Aesthetic Experience

First published Fri Jan 20, 2023

A paradigmatic aesthetic experience is a perceptual experience focused on the beauty of an object like a work of art or an aspect of nature. Some philosophers take it that this is the only kind of aesthetic experience, though many more take it that there are other varieties as well. You might, for instance, have an aesthetic experience by witnessing not a beautiful but a sublime storm. You might have an aesthetic experience not by having a perceptual but rather by having an (imagined) emotional experience of the deep suffering of Sethe expressed in Toni Morrison’s great novel Beloved. Perhaps you might even have an aesthetic experience by appreciating the way in which an elegant theorem reorganizes your thought about a mathematical structure.

Philosophical work on art and beauty in the Western tradition extends back at least as far as the ancient Greeks, but the concept of aesthetic experience as such emerged in this tradition only in the 18th century. Not all who work in this area take any form of experience to be the most fundamental concept for aesthetic theory; others take evaluative aesthetic judgments, or the aesthetic value of objects themselves, to be more basic in explaining the relevant phenomena. This entry discusses all those views in the Western tradition with any theory of aesthetic experience at all—not only those views that take aesthetic experience to be fundamental.

Philosophers use the idea of a distinctively aesthetic experience for several different purposes. Some use it to defend deep, effortful engagement with the arts or art criticism (Shelley 1832 [2003]). Some use it to give a substantive definition of art (Tolstoy 1897 [2007]), or to elevate ‘real’ art over other cultural media (Collingwood 1938 [1958]). Some use it to argue for the personal or social importance of an education in sensibility (Schiller 1795 [1989]). Others describe aesthetic experience as a special form of cognitive contact with the world, perhaps even with its fundamental metaphysics (Schopenhauer 1818 [1958]). Only a few now question the utility of the concept of aesthetic experience (Shusterman 1997, 2008, Nehamas 1998).

Given this diversity of purposes, it is difficult to say much about aesthetic experience that is not controversial. But a few questions can be posed for all theories of aesthetic experience. What is distinctive about aesthetic experience? What is valuable about having an experience of this kind? How if at all, does it involve evaluating its own object? Who can have these experiences, and under what conditions? Does it make sense to say that we should have such experiences?

These questions will be answered on behalf of various different approaches to aesthetic experience in the course of this overview. The overview organizes such approaches along two dimensions: in terms of the properties of an object on which such experience focuses; and in terms of various internal aspects of the experience itself.

1. Focus of aesthetic experience

Any aesthetic experience has intentionality: it is an experience (as) of some object. Typically, that object will be a work of art—such as a sculpture, a symphony, a painting, a performance, or a movie—or some aspect of nature, such as a bird’s plumage, a cliff, or a bright winter morning. An aesthetic experience of an object with sensible features is commonly thought to be a perceptual experience of those sensible features. In the case of poems, novels, and certain pieces of conceptual art, the experience might be understood as an imagined sensory experience; in the case of abstract or intelligible objects like theorems, it might be neither sensory nor imaginative in nature.

It is common to individuate aesthetic experience partly—but typically not only—in terms of the types of properties on which this experience focuses. In perceiving a sculpture, for instance, you might experience its shape, its color, its resemblance to a real person, its placement in a gallery, its authorship, or its representational style. Most think that aesthetic experience as such focuses on only some of these properties, and perhaps even excludes focus on others.

This section analyzes the broad categories of properties of objects on which aesthetic experience has been said to focus: formal properties like shape or composition; the powers things have to give us pleasure; properties of meriting or deserving certain subjective responses; expressive properties, especially those that express emotions; and fundamental metaphysical properties like essences or the nature of humanity. It is consistent to individuate aesthetic experience by its focus on more than one of these types of properties. The views presented under each subsection below are not mutually exclusive, except where explicitly stated.

This discussion largely treats these types of properties without discriminating between their presence in manufactured artworks vs. aspects of nature. It will leave aside discussion of the comparative fundamentality of art and nature (cf. Hegel 1820–29 [1920]; Croce 1938 [2007] p. 277; Adorno 1970 [1997] pp. 61–2; Wollheim 1990 §42–3; Savile 1982 Ch.8). It will also leave aside discussions of aesthetic experience that are solely focused on aesthetic experience of nature (cf. Bullough 1912, Hepburn 1966, Carlson 1979, 2005, Budd 1996, Rolston 1998) or solely focused on aesthetic experience of abstracta like theorems or proofs (cf. Baumgarten 1735 [1954], Hutcheson 1726 [2004], Schellekens 2022).

1.1 Form and Function

Long before the 18th-century development of special theories of aesthetic experience, neo-Platonic medieval philosophers developed a concept of beauty as rationally intelligible formal structure as it could be appreciated in experience. In his fourth-century work De Musica, Augustine took beauty in music to be partly a matter of proportionality of parts, and later argued that visual beauty is formal harmony combined in the right way with color (Haldane 2013). Nine centuries later, Thomas Aquinas (Summa Theologica) echoed this hylomorphic conception: the beautiful is material structured in proper form, the kind “of which apprehension in itself pleases” (“Pulchrum dicatur id cujus apprehensio ipsa placet,” § Ia, IIae, q.27, a.1 ad 3; as translated by Mothersill 1988, p. 323). In the Italian Renaissance, Leon Battista Alberti (1443–1452 [1988]) called beauty “reasoned harmony of all the parts within a body” (Book 6, §2 at p.156).

In the eighteenth century, attention to aesthetic experience per se, rather than beauty, grew out of a more general inquiry into perception. Alexander Baumgarten (1735 [1954]) first defined “aesthetics” much more broadly as we do now—as the science of cognizing objects by sensory perception (from the Greek “aisthêsis” for sensory perception). Baumgarten’s work on the topic was heavily influenced by that of Leibniz (1684 [1969]) and Wolff (1719 [2003]). All three took pleasure more generally to be sensory perception of an object’s perfection; Wolff treated this as the coherence of the aspects of an object either in themselves or as they work together to accomplish a purpose.

These early claims that experience of beauty is experience of form were thoroughly integrated into the general theistic metaphysics and epistemology of these thinkers. Baumgarten, for instance, claimed that we take pleasure not only in the perfection of an object, he wrote, but also in being conscious of our own “perfection of sensible cognition as such,” in how we are suited to sense the world (1750 [2007] §14; cf. Meier 1999 and Mendelssohn 1785 [1979]). The contemporary English philosopher Anthony Ashbury Cooper, the Third Earl of Shaftesbury (1711 [2007]), took pleasurable admiration of well-formed objects really to be admiration of the form-imposing minds, including those of the artist but ultimately that of the divine. “The beautifying, not the beautified, is the really beautiful,” he wrote (Cahn and Meskin 2007, p. 80).

Immanuel Kant’s immensely influential Critique of Judgment (1789 [1987]) peeled aesthetic experience away from apprehension of the divine, and cleaved the apprehension of form away from function. He claimed you make a pure judgment of (“free”) beauty when you take pleasure just in perceiving the form of an object without even conceptualizing its function.

Kant clearly contradicts his German predecessors in his claim that “neither does perfection gain by beauty, nor beauty by perfection” (§16 at p. 78). Nonetheless, Kant does make two kinds of theoretical concessions to this tradition. First, he allows that his German predecessors like Baumgarten may have confused perfection for a purpose with a subjective kind of purposiveness without reference to any specific purpose. This latter “purposiveness” is difficult to understand, but Kant suggests that it consists in the harmony of an object’s parts, as presented in experience, that allows you to unite them in your imagination into a structured unity (§15, p. 74; see Section 2.3). Secondly, Kant concedes that we sometimes speak of “beauty,” e.g. the beauty of a building, when we highlight how something is perfect for its function. Kant calls this “accessory beauty” (or “adherent beauty,” another translation of “pulchritude adhaerens”) (§16 at p. 76).

Kant is often cited as a “formalist”—someone who claims that aesthetic experience focuses exclusively on formal properties of objects—but this is a matter of interpretive dispute. What is clear is that Kant offered a way into understanding aesthetic experience’s focus on form independently from its association with the divine or with any function that form might fulfill.

Most German work on aesthetics in the nineteenth century moved away from focus on mere form to discuss the special knowledge that aesthetic experience might afford (see Section 1.5). Interest in form without function saw resurgence in the final decades of the nineteenth century.

In The Birth of Tragedy (1872 [1992]), Friedrich Nietzsche argued that the artistic form of a tragedy—its rhythm, its musical shapes, its overarching structure—could transfigure the fundamental facts of human suffering that would otherwise overwhelm and paralyze us. In such transfiguration by form, we come to take “aesthetic pleasure” (§24 at pp. 140–1,) in what would otherwise be horrible (cf. Bullough 1912 [2007]). Formal structure produces a necessary, salutary illusion in our perception of terrible and otherwise unmanageable truths.

The influential Austrian music critic Eduard Hanslick argued in 1891 [2007] that only pure form in music could be beautiful, and its lack of any “subject” was no discredit to it. In a partial return to Kant, George Santayana (1896) gave form a particularly important role to play in grounding beauty in all art forms. He said that you can take self-conscious pleasure in synthesizing various distinct perceptions of elements of an object to come to perceive it as a structured whole.

In response to the late 19th- and early 20th-century development of abstract and non-representational styles in the visual arts, a greater resurgence in formalism took place (Stolnitz 1960; Carroll 2013). The visual art critic Clive Bell (1914 [2007]) took aesthetic experience to be a response to what he called “Significant Form” in a piece of visual art, i.e. “arrangements and combinations that move us in a particular way” to “austere and thrilling raptures” distinct from those feelings we encounter otherwise (p.264, 268). In contrast, the “representative element” is always “irrelevant” to such aesthetic experience (p.27).

A significant twist in the history of formalism came with John Dewey’s landmark 1934 [1980] book Art as Experience. In it, Dewey emphasized primarily that aesthetic experience was an experience which itself had a unified, consummatory form with meaningful development. Understood in this way, an aesthetic experience can be an experience of any event or object which offers such a “single quality that pervades the entire experience in spite of the variation of its constituent parts” (pp. 305–6 as reprinted in Cahn and Meskin 2007). What it is for some experience to be “esthetic” is not for it to be an experience of some form, but rather for it to be an experience that has an internal phenomenological structure that constitutes its own form. You might have this kind of experience at an exciting baseball game, watching a sunset, or writing a paper.

