Conceptual Art

First published Thu Jun 7, 2007; substantive revision Wed Mar 23, 2022

The philosophy of art addresses a broad spectrum of theoretical issues arising from a wide variety of objects of attention. These range from Paleolithic cave painting to postmodern poetry, and from the problem of how music can convey emotion to that of the metaphysical status of fictional characters. Until recently, however, philosophical interest in conceptual art, or conceptualism, has been notably sparse. Why? After all, both philosophy and the myriad kinds and styles of art and art-making that fall under the conceptual tradition all have one thing in common: they are both intended to make you think and ask pressing questions. What are those questions and how do we go about answering them?

1. Conceptual Art – What Is It?

1.1 Introduction

Few artistic movements have attracted so much controversy and debate as conceptual art. By its nature, conceptual art has a tendency to provoke intense and perhaps even extreme reactions in its audiences. While some people find conceptual art very refreshing and relevant, many others consider it shocking, distasteful, and conspicuously lacking in craftsmanship. Some even simply deny that it is art at all. Conceptual art, it seems, is something that we either love or hate.

This divisive character is, however, far from accidental. Most conceptual art actively sets out to be controversial in so far as it seeks to challenge and probe us about what we tend to take as given in the domain of art. In fact, this capacity to evoke argument and debate lies at the very heart of what conceptual art sets out to do, namely to make us question our assumptions not only about what may properly qualify as art and what the function of the artist should be, but also about what our role as spectators should involve. It should come as no surprise, then, that conceptual art can cause frustration or vexation – to raise difficult and sometimes even annoying questions is precisely what conceptual art in general aspires to do. In reacting strongly to conceptual art we are, in some important sense, playing right into its hands.

The first difficulty that a philosophical investigation of conceptual art encounters has to do with identifying the object of examination, or at least the category of objects under scrutiny. In the words of the art historian Paul Wood,

[i]t is not at all clear where the boundaries of ‘conceptual art’ are to be drawn, which artists and which works to include. Looked at in one way, conceptual art gets to be like Lewis Carroll’s Cheshire cat, dissolving away until nothing is left but a grin: a handful of works made over a few short years by a small number of artists… Then again, regarded under a different aspect, conceptual art can seem like nothing less than the hinge around which the past turned into the present. (Wood 2002, 6)

On a strict historical reading, the expression ‘conceptual art’ refers to the artistic movement that reached its pinnacle between 1966 and 1972 (Lippard 1973).[1] Among its most famous adherents at its early stage we find artists such as Joseph Kosuth, Robert Morris, Joseph Beuys, Adrian Piper, to name but a few. What unites the conceptual art of this period is the absorption of the lessons learnt from other twentieth-century art movements such as Dadaism, Surrealism, Suprematism, Abstract Expressionism and the Fluxus group, together with the ambition once and for all to ‘free’ art of the Modernist paradigm. Most importantly, perhaps, conceptual art of the 1960s and 70s sought to overcome a backdrop against which art’s principal aim is to produce something beautiful or aesthetically pleasing. Art, early conceptual artists held, is redundant if it does not make us think. In their belief that most artistic institutions were not conducive to reflection but merely promoted a conservative and even consumerist conception of art and artists, conceptual artists in the mid-1960s to the early 1970s instead tried to encourage a revisionary understanding of art, the artist, and artistic experience.

While conceptual art in its purest form might arguably be limited to works produced during these five or six years half a century ago, it seems overly narrow – certainly from a philosophical perspective – to limit our inquiry to works produced during that period alone. For although the work created during that time might generally be conceived as more directly anti-establishment and anti-consumerist than later conceptual art, the spirit of early conceptual art seems to have carried on relatively undiluted into the very late twentieth and twenty-first centuries, as witnessed by pieces such as Tracey Emin’s Unmade Bed, Damian Hirst’s The Physical Impossibility of Death in the Mind of Someone Living, and Ai Weiwei’s Surveillance Camera.

The highly individualised character of the intellectual exploration that conceptual art urges us to engage in has always been such that any attempt to pinpoint a specific common denominator other than this general vision and approach to art, art-making and society at large invariably fails to catch its very essence. The means of artistic expression, we are told, are infinite and the topics available for questioning and discussion are limitless. It belongs to the very nature of conceptual art, then, to be – like Lewis’ Cheshire cat – elusive and slippery. Conceptual artists, be it Joseph Beuys or Marina Abramovic, pursue artistic originality and representation in every possible way. For that reason, one might find oneself obliged to replace the slightly lofty cliché according to which there are as many definitions of conceptual art as there are conceptual artists, with an even more extreme version of the claim, namely, that there are as many definitions of conceptual art as there are conceptual artworks.

