’s ideas nevertheless combine in such a way as to provide a single integrated approach to the problems of knowledge, action, language, and mind. The breadth and unity of his thought, in combination with the sometimes terse character of his prose, means that Davidson is not an easy writer to approach. Given the demanding nature of his work, it is perhaps only to be expected that it would receive a range of interpretations and assessments, and this is especially true of much of the engagement with Davidson’s thought that has developed in the last 20 years or so. In several publications, Kirk Ludwig, for instance, has advanced readings of Davidson’s philosophy, frequently in collaboration with Ernest Lepore, that although partly exegetical also take issue with many of Davidson’s claims and arguments (see e.g. Lepore and Ludwig 2005; see also the exchange between Lepore and Ludwig and Stoutland in Baghramian, 2013). This reflects a more general tendency for Davidson’s thinking to appear as a focus more often for critique than elaboration. Despite Davidson’s pre-eminence in analytic figure during the 1970s and 1980s, his influence has waned over the last decade or more and his work is now largely taken up, not in any systematic fashion, but in relation to specific issues, especially of mind and action (although this also reflects more general shifts in the configuration of current philosophical thought and practice – see Brandom, 2020: 260). Yet neither the various critiques that have been advanced nor disciplinary shifts in philosophical direction or approach should be taken to undermine the significance of Davidson’s contribution, and his work has nonetheless continued to have an influence in the work of a range of thinkers. At the same time, the re-publication of Davidson’s essays, especially those from later in his career, has disseminated his ideas to a wider, and sometimes newly appreciative audience. In addition, Davidson’s work remains an important, if sometimes contentious, point of focus for philosophical interaction between analytic and so-called ‘continental’ thought (see e.g. Malpas, 2011), and for reflection on the history and character of analytic thought as such (see, e.g, Isaac, 2013; Braver, 2017).
- 1. Biographical Sketch
- 2. Action and Mind
- 3. Meaning and Truth
- 4. Knowledge and Belief
- 5. Philosophical Contexts and Connections
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Biographical Sketch
Davidson was born on March 6th, 1917, in Springfield, Massachusetts, USA. He died suddenly, as a consequence of cardiac arrest following knee surgery, on Aug. 30, 2003, in Berkeley, California. Remaining both physically and philosophically active up until his death, Davidson left behind several important and unfinished projects including a major book on the nature of predication. The latter volume was published posthumously (see Davidson 2005b), together with two additional volumes of collected essays (Davidson 2004, 2005a), under the guidance of Marcia Cavell.
Davidson completed his undergraduate study at Harvard, graduating in 1939. His early interests were in literature and classics and, as an undergraduate, Davidson was strongly influenced by A. N. Whitehead. After starting graduate work in classical philosophy (completing a Master’s degree in 1941), Davidson’s studies were interrupted by service with the US Navy in the Mediterranean from 1942–45. He continued work in classical philosophy after the war, graduating from Harvard in 1949 with a dissertation on Plato’s ‘Philebus’ (1990b). By this time, however, the direction of Davidson’s thinking had already, under Quine’s influence, changed quite dramatically (the two having first met at Harvard in 1939–40) and he had begun to move away from the largely literary and historical concerns that had preoccupied him as an undergraduate towards a more strongly analytical approach.
While his first position was at Queen’s College in New York, Davidson spent much of the early part of his career (1951–1967) at Stanford University. He subsequently held positions at Princeton (1967–1970), Rockefeller (1970–1976), and the University of Chicago (1976–1981). From 1981 until his death, he worked at the University of California, Berkeley. Davidson was the recipient of several awards and fellowships and was a visitor at many universities around the world. He was married three times, to the artist Virginia Davidson, from whom he was divorced but with whom he had his only child, then to the psychologist Nancy Hirschberg, who died in 1979, and finally, in 1984, to Marcia Cavell. Davidson’s posthumously published essays are edited by Cavell, and she was also an important influence on Davidson as well as drawing on Davidson’s thinking in her own work (see esp. Cavell 1993). For more on Davidson’s biography, including reminiscences from those who knew him, see Baghramian 2013. The Donald Davidson papers, which include course notes, professional correspondence, administrative materials, and academic writings, are held in the Bancroft Library at the University of California, Berkeley. In the late 1990s, under the auspices of the Centre for Philosophy of the Natural and Social Sciences, at the London School of Economics, Davidson participated in a series of recorded one-on-one conversations with many of the leading figures in philosophy at the time – including, among others, Quine, Nancy Cartwright, Richard Rorty, Peter Strawson, and Michael Dummett (Davidson, 1997). These recordings, now available online and elsewhere, provide valuable additional insight into both the style and content of Davidson’s thought.
2. Action and Mind
2.1 Reasons as Causes
Much of Davidson’s early work was in decision theory (see Decision-Making: An Experimental Approach ), and it was not until the early 1960s that the work for which he is best known began to appear in print. Indeed, Davidson’s first major philosophical publication was the seminal paper ‘Actions, Reasons and Causes’ (1963). In that paper Davidson sets out to defend the view that the explanation of action by reference to reasons (something we do, for instance, when we refer to an agent’s intentions or motives in acting) is also a form of causal explanation. Indeed, he argues that reasons explain actions just inasmuch as they are the causes of those actions. This approach was in clear opposition to the Wittgensteinian orthodoxy of the time. On this latter account causal explanation was viewed as essentially a matter of showing the event to be explained as an instance of some law-like regularity (as we might explain the whistling of a kettle by reference to certain laws involving, among other things, the behaviour of gases under pressure). Since rational explanation was held, in general, not to involve any such reference to laws, but rather required showing how the action fitted into some larger pattern of rational behaviour, explanation by reference to reasons was held to be distinct from and independent of explanation by reference to causes.
Although directed against the Wittgensteinian-inspired view that reasons cannot be causes, Davidson’s argument nevertheless effectively redeploys several Wittgensteinian ideas (see Stoutland, in Malpas 2011: 297–324, for a sympathetic, but not uncritical, examination of the Davidsonian view of action from a largely Wittgensteinian perspective). Two ideas play an especially significant role in the Davidsonian account – ideas that are also, in one form or another, important in Davidson’s thinking elsewhere. The first of these ideas is the notion of a ‘primary reason’ – the pairing of a belief and a desire (or ‘pro-attitude’) in the light of which an action is explained. Thus, my action of flipping the light switch can be explained by reference to my having the belief that flipping the switch turns on the light in combination with my having the desire to turn on the light (for most explanations explicit reference to both the belief and the desire is unnecessary). An action is thereby rendered intelligible through being embedded in a broader system of attitudes attributable to the agent – through being embedded, that is, in a broader framework of rationality. The second idea is that of action ‘under a description’ (a phrase originally appearing in G. E. M. Anscombe’s Intention, published in 1959). As with the concept of a primary reason, the idea here is simple enough: one and the same action is always amenable to more than one correct description. This idea is especially important, however, as it provides a means by which the same item of behaviour can be understood as intentional under some descriptions but not under others. Thus, my action of flipping the light switch can be redescribed as the act of turning on the light (under which it is intentional) and also as the act of alerting the prowler who, unbeknown to me, is lurking in the bushes outside (under which it is unintentional). Generalising this point, we can say that the same event can be referred to under quite disparate descriptions: the event of alerting the prowler is the same event as my flipping the light switch which is the same event as my moving of my body (or a part of my body) in a certain way.
Davidson treats the connection between reason and action (where the reason is indeed the reason for the action) as a connection that obtains between two events (the agent’s believing and desiring on the one hand and her acting on the other) that can be variously described. The connection is both rational, inasmuch as the belief-desire pair (the ‘primary reason’) specifies the reason for the action, but it is also causal, inasmuch as the one event causes the other if it is indeed the reason for it. It is precisely because the reason is causally related to the action that the action can be explained by reference to the reason. Indeed, where an agent has several reasons for acting, and yet acts on the basis of one reason in particular, there is no way to pick out just that reason on which the agent acts other than by saying that it is the reason that caused her action.
Understood as rational, the connection between reason and action cannot be described in terms of any strict law. Yet inasmuch as the connection is also a causal connection, so there must exist some law-like regularity, though not describable in the language of rationality, under which the events in question fall (an explanation can be causal, then, even though it does not specify any strict law). Davidson is thus able to maintain that rational explanation need not involve explicit reference to any law-like regularity, while nevertheless also holding that there must be some such regularity that underlies the rational connection just inasmuch as it is causal. Moreover, since Davidson resists the idea that rational explanations can be formulated in the terms of a predictive science, so he seems committed to denying that there can be any reduction of rational to non-rational explanation.