Dewey’s methodology had an outsized impact on aesthetics in analytic philosophy. This impact even survived the influence of Wittgenstein’s later work (see 1953 [2009]), which many took to threaten the possibility of phenomenological inquiry in general. Dewey’s turn towards the primacy of the form of aesthetic experience—rather than the form of an object of aesthetic experience—can be found most notably in the work of Monroe Beardsley (1958 [1981], 1970 [1982]). Beardsley is known partly as a hedonist, because he thought that aesthetic experiences were necessarily pleasurable or “gratifying.” But it is not just any gratification that counts towards an experience’s being aesthetic. Aesthetic experiences tend to gratifying because they are intense, unified, complete experiences focused on single objects whose features reward curiosity and active attention. It is true that only a certain kind of object of attention could offer such a perceptual encounter—but it is the form of the experience so offered that is explanatorily prior, rather than the form of the object.

Formalism has now fallen out of favor, and is generally regarded as an extreme view about aesthetic experience. There are a few common objections to formalism as the view that aesthetic experience focuses exclusively on the formal properties of objects.

Some try to undercut a central motivation for formalism: the motivation to find a “common denominator” in all types of aesthetic objects, both artefactual and natural (Carroll 2012). Especially after Wittgenstein (1953 [2009]) challenged the possibility of providing necessary and sufficient conditions for the application of certain concepts, many philosophers of aesthetics thought that trying to define “art” was a lost cause—perhaps a cause antithetical to the radical “openness” (Weitz 1956) or “essentially contested” (Gallie 1956) nature of the concept of art.

Formalism crucially relies on the distinction between form and other features of artworks, notably the content of artworks. But it’s not clear how to draw a clean line between form and content, especially when it comes to art forms like instrumental music (Isenberg 1973). According to prolific Victorian critic Walter Pater (1873 [1986]), in music “the end is not distinct from the means, the form from the matter, the subject from the expression; they inhere in and completely saturate each other,” and it is the “constant effort of art to obliterate” this distinction (p.86).

A more specific version of this objection targets Bell’s (1914 [2007]) version of formalism. His theory relied not only on a distinction between form and content, but also on an obscure distinction between significant and insignificant form (Stolnitz 1960, p.144).

A third powerful line of criticism originated in work on the social structures of aesthetic appreciation. Arthur Danto (1964) famously argued, with special reference to Andy Warhol’s Brillo Boxes installation, that art can be formally indistinguishable from things that aren’t art, and so whether something counts as art cannot be a matter of its form, but must partly be a matter of a certain kind of theory we apply. George Dickie (1974, 1984) extended this idea to cover the claim that aesthetic appreciation per se is only available in the context of certain social institutions with their own patterns of value (see Guyer 2014c, p. 479, for further criticism). Kendall Walton (1970) likewise argued that the pleasure we take in an artwork’s formal features depends crucially on the category in which we perceive it.

While a purely formalist approach to aesthetic experience might effectively mark what is distinctive about aesthetic experience, it does not readily explain what is valuable about aesthetic experience. Especially when form is taken independently of function or apprehension of the divine, it’s not clear why it would even be pleasant, let alone important, to have experiences that focus only on form. Dewey’s (1934 [1980]) turn doesn’t help here: is it all that valuable to have experiences with internal growth and a feeling of consummation? Is this value great enough to justify all the time and money we spend pursuing aesthetic experience?

Although formalism has fallen from grace, even its critics accept the importance of appreciating form among other features in aesthetic experience (Carroll 2006, p. 78).

1.2 Power to Please

Influential medieval philosophers like Augustine (De Musica) and Aquinas (Summa Theologica) conceived of beauty as a real and objective property inhering in objects themselves—the kind of property whose nature does not depend on our capacity to experience it. In the eighteenth century, philosophers started to challenge this conception of beauty. Many posited a deeper metaphysical dependence between our capacity to have certain feelings and the properties on which those very experiences are focused: they took these properties just to be powers to produce certain pleasurable responses in us (cf. Shelley 2010 on “empiricism” and de Clercq 2013 on “experiential accounts”).

As James Shelley (“18th Century British Aesthetics”) has pointed out, these views treat beauty as a Lockean (1689) secondary quality (“nothing in the objects themselves, but powers to produce various sensations in us by their primary qualities,” Book I, Ch.VIII, §10). Accordingly, the British empiricists tended to endorse such views of beauty and sublimity. Addison (1712 [1879]) drew the connection with “Mr. Lock” directly (letter no.413). Hutcheson (1726 [2004]) said beauty was a capacity to “excite” a certain type of pleasure. Edmund Burke (1756 [2007]) called beauty “some quality in bodies, acting mechanically upon the human mind by the intervention of the senses” (in Cahn and Meskin 2007, p. 119). In his Treatise (1739–40 [1987]), David Hume called beauty as “nothing but a form, which produces pleasure” (II.1.8.2).

The empiricists and those they influenced gave similar treatments of the sublime, another kind of feature typically introduced as a focus of aesthetic experience (contrast Kant 1789 [1987]; see following section). Here the emphasis is less on a power to produce a certain frisson of feeling, and more on the power to inspire a certain kind of mental activity, especially of the imagination. Joseph Addison (1712 [1879]) treated “Greatness” as a “rude kind of Magnificence” that offers our faculty of imagination the pleasure of grasping at something it cannot capture in full (letter no.412). Burke (1756 [2007]), often cited as the originator of the idea of the sublime in Anglophone philosophy, considered the sublime to be that which would otherwise be painful and terrifying to behold, but which is so distanced as to modify these feelings “as not to be actually noxious … [but] capable of producing delight” (§VII). Influenced by reading Burke, Mendelssohn (1758 [1997]) defined the sublime as something that “captures our attention … [and] arouses a sweet shudder that rushes through every fiber of our being… giving wings to the imagination to press further and further without stopping” (pp. 196–7).

Since these philosophers took aesthetic experience to focus on beauty and sublimity, and took these features to be powers to produce certain kinds of pleasurable mental responses, they thereby took aesthetic experience to be experience of such powers to please. There need be nothing particularly troubling about the idea that you can experience an object’s power to please in perception; this power can be experienced precisely by being so pleased in such perception.

The view of beauty or sublimity as powers sometimes led the empiricists to deny that beauty or sublimity was really a feature of objects themselves (Hutcheson 1726 [2004], Hume 1739–40 [1987]). This was a substantive confusion, and was effectively called out as such by Thomas Reid. Reid (1785 [1969]) charged Hutcheson with “an abuse of words” (p.782): it cannot be right to say that beauty “property denotes the Perception of some Mind,” since we talk of objects as having the property of beauty (Hutcheson 1726 [2004], p. 27). Contemporary commentators agree that there isn’t anything suspect about an object’s genuinely having a property that is a power to produce certain mental responses (Moran 2012; Sibley 1968). This worry has fallen away from contemporary views that take beauty, sublimity, or aesthetic value to be a matter of having a power to please—and aesthetic experience to be experience of that power (e.g. Matthen 2017a, 2017b, 2018).

There are two serious issues for those views which take aesthetic experience to be solely focused in on its object’s powers to produce certain responses in us.

Here’s the first issue. If the beauty, sublimity, or other aesthetic value of an object O is just a power to produce certain responses in us, and aesthetic experience is just a certain appreciation of such a power—even one that involves actually having such a response—then anything that has the power to produce such a response in us should have the same beauty, sublimity, or other aesthetic value as O. But we do not typically take beauty, sublimity, or aesthetic value to be so cleanly separable from its bearer. Many think that an aesthetic experience of O’s properties is one that captures something utterly individual in O, undetachable from the object it is (cf. Sections 1.4.4 and 2.6). But any characterization of the kind of mental response which O has a power to produce, and which constitutes O’s beauty, sublimity, or aesthetic value, will simply offer an (in principle) way to get the same aesthetic experience elsewhere—e.g. by appreciating a perfect forgery, or a hallucinated object. This might seem unacceptable.

There are a couple of possible responses to this issue. Some (Budd 1985; Davies 1994; Levinson 1996) simply deny that you really could have the relevant type of experience in the absence of the relevant special object (cf. Shelley 2010). Another response is simply to accept that the relevant aesthetic experience and aesthetic value can be had elsewhere, and to explain away intuitions that this should not be possible (Peacocke 2021).

The second problem is harder to dismiss, and it calls for a more fundamental reorientation towards the focus of aesthetic experience. It takes very little for an object to have a mere power to please, even a power to please via perception of its features. If all it took for an object to be beautiful or sublime was for it to have some such power, we should take individual experiences of such powers—individual instances of being so pleased—to be demonstrative of such aesthetic value in objects. But we typically do not take reports of such experience to be so demonstrative. Instead, the pleasure an individual takes in an object is usually taken to be contestably relevant to its aesthetic value. Whether that pleasure attests to an object’s power to please is beyond dispute, but whether it attests to an object’s beauty, sublimity, or aesthetic value is often disputed.

This fact troubled Hume in his later writing on aesthetics. In his seminal essay “Of the standard of taste,” Hume (1757 [1987a]) subtly amended his Treatise’s (1739–40 [1987]) view of beauty (cf. Nehamas 1981, Cavell 1965 [2007]). What is “fitted by nature to produce those particular feelings” of pleasurable liking, and thus is in a sense genuinely beautiful, is that which draws univocal and lasting approval from “true judges”—ideally sensitive, practiced, and unprejudiced critics of the arts. This view of beauty still entangles it constitutively with experience, but with a crucially idealized restriction (cf. De Clercq 2013 on “response dependent properties” at p. 305). This restriction anticipates, but does not itself yet reach, a more fundamental shift in approach to the focus of aesthetic value brought about by Kant: an approach that takes aesthetic experience to involve an attribution of a merited response.