Nevertheless, in the midst of this deliberately produced uncertainty about the nature of conceptual art, a handful of characteristics and general aims do seem to recur, and although they should not be seen as criteria for conceptual art strictly speaking, they may be considered tenets fundamental to (most) conceptual art.

1.2 The Limits of Art and the Role of Artists

First and foremost, conceptual art challenges our intuitions concerning the limits of what may count as art and what it is an artist does. It does so, on the one hand, by postulating ever more complex objects as candidates for the status of ‘artwork’, and, on the other hand, by distancing the task of the artist from the actual making and manipulating of the artistic material.

A characteristic way in which conceptual art explores the boundaries of the artwork is by a process of questioning where the realm of the artistic ends and that of utility begins. Continuing the tradition of Marcel Duchamp’s readymades such as Fountain, or Bottlerack, it sets out to overthrow our traditional conceptions of what an art object should be made of and what it should look like. The artwork is a process rather than a material thing, and as such it is no longer something that can be grasped merely by seeing, hearing or touching the end product of that process. The notion of agency in art-making is thus particularly emphasised. In many cases, the ‘art-making’ and the ‘artwork’ come together, because what is sought is an identification of the notion of the work of art with the conceptual activity of the artist. Conceptual art, politicised and influenced by events such as the ‘May Days’ in Paris (1968), the ‘Hot Autumn’ in Italy (1969), the Vietnam War, and the rise of feminism, promotes a rapprochement between art-making and criticism – both artistic and social – by raising questions about the products of artistic activities and the very purpose of art. To use the words of Joseph Kosuth, it ‘annexes the functions of the critic, and makes a middle-man unnecessary.’ (Guercio 1999, 39).

1.3 Artistic Media

As a direct result of its examination of what may properly qualify as art, and of the markedly broad conception of what may constitute an art object resulting from this examination, conceptual art tends to reject traditional artistic media such as conventional painting or sculpture. Instead, it has found itself drawn to alternative means of expression, including performances, photography, films, videos, events, bodies, new ready-mades and new mixed media. In a nutshell, nothing can be ruled out in principle for use as possible artistic media, as can be seen, for example, in Richard Long’s photograph of a line made in the grass by walking[2], Bruce Nauman’s nine minute film of the artist himself playing one note on a violin whilst walking around in his studio[3], Janine Antoni’s use of chocolate and soap, Marina Abramovic’s display of an array of everyday objects, including knives, torches and feathers, which the audience is invited to apply directly on to the artist’s body, and Piero Manzoni’s act of signing a woman’s arm[4].

1.4 Art as Idea

The most fundamentally revisionary feature of conceptual art is the way in which it proclaims itself to be an art of the mind rather than the senses: it rejects traditional artistic media because it locates the artwork at the level of ideas rather than that of objects. Because more weight tends to given to creative process than physical material, and because art should be about intellectual inquiry and reflection rather than beauty and aesthetic pleasure (as traditionally conceived), the identity of the work of art is said to lie in the idea at the heart of the piece in question. In the words of Kosuth, ‘[t]he actual works of art are ideas’ (Lippard 1973, 25). For conceptual art, ‘the idea or concept is the most important aspect of the work’ (LeWitt 1967, 166). Art is ‘de-materialised’, and in this sense held to be prior to its materialisation in any given object.

The claim that the conceptual artwork is to be identified with an idea that may be seen to underlie it has far-reaching ramifications. It not only affects the ontology of the conceptual artwork but also profoundly alters the role of the artist by casting her in the role of thinker rather than object-maker. Moreover, it calls for a thorough review of the way in which we perceive, engage and appreciate artworks. Further still, it links art so intimately to ideas and concepts that even a principled distinction between the domain of art and the realm of thought seems difficult to preserve.

1.5 Semantic Representation

For all these reasons, the kind of representation employed in conceptual artworks is best described in terms of the transmission of ideas. In conceptual art, the representation at work can generally be seen as semantic rather than illustrative. That is to say, it sets out to have and convey a specific meaning rather than to depict a scene, person or event. Even in cases where a work makes use of illustrative representation, conceptual art is still putting that representation to a distinctively semantic use, in the sense of there being an intention to represent something one cannot see with the naked eye. Accordingly, the conceptual artist’s task is to contemplate and formulate this meaning – to be a ‘meaning-maker’.