2.2 The Anomalism of the Mental
The more developed argument for this latter claim, and for the more general position in the philosophy of mind, of which it forms a part, appears at several places in Davidson’s work. The first and best-known presentation is that of ‘Mental Events’ (1970b) in which Davidson argues for the compatibility of three principles (all three of which are adumbrated in various ways in the argument of ‘Actions, Reasons and Causes’): (i) that at least some mental events interact causally with physical events – The Principle of Causal Interaction; (ii) that events related as cause and effect fall under strict laws (that is, laws that are ‘precise, explicit and as exceptionless as possible’) – The Principle of the Nomological Character of Causality; and (iii) that there are no strict laws (as opposed to mere generalisations) relating mental and physical events – The Anomalism of the Mental. Of these principles the first two would ordinarily be held to be incompatible with the third, and to imply, not the ‘anomalism’ of the mental, but rather, in the case of mental and physical events related as cause and effect, the existence of strict laws relating those events. To argue, as does Davidson, for the compatibility of the original principles is thus also to argue for the truth of the third, that is, for the truth of anomalous monism.
Davidson holds that events are particulars such that the same event can be referred to under more than one description. He also holds that events that are causally related must be related under some strict law. However, since Davidson takes laws to be linguistic entities, so they can relate events only as those events are given under specific descriptions. Thus, as was already evident in Davidson’s approach to the theory of action, the same pair of events may instantiate a law under one description, but not under others. There is, for example, no strict law that relates, under just those descriptions, the formation of ice on the surface of a road to the skidding of a car on that road, and yet, under a different description (a description that will employ a completely different set of concepts), the events at issue will indeed be covered by some strict law or set of laws. But while nomological relations between events (relations involving laws) depend on the descriptions under which the events are given, relations of causality and identity obtain irrespective of descriptions – if the icing-up of the road did indeed cause the skid, then it did so no matter how the events at issue are described (the form of description, whether mental or physical, is thus irrelevant to the fact that a particular causal relation obtains). It follows that the same pair of events may be related causally, and yet, under certain descriptions (though not under all), there be no strict law under which those events fall. In particular, it is possible that a mental event (an event given under some mental description) will be causally related to some physical event (an event given under a physical description) and yet there will be no strict law covering those events under just those descriptions. My wanting to read Tolstoy may lead me to take War and Peace from the shelf, and so my wanting may cause a change in the physical arrangement of a certain region of space-time, but there is no strict law that would relate my wanting to the physical change. Similarly, while any mental event will be identical with some physical event – it will indeed be one and the same event under two descriptions – it is possible that there will be no strict law relating the event as described in mentalistic terms with the event as physically described. In fact, Davidson is explicit in claiming that there can be no strict laws that relate the mental and the physical in this way. Thus, in the example just cited, there is no strict law that relates wanting to read with a particular kind of brain activity.
Davidson’s denial of the existence of any strict ‘psycho-physical’ laws follows from his view of the mental as constrained by quite general principles of rationality that do not apply, at least not in the same way, to physical descriptions: normative considerations of overall consistency and coherence, for instance, constrain our own thinking about events as physically described, but they have no purchase on physical events as such. This does not mean, of course, that there are no correlations whatsoever to be discerned between the mental and the physical, but it does mean that the correlations that can be discerned cannot be rendered in the precise, explicit and exceptionless form – in the form, that is, of strict laws – that would be required in order to achieve any reduction of mental to physical descriptions. The lack of strict laws covering events under mental descriptions is thus an insuperable barrier to any attempt to bring the mental within the framework of unified physical science. However, while the mental is not reducible to the physical, every mental event can be paired with some physical event – that is, every mental description of an event can be paired with a physical description of the very same event. This leads Davidson to speak of the mental as ‘supervening’ on the physical in a way that implies a certain dependence of mental predicates on physical predicates: predicate p supervenes on a set of predicates S ‘if and only if p does not distinguish any entities that cannot be distinguished by S’ (see ‘Thinking Causes’ ). Put more simply, events that cannot be distinguished under some physical description cannot be distinguished under a mental description either.
On the face of it, anomalous monism appears a highly attractive way to think about the relation between the mental and the physical – inasmuch as it combines ‘monism’ with ‘anomalism’ so it seems to preserve what is important about physicalism while nevertheless retaining the ordinary language of so-called ‘folk-psychology’ (the language of beliefs and desires, actions and reasons). Yet anomalous monism has proved to be a highly contentious position drawing criticism from both physicalists and non-physicalists alike. The nomological conception of causality (the second of the three principles defended in ‘Mental Events’) has often been seen as something for which Davidson fails to supply any real argument (a criticism he has attempted to address in ‘Laws and Cause’ ); the Davidsonian account of supervenience has been viewed as incompatible with other aspects of his position and sometimes as simply mistaken or confused (the idea of supervenience is itself the focus for what is now a very large body of discussion); and, perhaps the most serious and widespread criticism, anomalous monism has been seen as making the mental causally inert. These criticisms have not, however, gone unanswered (see especially ‘Thinking Causes’), and although Davidson modified aspects of his position over the years, he continued to hold to, and to defend, the basic theses first made explicit in ‘Mental Events’.
2.3 Problems of Irrationality
Davidson’s commitment to the rationality of the mental as one of the cornerstones of anomalous monism (as well as to the account of ‘radical interpretation’ [see ‘Meaning and Truth’ below]) led him to take a special interest in the problem of apparently irrational belief and action – something first addressed in ‘How is Weakness of the Will Possible?’(1970a). While Davidson treats irrationality as a real feature of our mental lives, he offers a way of dealing with it that aims at preserving, in some sense, the overall rationality of the mind (see especially ‘Two Paradoxes of Irrationality’ [1982b]). A belief or desire in the mind of one person can cause a belief or desire in the mind of another without this compromising the rationality of the mental. (Davidson’s example is my growing of a beautiful flower because I desire you to enter my garden – you develop a craving to see the flower as a result of my desire and my desire has thereby caused, without being a reason for, your craving). Davidson suggests that we should view the same sort of relation as sometimes holding within a single mind. To this end we should view the mind as weakly ‘partitioned’ so that different attitudes may be located within different ‘territories’ and need not, therefore, be taken to come into direct conflict.
Davidson’s thinking about irrationality was increasingly influenced by an engagement with psychoanalytic thinking. Marcia Cavell had strong psychoanalytic interests, and in The Psychoanalytic Mind (Cavell 1993), she connects Davidson’s thought directly with that of Freud.
2.4 Ontology and Logical Form
Davidson’s accounts of action and of mind call upon a well-developed set of analyses concerning psychological concepts such as belief, desire and intention – concepts whose analysis is taken further in a number of papers that follow on from, and develop or modify, the ideas first set out in ‘Actions, Reasons and Causes’ (papers such as ‘Agency’ (1971) and ‘Intending’ [1978a]) as well as in Davidson’s discussions of epistemological and semantic issues (see below). But Davidson ‘s work in this area is also dependent on his account of the notions of cause, event, and law and, in particular, on his defence of the view that events are particulars and so constitute a fundamental ontological category. If events are indeed particulars, then an important question concerns the conditions of identity for events. In ‘The Individuation of Events’ [1969a] Davidson argues that events are identical if and only if they have identical causes and effects. In ‘Reply to Quine on Events’ [1985b] he abandons this criterion in favour of the Quinean suggestion that events are identical if and only if they occupy exactly the same location in space and time.
A characteristic feature of Davidson’s approach to such ontological questions has been to focus on the logical structure of sentences about the entities at issue rather than on those entities as such. Davidson’s approach to events, for instance, is grounded in an analysis of the underlying logical form of sentences about events; in the case of causal relations, in an analysis of the logical form of sentences that express such relations (see ‘Causal Relations’ [1967a]); and in his approach to action also, Davidson’s approach involves an analysis of the logical form of sentences about actions (see ‘The Logical Form of Action Sentences’ [1967b]). This reflects a more general commitment on Davidson’s part to the inseparability of questions of ontology from questions of logic. This commitment is spelt out explicitly in ‘The Method of Truth in Metaphysics’ (1977) and it provides a further point of connection between Davidson’s work in the philosophy of action, event and mind and his work on questions of meaning and language.
3. Meaning and Truth
3.1 The Structure of a Semantic Theory
Although Davidson wrote on a wide range of topics, a great deal of his work, particularly during the late 1960s and early 1970s, is focussed on the problem of developing an approach to the theory of meaning that would be adequate to natural language. The characteristic feature of Davidson’s approach to this problem is his proposal that meaning is best understood via the concept of truth, and, more particularly, that the basic structure for any adequate theory of meaning is that given in a formal theory of truth.