1.3 Merit

At the end of the eighteenth century, philosophers turned away from views that took aesthetic experience to focus only on objects’ powers to produce pleasure. This seems to have taken place largely due to the influence of Kant’s 1789 [1987] Critique of Judgment. There he distinguished the merely agreeable—things which we simply like, e.g. because they satisfy our appetites—from the beautiful. In doing so, he took it that an aesthetic experience of an object’s free or pure beauty involves pleasure felt to be merited by the object so perceived (§9). To have that response is to feel as though the object deserves that very response you give it.

This is meant to make better sense of the way we discuss aesthetic experiences and what we take to be authoritative on the matter of beauty. To take pleasure in an aesthetic way in an object, Kant thought, is just to engage your mental faculties of imagination and understanding in a pleasant free play with the form of the object you perceive, unconstrained by thought of any real purpose that the object might serve or any appetite it might satisfy (see Sections 2.3 and 2.5). But any perceiver has these mental faculties, and must see the same form in the object, and so (claimed Kant) aesthetic experience involves a further thought that everyone ought to take such pleasure in this object.

On this view of aesthetic experience, what you take to be merited is not (just) a judgment about the aesthetic quality of an object presented in perception. Kant is emphatic that what seems merited to you, in having an aesthetic experience, is a feeling, a form of pleasure. This is so in the case of beauty but also in the case of the sublime (contrast the empiricists from the previous section). The “mathematically sublime” is that which cannot be captured in full in our imagination, but about which we can nonetheless reason, like infinitude itself. The “dynamically sublime” is that which looks to have total power over us—like a massive storm or other monstrous aspects of nature—but which we can nonetheless resist with the power of our own practical reason. In each, we feel pleased that our minds can overcome limitations.

This is not a return to those thinkers (Augustine De Musica, Aquinas Summa Theologica) who thought that aesthetic experience was a direct apprehension of some inherent property of an object, like its being well-formed for its function, or symmetrical in a way that reflects the divine. According to Kant, beauty isn’t strictly speaking a property of objects (even though we speak as though it is), and we aren’t even tempted to attribute sublimity itself to objects. The focus here is pleasure in the powers of universal mental capacities themselves. Part of Kant’s innovation in aesthetics consists in the suggestion that objects might deserve certain subjective responses.

This idea is not easy to understand, and many have done significant interpretive and substantive philosophical work attempting to explain how an object could deserve a subjective feeling (see e.g. Mothersill 1988; Eaton 2001; Hamawaki 2006; Moran 2012; Cavell 1965 [2007]; Ginsborg 2015; Gorodeisky 2019, 2021). One approach here is to interpret the pleasure in question as not just a phenomenal tone (see Labukt 2012, Bramble 2013) but rather as a kind of liking or pro-attitude which, like other attitudes, could be suited or ‘fitted’ to its intentional object (Gorodeisky 2019, 2021; Kriegel forthcoming; compare Hume 1757 [1987a]).

Despite this difficulty, the idea that aesthetic experience involves a focus on how an object merits a certain response has pervaded recent discussion. There’s an important distinction to be made here between what it is to take aesthetic experience to involve (what feels like) merited pleasure or admiration per se (Scruton 1974, Sibley 1974, Walton 1993), and what it is to feel pleasure in or simply to like some object when you have an otherwise merited kind of experience of it (Beardsley 1970; Matthen 2017a, 2017b, 2018). The challenge of making sense of what it is to merit a certain subjective feeling of pleasure does not face this latter claim in the same way, as we can make sense of how an artwork merits a general experience in terms of that experience’s accuracy, its contextualization, or even how it matches the intentions of the artist who created an object (Wimsatt and Beardsley 1949; Wollheim 1990).

One line of research pulls the idea of a merited response apart from Kant’s claim that the beautiful and the sublime universally merit the same feelings across people. In his magnum opus In Search of Lost Time (originally published 1913–1927), Marcel Proust (1913–1927 [2003]) suggested that an individual like his narrator Marcel might feel an individualized, personal demand for a feeling or an emotion from a certain scene or piece of artwork. Partly in response to Proust, and in resistance to Kant, Richard Moran (2012) and Nick Riggle (2016) have given substantive characterizations of the personal demands that artworks and natural scenes can make upon us (cf. Nussbaum 1990, Ch.13; Landy 2004, Chs. 1 and 3; Nehamas 2007).

There is a challenge facing any theory that takes aesthetic experience to focus exclusively on objects’ meriting certain pleasurable subjective responses. It is possible to see that Michelangelo’s statue of David merits admiration, or that the view over Waimea Canyon merits awe, without yourself feeling admiration or wonder in that moment (cf. Moran 2012 on Proust 1913–1927 [2003]). Assuming that other substantive restrictions can be met here (e.g. the demand for disinterested attention; see Section 2.5), would this count as an aesthetic experience? If so, it’s not clear entirely what would be valuable about it, even if it does involve a positive evaluation of its object. Some might say that you have gotten something right: you are correct in thinking that the statue merits admiration and the view merits awe. It’s not clear that this correctness would be enough to make sense of the great value of aesthetic experience.

It seems best to say here that this would not count as an aesthetic experience because it does not bear the value of actually involving a subjective response that is itself of value. But this could lead to trouble with dissociation in the other direction, which is also clearly possible: you could have a pleasurable experience as of some object’s meriting that very kind of pleasurable experience, while also being incorrect that it merits that. If the value of aesthetic experience rests exclusively or primarily on the value of the pleasure itself, then it seems that this inappropriate experience should share almost all the value that a merited aesthetic experience would have. That, to some, is inconceivable (Budd 1985; see Shelley 2010, Peacocke 2021 for further discussion).

The view that aesthetic experience focuses primarily on object’s meriting certain positive responses can also clash with other intuitions about the nature of aesthetic experience. Some think that an experience should be counted as aesthetic even if it involves a negative evaluation of its object: “an abominable performance of the London Symphony is as aesthetic as a superb one … The symptoms of the aesthetic are not marks of merit,” wrote Nelson Goodman (1968 [1976], p. 255).

1.4 (Emotional) expression

A third view takes aesthetic experience to be focused on expressive properties of objects. An expressive property of an object is a property by which it expresses something—usually an emotion or other affect, but more rarely an attitude, a movement, a personality, or a way of experiencing the world as a whole.

Consider how this kind of view differs from those discussed in the last three subsections. Although certain forms can be expressive, expressive properties in general are not just the same as formal properties: something might have a deeply expressive coloration with very simple, unexpressive form, like Rothko’s famous color field paintings. It is a matter of substantive dispute (to be described below) whether expressive properties are the same as powers to make perceivers feel certain ways, or properties that merit certain mental responses in perceivers.

Regardless of the answers to these questions, two positions need to be distinguished. One is the position that having an aesthetic experience essentially or necessarily involves some emotion. The other is the position that aesthetic experience is essentially, primarily, or paradigmatically experience of expressive properties of its object. These claims do not necessarily come together. This section discusses the latter claim (see Section 2.4 for discussion of the former).

There are roughly four kinds of views of expression endorsed by those who take the primary focus of aesthetic experience to be expressive properties of an artwork (or, more rarely, of nature; see Croce 1902 [1992], 1938 [2007]; Wollheim 1968 [1980]). These differ according to their conceptions of how expression takes place, and what it means for the experience both of the creator and of the appreciator of an artwork. These are transfer views, projection views, correspondence views, and transformation views (for alternative taxonomies, see Matravers 2013 and Levinson 2006).

Debates about the nature of expression and its importance to aesthetic experience are still lively (Matravers 1998, Robinson 2005, 2011, Gaut 2007, Kivy 1989, 2002, Boghossian 2002, 2010, 2020, Nussbaum 2007, Montero 2006a-b, Cochrane 2010, Wiltsher 2016; for overviews see Kania 2013 and Matravers 2007, 2013).

1.4.1 Transfer

The first kind of view is the simplest, but it offers the least explanation of expression. A simple transfer view of expression takes it that some inner state or event of the creator is simply shared via experience of the artwork to the observer—i.e. the spectator, percipient, or reader. What is expressed on this kind of view is usually an emotion or feeling, but it is sometimes a whole perceptual experience or an entire way of seeing the world.

In the 1802 [1984] preface to his Lyrical Ballads, the poet William Wordsworth identified poetry (which, on his view, could include prose) as “the spontaneous overflow of powerful feelings … emotions recollected in tranquillity” after having been felt in all their heat previously by the poet (p.611; cf. Dewey 1934 [2007], p. 312). The reader of a poem shares this feeling, learns about this feeling, and thereby feels a pleasant communal feeling with the author. Perhaps the greatest champion of this view was the Russian novelist Leo Tolstoy, who in 1897 [2007] defined art as that “human activity” by which “one man consciously, by means of certain external signs, hands on to others feelings he has lived through, and that other people are infected by these feelings and also experience them” (in Cahn and Meskin 2007 at p. 237). Someone who undergoes an aesthetic experience of art, then, will feel a “joy and spiritual union” not only with its creator, but also with those others who experience it (p.239).

The transfer theory of emotional expression often associates this transfer with an intermediate clarificatory step, and offers as part of a theory of the value of aesthetic experience that it offers not just emotional experience but a certain organized knowledge of what emotions feel like from the inside. In his lectures on aesthetics in 1819–33 [1984], Friedrich Schleiermacher argued that artists conceive of works that both communicate their own emotions to the audience and clarify them in so doing (p.11). The painter and curator Roger Fry moved away from his friend Clive Bell’s formalism as he endorsed it in his early work (“Art and Life,” 1917 [1981]) to claim that art rouses emotion in us in a specifically clear way, cut off as they are from motivating us to specific action in our own lives (“Essay in Aesthetics” 1909 [1981], “Retrospect” 1920 [1981]).

The transfer theory of expression of emotions is not particularly popular, largely because it seems that an artist need not feel those emotions she expresses in a work, and that the audience need not themselves feel those emotions expressed in a work (cf. Langer 1953; Stolnitz 1960; Matravers 2013). Moreover, different spectators tend to feel quite different emotions in response to an artwork, so it’s not clear that art should be understood fundamentally in terms of transferring just those emotions the creator had (Stolnitz 1960 p. 186; Wimsatt and Beardsley 1949). Others take the focus on the emotion that an artist felt to distract from the artwork itself (Stolnitz 1960, p. 164).