2. The Philosophy of Conceptual Art – What is it?

On the whole, the philosophical concerns raised by conceptual art can be divided into two main categories. First, there are specific questions to do with conceptual art itself, and the claims which underpin the project that drives it. Philosophical investigations might thus be called for not only in relation to the internal consistency and coherence of the project and its set goals, but also with regards to the particular tenets outlined above. For example, what does it mean to say that every single thing, person or event is a possible candidate for an artistic medium and does that suggestion not render the category of art, as we know it, redundant?

Second, conceptual art poses philosophical problems from a wider perspective, in so far as one might expect philosophy to provide us with unitary accounts of the nature of art, the role of the artist, and artistic experience. In many important respects, conceptual art sits very uncomfortably with other, often more traditional artforms and artworks, and this tension highlights a pressing issue for anyone interested in the possibility of a universal theory of art. For if there is to be one rule for conceptual art and another for all other kinds of art, are there still good grounds for thinking of conceptual art as a kind of art? Moreover, could not every particular kind of artform or artwork demand a separate theory of art, artist and artistic experience?

If we are to sidestep such an intrinsic division between conceptual art on the one hand, and other kinds of art on the other, then theories concerned mainly with art that is not conceptual will have to make many significant concessions in order to incorporate the problematic case that conceptual artworks present. At the very least, a compromise will have to be reached concerning what we mean by the term ‘artwork’.

One of the over-riding concerns that beset the philosophy of conceptual art is thus whether and, if so, why one should actively pursue unified accounts in the philosophy of art. Whether one comes out of that investigation embracing a broader – albeit perhaps vaguer – set of concepts and tools than one started off with, or whether one considers oneself forced to abandon any hope of anything but very specific theories of art, artist, and artistic experience, conceptual art obliges us to think about where we stand on these issues.

Philosophizing about conceptual art is, then, not merely philosophizing about one specific artform. It is philosophizing about the most revisionary kind of art, one that sees its own task as being profoundly philosophical in nature. Let us now turn to five more specific philosophical themes that conceptual art urges us to consider.

3. Five Philosophical Themes

3.1 The Definition of Art

The problem of defining art is by no means a problem for conceptual art alone. Two principal difficulties immediately arise in the context of any attempt to form a definition. First, the category of art is particularly heterogeneous. Simply put, there seems to be an infinite variety of things, or kinds of thing, that need to fall under its jurisdiction. Second, there is great variety of opinion on what any putative definition of art should actually consist of.

On the standard conception, a definition is something that provides us with necessary and sufficient conditions for some thing x to be F, so that, for example, it is a necessary and sufficient condition for a number to be an even number that it is (i) an integer and (ii) divisible by two. Accordingly, a definition of art must be capable of outlining a clear set of conditions that must be satisfied.

There have been no shortages of attempts to define art in this manner. Most prominently perhaps, it has been suggested that art ought to be defined in terms of its aesthetic character, so that, roughly, x is an artwork if and only if x gives rise to an aesthetic experience (e.g., Beardsley 1958). Notwithstanding the difficulties that this particular suggestion entails (we shall return to this in §3.3), the advent of a kind of art that is as profoundly revisionary and difficult to classify as conceptual art renders the attempt to provide a general definition applicable to all art particularly complex. It is no coincidence, then, that a neo-Wittgensteinian approach came to dominate the philosophy of art in the late 1950s and 1960s. Drawing support from anti-essentialist theories of language, it was suggested that art was numbered among the various concepts that are, by their very nature, ‘essentially contested’ (Gallie 1948; see also Weitz 1956). That is to say, some concepts – such as that pertaining to sports, for example– simply do not allow for definitions in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions, and art is best as understood as one of them. In the words of Morris Weitz, art may be

an open concept. New conditions have constantly arisen and will undoubtedly constantly arise; new art forms, new movements will emerge, which will demand decisions on the part of those interested… as to whether the concept should be extended or not. (Weitz 1956, 32)

The act of proposing a definition of art thus becomes a less stringent exercise of conceptual analysis. The alternative method proposed by neo-Wittgensteinians such as Weitz in attempting to identify art and explain how we are to distinguish it from non-art is the notion of family resemblance (see Wittgenstein 1953, §66–71). Faced with the question ‘Is X an artwork?’, what we should do is try to detect strands of resemblance with paradigmatic instances of an artwork. If some significant resemblance to such a paradigmatic case is observed, we can rightly call the object of our scrutiny a work of art.