Davidson’s thinking about semantic theory develops on the basis of a holistic conception of linguistic understanding (see ‘Truth and Meaning’ [1967c]). Providing a theory of meaning for a language is thus a matter of developing a theory that will enable us to generate, for every actual and potential sentence of the language in question, a theorem that specifies what each sentence means. On this basis a theory of meaning for German that was given in English might be expected to generate theorems that would explicate the German sentence ‘Schnee ist weiss’ as meaning that snow is white. Since the number of potential sentences in any natural language is infinite, a theory of meaning for a language that is to be of use to creatures with finite powers such as ourselves, must be a theory that can generate an infinity of theorems (one for each sentence) on the basis of a finite set of axioms. Indeed, any language that is to be learnable by creatures such as ourselves must possess a structure that is amenable to such an approach. Consequently, the commitment to holism also entails a commitment to a compositional approach according to which the meanings of sentences are seen to depend upon the meanings of their parts, that is, upon the meanings of the words that form the finite base of the language and out of which sentences are composed. Compositionality does not compromise holism, since not only does it follow from it, but, on the Davidsonian approach, it is only as they play a role in whole sentences that individual words can be viewed as meaningful. It is sentences, and not words, that are thus the primary focus for a Davidsonian theory of meaning. Developing a theory for a language is a matter of developing a systematic account of the finite structure of the language that enables the user of the theory to understand any and every sentence of the language.
A Davidsonian theory of meaning explicates the meanings of expressions holistically through the interconnection that obtains among expressions within the structure of the language as a whole. Consequently, although it is indeed a theory of meaning, a theory of the sort Davidson proposes will have no use for a concept of meaning understood as some discrete entity (whether a determinate mental state or an abstract ‘idea’) to which meaningful expressions refer. One important implication of this is that the theorems that are generated by such a theory of meaning cannot be understood as theorems that relate expressions and ‘meanings’. Instead such theorems will relate sentences to other sentences. More particularly, they will relate sentences in the language to which the theory applies (the ‘object-language’) to sentences in the language in which the theory of meaning is itself couched (the ‘meta-language’) in such a way that the latter effectively ‘give the meanings of’ or translate the former. It might be thought that the way to arrive at theorems of this sort is to take as the general form of such theorems ‘s means that p’ where s names an object-language sentence and p is a sentence in the meta-language. But this would be already to assume that we could give a formal account of the connecting phrase ‘means that’, and not only does this seem unlikely, but it also appears to assume a concept of meaning when it is precisely that concept (at least as it applies within a particular language) that the theory aims to elucidate. It is at this point that Davidson turns to the concept of truth. Truth, he argues, is a less opaque concept than that of meaning. Moreover, to specify the conditions under which a sentence is true is also a way of specifying the meaning of a sentence. Thus, rather than ‘s means that p’, Davidson proposes, as the model for theorems of an adequate theory of meaning, ‘s is true if and only if p’ (the use of the biconditional ‘if and only if’ is crucial here as it ensures the truth-functional equivalence of the sentences s and p, that is, it ensures they will have identical truth-values). The theorems of a Davidsonian theory of meaning for German couched in English would thus take the form of sentences such as “‘Schnee ist weiss’ is true if and only if snow is white.”
3.2 Tarski and ‘Convention T’
One of the great advantages of this proposal is that it enables Davidson to connect his account of a theory of meaning with an already existing approach to the theory of truth, namely that developed by Alfred Tarski (in his seminal work ‘The Concept of Truth in Formalised Languages’, first published in Polish in 1933 and in English translation in 1956). Tarski’s theory of truth was originally intended, not as a general account of the nature of truth, but rather as a way of defining the truth-predicate as it applies within a formal language. Tarski suggests that we arrive at a formal definition of the predicate ‘is true’ by providing, for every sentence s in the object language, a matching sentence p in the meta-language that is a translation of s (here, in his use of the idea of translational synonymy, Tarski relies upon the concept of meaning in order to get at a theory of truth – Davidson reverses this approach). The resulting ‘T-sentences’ will have the form ‘s is true in language L if and only if p’. That an adequate theory should indeed be capable of generating a T-sentence for every sentence in the object-language is the essence of Tarski’s ‘Convention T’ – a requirement that clearly matches the holistic requirement Davidson also specifies for an adequate theory of meaning. And just as a Davidsonian theory of meaning treats the meaning of whole sentences as dependent on the components of those sentences, so a Tarskian theory of truth also operates recursively by means of the technical notion of satisfaction – a notion that stands to open sentences (expressions containing unbound variables) as does truth to closed sentences (expressions that contain no variables other than bound variables) – such that the satisfaction conditions of more complex sentences are seen to depend on the satisfaction conditions of simpler sentences.
The formal structure that Tarski articulates in his ‘semantic’ account of truth is identical to that which Davidson explicates as the basis for a theory of meaning: a Tarskian truth theory can generate, for every sentence of the object-language, a T-sentence that specifies the meaning of each sentence in the sense of specifying the conditions under which it is true. What Davidson’s work shows, then, is that meeting the requirement of Tarski’s Convention T can be seen as the basic requirement for an adequate theory of meaning.
A Tarskian truth theory defines truth using a logical apparatus that requires little more than the resources provided within first-order quantificational logic as supplemented by set theory. Moreover, it also operates to deliver a definition of truth that is purely ‘extensional’, that is, it defines truth by specifying just those instances to which the truth-predicate properly applies without any reference to ‘meanings’, ‘thoughts’ or other ‘intensional’ entities. Both these features represent important advantages for the Davidsonian approach (Davidson’s rejection of determinate meanings as having a significant role to play in a theory of meaning already involves a commitment to an extensional approach to language). However, these features also present certain problems. Davidson wishes to apply the Tarskian model as the basis for a theory of meaning for natural languages, but such languages are far richer than the well-defined formal systems to which Tarski had directed his attention. In particular natural languages contain features that seem to require resources beyond those of first-order logic or of any purely extensional analysis. Examples of such features include indirect or reported speech (‘Galileo said that the earth moves’), adverbial expressions (‘Flora swam slowly’ where ‘slowly’ modifies ‘Flora swam’) and non-indicative sentences such as imperatives (‘Eat your eggplant!’). An important part of Davidson’s work in the philosophy of language has been to show how such apparently recalcitrant features of natural language can indeed be analysed so as to make them amenable to a Tarskian treatment. In ‘On Saying That’ (1968) and ‘Quotation’ (1979b) he addresses the question of indirect speech; in ‘Moods and Performances’ (1979a) he deals with non-indicative utterances; and in ‘Adverbs of Action’ (1985a) he takes up the problem of adverbial modification. As in Davidson’s analysis of actions and events, the notion of logical form plays an important part in his approach here – the problem of how to apply a Tarskian truth theory to natural language is shown to depend on providing an analysis of the underlying logical form of natural language expressions which renders them in such a way that they fall under the scope of a purely extensional approach employing only minimal logical resources.
There is, however, another more general problem that affects Davidson’s appropriation of Tarski. Whilst Tarski uses the notion of sameness of meaning, through the notion of translation, as the means to provide a definition of truth (one of the requirements of Convention T is that the sentence on the right-hand side of a Tarskian T-sentence be a translation of the sentence on the left), Davidson aims to use truth to provide an account of meaning. But in that case, it seems that Davidson needs some other way to constrain the formation of T-sentences so as to ensure that they do indeed deliver correct specifications of what sentences mean. This problem is readily illustrated by the question of how we are to rule out T-sentences of the form “‘Schnee ist weiss’ is true if and only if grass is green.” Since the biconditional ‘if and only if’ ensures only that the sentence named on the left will have the same truth value as the sentence on the right, so it would seem to allow us to make any substitution of sentences on the right so long as their truth value is identical to that on the left. In one respect this problem is met by simply insisting on the way in which T-sentences must be seen as theorems generated by a theory of meaning that is adequate to the language in question as a whole (see ‘Truth and Meaning’). Since the meaning of particular expressions will not be independent of the meaning of other expressions (in virtue of the commitment to compositionality the meanings of all sentences must be generated on the same finite base), so a theory that generates problematic results in respect of one expression can be expected to generate problematic results elsewhere, and, in particular, to also generate results that do not meet the requirements of Convention T. This problem can also be seen, however, as closely related to another important point of difference between a Tarskian truth theory and a Davidsonian theory of meaning: a theory of meaning for a natural language must be an empirical theory (it is, indeed, a theory that ought to apply to actual linguistic behaviour) and as such it ought to be empirically verifiable. Satisfaction of the requirement that a theory of meaning be adequate as an empirical theory, and so that it be adequate to the actual behaviour of speakers, will also ensure tighter constraints, if such are needed, on the formation of T-sentences. Indeed, Davidson is not only quite explicit in emphasising the empirical character of a theory of meaning, but he also offers a detailed account that both explains how such a theory might be developed and specifies the nature of the evidence on which it must be based.