Another kind of transfer theory focuses on transfer not of emotion but of sensory experience from creator to consumer. The critic John Ruskin (1843–60 [2004]) claimed that the true artist (e.g. the painter J.M.W. Turner) could communicate precisely what it is like to have a certain perceptual experience the artist had, by “producing on the far-away beholder’s mind precisely the impression which the reality would have produced” (pp. 86–8). The French novelist Marcel Proust—who was a deep admirer of Ruskin—added that not only could aesthetic experience involve the appreciation of one episode of subjective experience, but it could also involve the appreciation of the artist’s total and unique way of experiencing the world, as a kind of subjective personality (for discussion, see Landy 2004; compare Véron 1879, Stolnitz 1960 p.161ff.). One’s act of writing, then, can be understood as a “secretion of one’s innermost life … that one gives to the world” (1895–1900 [1984], p. 79). The denouement of his great novel In Search of Lost Time involves the recognition on the narrator’s part that

art, if it means awareness of our own life, means also awareness of the lives of other people … it is the revelation, which by direct and conscious methods would be impossible, of the qualitative difference, the uniqueness of the fashion in which the world appears to each one of us, a difference which, if there were no art, would remain for ever the secret of every individual (Time Regained in 1913–1927 [2003], p. 299).

Arthur Danto (1981) echoes this idea in his claim that “externalization of the artist’s consciousness, as if we could see his way of seeing and not merely what he saw,” is an essential part of expressiveness in art (p.164). This, too, is a way of making available to an appreciator a subjective state—but a more general subjective stance on the world, a way of experiencing it as a whole, rather than just an individual emotion.

1.4.2 Projection

Projection views derive largely from mid-19th century to early 20th century psychological thought about “empathy,” which was originally called “Einfühlung” in the German (Lipps 1903–6, translated to “empathy” by Titchener 1909 [1926]). Empathy theorists took it that aesthetic experience involves mentally (or perhaps even mystically; Vischer 1873 [1994], p. 104) projecting ourselves into the physical shape of an item to have an emotional or dynamic experience of the kind that a human subject would have if she took on that physical shape. In the 1850s, Hermann Lotze (1885 [1899]) claimed that a shape can “transport” us inside of it “and make us share its life” (quoted by Lee & Anstruther-Thomson 1912, pp. 17-18). As Robert Vischer (1873 [1994]) wrote, “I can think my way into [an object], mediate its size with my own, stretch and expand, bend and confine myself to it” (pp. 104–5). The Swiss art historian Heinrich Wölfflin (1886) agreed that “we submit all objects to soulification” in this projective way, and suggested that such projection involved actual workings of the “motor nerve system.”

This view takes it that aesthetic perceivers attribute feeling to objects, but partly by relating them closely to oneself. The philosopher Theodor Lipps (1935) insisted that the “inner imitation” involved in empathy involved feeling that the emotion in question is felt as belonging to the object perceived—but since you feel “entirely and wholly identical” with the object in this context, you feel that emotion as belonging to yourself too. The English novelist Vernon Lee (real name Violet Paget) co-wrote a work with her lover and fellow author Clementina Anstruther-Thomson (1912) in which they claimed that we attribute “to lines and surfaces, to the spatial forms, those dynamic experiences which we should have were we to put our bodies into similar conditions” (pp. 20–1).

Later on, the psychologist Herbert Sidney Langfeld offered an analysis of The Aesthetic Attitude (1920) in terms of empathy, and made several innovations to the theory as it stood: he noted that the capacity for empathy varies across people (p.133), and that sometimes we project motion onto a shape not by feeling as a human in that shape would feel, but rather by feeling how one who produced that gestural trace would feel (p.122).

These theorists disagreed on some points, for example: whether such projection was voluntary (Vischer, Langfeld) or involuntary (Wölfflin, Lipps 1935); whether the emphasis of one’s experience is on feeling oneself as identical to the object (Lipps 1935 p. 298, Puffer 1905 pp. 12–13) or on the object as it might feel were it human (Vischer p. 92, Wölfflin p. 4, Lee & Anstruther-Thomson p. 17); whether the emotions in question literally involved any physical bodily activation of the perceiver’s nervous system (Wölfflin, Puffer 1905, Langfeld) or not (Lipps 1935); and whether such projection needed to be based on actual remembered emotion or motion of the body (Lee & Anstruther-Thomson, Langfeld) or not (Vischer, Wölfflin, Lipps 1935, Puffer 1905). But these disagreements pale in the face of the broad consistency of these theories.

First: none placed any particular emphasis on the mental, bodily, or emotional states of the creator of an object—just on the features of an object that made it amenable to the projective identification involved in empathy. Beautiful things, they tended to agree, were those things most amenable to this identification that would then offer pleasure (in this way, some of these theories also have ancestors in those who took beauty to be a power to please; see Section 1.2). The pleasure to be had in these contexts is thought by these theorists to be universally accessible (Vischer), as a joy taken in the “liveliness” (Lipps 1903–6 p. 102) of objects, the lessening of loneliness (Vischer), or in particular in the naturally harmonious (Puffer 1905) or intrinsically salutary (Lee & Anstruther-Thomson) condition into which such empathic identification puts an observer’s body. In the psychological context in which they wrote, they were not all exclusively concerned with aesthetic experience per se, although they applied it to architecture and the visual arts (Lipps 1903–6, 1935, Puffer 1905, Lee & Anstruther-Thomson, Langfeld).

Remarkably, these theorists are generally content to make claims about identification and attribution of emotion that sound paradoxical to the 21st-century ear (Goodman 1968 [1976], p. 243; Wollheim 1968 [1980]). Partly due to the oddity in literally attributing emotions to objects or identifying with them, newer descendants of this view focus instead on engagement from the imagination. Levinson (2006b) has claimed that you imagine a fictional “persona” in music who is expressing the emotions she really has, and Walton (1988, 1994) says you imagine of your own actual experience of a work of art that it’s an experiencing of real emotions (see Matravers 2013, p. 410, for objections).

1.4.3 Correspondence

There is a difference between (i) experiencing certain feelings suggested by a shape’s affinity with a bodily position and (ii) experiencing that very affinity itself. The former simply exploits a resemblance in eliciting a feeling experienced as being ‘in’ the object, whereas the latter kind of experience takes as its focus that very resemblance relation. Those who endorse correspondence theories of expression, and take expressive properties to be the focus of aesthetic experience, understand aesthetic experience as belonging to the latter kind. These correspondence theories tend to treat aesthetic experience as fundamentally a matter of understanding a meaning that certain artworks already have in virtue of their manifest correspondence with certain aspects of human subjective experience—which correspondence is experienced as such.

After the resurgence of formalism in the early twentieth century, several philosophers started to think about form as having significance not just in itself but in the way it manifestly resembled or corresponded to emotion (e.g. Fry 1981). The philosopher to develop this view most significantly was Susanne Langer, whose two influential books Philosophy in a New Key (1942) and Feeling and Form (1953) focused on music, poetry, and dance (for commentary see Danto 1984). Music itself, she claimed, bears a “close logical similarity to the forms of human feeling – forms of growth and attenuation, flowing and stowing, conflict and resolution, speed, arrest, terrific excitement, calm, or subtle activation and dreamy lapses” (1953, p. 27). This is a “pattern of sentience,” the form which lived phenomenal subjectivity of feeling shares with music. Since music itself has this form, it has “import” or significance as well: it “expresses life – feeling, growth, movement, emotion and everything that characterizes vital existence” (1953, p. 82).

According to Langer, this is not just a matter of conventional symbolization, nor a matter of transmission of the life or feelings of a creator. What the artist felt in making something, and indeed what you yourself feel when you see it, is mostly beside the point. To the extent that there is a phenomenological feeling that pervades aesthetic experience generally, it should be understood as a “pervasive feeling of exhilaration” (p.395). In aesthetic experience a feeling is “not ‘communicated,’ but revealed; the created form ‘has’ it, so that perception of the virtual object—say, the famous frieze from the Parthenon—is at once the per­ception of its amazingly integrated and intense feeling” (1953, p. 394). Far from erasing the comparison, aesthetic experience (or ‘intuition’) makes plain to us, in an intellectually satisfying way, how space can mirror sentiment: “What it does to us is to formulate our conceptions of feeling and our conceptions of visual, factual, and audible reality together. It gives us forms of imagination and forms of feeling, inseparably” (p.397).

Richard Wollheim is well known for formulating this subtle aspect of ‘expressive perception’ in several books and essays (notably 1968 [1980], 1990, 1994). He treated art objects as meaningful pieces of the physical world to be understood by spectators as physical objects which artists themselves intended to be perceived in a certain way. These are, and indeed are intended to be, expressive of the actual internal life of the artist. But an internal mental condition can only be expressed by an art object via that object’s correspondence to the relevant condition, i.e. that property of “seem[ing] to us to match, or correspond with, what we experience inwardly” (p.21) in that condition. In an aesthetic experience of such an art object, the object is seen (or heard, or felt) as corresponding in this way to a certain feeling, in a way that involves a spectator’s feeling the relevant feeling herself (cf. Wollheim 1994; see Budd 2008, Noordhof 2008, Galgut 2010). This is not a matter of “reading off” the feeling from the artwork as you might decode an unfamiliar diagram (1980 §29, p. 39ff), but rather participating in a certain practice of meaning-making and meaning-interpretation which he labels a “form of life” (after Wittgenstein 1953 [2009]), and which allows us to literally experience emotion and inner life in artworks.

Other views exploit correspondence, and our experience of correspondence as such, in different ways. Roger Scruton (1974) notably analyzed aesthetic experience in terms of seeing as (cf. Wittgenstein 1953 [2009], 1958 [1965]), and stressed in a way similar to Wollheim that both a perceptual aspect and an aspect of ‘thought’ that can attribute emotion to what is seen are inseparable aspects of one and the same experience (p.117ff.). At base, such ‘seeing as’ is only available when we notice a certain resemblance which we exploit via an act of the imagination to hear something like a falling melody as sad (Chs.8–9). In contrast with Wollheim, though, Scruton claimed the relevant resemblance was between the experience of an artwork and the experience of the emotion, not the artwork itself and the experience of the emotion (p.127; for amendments to his view, see his 1999, pp. 140–170).