The proposal, though interesting, is not without its own difficulties. One problem that immediately arises relates to the idea of resemblance itself, and the way it rapidly expands in such a way as to render it close to useless. This is for the simple reason that we can always find some way in which some given thing may be said to resemble any other given thing. This kind of openness, it is important to note, is not something that fits in with the programme of conceptual art. Whilst conceptual art does hold that any kind of object could be a work of art, it is not saying that every object is a work of art. Far from it. Much conceptual art, in exploring the boundaries between the realms of the artistic and that of function and utility, is perceptually indistinguishable from non-art, such as Andy Warhol’s Brillo Boxes. In that sense, conceptual art presents a particularly difficult case for the neo-Wittgensteinian method of identification. After all, the only way in which Warhol’s Brillo Boxes does not resemble any other stack of Brillo Boxes is the sense in which the former is a work of art and the latter is not. The notion of resemblance is clearly of little use here.

Picking up on this concern, Arthur Danto has famously suggested that it is in fact a non-manifest relation that makes something an artwork rather than an observable property (Danto 1981). That is to say, artworks acquire that status in virtue of their relations to the historical and social setting constituted by the practices and conventions of art, our artistic heritage, the intentions of artists, and so on — the ‘artworld’ (see also Dickie 1974). The general idea here is that artworks are generated within a social and artistic context, and so being an artwork is a function of certain social relations. Conceptual art reinforces the idea that art and non-art can be perceptually indistinguishable and so cannot be marked off from each other by ‘exhibited’ properties alone.[5]

Setting aside the details of such an account, one of the things conceptual art has helped philosophers to grasp more fully is that any successful general definition, or indeed principled theory of the identification of art, will need to have the non-manifest properties of artworks at its centre. It is the meaning that the artist infuses into the work and the meaning that we as audience stand to gain from it that contains the key to its status as art (more on this in §3.4). To use the example of Warhol’s Brillo Boxes again, the work of the conceptual artist seems primarily to be the work of imbuing objects with a particular kind of meaning.

A more promising line of enquiry has been developed by David Davies. Taking his cue from the problems posed by conceptual art, Davies argues that a unified definition of art can only be found if we think of art primarily in terms of the creative process or series of actions resulting in a material thing or other ‘focus of appreciation’. In that sense, the artwork is primarily identified with the intentional acts through which it comes into being rather than with the end-product of that process (Davies 2004). Art, on this view, is better understood as a kind of performance than as a manifest object. By shifting the focus of our attention in this way, we can overcome many of the difficulties associated with defining art, most notably that of its heterogeneity. It may be, then, that the most enduring lesson to be learnt from conceptual art with regards to the definition of art is not so much that a conceptual analysis of art is completely unattainable, as that we simply have been looking in the wrong place.

3.2 The Ontology and Media of Art

The claim that conceptual art is to be identified less with a perceivable object than with the meaning or idea it aims to convey, gives rise to a host of complex ontological questions. The rejection of traditional artistic media, together with the de-materialisation of the art object, forces us to reconsider what seemed to be relatively uncomplicated aspects of artistic experience. The answers to questions such as ‘Is there in fact any one thing (or set of things) that we must perceive in artistic appreciation?’, and ‘Is it a necessary condition for the existence of an artwork that it have a medium?’ suddenly become a good deal less obvious.

In the first instance, conceptual art drives us to review the common assumption that appropriate appreciation and engagement with an artwork must involve a direct first-hand experience of that piece itself. The idea here, to use Frank Sibley’s words, is that

[p]eople have to see the grace or unity of a work, hear the plaintiveness or frenzy in the music, notice the gaudiness of colour scheme, feel the power of a novel, its mood, or its uncertainty of tone. They may be struck by these qualities at once, or they may come to perceive them only after repeated viewings, hearings, or readings, and with the help of critics. But unless they do perceive them for themselves, aesthetic enjoyment, appreciation, and judgement are beyond them… the crucial thing is to see, hear, or feel. (Sibley 1965, 137).

The assumption in question is, then, that although we seem to gain something from looking at, for example, a postcard or poster of Katsushika Hokusai's Fine Wine, Clear Morning or Élisabeth Vigée Le Brun’s Self-Portrait in a Straw Hat , a genuine judgement about its artistic character necessitates one’s own un-mediated perceptual experience of it. But – and herein lies the crux of the problem for conceptual art – what if there is nothing for us to get a first-hand perceptual experience of? In the case of Walter De Maria’s Vertical Earth Kilometer (1977)[6], a kilometre-long metal shaft plunged into the surface of the earth so that only the very top is visible, first-hand perceptual experience is simply not something that can be had. More pertinently, what does it even mean to have a perceptual engagement with an artwork that claims, basically, to be an idea?