3.3 Radical Interpretation
Davidson’s strategy is to embed the formal structure for a theory of meaning (the structure he finds in a Tarskian truth theory) within a more general theory of interpretation the broad outlines of which he draws from Quine’s discussion in Word and Object (first published in 1960). ‘Radical translation’ is intended by Quine as an idealisation of the project of translation that will exhibit that project in its purest form. Normally the task of the translator is aided by prior linguistic knowledge – either of the actual language to be translated or of some related language. Quine envisages a case in which translation of a language must proceed without any prior linguistic knowledge and solely on the basis of the observed behaviour of the speakers of the language in conjunction with observation of the basic perceptual stimulations that give rise to that behaviour. Davidson has a broader conception of the behavioural evidence available than does Quine (he allows that we may, for instance, identify speakers as having the attitude of ‘holding true’ with respect to sentences) and, in addition, rejects the Quinean insistence on a special role being given to simple perceptual stimulations. Moreover, since Davidson’s interest is more properly semantic than Quine’s (Quine sees radical translation as part of a primarily epistemological inquiry), while Davidson also views a theory of translation alone as insufficient to ensure understanding of the language it translates (the translation may be into a language we do not understand), so the notion of ‘translation’ is replaced in the Davidsonian account with that of ‘interpretation’. Radical interpretation is a matter of interpreting the linguistic behaviour of a speaker ‘from scratch’ and so without reliance on any prior knowledge either of the speaker’s beliefs or the meanings of the speaker’s utterances. It is intended to lay bare the knowledge that is required if linguistic understanding is to be possible, but it involves no claims about the possible instantiation of that knowledge in the minds of interpreters (Davidson thus makes no commitments about the underlying psychological reality of the knowledge that a theory of interpretation makes explicit).
The basic problem that radical interpretation must address is that one cannot assign meanings to a speaker’s utterances without knowing what the speaker believes, while one cannot identify beliefs without knowing what the speaker’s utterances mean. It seems that we must provide both a theory of belief and a theory of meaning at one and the same time. Davidson claims that the way to achieve this is through the application of the so-called ‘principle of charity’ (he refers to it briefly elsewhere as the principle of ‘rational accommodation’), a version of which is also to be found in Quine. In Davidson’s work this principle, which admits of various formulations and cannot be rendered in any completely precise form, often appears in terms of the injunction to optimise agreement between ourselves and those we interpret, that is, it counsels us to interpret speakers as holding true beliefs (true by our lights at least) wherever it is plausible to do (see ‘Radical Interpretation’ ). In fact the principle can be seen as combining two notions: a holistic assumption of rationality in belief (‘coherence’) and an assumption of causal relatedness between beliefs, especially perceptual beliefs, and the objects of belief (‘correspondence’) (see ‘Three Varieties of Knowledge’ ). The process of interpretation turns out to depend on both aspects of the principle. Attributions of belief and assignments of meaning must be consistent with one another and with the speaker’s overall behaviour; they must also be consistent with the evidence afforded by our knowledge of the speaker’s environment, since it is the worldly causes of beliefs that must, in the ‘most basic cases’, be taken to be the objects of belief (see ‘A Coherence Theory of Truth and Knowledge’ ). Inasmuch as charity is taken to generate particular attributions of belief, so those attributions are, of course, always defeasible. The principle itself is not so, however, since it remains, on the Davidsonian account, a presupposition of any interpretation whatsoever. Charity is, in this respect, both a constraint and an enabling principle in all interpretation. It is more than just a heuristic device to be employed in the opening stages of interpretative engagement.
If we assume that the speaker’s beliefs, at least in the simplest and most basic cases, are largely in agreement with our own, and so, by our account, are largely true, then we can use our own beliefs about the world as a guide to the speaker’s beliefs. And, provided that we can identify simple assertoric utterances on the part of a speaker (that is, provided we can identify the attitude of holding true), then the interconnection between belief and meaning enables us to use our beliefs as a guide to the meanings of the speaker’s utterances, thereby providing the basis for both a rudimentary theory of belief and a rudimentary account of meaning. So, for example, when the speaker with whom we are engaged uses a certain sequence of sounds repeatedly in the presence of what we believe to be a rabbit, we can, as a preliminary hypothesis, interpret those sounds as utterances about rabbits or about some particular rabbit. Once we have arrived at a preliminary assignment of meanings for a significant body of utterances, we can test our assignments against further linguistic behaviour on the part of the speaker, modifying those assignments in accordance with the results. Using our developing theory of meaning we are then able to test the initial attributions of belief that were generated through the application of charity, and, where necessary, modify those attributions also. This enables us, in turn, to further adjust our assignments of meaning, which enables further adjustment in the attribution of beliefs, … and so the process continues until some sort of equilibrium is reached. The development of a more finely tuned theory of belief thus allows us to better adjust our theory of meaning, while the adjustment of our theory of meaning in turn enables us to better tune our theory of belief. Through balancing attributions of belief against assignments of meaning, we are able to move towards an overall theory of behaviour for a speaker or speakers that combines both a theory of meaning and of belief within a single theory of interpretation.
3.4 Holism and Indeterminacy
Since it is indeed a single, combined theory that is the aim here, so the adequacy of any such theory must be measured in terms of the extent to which the theory does indeed provide a unified view of the totality of behavioural evidence available to us (taken in conjunction with our own beliefs about the world) rather than by reference to any single item of behaviour. This can be viewed as a more general version of the same requirement, made in relation to a formal theory of meaning, that a theory of meaning for a language address the totality of utterances for that language, although, in the context of radical interpretation, this requirement must be understood as also closely tied to the need to attend to normative considerations of overall rationality. A direct consequence of this holistic approach is that there will always be more than one theory of interpretation that will be adequate to any particular body of evidence since theories may differ in particular attributions of belief or assignments of meaning while nevertheless providing an equally satisfactory account of the speaker’s overall behaviour. It is this failure of uniqueness that Davidson terms the ‘indeterminacy’ of interpretation and which provides a counterpart to the ‘indeterminacy of translation’ that also appears, though it has a more limited application, in Quine. On the Davidsonian account, such indeterminacy often goes unnoticed and is indeed rather less for Davidson than for Quine (partly as a consequence of Davidson’s employment of Tarski and so of the need to read the structure of first-order logic into the language interpreted). It nevertheless remains an ineliminable feature of all interpretation. Moreover, such indeterminacy is not to be viewed merely as reflecting some epistemological limitation on interpretation, but rather derives from the holistic character of meaning and of belief. Such concepts refer us to overall patterns in the behaviour of speakers rather than to discrete, entities to which interpretation must somehow gain access. Indeed, holism of this sort applies, not only to meanings and beliefs, but also to the so-called ‘propositional attitudes’ in general. The latter are most simply characterised as attitudes specifiable by reference to a proposition (believing that there is eggplant for dinner is a matter of holding true the proposition that there is eggplant for dinner; desiring that there be eggplant for dinner is a matter of wanting it to be true that there be eggplant for dinner) and so the contents of attitudes of this sort are always propositional. Davidsonian holism is thus a holism that applies to meanings, to attitudes, and, thereby, to the content of attitudes. Indeed, we can speak of the Davidsonian account of interpretation as providing a quite general account of how mental content is determined (such content being understood as the content of propositional mental states such as belief): through the causal relation between speakers and objects in the world and through the rational integration of speakers’ behaviour. Thus, as Davidson’s approach to the theory of meaning turns out to imply a more general theory of interpretation, so his holistic view of meaning implies a holistic view of the mental, and of mental content, in general.
Davidson’s commitment to the indeterminacy that follows from his holistic approach has led some to view his position as involving a form of anti-realism about the mind and about beliefs, desires and so forth. Davidson argues, however, that the indeterminacy of interpretation should be understood analogously with the indeterminacy that attaches to measurement. Such theories assign numerical values to objects on the basis of empirically observable phenomena and in accordance with certain formal theoretical constraints. Where there exist different theories that address the same phenomena, each theory may assign different numerical values to the objects at issue (as do Celsius and Fahrenheit in the measurement of temperature), and yet there need be no difference in the empirical adequacy of those theories, since what is significant is the overall pattern of assignments rather than the value assigned in any particular case. Similarly in interpretation, it is the overall pattern that a theory finds in behaviour that is significant and that remains invariant between different, but equally adequate, theories. An account of meaning for a language is an account of just this pattern.