By definition, all correspondence views of expression will claim that an experience of an expressive property (aesthetic or not) involves experiencing the correspondence relation itself. In this regard correspondence views are distinct from nearby theories. Christopher Peacocke’s (2009) view of expression, for instance, is a view on which you can hear music metaphorically as sad by exploiting, but not by consciously representing or experiencing, an isomorphism between music and sadness. This isomorphism might make a difference to subpersonal representational processes, and thereby come to causally affect the phenomenology of the experience of sadness in the music, but the relation itself is not experienced, on this view.

Despite their differences, the correspondence views of Langer, Wollheim, and Scruton all agree on one crucial point: the relevant experience of correspondence is not one that can be decomposed into strictly separable aspects, one of what is ‘strictly’ perceived and another added element of what is expressed via what is seen. According to all, an experience can be one of correspondence, but in a particularly integrated and indecomposable way.

Correspondence views of expression—which, by definition, take it that you understand an expression partly by experiencing or noticing the correspondence relation itself—are still popular (Budd 1995, Kivy 1989, Davies 1994), and still vigorously debated (Peacocke 2009, Matravers 2013, Davies 2006, Levinson 2006b).

1.4.4 Transformation

Transfer, projection, and correspondence views of expression all share (at least) one key commitment—the commitment to the idea that the kinds of emotions or mental states expressed in art are one and the same as the kinds of emotions or mental states experienced in ordinary life. But those philosophers most closely associated with the view that aesthetic experience is focused on expressive properties did not make this commitment. Instead, they took expression to transform the nature of a feeling, and took the art-making process to be inextricably bound up with the nature of this transformation (Bosanquet 1892 [1904]; Ducasse 1929, p. 111; Dewey 1934 [1980]; Cassirer 1944, pp. 142–5).

The British philosopher Bernard Bosanquet propounded an early version of this view in his 1892 [1904] History of Aesthetic. He claimed that expression of content through form—and especially of emotion—is the ultimate aim of any artwork. That content or emotion is fundamentally bound up with its “embodiment” in the artwork, “attached, annexed, to the quality of some object – to all its detail” (p.4). The process of expression “creates the feeling in creating its embodiment, and the feeling so created not merely cannot be otherwise expressed, but cannot otherwise exist, than in and through the embodiment which imagination has found for it” (p.34). While John Dewey (1934 [1980]) thought that aesthetic experience could be enjoyed in various ordinary life circumstances, he considered art intrinsically expressive as the “very operation of creating, by means of new objects, new modes of experience … It enables us to share vividly and deeply in meanings to which we had been dumb” (p.248).

The philosopher who most systematically developed the view of expression as transformation was R.G. Collingwood, whose Principles of Art (1938 [1958]) drew deeply from Benedetto Croce’s work (1902 [1992], 1938 [2007]). Croce considered expression fundamental to aesthetic experience, and considered aesthetic experience to be one of the most fundamental modes of cognitive interaction with the world (compare Baumgarten 1735 [1954]). Expression, for Croce, was not a matter of communication; it was a matter of organizing fleeting impressions into a clarified, meaningful whole, and as such it can happen purely in the mind of an individual (e.g. a single artist). A work of art, then, is not to be considered any public manifestation, but rather a mental item, a “theoretical form” to be “convert[ed] into words, song, and outward shape” (1938, in Cahn and Meskin 2007, p.272).

Collingwood (1938 [1958]) left aside Croce’s unusual metaphysics and philosophy of mind, but retained and elaborated much of what he said about the nature of expression. Real art just is a matter of expression, and expression is an internal process directed at your own feelings. It involves clarifying those feelings in a way that releases you from their dominating influence on your thought and action (pp. 109–10). To express a feeling is to attend wholly to a particular affect-laden fleeting impression, to “stabilize and perpetuate it as an idea” in a Humean sense (p.218). In attending in this way, you come to consciousness of your feeling, but you thereby also transform it: though “There is emotion there before we express it … as we express it, we confer upon it a different kind of emotional colouring; in one way, therefore, expression creates what it expresses” (p.152). Collingwood gives the somewhat unusual label “Imagination” to “the new form which feeling takes when transformed by the activity of consciousness” (p.218). Insofar as art simply is expression, it is the production not of some object in the physical world, nor even “a ‘form’, understood as a pattern or a system of relations between the various noises we hear or the various colours we see,” but an episode of “total imaginative activity,” which asserts the mastery of the self over feeling (p.142).

Importantly for Collingwood, a consumer-side experience of an artist’s expression is not to be understood as the reception of a transferred feeling, or as the interpretation of a meaningful symbol or sign. Instead, it is a repetition of what the artist herself has already done:

If a poet expresses, for example, a certain kind of fear, the only hearers who can understand him are those who are capable of experiencing that kind of fear themselves. Hence, when some one reads and understands a poem, he is not merely understanding the poet’s expression of his, the poet’s, emotions, he is expressing emotions of his own in the poet’s words, which have thus become his own words. As Coleridge puts it, we know a man for a poet by the fact that he makes us poets. We know that he is expressing his emotions by the fact that he is enabling us to express ours. (p.118)

This conception puts certain limitations on what aesthetic production and spectator-side aesthetic experience can do. Expression cannot be intended at the level of the individual feeling, as it isn’t clear before expression what feeling is affecting you (p.111). What’s more, a feeling when expressed is not purged from the mind, only recognized for what it is, and controlled (p.110).

Collingwood’s view is complicated and often obscure, but secondary literature has elucidated it somewhat. Hopkins (2017) claims that the clarification and freedom that expression offers comes from placing a raw feeling imaginatively into a modal profile, thereby projecting how it would shift with changes in objective circumstances. This can affect the feeling itself in the moment, just as understanding the square projective shape in front of you as the face of a cube can affect the phenomenology of your visual experience of that shape.

There is an elusive quality to the expression views of Croce, Collingwood, and their contemporaries: it is not easy to understand the kinds of transformation, embodiments, or objectifications of feelings that they take expression to involve. But the basic idea that a feeling expressed in an artwork is thereby transformed in a way inextricable from the work itself has proven enduringly popular (Stolnitz 1960, p. 169; Sircello 1972, 1975; compare Budd 1985, Davies 1994, Levinson 1996c, and Shelley 2010; see Wollheim 1980, p. 76ff., Matravers 2013, and Tormey 1971 [1987] for criticism).

1.5 Fundamental Nature

The idea that aesthetic experience offers acquaintance with aspects of nature has a deep history. Medieval philosophers treated it as a means of knowing the divine. Several of those eighteenth-century philosophers who focused on appreciation of form (see Section 1.1) thought form was itself a reflection of God’s creative power.

The association between the arts and truth has an even longer history, tracing at least back to Aristotle’s claim in the Poetics that (good) drama represents possibilities for human life. Many philosophers have argued that the arts offer acquaintance with emotions by expressing emotions (Section 1.4.), and many have argued that they offer acquaintance with moral truths (Ruskin 1843–60 [2004]; Cousin 1854 [1873]; Nussbaum 1990; McMahon 2018; see Landy 2012 for criticism). A significant new trend in philosophical aesthetics also incorporates more cognitive content generally into the focus of aesthetic experience (see Carroll 2002, 2006, 2015, Goldman 2013, Peacocke 2021). This section will not cover all such views, but only those that treat aesthetic experience as a means to acquaintance with or knowledge of fundamental facts about the structure of the world and our place in it.

This claim is systematically defended in three historical contexts: Romanticism, post-Kantian German Idealism, and the 20th-century intersection of existentialism and phenomenology.

1.5.1 Romanticism

The English poet Samuel Taylor Coleridge, in his critical and philosophical essays published together as Biographia Literaria (1817 [1907]), treated imagination as essential to artistic creation and aesthetic experience—but fundamentally as a source of knowledge rather than an empiricist faculty of association or a way of entertaining fantasies. In a proto-Idealist vein, he claimed that such knowledge was knowledge of the spirit that grounds reality itself, and to which we ourselves belong as individual loci of spirit (cf. Guyer 2014b, p. 65). In Germany, the poet-philosopher Johann Christian Friedrich Hölderlin (1795 [1963]) wrote that aesthetic experience could lead the mind to construct a unity out of a messy space of intuition, which unity mirrored the unity of spirit inherent in the metaphysical fabric of the world itself.

A retrospective reverence for the ancient Greek arts was a touchstone of the Romantics, who thought its pursuit of beauty precisely allowed it to attain “objectivity.” The English poet John Keats concluded his famous Ode on a Grecian Urn (1820) with these lines (46–50):

When old age shall this generation waste,
  Thou shalt remain, in midst of other woe
Than ours, a friend to man, to whom thou say’st,
  “Beauty is truth, truth beauty—that is all
    Ye know on earth, and all ye need to know.”

(For criticism of Keats on this point, see Ruskin 1843–60 [2004]). The German philosopher Friedrich Schlegel made this claim explicitly in his essay “On the Study of Greek Poetry” (1795). He thought Sophocles composed terrific tragedy effortlessly, just by letting the harmonious structure of nature flow through him into his drama.

The Romantics thought that aesthetic experience offered acquaintance with a concrete individual sometimes called “the Absolute”—either the infinite itself, or some particular concrete individual within nature that somehow reflected the whole unified spirit of the universe. As Schlegel (1798–1800 [1991]) put it, “one might believe [Romantic poetry] exists only to characterize poetical individuals of all sorts; and yet there is still no form so fit for expressing the entire spirit of an author … It alone can become, like the epic, a mirror of the whole circumambient world, an image of the age” (§116, pp. 31–2). This acquaintance with a concrete individual was contrasted with conceptualized or descriptive understanding.