Perhaps the most pressing question, however, has to do with the extent to which we are to take conceptual art’s claim of de-materialisation seriously. Does the de-materialisation of such art not suggest that there is not only a rejection of traditional artistic media in conceptual art, but an outright refutation of artistic media in general? One possible way of making sense of this idea is with a distinction outlined by Davies, namely that between physical medium and vehicular medium (Davies 2004). Crucially, a vehicular medium is said to incorporate not only physical objects (such as paintings and sculptures, say) but also actions, events, and generally more complex entities. In Davies’ words, ‘[t]he product of an artist’s manipulation of a vehicular medium will then be the vehicle whereby a particular artistic statement is articulated… The vehicle may, as in the case of Picasso’s Guernica, be a physical object, or, as in the case of Coleridge’s Kubla Kahn, a linguistic structure-type, or, as arguably in the case of Duchamp’s Fountain, an action of a particular kind.’ (Davies 2004, 59). Adhering to this vehicular medium in art, may then at least equip philosophers with a notion that can deflate the concern of whether conceptual art, by rejecting physical media, denies the need for all artistic media.

Clearly, conceptual art is not the first kind of art to raise ontological concerns of this kind. After all, music and literary art, be it traditional or avant-garde, hardly present straightforward cases either. The question of what exactly constitutes, say, a novel or a musical work have been widely discussed for some time (e.g. Davies 2001; Ingarden 1973; Wollheim 1980) Building on the suggestion that artworks such as musical pieces and literary works are best understood in terms of universals or ‘types’, one view that has been widely discussed in the last two decades or so is based on the idea that not only musical and literary artworks, but all artworks, are types. More specifically, they are to be conceived of as ‘event- or action-types’ (Currie 1988). According to this theory, the artwork is thus not the material thing itself but, rather, the way in which the artist arrived at the underlying structure shared by all instances or performances of that work.

Whilst the general approach fostered by both Currie and Davies is clearly congenial to some aspects of conceptual art, it might nevertheless still be the case that further work needs to be done if the view that artworks are basically event- or action-types is to accommodate all art in the conceptual tradition. Further questions include what role, if any, is played by the (set of) material thing(s) that many conceptual artists undeniably do present us with. What, in other words, are we to make of the object (be it a human body or a video-recording) that is supposed to transmit the idea which, in turn, is said to be the genuine artwork? A good philosophical explanation needs to be given as to how the material thing that is regularly presented to the audience is, in fact, relevant to the artwork itself. Is the vehicular medium constitutive of the artwork, and if so, how exactly does that square with the claim of de-materialisation?

3.3 The Aesthetic Value of Art

Underlying the claim that we need to have a direct experiential encounter with an artwork in order to appreciate it appropriately is the fact that some of the properties that bear on the value of a work can only be grasped in this way. The properties in question here are generally aesthetic properties, and the assumption motivating the experiential requirement is that the appreciation of artworks necessarily involves an aesthetic element (i.e. not necessarily beauty per se, but something aesthetically pleasing or rewarding).

However, one of the most distinguishing features of conceptual art, setting out as it does to replace illustrative representation with semantic representation, is that it does not prioritise aesthetic experience in a traditional sense. Conceptual art is intended as an art of the mind: it generally appeals to matters of the intellect and emphasises art’s cognitive rather than aesthetic value. In the words of Timothy Binkley, traditional aesthetics is preoccupied ‘with perceptual entities’ and this ‘leads aesthetics to extol and examine the “work of art”, while averting its attention almost entirely from the myriad other aspects of that complex cultural activity we call “art” ’ (Binkley 1977, 271).

We can now see that the experiential requirement may well fail to have any bite with regards to conceptual artworks because the artist’s aim does not necessarily involve conferring to the work of art properties that must be experienced directly in order to be grasped and fully appreciated. If there is to be any kind of first-hand experiential requirement for the appropriate appreciation of conceptual artworks, it will perhaps be of a kind that focuses on an imaginative engagement with the idea central to the artwork rather than a perceptual experience of its aesthetic properties (see Schellekens 2007)

The main philosophical question highlighted by conceptual art in this context, then, is the following: ‘Does art really need to be aesthetic, and, if so, in what sense?’. In Binkley’s opinion, and in support of conceptual art, one does not necessarily have to think of art in terms of aesthetic value –whilst a lot of ‘art has chosen to articulate in the medium of an aesthetic space’, there is ‘no a priori reason why art must confine itself to the creation of aesthetic objects. It might opt for articulation in a semantic space instead of an aesthetic one so that artistic meaning is not embodied in a physical object or event’ (Binkley 1977, 273).