Although the indeterminacy thesis has sometimes been a focus for objections to Davidson’s approach, it is the more basic thesis of holism as developed in its full-blown form in the account of radical interpretation (and particularly as it relates to meaning) that has often attracted the most direct and trenchant criticism. Michael Dummett has been one of the most important critics of the Davidsonian position (see especially Dummett 1975). Dummett argues that Davidson’s commitment to holism not only gives rise to problems concerning, for instance, how a language can be learnt (since it seems to require that one come to understand the whole of the language at one go, whereas learning is always piecemeal), but that it also restricts Davidson from being able to give what Dummett views as a properly full-blooded account of the nature of linguistic understanding (since it means that Davidson cannot provide an account that explicates the semantic in terms of the non-semantic). Criticism has also come from Jerry Fodor, amongst others, whose opposition to holism (not only in Davidson, but in Quine, Dennett and elsewhere) is largely motivated by a desire to defend the possibility of a certain scientific approach to the mind (see especially, Fodor and Lepore 1992).
3.5 Language and Convention
The heart of a Davidsonian theory of interpretation is, of course, a Tarskian truth theory. But a truth theory provides only the formal structure on which linguistic interpretation is based: such a theory needs to be embedded within a broader approach that looks to the interconnections between utterances, other behaviour and attitudes; in addition, the application of such a theory to actual linguistic behaviour must also take account of the dynamic and shifting character of such behaviour. This latter point is easily overlooked, but it leads Davidson to some important conclusions. Ordinary speech is full of ungrammatical constructions (constructions that may even be acknowledged to be ungrammatical by the speaker herself), incomplete sentences or phrases, metaphors, neologisms, jokes, puns and all manner of phenomena that cannot be met simply by the application to utterances of a pre-existing theory for the language being spoken. Linguistic understanding cannot, then, be a matter simply of the mechanical application of a Tarski-like theory (although this is just what Davidson might be taken to suggest in the early essays). In papers such as ‘A Nice Derangement of Epitaphs’ (1986), Davidson addresses just this point, arguing that while linguistic understanding does indeed depend upon a grasp of the formal structure of a language, that structure always stands in need of modification in the light of actual linguistic behaviour. Understanding a language is a matter of continually adjusting interpretative presuppositions (presuppositions that are often not explicit) in accord with the utterances to be interpreted. Furthermore, this calls upon skills and knowledge (imagination, attentiveness to the attitudes and behaviour of others, knowledge of the world) that are not specifically linguistic and that are part of a more general ability to get on in the world and in relation to others – an ability that also resists any formal explication. In ‘A Nice Derangement of Epitaphs’, Davidson puts this point, in provocative fashion, by claiming that ‘there is no such thing as a language’ (adding the immediate qualification ‘not if a language is anything like what many philosophers and linguists have supposed’). Put less provocatively, the essential point is that linguistic conventions (and in particular linguistic conventions that take the form of agreement over the employment of shared syntactic and semantic rules), while they may well facilitate understanding, cannot be the basis for such understanding.
Davidson’s denial of rule-based conventions as having a founding role in linguistic understanding, together with his emphasis on the way in which the capacity for linguistic understanding must be seen as part as part of a more general set of capacities for getting on in the world, underlie Davidson’s much-discussed account of metaphor and related features of language (see ‘What Metaphors Mean’ [1978b]). Davidson rejects the idea that metaphorical language can be explained by reference to any set of rules that govern such meaning. Instead it depends on using sentences with their ‘literal’ or standard meanings in ways that give rise to new or unexpected insights, and just as there are no rules by which we can work out what a speaker means when she utters an ungrammatical sentence, makes a pun or otherwise uses language in a way that diverges from the norm, so there are no rules that govern the grasp of metaphor.
4. Knowledge and Belief
4.1 ‘Three Varieties of Knowledge’
In Davidson’s work the question ‘what is meaning?’ is replaced by the question ‘What would a speaker need to know to understand the utterances of another?’ The result is an account that treats the theory of meaning as necessarily part of a much broader theory of interpretation and, indeed, of a much broader approach to the mental as such. This account is holistic inasmuch as it requires that any adequate theory must address linguistic and non-linguistic behaviour in its entirety. As we have already seen, this means that a theory of interpretation must adopt a compositional approach to the analysis of meaning; it must recognise the interconnected character of attitudes and of attitudes and behaviour; and it must also attribute attitudes and interpret behaviour in a way constrained by normative principles of rationality. Rationality is not, however, the only principle on which Davidson’s account of radical interpretation depends. It involves, in fact, a marriage of both holistic and ‘externalist’ considerations: considerations concerning the dependence of attitudinal content on the rational connections between attitudes (‘holism’) and concerning the dependence of such content on the causal connections between attitudes and objects in the world (‘externalism’). Indeed, this marriage is evident, as we saw earlier, in the principle of charity itself and its combination of considerations of both ‘coherence’ and ‘correspondence’. Davidson holds, in fact, that attitudes can be attributed, and so attitudinal content determined, only on the basis of a triangular structure that requires interaction between at least two creatures as well as interaction between each creature and a set of common objects in the world.
Identifying the content of attitudes is a matter of identifying the objects of those attitudes, and, in the most basic cases, the objects of attitudes are identical with the causes of those same attitudes (as the cause of my belief that there is a bird outside my window is the bird outside my window). Identifying beliefs involves a process analogous to that of ‘triangulation’ (as employed in topographical surveying and in the fixing of location) whereby the position of an object (or some location or topographical feature) is determined by taking a line from each of two already known locations to the object in question – the intersection of the lines fixes the position of the object (this idea first appears in ‘Rational Animals ). Similarly, the objects of propositional attitudes are fixed by looking to find objects that are the common causes, and so the common objects, of the attitudes of two or more speakers who can observe and respond to one another’s behaviour. In ‘Three Varieties of Knowledge’, Davidson develops the idea of triangulation as a means to elaborate the three-way conceptual interdependence that he argues obtains between knowledge of oneself, knowledge of others and knowledge of the world. Just as knowledge of language cannot be separated from our more general knowledge of the world, so Davidson argues that knowledge of oneself, knowledge of other persons and knowledge of a common, ‘objective’ world form an interdependent set of concepts no one of which is possible in the absence of the others.
The idea of triangulation has important implications that go far beyond questions of knowledge alone, and the idea is one of the most important and enduring, but also controversial elements in Davidson’s later thinking (see Myers and Verheggen, 2016). Moreover, although the idea may appear at first sight to be intended purely as a metaphor, the structure of triangulation seems actually to direct attention to the way in which knowledge, action, and content are fundamentally dependent on the genuinely embodied and located character of speakers and agents. As Davidson presents matters, it is only through their concrete engagement in the world, in relation both to objects and to other speakers or agents, that a putative speaker or agent can be capable of genuine speaking or agency; only then can they speak, act, or think.
The emphasis on the holistic and externalist character of knowledge and of content that is so central to triangulation is also expressed in Davidson’s well-known ‘Swampman’ example (in ‘Knowing One’s own Mind’, Davidson 1987: 443–4) Here we are asked to imagine a situation in which a lightning strike in a swamp reduces Davidson’s body to its basic elements, while simultaneously transforming a nearby dead tree into an exact replica of him. Although the resulting ‘Swampman’ behaves exactly like the original author of ‘Radical Interpretation’, Davidson denies that the ‘Swampman’ could properly be said to have thoughts or its words have meaning – and the reason is simply that the Swampman would lack the sort of causal history that is required in order to establish the right connections between itself, others and the world that underpin the attribution of thought and meaning. For all its notoriety, however, the Swampman example is not elaborated upon by Davidson, and the example has a very limited usefulness. In this respect, the attention Swampman has generated is quite disproportionate to his extremely brief appearance in Davidson’s writing.
4.2 Against Relativism and Scepticism
Although it is not simply an epistemological notion, the way Davidson presents the idea of triangulation tends to be such as to bring its epistemological implications to the fore. This is especially true of the way Davidson develops the idea in ‘Three Varieties of Knowledge’. Since our knowledge of our own minds is not independent of our knowledge of the world nor of our knowledge of others, so we cannot treat self-knowledge as a matter of our having access to some set of private ‘mental’ objects. Our knowledge of ourselves arises only in relation to our involvement with others and with respect to a publicly accessible world – as well as a history of such involvement (this is indeed part of the point of the Swampman example). Even so, we retain a certain authority over our own attitudes and utterances simply in virtue of the fact that those attitudes and utterances are indeed our own (see ‘First-Person Authority’, ). Moreover, because our knowledge of the world is inseparable from other forms of knowledge, global epistemological scepticism (the view that all or most of our beliefs about the world could be false) turns out to be committed to much more than is usually supposed. Should it indeed turn out that our beliefs about the world were all, or for the most part, false, then this would not only imply the falsity of most of our beliefs about others, but it would also have the peculiar consequence of making false most of our beliefs about ourselves – including the supposition that we do indeed hold those particular false beliefs. Although this may fall short of demonstrating the falsity of such scepticism, it surely demonstrates it to be deeply problematic.