Although these various Romantic poets and philosophers thought aesthetic experience was the best way to achieve acquaintance with the true fundamental nature of the universe, they also took on a certain pessimism or “irony” about the extent to which this could really be achieved. The thematization of limitations on our knowledge in the context of aesthetic attempts to know the harmonious unity of the world is a common feature of Romantic writing.

1.5.2 German Idealism

The systematic theories of German Idealism and the proposals of Romanticism permeated one another, especially in the work of Friedrich Schelling. His System of Transcendental Idealism (1800 [1978]) claimed that both the beautiful and the sublime gave us awareness of a fundamental conflict between unconscious (but nonetheless mental or spiritual) nature and the conscious “infinity” of human freedom. The sublime makes us aware of this terrible conflict directly, and the beautiful offers the temporary apparent reprieve from or resolution of this conflict. In his later Philosophy of Fine Art (1802–3 [1989]), he denied that art offered “sensual stimulation, as recreation, as relaxation for a spirit fatigued by more serious matters” (in Cahn and Meskin 2007, p. 170). Instead, “truth and beauty are merely two different ways of viewing the one absolute,” where the beautiful offers acquaintance with “the essential forms of things” via concrete particulars, and philosophical theorization offers knowledge of the same via general principles (pp. 178, 173).

Arthur Schopenhauer’s metaphysics in The World as Will and Representation (1818 [1958]) picks up a significant piece of Schelling’s system. He expanded on Schelling’s claim that “Will is primal being” by claiming that all of fundamental reality is a matter of will. What aesthetic experience offers us is direct, intimate acquaintance with essences: “what is thus known is no longer the individual thing as such, but the Idea, the eternal form, the immediate objectivity of the will at this grade” (§34 at p. 195).

Schopenhauer sometimes speaks as though we can choose to have an aesthetic experience by a “conscious and violent tearing away from the relations of the same object to the will” (§39, p.202); the ‘genius’ artist in particular is good at doing this. When we “devote the whole power of our mind to perception” of an object, we can come to forget our own will—which is itself a pleasant thing, for our will is constantly either bored with its own satisfaction or pained by its frustration (§34, pp. 178–9).

At other points, Schopenhauer presented aesthetic experience as a passive result of experiencing great art, especially the art of tragic drama. In tragedy, he wrote,

the terrible side of life is presented to us… and so that aspect of the world is brought before our eyes which directly opposes our will … we become aware that there is still left in us something different that we cannot possibly know positively, but only negatively, as that which does not will life … it raises us above the will and its interest, and puts us in such a mood that we find pleasure in the sight of what directly opposes the will. (p.433)

Outside of aesthetic experience, we can only know the nature of the universe by a kind of extrapolation. Schopenhauer thus puts aesthetic experience in a place of priority with respect to philosophy itself.

On this last point he was directly opposed by Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel, whose system of historical development developed in The Phenomenology of Spirit (1807 [1979]) and his lectures on aesthetics and fine art (1820–29 [1920]) published posthumously. According to him, the point of art is to come to understand the fundamental, minded nature of the world—the “spirit” to which we all belong as self-conscious, rational, self-determining beings. Hegel considered a mode of understanding fundamental nature to be more advanced the more that it abstracts from concrete sensuous presentation and the more that it can turn contemplation back onto itself. There is a scale within types of art in this respect; visual art is less advanced than music, which is itself less advanced than poetry (1807 [1979]). While self-conscious Romantic poetry allows us to see our rational self-determining nature as minded beings, it nonetheless remains imperfect as a mode of knowledge of spirit. Philosophy, in its endless capacity for self-conscious reflection, “is a higher mode of presentment” (in Cahn and Meskin 2007, p. 181) and can ultimately supplant art as a mode of knowing the world’s essential structure.

This Hegelian consequence is not a happy one, and it is a serious drawback of treating art as revelatory of the structure of the universe: its pits aesthetic endeavors in competition with scientific and philosophical ones themselves (Poe 1850 [1984], Gotshalk 1947 p.8).

1.5.3 Existentialism and Phenomenology

Schelling’s (1800 [1978]) account of the inherent conflict between “unconscious” nature and the “conscious” free human subject had a great influence on phenomenologists and existentialists who wrote about aesthetic experience in the early to mid-20th century.

In his influential essay “On the Origin of the Work of Art” (1935 [1971]), the phenomenologist Martin Heidegger initially objected to the centrality of the “much-vaunted aesthetic experience” to point out that the “thingly aspect” of an artwork is essential to what it does for us (in Cahn and Meskin 2007, p. 345). But it turns out that he is really only objecting to a certain abstracted, perhaps Hegelian or neo-Hegelian conception of aesthetic experience, rather than all experience of art considered as special. He gives his own account of our experience of art, one on which art offers acquaintance with the basic, essential nature of our own human subjectivity. Our primary experience of the physical objects around us foregrounds their utility to us—what Heidegger had previously called their “readiness-to-hand” (Being and Time, 1927)—rather than their physicality; things only stand out as the clumps of matter they are when they fail in serving us in the way we expect them to, as when a tool breaks. It is art that allows us to step back from this mode of experiencing objects to contemplate that very phenomenological mode of readiness-to-hand itself, and how it struggles against blunt physical constraints. A work of art, then, sets up a “world”—roughly, a way of experiencing things—as it emerges from its physical basis (the “earth”). Through experiences of art, we come to see this struggle itself. Heidegger uses the example of a Van Gogh painting of worn, dirty peasant shoes and a Greek temple to exemplify how these ways of “being” emerge from physical things in their “thingliness.” Heidegger defines art as “the becoming and happening of truth” as a form of “unconcealedness:” it brings to the foreground our ways of experiencing the world and how they clash with physicality.

The French atheist existentialist Jean-Paul Sartre studied with Heidegger and with the founding phenomenologist Edmund Husserl. The view of aesthetic experience that emerges from his novel Nausea (1938 [1965]) is one that draws from both of their conceptions of the physical world as fundamentally devoid of meaning. The world and all of “existence” as it is in itself independently of human agency is absurd enough to inspire a form of nausea in the narrator, Antoine Roquentin. This absurdity consists in the facts that: things happen contingently and for no particular reason; no life has any narrative unity; and there is no patterned structure to the unfolding of events one after another.

What the experience of art is needed to do is to bring any order, structure, and meaning to human life. In a series of scenes in which Roquentin hears the music of a particular jazz vocalist, he comes to find in music the necessity, purpose, and internal structure the world had lacked:

It seems inevitable, the necessity of this music is so strong … If I love that beautiful voice, it is above all because of that: it is neither for its fullness nor its sadness, but because it is the event which so many notes have prepared so far in advance, dying so that it might be born. … something has happened. (38)

From Roquentin’s ecstatic listening we can extrapolate a theory of an experience of art and why it is so essential to us. Art exercises human freedom to structure the world and give it meaning and a sense of purpose or necessity; it offers to those who appreciate it a form of aesthetic experience that makes the world feel whole and necessary. By extrapolating from Sartre’s writing of Nausea itself, we can also see that art can give us acquaintance with the very absurdity of existence itself, and challenge us to make something meaningful of ourselves. In What is Literature? (1948 [1967]) Sartre called writing a way of “imposing the unity of mind on the diversity of things” that serves our “need of feeling that we are essential in relationship to the world” (p.27). The creation and appreciation of art, then, not only offers knowledge of the nauseating fundamental absurdity in existence, but also offers at least a phenomenological cure for it.

Not all in Sartre’s group were so optimistic (nor all so pessimistic about the meaning in the world; consider Sartre’s Christian contemporary Marcel 1951 [1960]). Albert Camus (1942), for instance, thought that absurdity was inescapable, and all you could do was defy it and go on living anyway (cf. Nagel 1971). Later critical theorists who were deeply influenced by the existentialists took a more complicated stance. In Aesthetic Theory (1970 [1997]), Theodor Adorno claimed that artworks offer fantasies of escape from the material world by imposing a new form upon its matter, but only in a way that involves rejecting their material origin. “Aesthetic experience,” then, “is that of something that spirit may find neither in the world nor in itself; it is possibility promised by its impossibility” (pp. 135–6).

This concludes the survey of the various different types of properties on which philosophers have variously claimed aesthetic experience focuses. Note that it is consistent to claim that aesthetic experience is focused on more than one of these types of properties. In an important turn in mid-20th-century aesthetics, Frank Sibley (1959) argued that there was a heterogeneous class of aesthetic properties—including beauty, sublimity, elegance, charm, and various expressive properties—on which aesthetic experience focused (for discussion see Matravers 1996, Brady and Levinson 2001). Some contemporary philosophers draw from multiple traditions to characterize aesthetic experience (Carroll 2002, 2006, 2015, Levinson 1996a-d, 2016b, Stecker 2005, Goldman 2013, Peacocke 2021). Views of aesthetic experience that diffuse focus onto several different types of properties of objects are under correspondingly more pressure to clarify what is special about aesthetic experience in other terms.

2. Mental aspects of aesthetic experience

2.1 Pleasure

Almost all agree that pleasure is a typical aspect of aesthetic experience (for exceptions see Carroll 2006, Adorno 1970 [1997]). But not all agree that it is an essential or even necessary aspect of aesthetic experience (those who do not include Levinson 1996c, Stecker 2005, and Peacocke 2021).

Is it possible to explain the source of such pleasure in aesthetic experience? It’s not obvious that it should be possible, especially on the view that art has no function and aesthetic experience no further purpose (see Section 2.5). One option is simply to delineate the particular type of pleasure that makes aesthetic experience what it is—and thereby count on an interlocutor’s recognition of that type of pleasure—without explaining its source. In the “aestheticist” or “art for art’s sake” movement amongst Romantic poets and essayists (Gautier 1835–6 [2005], Poe 1850 [1984], Baudelaire 1857 [1965], Pater 1873 [1986]; for overview see Guyer 2014b, Ch.6), many took this particular stance, especially to rebel against those (like Ruskin 1843–60 [2004]) who took the point of art to be moral in nature.