However, not everyone has endorsed such a liberal view about the separation between the aesthetic and the artistic[7]. If art does not aim at having aesthetic value, what, one might argue, will set it apart from non-art? Which view one decides to favour on this point may well end up being an issue about definition. If one wishes to define art in terms of aesthetic experience, the question finds a clear-cut answer, namely that conceptual art simply cannot be considered a kind of art. The down-side of that position is, however, a whole set of difficult concerns to do with things, such as nature or persons, that hardly qualify as art even though they invite aesthetic experiences. If one is impressed by these worries and cannot see any decisive philosophical reason to uphold the aesthetic view, there is little, if anything, to block a conception of art which is not necessarily aesthetic. One may, then, think of aesthetic value as one kind of artistic value that, alongside with moral, religious, political, historical and financial value, some artworks have and others do not.[8]

Now, even if it is granted that art need not be aesthetic, it is still possible to hold that conceptual art does not qualify as good art because it does not (aim to) yield aesthetic experiences. But while this may be a viable position to hold in relation to the project of conceptual art in general, it cannot be used to attack conceptual art on its own grounds. Saying, for example, of Michael Craig-Martin’s An Oak Tree that one cannot consider it a great work of art because it fails to give rise to a distinctively aesthetic kind of pleasure does not actually undermine the project. Conceptual art, as we now know, is more about conveying meaning through a vehicular medium than about furnishing its audiences with experiences of, say, beauty. Any attack on this fundamental feature of conceptual art targets not so much an individual work of art but rather finds fault with the artistic tradition itself.

3.4 The Interpretation of Art

At the most basic level of inquiry, two queries arise about interpretation in art: (i) what ‘tools’ do we use to interpret artworks?, and (ii) what is it we do when we interpret artworks? In the case of conceptual art, a satisfactory answer to (i) will most probably appeal to elements such as the narrative aids provided by artists or curators (e.g. catalogues, titles, exhibited explanations, labels, etc.); the appropriate mode of perception (i.e. looking or listening); and what we know about the artwork’s and artist’s social, historical, political or artistic context. Depending on the ontological status of the particular piece (if it is, say, a ready-made or a performance), these elements can be combined in different ways to explain our interpretative habits and practices.

In addressing (ii) we will most likely need to refer to the various mental abilities we put to use in such interpretative exercises (e.g. imagination, empathy); and also to ask precisely what the target of our interpretation is. This latter task is not as unproblematic as it may seem, for it is not always clear whether it is the object itself that should be under scrutiny, the object’s perceptual properties (and, if so, which), the idea at the heart of the work, or the artist’s intentions in making the piece. It seems unlikely that the question will find an adequate answer until we find an acceptable solution to the problem mentioned above, namely ‘Is the vehicular medium a constitutive part of the conceptual artwork or not, and if so how?’.

Two further philosophical questions about the notion of artistic interpretation take on a particularly complex dimension in relation to conceptual art. First, exactly what information is relevant in artistic interpretation? And, more importantly, to what extent should the artist’s intention be allowed to determine the appropriate interpretation? Views differ widely on this topic. In their article, ‘The Intentional Fallacy’, William Wimsatt and Monroe Beardsley famously argue in relation to the literary arts that the only kind of evidence that is relevant to interpretation is that which is internal to the work in question. (Wimsatt & Beardsley 1946). An artist’s intention or design is of no interpretative significance. Obviously, this position seems difficult to defend in the case of conceptual art: when we are dealing with pieces such as Warhol’s Brillo Boxes, where the internal evidence is clearly insufficient to discern that it is an artwork in the first place, it seems that we need to know that Warhol intended the boxes to be viewed qua art, at the very least.

Now, even if we do wish to defend the view that the artist’s intention needs to be taken into account somehow in the interpretation of conceptual art, further questions still require our attention here. Most centrally, should the artist’s intention always be considered the decisive factor in interpretation and must it always be involved? Generally speaking, there are two main strands of intentionalist positions available. On the one hand, there is an approach which holds that the artist’s intention determines an artwork’s meaning, and thus cannot be overlooked – or indeed superseded – in artistic interpretation (e.g., Carroll 1992). On the other hand, there is a view that the interpreter ought to construct the best hypothesis concerning the artist’s actual intention with the help of, say, the text and biographical notes, and that this hypothesis confers meaning on the work in question (e.g., Levinson 1992).