The way in which the Davidsonian rejection of scepticism does indeed derive quite directly from Davidson’s adoption of a holistic, externalist approach to knowledge, and to attitudinal content in general, has sometimes been obscured by Davidson’s presentation of his argument against scepticism through the employment (for the first time in ‘Thought and Talk’) of the rather problematic notion of an ‘omniscient interpreter’ (the idea echoes one deployed by Wilfrid Sellars in an essay with which Davidson was certainly familiar [Sellars, 1948]). Such an interpreter would attribute beliefs to others and assign meanings to their utterances but would nevertheless do so on the basis of her own (true) beliefs. The omniscient interpreter would therefore have to find a large amount of agreement between her own beliefs and the beliefs of those she interprets, and what was agreed would also, by hypothesis, be true. Like the Swampman example, however, the omniscient interpreter example has given rise to a number of complications and misunderstandings (so much so that Davidson has expressed regret at ever having deployed those examples in the first place), and although the omniscient interpreter appears at several places in Davidson’s writings, the idea disappears from his later discussions, and does not play a crucial role in his thinking.
A feature of both the triangulation argument, and the Davidsonian account of radical interpretation, is that the attribution of attitudes must always proceed in tandem with the interpretation of utterances – identifying content, whether of utterances or of attitudes, is indeed a single project. An inability to interpret utterances (that is, an inability to assign meanings to instances of putative linguistic behaviour) will thereby imply an inability to attribute attitudes (and vice versa). A creature that we cannot interpret as capable of meaningful speech will thus also be a creature that we cannot interpret as capable of possessing contentful attitudes. Such considerations lead Davidson to deny that non-linguistic animals are capable of thought – where thought involves the possession of propositional attitudes such as beliefs or desires (see especially ‘Thought and Talk’). This does not mean that such animals have no mental life at all, nor does it mean that we cannot usefully use mental concepts in explaining and predicting the behaviour of such creatures. What it does mean, however, is that the extent to which we can think of such creatures as having attitudes and a mental life like our own is measured by the extent to which we can assign determinate propositional content to the attitudes we would ascribe to those creatures. A further consequence of this view is that the idea of an untranslatable language – an notion often found in association with the thesis of conceptual relativism – cannot be given any coherent formulation (Davidson’s argument here is suggestive, as Davidson notes, of a form of transcendental argumentation; see Davidson, 2001b: 72; but also Davidson, in Hahn, 1999: 342–4). Inability to translate counts as evidence, not of the existence of an untranslatable language, but of the absence of a language of any sort (see ‘On the Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme’ )
4.3 The ‘Third Dogma’ of Empiricism
Davidson’s rejection of the idea of an untranslatable language (and the associated idea, also common to many forms of conceptual relativism, of a radically different, and so ‘incommensurable’ system of belief) is part of a more general argument that he advances (notably in ‘On the Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme’) against the so-called ‘third dogma’ of empiricism. The first two dogmas are those famously identified by Quine in ‘Two Dogmas of Empiricism’ (first published in the Philosophical Review, in 1951). The first is that of reductionism (the idea that, for any meaningful statement, it can be recast in the language of pure sensory experience, or, at least, in terms of a set of confirmatory instances), while the second is the analytic-synthetic distinction (the idea that, with respect to all meaningful statements, one can distinguish between statements that are true in virtue of their meaning and those that are true in virtue of both their meanings and some fact or facts about the world). The rejection of both these dogmas can be seen as an important element throughout Davidson’s thinking. The third dogma, which Davidson claims can still be discerned in Quine’s work (and so can survive the rejection even of the analytic-synthetic distinction), consists in the idea that one can distinguish within knowledge or experience between a conceptual component (the ‘conceptual scheme’) and an empirical component (the ‘empirical content’) – the former is often taken to derive from language and the later from experience, nature or some form of ‘sensory input’. While there are difficulties in even arriving at a clear formulation of this distinction (particularly so far as the nature of the relation between the two components is concerned), such a distinction depends on being able to distinguish, at some basic level, between a ‘subjective’ contribution to knowledge that comes from us and an ‘objective’ contribution that comes from the world. What the Davidsonian account of knowledge and interpretation demonstrates, however, is that no such distinction can be drawn. Attitudes are already interconnected with objects and events in the world (causally, semantically and epistemically), whilst knowledge of self and others already presupposes knowledge of the world. The very idea of a conceptual scheme is thus rejected by Davidson along with the idea of any strong form of conceptual relativism. To possess attitudes and be capable of speech is already to be capable of interpreting others and to be open to interpretation by them.
4.4 Truth, Predication, and Realism/Anti-Realism
Davidson emphasizes the holistic character of the mental (both in terms of the interdependence that obtains between various forms of knowledge as well as the interconnected character of attitudes and of attitudes and behaviour). He has, at times, also referred to his position as involving a ‘coherence’ theory of truth and of knowledge (in ‘A Coherence Theory of Truth and Knowledge’ ). Nevertheless, Davidson is not a coherentist, in any standard sense, about either truth or knowledge. Nor, for all that he adopts a Tarskian approach to meaning, does he espouse a correspondence theory of truth (in fact, he denies that a Tarskian truth theory is a correspondence theory in any conventional sense). In general, Davidson eschews the attempt to provide an account of the nature of truth, maintaining that truth is a central concept that cannot be reduced to or replaced by any other notion (see [Davidson 1990a] and [Davidson 2005b]). Since he takes truth to belong to sentences or statements, and not to ‘propositions’ in any philosophically significant sense (in Truth and Predication [2005b], he is particularly emphatic in rejecting the idea of the proposition as a theoretical or explanatory concept), Davidson denies that truths can be understood as timeless or eternal (or at least they are no more so than are languages or sentences themselves). The only way of defining truth, as Davidson sees it, is by means of a Tarskian truth theory and such a theory is not a definition of truth in any unqualified sense, but only a definition of the truth predicate as it applies within a particular language.
Davidson’s employment of the notion of coherence is best viewed, not as a way of understanding truth, but rather as reflecting his commitment to the fundamentally rational and holistic character of the mind. It also connects with Davidson’s rejection of those forms of epistemological foundationalism that would attempt to ground knowledge or belief in the sensory causes of belief – beliefs, as one might expect given Davidson’s holistic approach, can find evidential support only in other beliefs. Similarly, Davidson’s sometime employment of the notion of correspondence is best understood, not as providing, any direct elucidation of the nature of truth, but rather as deriving from his externalist commitment to the idea that the content of belief is dependent upon the worldly causes of belief. In ‘True to the Facts’ (1969b) Davidson does defend what he there presents as a form of correspondence theory of truth. However, not only does Davidson later relinquish the claim that his is a ‘correspondence’ view of truth (this is already evident in ‘The Structure and Content of Truth’ [1990a], much of the material from which was later incorporated into Truth and Predication [2005b]), but the account set out in ‘True to the Facts’ is, in any case, far removed from what is usually taken to be involved in any correspondence theory.
The strategy that Davidson employs in relation to the concept of truth reflects a more general approach that runs throughout his thinking. Rather than trying to reduce key concepts, like truth, to something else, his tendency is to retain the primitive character of those concepts and instead to look to how they are worked out within the larger structure to which they belong (in this respect, Davidson is a moderate ‘deflationist’ about most of his key concepts). The strategy Davidson adopts in respect of truth is therefore much the same strategy as that which he adopts with respect to meaning (which should not surprise us given the role Tarski plays): meaning belongs primarily to sentences, it is not reducible to any other notion, and it is explicated only by reference to a larger linguistic structure. Moreover, this strategy is also one Davidson applies to the topic that occupies a large part of his last work – his inquiry into the problem of the problem of predication or of the unity of the proposition (2005b). How are we to elucidate the relation between a subject and that which is predicated of it in a standard predicative sentence such as ‘Socrates is mortal’? The problem, like the problem that arises when one tries to use the truth predicate reflexively, is that any attempt to explicate the predicative relation seems to give rise to circularity or regress. Davidson’s solution is to deny that predication can be explained by resort to any prior notion of propositionality. Instead, Davidson takes predication as basic, irreducible, and able to be explicated only through the sort of structure that is revealed by a Tarski-style theory of meaning.
The question of truth lies at the heart of the realist/anti-realist controversy that was once a major concern of many Anglo-American philosophers. Despite his insistence on the indispensability of an irreducibly basic concept of objective truth, and his rejection of both sceptical and relativist positions, Davidson has been variously assimilated, at different times and by different critics, to both the realist and the anti-realist camps. Yet realism and anti-realism are equally unsatisfactory from a Davidsonian point of view, since neither is compatible with the holistic and externalist character of knowledge and belief. Realism makes truth inaccessible (inasmuch as it admits the sceptical possibility that even our best-confirmed theories about the world could all be false), while anti-realism makes truth too epistemic (inasmuch as it rejects the idea of truth as objective). In this respect, and as he himself makes clear (see 1990a, 2005b), Davidson does not merely reject the specific premises that underlie the realist and anti-realist positions but views the very dispute between them as essentially misconceived. This reflects a characteristic feature of Davidson’s thinking in general (and not just as it relates to realism and anti-realism), namely its resistance to any simple classification using the standard philosophical categories of the day.