It is more common, however, to claim that aesthetic experience involves pleasure taken in some further aspect of aesthetic experience. There are a few distinct proposed sources of pleasure in aesthetic experience. First, we might take pleasure in positive evaluation of an object or its creator. Second, we might enjoy the activity of our own minds, including the free play of our faculties. Third, we might feel joyful relief in being liberated, at least temporarily, from certain practical pressures or domination. Fourth, we might take pleasure in coming to know or understand something in aesthetic experience. Fifth, and finally, we might take pleasure in a special connection to others made available in aesthetic experience in particular.

Various theories of aesthetic experience combine these claims in consistent ways; it is possible to think that there are several grounds for the total pleasure involved here. Note also that it’s consistent to take pleasure to be a necessary aspect of aesthetic experience without claiming (i) that pleasure makes aesthetic experience what it is, (ii) that pleasure is the point or aim of aesthetic experience, or (iii) that an object’s power to produce pleasure in us is the focus of aesthetic experience. (For discussion of this last claim, see Section 1.2 above).

Perhaps most popular is the claim that aesthetic experience involves pleasure because (and insofar as) it involves a positive evaluation of an object in some respect (see also Sections 1.1 and 1.3). The idea here is that we take pleasure in an object’s intrinsic value, its suitedness to function, its power to produce a certain kind of experience, or even in the goodness and skill of its creator (including, perhaps, the divine).

To compliate matters, pleasure can be understood in at least two ways: as a phenomenological feeling with a certain positive “hedonic tone,” or as a kind of pro-attitude with positive content (see Labukt 2012, Bramble 2013). On the former definition, it’s not clear that any positive evaluation of an object should involve a positive frisson of feeling (Peacocke 2021, pp. 173–4). Given that we can begrudgingly, enviously, or otherwise grumpily attribute genuine value to things in other contexts, why should positive evaluation in aesthetics necessarily involve a positive hedonic tone? On the latter definition, it might trivially follow that aesthetic experience involves pleasure (as a pro-attitude) if it involves positive evaluation, but this claim has limited interest. Recent work in aesthetic normativity has done significant work to make sense of a combination of the two (Gorodeisky 2019, 2021; Kriegel forthcoming).

A second common claim is that pleasure in aesthetic experience derives from a biologically natural joy we take in the activity of our own mental faculties. This position was especially popular in the eighteenth century among those philosophers who thought of the mind fundamentally in terms of a limited number of faculties like sensation, imagination, understanding, and reason (Baumgarten 1735 [1954], Meier 1999, Schlegel 1795 [2001], 1798–1800 [1991]). This view also has its own contemporary proponents (Levinson 1996b, p. 13).

The claim that we take pleasure in mental activity can be readily combined with the thought that aesthetic experience involves an evaluation, especially as it involves a (positive) evaluation of our own minds (Baumgarten 1735 [1954], Mendelssohn 1758 [1997], Feagin 1983). But this can seem too much focused on the perceiver or appreciator rather than the object of aesthetic experience itself.

A famous version of this second claim derives largely from Kant (1789 [1987]), who argued that we take pleasure in the free play of our mental faculties. This pleasure has a substantive aspect, but it also has a privative aspect. In the absence of a concept we apply to some object of perceptual representation, our imagination and understanding are liberated from the strictures of rational, discursive thought about the things we encounter in experience. This liberation is itself joyful. Some philosophers, notably Friedrich Schiller (1795 [1989]), thought this mental liberation was the single fundamental source of pleasure in aesthetic experience (cf. Matherne and Riggle 2020).

This relates closely to a third proposed source of pleasure in aesthetic experience: liberation from certain practical thought and emotion in aesthetic experience. Schopenhauer (1818 [1958]) took it that the basic condition of human practical life was a painful one: as willing creatures, we are constantly vacillating between frustration of our desires and boredom in the satisfaction of them. What aesthetic experience offers us is a reprieve from such suffering, a way to become a “pure will-less, painless, timeless subject of knowledge” (§34, p. 179; cf. Schelling 1800 [1978]).

Influential modern theories focused on liberation from the influence of unexpressed emotions. R.G.C. Collingwood (1938 [1958]) in particular thought that all experience of “art proper,” whether as creator or appreciator involves expression of an emotion, and that all such expression involves clarification and transformation of a feeling into something whose murky domination you can now resist in a way you couldn’t before (see Section 1.4.4 above).

Collingwood explicitly distinguishes his view from another kind of view that takes pleasure in aesthetic experience to be a matter of release. This other view makes a process of “catharsis” central to some or all aesthetic experience. Catharsis is an Aristotelian concept; Aristotle himself used it to explain the pleasurable release from tension we feel after a tragic drama raises emotions of pity and fear in us (Poetics). But it is not entirely clear what catharsis is.

A fourth proposed source of pleasure in aesthetic experience is the pleasure of gaining knowledge or understanding. Those who take aesthetic experience to involve, essentially, a form of acquaintance with fundamental aspects of nature tend to attribute pleasure in this way. But any broadly epistemic approach to aesthetic experience can attribute pleasure to this source, even if the knowledge or understanding gained by aesthetic experience is not necessarily of fundamental metaphysics. Nelson Goodman (1968 [1976]), for instance, took aesthetic experience to be an encounter with a meaningful symbolic object. He rejects all attempts “to distinguish the aesthetic in terms of immediate pleasure … The claim that aesthetic pleasure is of a different and superior quality is now too transparent a dodge to be taken seriously” (p.242–3). But he nonetheless notes that “what delights is discovery,” so there’s pleasure involved here (p.258).

Finally, some trace pleasure in aesthetic experience to connection with other people. This claim is particularly associated with those who treat aesthetic experience as focused on expressive properties (see Section 1.4. above). The pleasure we take in communing with others can be a matter of connecting with an artist and her own inner life (Wordsworth 1802 [1984], Vischer 1873 [1994], Proust 1913–1927 [2003]), or a matter of connecting with others who would react to an object in the same distinctively aesthetic ways we do, or both (Tolstoy 1897 [2007]).

2.2 Conceptualization

One traditional line of thought in aesthetic theory takes it that aesthetic experience of an object excludes conceptual thought about what kind of thing that object is. This was central to Kant’s (1789 [1987]) view; he thought that the imagination and the understanding could engage in a “free play” in aesthetic experience precisely because no conceptual binding restricted the way an object presented itself to us in this context.

The same idea has been central to vastly different theories of aesthetic experience too. After Croce (1902, 1938), Collingwood (1938 [1958]) denied that an emotion could be conceptualized in the expression essential to aesthetic experience because conceptual “description generalizes … Expression, on the contrary, individualizes” (112). The idea that conceptualization is generalization, and so incompatible with the focus on the particular demanded by aesthetic experience, is an enduring one (see e.g. Sibley 1974, 1983). Theodor Adorno (1970 [1997]) claimed that artworks offer the promise of escape from worldly conceptualization, although he also argued that this promise is inevitably broken, given that artworks are themselves aspects of the real world.

Even those who take aesthetic experience to be a mode of cognitive contact with the world often distinguish it from other cognitive modes in terms of its incompatibility with conceptualization. The Romantics (see Section 1.5.1. above) thought that the “absolute,” or the total infinite substratum of reality, could be experienced in a concrete individual, but not by conceptualization. Nelson Goodman (1968 [1976]) treated aesthetic experience as a matter of understanding objects that present their subjects in an analog way (with what he calls “syntactic density, semantic density, and syntactic repleteness,” p. 252), where this contrasts sharply with the conceptual mode of representation offered by natural languages.

On the other hand, various philosophers have argued that conceptualization is positively necessary to aesthetic experience.

Scruton (1974) took a form of “unasserted” conceptual imagination to be central to the “seeing-as” and “hearing-as” (etc.) of aesthetic experience. In this Scruton was influenced by Wollheim, but Wollheim’s (1968 [1980], 1990, 1994) reliance on conceptualization in aesthetic experience plausibly runs deeper than Scruton’s. To have an aesthetic experience of an artwork in particular is, in part, to interpret it, and to interpret an artwork is in part to attribute certain intentions concerning that very experience to the artist who made it (1987, p. 8; for a famous criticism of this claim, see Wimsatt and Beardsley, 1946). This attribution of intentions surely involves conceptualization, insofar as intention itself does.

A similar interpenetration of thought and experience undergirds Walton’s (1970) famous argument that an aesthetic experience of an artwork necessarily involves assigning that work to a category. The expressive chaos of Picasso’s Guernica would not seem chaotic at all if it belonged to a genre of “Guernicas” which tended to be much more brashly colored and three-dimensional; in that context, it would seem flat, muted, even gentle. In a rare entry into aesthetics, p. F. Strawson (1966) once argued that aesthetic appraisal—itself plausibly a part of aesthetic experience—must involve conceptualization of a work of art as such, in order to focus attention on just those features relevant to such appraisal (for critical discussion, see Sibley 1974 and Wollheim 1980).

2.3 Imagination

It’s an old idea (Addison 1712 [1879], Burke 1756 [2007]) that imagination is essentially involved in aesthetic experience. But different philosophers mean vastly different things by “imagination” here.

In the eighteenth century, the imagination was conceived by both empiricists and rationalists as one of the few fundamental mental faculties (alongside others like sensation and reason). As such, it played various different roles in the mental system. One of those roles was to take up and combine the raw material offered by sensation into more sophisticated representations available in the absence of individual objects there to be sensed.

As Kant put it, the imagination “synthesiz[es] the manifold of intuition.” In ordinary (non-aesthetic) experience, it does so according to rules or schema provided by the understanding, which correspond roughly to what we consider concepts today. In an experience of a beautiful object or scene, however, the imagination is given no such rules, and engages in a “harmonious” form of “free play” with the faculty of understanding without bringing the object presented in experience under any particular concept whatsoever (see also Section 2.2. above).