At least at a first glance, it may seem that conceptual art presents a stronger case for the first approach to interpretation, since the artist’s intention is all we have to go by, quite literally, in works such as Robert Barry’s simple statement entitled All the Things I Know But of which I am Not at the Moment Thinking (1969) (see, e.g., Maes 2010 and Gover 2012). Nevertheless, the question cannot be settled quite so easily, for many conceptual artists make a point of putting all the interpretative onus on the spectator. How often are we told, after all, that a specific artwork’s meaning rests entirely in our hands; that ‘it means whatever you want it to mean’?

This leads us to the second question that is especially pertinent for a kind of art that sets out to convey an idea or meaning, namely whether there can be more than one correct or appropriate interpretation of an artwork. Again, several theories present themselves as eligible candidates in relation to this problem. One suggestion has centred around the idea that there can be a multiplicity of appropriate or correct divergent interpretations of one and the same artwork which cannot be reduced to one underlying interpretation or ranked in relation to each other (e.g., Margolis 1991; Goldman 1990). In opposition to this view, however, another approach has it that there is in fact always a single best interpretation which is better than any other (e.g., Beardsley 1970). The aim of artistic interpretation is, then, in Matthew Kieran’s words, ‘restricted to discovering the one true meaning of an artwork.’ (Kieran 1996, 239). Whilst conceptual art certainly seems to rest on something like the interpretative plurality of the first view, it is not obvious how a kind of art that presents itself as an idea can, in reality, accommodate such indeterminacy.

There are good reasons to believe that of all the questions conceptual art gives rise to, interpretation is the most problematic from an internal point of view. The conundrum can be put in the following terms. If the conceptual work is the idea, it seems reasonable to assume that artistic interpretation will consist primarily in coming to understand that idea (which is conceded by the artist to the artwork considered as such). In other words, if we take conceptual art’s de-materialisation claim seriously, we are left with a notion of interpretation which is relatively constrained to the artist’s intention and to the claim that that intention determines the appropriate or correct interpretation for that particular work.

As we have seen, though, we are often encouraged by conceptual artists to take the interpretative exercise into our own hands, so to speak, and not be shy to use features about ourselves and our own lives as interpretive tools. We are, in other words, asked to combine the idea of art as idea with the claim that we can, as spectators, convey an entirely new and fresh interpretation onto an artwork that is nothing but an idea which, by definition, needs to be about or concerned with something. So, if the idea is the art, then how can my idiosyncratic interpretation of that idea be anywhere near valid? It seems, then that in order to be coherent, conceptual art must give up either the claim that the actual artwork is nothing other than the idea, or the claim that the interpretative onus lies on the viewer.

3.5 The Cognitive Value of Art

In seeking to convey a semantic representation through a vehicular medium, conceptual art arguably aims to have cognitive – rather than aesthetic – value. By cognitive value, what is meant is simply the value an artwork may have in virtue of enhancing or increasing our understanding of some topic, notion or event. Interestingly, conceptual art seems to assume that the aesthetic detracts from or divests art of its possible cognitive value in such a way as to render the two kinds of value close to mutually exclusive (Schellekens 2007).

The attempt to separate the aesthetic from the cognitive is far from a recent investigative endeavour in philosophical circles. In the very first section of Kant’s Critique of the Power of Judgement, a clear-cut distinction is outlined between aesthetic and cognitive (or ‘logical’) judgements. However, few artistic movements have pressed these questions about the division between aesthetic value on the one hand, and cognitive value on the other, as scrupulously and explicitly as conceptual art. In fact, conceptual art makes things very difficult for itself by holding that the only kind of artistic value that is entirely legitimate is cognitive value.

Clearly, conceptual art is not the only kind of art that may have cognitive value – many other artforms aim to have cognitive value in addition to aesthetic value – and most of us would agree that part of why we find art rewarding is precisely because it often yields some kind of understanding. That is to say, we read novels, look at paintings and listen to music not only because of the pleasure it may afford, but also because it tends to make us richer human beings, better able to make sense of the world around us.

Uncontroversial as this claim may seem, some philosophers have denied that art should either have or seek to have cognitive value. Most famously perhaps, expressivists such as Clive Bell and Roger Fry held that art should only seek to express and arouse emotions (Bell 1914; Fry 1920). James Young has defended a view whereby avant-garde art, like conceptual art, cannot yield any significant knowledge or understanding (Young 2001, 77).