5. Philosophical Contexts and Connections
Whilst Davidson’s work was at the centre of many analytic discussions during the 1970s and 1980s, it was also increasingly juxtaposed, from the mid-1980s onwards, with ideas and approaches from outside of the analytic mainstream – often to his own bemusement. “What am I doing here?” asks Davidson in his catalogue essay for the 1992 Robert Morris exhibition. “Blind Time Drawings IV: Drawing with Davidson”, and he goes on: “Nothing has surprised me more than to discover myself anthologized in books with titles such as Post-Analytic Philosophy or After Philosophy” (Davidson, 160; see Rajchman and West, 1985; Baynes, Bohman, McCarthy, 1987; Dasenbrock, 1993).
Part of the reason for this juxtaposition, as Davidson himself surmised, was to do with his “rejection of subjectivist theories of epistemology and meaning” and his affirmation of the view that “thought itself is essentially social” (Davidson, 160). Davidson’s work, alongside that of figures such as Dewey and Heidegger, was thus explicitly drawn upon by Richard Rorty in the elaboration of his own brand of pragmatist anti-representationalism (see Rorty, 1991, i). And although Davidson did not regard himself as a pragmatist (again reflecting his resistance to easy categorisation as well as his rejection of pragmatist theories of truth), he did acknowledge convergences between his work and that of figures within the pragmatist tradition, including C.I. Lewis and G.H. Mead. Hans-Georg Gadamer appeared to feel a sense of affinity with Davidson, recommending Davidson for the Hegel Prize in 1989, writing to him in the years after, and asking Davidson to contribute to his volume in the Library of Living Philosophers (see Davidson, 2005: 261–276; Gadamer, 1997) – although this did not prevent the two from misreading each other in crucial ways. Davidson’s interest in psychoanalysis, partly due to the influence of Marcia Cavell, can be seen in some of his writings on irrationality and weakness of the will, and the connections between aspects of Davidsonian and Freudian thinking are explored by Cavell herself (see Cavell, 1993). Various writers have taken up connections between the work of Davidson and that of Gadamer (see e.g. essays by Braver, Dostal, Fultner, Vessey, and Malpas, in Malpas, 2011: 147–190 & 219–279; see also Keane, 2021), as well as between Davidson and Heidegger (e.g. Malpas, 1992, 2012: 199–224; Wrathall, 1999; Nulty 2006; Okrent, in Malpas, 2011: 87–112), and Davidson and Derrida (e.g. Dasenbrock, 1993; Wheeler, 2000; Wheeler in Malpas, 2011: 29–42). The role of a form of transcendental argumentation in Davidson has also been a focus for several discussions (see e.g. Maker, 1993; Carpenter, 2003), and has sometimes figured in broader explorations of connections between Davidson and Kant (see e.g. Goldberg 2015, also Fennell, 2010, and, in relation to the question of idealism, Haddock, 2011). Davidson himself acknowledged the important influence of Wittgenstein in his work (on connections between the two see Verheggen, 2017; also Stoutland, in Malpas, 2011: 297–324) as well as exploring parallels between aspects of his thinking and that of various figures within the history of philosophy, most notably, Spinoza (Davidson, 2005: 295–313; see also Van der Burg, 2007) and Plato (2005: 223–260), as well as Aristotle (Davidson, 2005: 277–294) and Hume (Davidson, 2001: 277–290), and, if very briefly, Kant (Davidson, 2001: 207). Davidson’s early studies in the history of philosophy, undertaken, at Harvard, under the influence of A. N. Whitehead, and literature (Davidson retained an abiding interest in the work of James Joyce, see Davidson, 2005: 143–157; also Dasenbrock, 2002) provide an important if largely hidden background throughout his mature thinking.
An extensive bibliography of primary and secondary material was compiled by Davidson himself as part of Hahn (ed.) 1999, and although now over 20 years old, it remains useful.
- 1957, Decision-Making: An Experimental Approach, with P. Suppes, Stanford: Stanford University Press, reprinted 1977, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, Midway Reprint Series.
- 1963, ‘Actions, Reasons and Causes’, Journal of Philosophy, 60: 685–700; reprinted in Davidson 2001a.
- 1967a, ‘Causal Relations’, Journal of Philosophy, 64: 691–703; reprinted in Davidson 2001a.
- 1967b, ‘The Logical Form of Action Sentences’, in Nicholas Rescher (ed.), The Logic of Decision and Action, Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, reprinted in Davidson, 2001a.
- 1967c, ‘Truth and Meaning’, Synthese, 17: 304–23; reprinted in Davidson 2001b.
- 1968, ‘On Saying That’, Synthese, 19: 130–46; reprinted in Davidson 2001b.
- 1969a, ‘The Individuation of Events’, in Nicholas Rescher (ed.), Essays in Honor of Carl G. Hempel, Dordrecht: D. Reidel, reprinted in Davidson 2001a.
- 1969b, ‘True to the Facts’, Journal of Philosophy, 66: 748–764; reprinted in Davidson 2001b.
- 1970a, ‘How is Weakness of the Will Possible?’, in Joel Feinberg (ed.), Moral Concepts, Oxford: Oxford University Press, reprinted in Davidson 2001a.
- 1970b, ‘Mental Events’, in Lawrence Foster and J. W. Swanson (eds.), Experience and Theory, London: Duckworth, reprinted in Davidson 2001a.
- 1971, ‘Agency’, in Robert Binkley, Richard Bronaugh, and Ausonia Marras (eds.), Agent, Action, and Reason, Toronto: University of Toronto Press, reprinted in Davidson 2001a.
- 1973, ‘Radical Interpretation’, Dialectica, 27: 314–28; reprinted in Davidson 2001b.
- 1974, ‘On the Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme’, Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association, 47: 5–20; reprinted in Davidson 2001b.
- 1975, ‘Thought and Talk’, in S. Guttenplan (ed.), Mind and Language, Oxford: Oxford University Press, reprinted in Davidson 2001b
- 1977, ‘The Method of Truth in Metaphysics’, in P.A. French, T.E. Uehling Jr., and H.K. Wettstein (eds.), Midwest Studies in Philosophy 2: Studies in the Philosophy of Language, Morris: University of Minnesota Press, reprinted in Davidson 2001b.
- 1978a, ‘Intending’, in Yirmiahu Yovel (ed.), Philosophy of History and Action, Dordrecht: D. Reidel, reprinted in Davidson 2001a.
- 1978b, ‘What Metaphors Mean’, Critical Inquiry, 5: 31–47; reprinted in Davidson 2001b.
- 1979a, ‘Moods and Performances’, in A. Margalit (ed.), Meaning and Use, Dordrecht: D. Reidel, reprinted in Davidson, 2001b.
- 1979b, ‘Quotation’, Theory and Decision, 11, reprinted in Davidson 2001b.
- 1982a, ‘Rational Animals’, Dialectica, 36: 318–27; reprinted in Davidson 2001c.
- 1982b, ‘Two Paradoxes of Irrationality’, in R. Wollheim and J. Hopkins (eds.) Philosophical Essays on Freud, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 289–305; reprinted in Davidson 2004
- 1983, ‘A Coherence Theory of Truth and Knowledge’, in D. Henrich (ed.), Kant oder Hegel?, Stuttgart: Klett-Cotta; reprinted in Lepore 1986, and Davidson 2001c.
- 1984, ‘First-Person Authority’, Dialectica, 38: 101–112; reprinted in Davidson 2001c.
- 1985a, ‘Adverbs of Action’, in Vermazen and Hintikka (eds.), 1985, reprinted in Davidson 2001a.
- 1985b, ‘Reply to Quine on Events’, in Lepore and McLaughlin (eds.), 1985, reprinted in Davidson 2001a.
- 1986, ‘A Nice Derangement of Epitaphs’, in Lepore (ed.), 1986, reprinted in Davidson 2005a.
- 1987, ‘Knowing One’s Own Mind’, in Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association, 61: 441–58; reprinted in Davidson 2001c.
- 1990a, ‘The Structure and Content of Truth’ (The Dewey Lectures 1989), Journal of Philosophy, 87: 279–328.
- 1990b, Plato’s ‘Philebus’, New York: Garland Publishing.