Young’s argument focuses on the notion of exemplification which he locates at the heart of the only kind of semantic representation and cognitive value that can be ascribed to artworks such as conceptual ones. Exemplification is a form of reference to properties by means of a sample (or exemplar). An exemplar ‘stands for some property by [non-metaphorically, literally] possessing the property’ (Young 2001, 72). In the case of conceptual art, a work then exemplifies an idea or concept. So, for example, Tom Marioni’s The Act of Drinking Beer with One’s Friends is the Highest Form of Art (1970)[9] – a piece involving the artist and his friends drinking beer together – is an exemplar of the idea at the heart of the work, namely that drinking beer with one’s friends is the highest art-form of all. This is the work’s statement. However, as Young points out, it doesn’t follow from the fact that something expresses a statement or has meaning that it has significant cognitive value. All things considered, the kind of statement that conceptual artworks and their like are typically able to make, according to Young, are merely truisms. If conceptual art yields cognitive value, that is to say, it tends to be so trivial that it barely deserves the name.

The argument puts a finger on an experience shared by many spectators of conceptual art who feel conned or deceived by it. Not only are conceptual artworks not beautiful, one might object, they don’t even tell us anything over and beyond banal clichés. What, then, is conceptual art really good for?

If there is to be a way out of this difficulty, we will have to take the bull by the horns and discuss exactly what (kind of) understanding one may gain from it. This answer will have to be cashed out in terms of two concerns: one about the content of the knowledge, and another about the kind of knowledge in question. First, knowledge yielded by art can be about the artwork – not only the techniques employed, the work’s history and tradition, and so on, but also the meaning and thoughts that the work conveys. Second, art can yield either propositional knowledge or knowledge by acquaintance. Whereas the first consists of knowledge given to us in terms of propositions and can either be concerned with the artwork itself (e.g. knowledge ‘that [Manet's famous painting] represents the Emperor Maximilan’s execution') or a reality beyond that work (e.g. knowledge ‘that horrible things are often done in the name of political revolutions’), the second kind of knowledge has the potential to enable one to imagine what it would be like to be in a certain position or situation, to empathize, to come very close to experiencing what it would be like to have that kind of experience first-hand (e.g. what it is like to witness the execution of a dishonoured Emperor).

The notions of knowledge and cognitive value, whilst at the very heart of the conceptual project, raise a manifold of important questions that require solid and cogent philosophical answers. Perhaps exemplification can still serve an epistemological purpose by inviting us to engage with the issues raised by a work of art in a richer and more imaginative way; in a way that makes us think about questions of philosophical interest in particular way – a way that propositions alone cannot do? Perhaps the key to conceptual art’s value lies in a more challenging intellectual relationship with the work, a genuine engagement with the idea in question. Exploring this avenue may yet help us see what kind of non-trivial cognitive value conceptual art is capable of yielding.

4. Further Questions

Many more questions centred around these five philosophical themes remain to be examined in relation to conceptual art. With regards to concerns about defining art, we need to address the increasing number of worries to do with exactly how we are to distinguish art from non-art, and indeed whether there really is a distinction (if only theoretical) to be drawn here. That is to say, if conceptual art is at times not only perceptually indistinguishable from non-art but it is also the case that everything is alleged to be (part of) a potential artwork, perhaps the inevitable outcome is that there simply cannot be a principled distinction between art and non-art. So, does the conceptual project lead to the end of the category of art as such?

From the ontological perspective, this set of concerns acquires an even more aggressive flavour: if art should be all about putting forward ideas and making statements, why, one might wonder, do we need the conceptual artwork at all? Can we not merely ask the same questions and make the same statements directly?

In addition to these questions, the host of issues that have been raised about interpretation, intention, appreciation and the way they are (or should be) related have not yet been silenced. For art that is as discourse-dependent as most conceptual art is, it is not always clear whether there is anything more to interpreting conceptual art than just being told what the idea in question is. And if so, can we still call this interpretation?

Finally, what are we to make of the relation between aesthetic and cognitive value in conceptual art – should they be considered as in opposition or even as mutually exclusive? If the only kind of value that is of genuine artistic importance is cognitive value, it will be difficult to avoid the definitional and ontological concerns mentioned above. Also, it will call for a deeply revisionary conception of art, one fundamentally hostile to the very notions we are probably most used to associating with art, namely beauty and aesthetic pleasure.

Central to the philosophy of conceptual art is thus the provocative spirit of the project under investigation – conceptual art throws down the gauntlet by challenging us to reconsider every aspect of artistic experience, and it may well be up to philosophy to pick it up and address some of the questions conceptual art makes its business to raise. Conceptual art actively aims to be thought-provoking, stimulating and inspiring, and if only for that reason, philosophers interested in art should not pass it by unaffected.


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