- 1991, ‘Three Varieties of Knowledge’, in A. Phillips Griffiths (ed.), A.J. Ayer Memorial Essays: Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplement, 30, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, reprinted in Davidson 2001c.
- 1993, ‘Thinking Causes’, in John Heil and Alfred Mele (eds.), Mental Causation, Oxford: Clarendon Press, reprinted in Davidson 2005a.
- 1995, ‘Laws and Cause,’ Dialectica, 49: 263–280; reprinted in Davidson 2005a.
- 1997, In conversation : Donald Davidson, videorecording, directed and produced by Rudolf Farra (19 conversations between Davidson and other philosophers), London: Philosophy International, Centre for Philosophy of the Natural and Social Sciences, London School of Economics (see: https://www.lse.ac.uk/cpnss/research/philosophy-international/davidson).
- 1999, ‘Intellectual Autobiography’, in Hahn (ed.), 1999.
- 2001a, Essays on Actions and Events, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2nd edn,
- 2001b, Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2nd edn.
- 2001c, Subjective, Intersubjective, Objective, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- 2004, Problems of Rationality, with introduction by Marcia Cavell and interview with Ernest Lepore, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- 2005a, Truth, Language and History: Philosophical Essays, with Introduction by Marcia Cavell, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- 2005b, Truth and Predication, Cambridge, Mass.: Belknap Press.
- 2006, The Essential Davidson, ed. Kirk Ludwig and Ernest Lepore, New York: Oxford University Press, contains a selection made up of 15 of Davidson’s essays taken largely from Essays on Actions and Events and Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation.
- 2020, The Structure of Truth. The 1970 John Locke Lectures, edited by Cameron Domenica Kirk-Giannini and Ernest Lepore, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Amoretti, Maria and Nicla Vassalo (eds.), 2009, Knowledge, Language, and Interpretation: On the Philosophy of Donald Davidson, Frankfurt-Heusenstamm: Ontos Verlag.
- Baghramian, Maria (ed.), 2013, Donald Davidson: Life and Words, London: Routledge.
- Brandom, Robert B., 2020, ‘Remembering Richard Rorty: An Interview with Robert Brandom’, in Pedro Góis Moreira. (ed), Revisiting Richard Rorty, Wilmington, DE: Vernon Press, pp. 251–262.
- Baynes, Kenneth, James Bohman, and Thomas McCarthy, 1987, After Philosophy: End or Transformation?, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
- Braver, Lee, 2017, ‘Davidson’s Interpretation of Quine’s Radical Translation, and How It Helped Make Analytic Philosophy a Tradition’, in Aaron Preston (ed.), Analytic Philosophy: An Interpretive History, London: Routledge, pp. 240–253.
- Carpenter, Andrew N., 2003, ‘Davidson’s Transcendental Argumentation’, in Jeff Malpas (ed.), From Kant to Davidson: Philosophy and the Idea of the Transcendental, London: Routledge, pp. 219–237.
- Cavell, Marcia, 1993, The Psychoanalytic Mind: From Freud to Philosophy, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
- Dasenbrock, Reed Way (ed.), 1993, Literary Theory After Davidson, University Park: Pennsylvania University Press.
- Dasenbrock, Reed Way, 2002, ‘Philosophy After Joyce: Derrida and Davidson’, Philosophy and Literature 26: 334–345
- Dummett, Michael, 1975, ‘What is a Theory of Meaning’, in S. Guttenplan (ed.), Mind and Language, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Evnine, Simon, 1991, Donald Davidson, Cambridge: Polity Press.
- Fennell, John, 2010, ‘Rethinking Anglo- American philosophy: the neo- Kantianism of Davidson, McDowell, and Brandom’, Alan D. Schrift (ed.), The History of Continental Philosophy, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, pp. 2855–2874.
- Fodor, Jerry and Ernest Lepore, 1992, Holism: A Shopper’s Guide, Oxford: Blackwell.
- Gadamer, Hans-Georg, 1997, ‘Reply to Davidson’, in Lewis Edwin Hahn (ed.), The Philosophy of Hans-Georg Gadamer, Library of Living Philosophers, Volume XXIV, Chicago: Open Court, pp. 433–435.
- Goldberg, Nathaniel Jason, 2015, Kantian Conceptual Geography, New York: Oxford University Press.
- Glüer, Kathrin, 2011, Donald Davidson: A Short Introduction, New York: Oxford University Press
- Haddock, Adrian, 2011, ‘Davidson and Idealism’, in Joel Smith and Peter Sullivan (eds.), Transcendental Philosophy and Naturalism, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 26–41.
- Hahn, Lewis Edwin (ed.), 1999, The Philosophy of Donald Davidson, Library of Living Philosophers, Volume XXVII, Chicago: Open Court.
- Isaac, Joel, 2013, ‘Donald Davidson and the analytic revolution in american philosophy, 1940–1970’, The Historical Journal 56: 757–779.
- Joseph, Marc A., 2004, Donald Davidson, Montreal: McGill-Queen’s University Press.
- Keane, Niall, 2021, ‘Hermeneutics in a Broader Horizon: Gadamer, Rorty, Davidson’, in Robert Dostal (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Gadamer, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2nd edn., pp. 374–405.
- Kotatko, Petr, Peter Pagin and Gabriel Segal (eds.), 2001, Interpreting Davidson, Stanford: CSLI Publications.
- Lepore, Ernest (ed.), 1986, Truth and Interpretation: Perspectives on the Philosophy of Donald Davidson, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
- Lepore, Ernest and Kirk Ludwig, 2006, Donald Davidson: Meaning, Truth, Language and Reality, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- –––, 2007, Donald Davidson’s Truth-Theoretic Semantics, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Lepore, Ernest and Kirk Ludwig (eds.), 2013, A Companion to Donald Davidson, Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell.
- Lepore, Ernest and Brian McLaughlin (eds.), 1985, Actions and Events: Perspectives on the Philosophy of Donald Davidson, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
- Ludwig, Kirk (ed.), 2003, Donald Davidson, New York: Cambridge University Press.
- Maker, William, 1993, ‘Davidson’s Transcendental Arguments’, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 51: 345–360
- Malpas, Jeff, 1992, Donald Davidson and the Mirror of Meaning, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Malpas, Jeff, 2012, Heidegger and the Thinking of Place, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
- Malpas, Jeff (ed.), 2011, Dialogues with Davidson: Acting, Interpreting, Understanding, Cambridge, Mass.: The MIT Press Press.
- Mou, Bo (ed.), 2006, Davidson’s Philosophy and Chinese Philosophy. Constructive Engagement, Leiden: Brill.
- Myers, Robert H.and Claudine Verheggen, 2016, Donald Davidson’s Triangulation Argument: A Philosophical Inquiry, New York: Routledge.
- Nulty, Timothy J. , 2006, Primitive Disclosive Alethism: Davidson, Heidegger, and the Nature of Truth, New York: Peter Lang.
- Okrent, Mark, 2011, ‘Davidson, Heidegger and Truth’, in Malpas (ed.). Dialogues with Davidson, pp.87–112.
- Preyer, Gerhard, Frank Siebelt and Alexander Ulfig (eds.), 1994, Language, Mind and Epistemology, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
- Preyer, Gerhard (ed.), 2012, Donald Davidson on Truth, Meaning, and the Mental, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Rajchman, John, and Cornell West (eds.), 1985, Post-Analytic Philosophy, New York: Columbia.
- Ramberg, Bjørn, 1989, Donald Davidson’s Philosophy of Language: An Introduction, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
- Sellars, Wilfrid, 1948, ‘Realism and the New Way of Words’, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 8: 601–634.
- Stoecker, Ralf (ed.), 1993, Reflecting Davidson, Berlin: W. de Gruyter.
- Van der Burg, Floris, 2007, Davidson and Spinoza, Aldershot: Ashgate.
- Verheggen, Claudine (ed.), 2017, Wittgenstein and Davidson on Language, Thought, and Action, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Vermazen, B., and Hintikka, M., 1985, Essays on Davidson: Actions and Events, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Wheeler, Samuel C. III, 2000, Deconstruction as Analytic Philosophy, Stanford, Stanford University Press.
- Wrathall, Mark A., 1999, ‘The Conditions of Truth in Heidegger and Davidson’, The Monist 82: 304–323.
- Zeglen, Ursula M. (ed.), 1991, Donald Davidson: Truth, meaning and knowledge, London: Routledge.
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Other Internet Resources
- Marc A. Joseph, ‘Donald Davidson: Philosophy of Language’, Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy, U. Tennessee/Martin.
- Vladimir Kalugin, ‘Donald Davidson: Mind and Action’, Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy, U. Tennessee/Martin.
- Mark Silcox, ‘Donald Davidson: Anomalous Monism’, Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy, U. Tennessee/Martin.