Although it is hard to say exactly what such “free play” is (cf. Ginsborg 1997, Matherne 2016, Küplen 2015, Savile 2020), the idea that aesthetic experience crucially involves such free play of the imagination has been a vastly influential one (see Guyer 2014 for a comprehensive approach to the history of this thought). It is closely allied with the idea of beauty as a form of unity in variety (Hutcheson 1726 [2004]), and the idea that we enjoy the activity of our own mental faculties in aesthetic experience (see Section 2.1. above). As Benedetto Croce summarized it, it is the idea that “aesthetic activity fuses impressions into an organic whole… the synthesis of variety, or multiplicity, into unity” (1902 [1992], p. 21). Such play is meant to involve the subject as an agent, and it is meant to be pleasurable in part due to the freedom it gives to the imagination. This is disputable: as the novelist-philosophers Vernon Lee and Clementina Anstruther-Thomson (1912) put it, “we do not take pleasure in playing because playing makes us feel free; but, on the contrary, we get greater and more unmixed pleasure while playing, because we are free to … accommodate our activity to our pleasure” (pp. 6–7).

This kind of mental play should be carefully distinguished from other forms of play associated with aesthetic experience that also constitutively involve imagination (e.g. Spencer 1855 [1895], Groos 1896–9 [1901]). For example, Walton (1990) has influentially treated our aesthetic engagement with various fictions as a form of make-believe game involving imagination as constrained by certain kinds of prescriptions given by the structure of a story or a picture (cf. Groos 1898 on a “self-conscious illusion,” pp. 302–3). This is structured, game-like play; Walton intends us to understand what we do with such aesthetic objects on the model of what kids do with toys. It is also often a purely ‘internal’ play, one that doesn’t manifest in further bodily action. But it is a form of play undergirded by the imagination not as a synthetic capacity to structure a mess of impressions, but rather undergirded by the imagination as a more general creative capacity, one that allows us to entertain vividly things which are not currently present to our senses.

This now more common conception of the imagination also informs those otherwise various and disparate views which take aesthetic experience to extend beyond what is immediately given in perception. The English Romantic poet Percy Bysshe Shelley (1832 [2003]) defined poetry as the expression of imagination, where the imagination is just “mind acting upon … thoughts so as to color them with its own light, and composing from them as from elements, other thoughts, each containing within itself the principle of its own integrity” (p.674). Arthur Schopenhauer (1818 [1958]) thought that the imagination of the artist was required to go beyond what is literally perceived to divine the essences of things:

actual objects are almost always only very imperfect copies of the Idea that manifests itself in them. Therefore the man of genius requires imagination, in order to see in things not what nature has actually formed, but what she endeavoured to form, yet did not bring about … (§36 p. 198).

Dilman Walter Gotshalk wrote in Art and the Social Order (1947) that aesthetic experience involves the amplification of what is currently presented in experience by “suggestions of the object” brought to mind by the imagination (p.19).

Roger Scruton built a theory of aesthetic experience on this creative, expansive power of the imagination in his book Art and Imagination (1974). A proper experience of art is an imaginative one, one which “goes beyond what is strictly given” (p.98). The relevant role of imagination here is to make it possible for you to engage in a voluntary, willed form of aspectual seeing, or “seeing as,” which makes it possible for you to see a certain shade of blue as sad, for instance, even though it cannot literally be sad. Scruton is quick to emphasize that this kind of imagination is not perfectly free, but rather constrained; it “involves thinking of these descriptions [e.g. of blue as sad] as appropriate in some way to the primary object,” and is subject to certain constraints of rationality and objectivity (pp. 98, 55, 112).

A final role key role for the imagination in aesthetic experience of art involves recreating something that was originally in the mind of the artist. This is, quite often, a matter of an emotion that is expressed in the artwork (Tolstoy 1897 [2007]; Croce 1912, 1938; Collingwood 1938 [1958]; see Section 1.4 above). But it can also be more than that. In The Imaginary (1940 [2004]) and his later essay “What is Literature?” (1948 [1967]) the French existentialist Jean-Paul Sartre spoke of the imagination as needed to constitute an object for conscious aesthetic contemplation (cf. Dufrenne 1953). In the case of literature, “the imagination of the spectator has not only a regulative function but a constitutive one. It does not play: it is called upon to recompose the beautiful object beyond the traces left by the artist” (1948, p. 33). John Dewey (1934 [1980]) also claimed, in his theory of ‘esthetic’ and thus particularly unified experience, that a spectator of art “must create his own experience. And his creation must include relations comparable to those which the original producer underwent. … there must be an ordering of the elements of the whole that is in form, although not in details, the same as the process of organization the creator of the work consciously experienced” (p.314).

2.4 Emotion

Emotion has been taken to be central to aesthetic experience since early work on aesthetics as such in the eighteenth century. In France, the influential Abbé Jean-Baptiste Du Bos (1719 [1748]) emphasized the importance of occurrent, bodily emotion in our appreciation of drama. This emotion is pleasant in comparison to the languor of everyday life (cf. discussion in Hume, “Of tragedy,” 1757 [1987b]). In Germany, Georg Friedrich Meier (1999) treated the passions as essential to the pleasure we take in aesthetic experience, and Mendelssohn (1785 [1979])—after Dubos—added that part of why this is pleasurable is that we feel a certain salutary effect on the body in having emotion in aesthetic experience. Although Baumgarten (1735 [1954]) wrote more generally about aesthetics as the science of cognition of objects by sensation, he also specified in the case of poetry in particular that one central goal is “to arouse affects” (§XXV, p. 24).

With the rise of Romanticism and then of empathy theory, artists and philosophers were particularly concerned to clarify the ways in which aesthetic experience involved feeling an emotion alongside that expressed in an artwork (see Section 1.4 above). It is possible to take aesthetic experience to be singularly focused on emotional expression without claiming that the appreciator of an aesthetic object actually needs to feel the emotion that object expresses (Langer 1953). Nonetheless, many views of expression did indeed think that an appropriate aesthetic experience involved feeling that expressed emotion (Bosanquet 1915, Collingwood 1938 [1958], Wollheim 1990). On a view that takes aesthetic experience essentially to involve appreciating expression of emotion, and which also takes such appreciation essentially to involve feeling that emotion, feeling some emotion or other is essential to aesthetic experience. But the emotion in question varies from case to case, depending on what the aesthetic object expresses.

A distinct influential view has it that there is one consistent distinctive “aesthetic emotion” felt in all aesthetic experience of any object whatsoever. A version of this thought G.E. Moore’s brief remarks on aesthetic experience in Principia Ethica (1903 [1993]; cf. Guyer 2014c pp. 112–3): “It is not sufficient that a man should merely see the beautiful qualities in a picture and know that they are beautiful, in order that we may give his state of mind the highest praise. We require that he should also appreciate the beauty of that which he sees … he should have an appropriate emotion towards the beautiful qualities which he cognizes” (§113). But the idea of a distinctive aesthetic emotion is perhaps most closely associated with Moore’s friend Clive Bell (1914 [2007]), who took the goodness of art to be a matter of its ability to rouse us to a “state of ecstasy” by its “significant form” (cf. Dean 1996). Bell explicitly called this “peculiar emotion provoked by works of art” an “aesthetic emotion.”

Bell presumed so much agreement on this point that he said little about what this emotion is, leading to much criticism (e.g. Stolnitz 1960, p. 144). Nelson Goodman (1968 [1976]) claimed that this oversight meant that Bell had little or no available distinction between non-aesthetic and aesthetic experience: “The theory of aesthetic phlogiston explains everything and nothing” (p.247). More recently, Jesse Prinz (2014) has suggested that we understand the aesthetic emotion in question as a form of wonder (see Carroll 2019 for objections).

After Bell, Dewey (1934 [1980]) and Collingwood (1938 [1958]) took more moderate positions on the nature of a specific aesthetic emotion. Both thought that aesthetic experiences were colored distinctively by their own variable emotions, but also that there is a distinctive affect in common across all aesthetic experiences. Dewey claimed that this affect was a matter of “qualitative unity” of an experience (1938 [1980], pp. 84–5), and Collingwood that it was “the specific feeling of having successfully expressed ourselves” (1938 [1958], p. 117).

All the views discussed in this section thus far share the claim that some emotion or other is essential to aesthetic experience. There are other views on which emotion is a common concomitant of aesthetic experience, but that it does not make aesthetic experience what it is (e.g. Vivas 1937). Goodman (1968 [1976]) insisted that “in aesthetic experience the emotions function cognitively … Cognitive use involves discriminating and relating them in order to gauge and grasp the work and integrate it with the rest of our experience and the world” (p.248). According to Goodman, such cognitively purposed emotions need not be present in aesthetic experience, and they are sometimes present in non-aesthetic experience too (p.251).

It is somewhat surprising that two of the most important historical theories of aesthetic experience make the now rare claim that emotion is positively incompatible with aesthetic experience. Kant (1789), for instance, claimed that “a pure judgment of taste”—that which you would make in an aesthetic experience of pure beauty—“is independent of charm and emotion” (p.68). Schopenhauer (1818 [1958]) thought of emotion as wrapped up in motive and will, in its striving or frustration, but also claimed that aesthetic experience offered complete release from such striving and frustration. As such, aesthetic experience does not involve emotion as we ordinarily understand it. Nonetheless, Schopenhauer did indeed notice the importance of emotional expression to certain arts, and he conceded that some of those general “Ideas” we can come to understand in the course of aesthetic experience are ideas of emotions and “their essential nature, without any accessories, and so also without the motives for them” (§52, p. 260).

2.5 Disinterest

The idea that aesthetic experience must be in some way “disinterested”—roughly speaking, unconcerned with the way its object could serve further practical purposes—is central in discussion of aesthetic experience. It is used to distinguish aesthetic experience from close counterpart experiences of the same object, and is thought to capture something essential about the nature of the aesthetic. But philosophers can mean quite different things by “disinterested” (for a brief history, see Stolnitz 1961).

Anthony Ashley Cooper, the Third Earl of Shaftesbury, is often cited (e.g. by Guyer 2004) as the originator of the modern idea of disinterest. However, John Haldane (2013) persuasively traces the idea right back to Johannes Scotus Erigena, who wrote in his De divisione naturae that “The sense of sight is abused by those who approach the beauty of visible forms with appetite or desire” (Haldane 2013, p. 30; Erigena, De divisione naturae, IV–V). Some find an ancient ancestor of the idea in Aristotle’s ethical writings (see entry on “Aristotle’s Aesthetics”).

Nonetheless, Shaftesbury (1711) did write of disinterest, and illustrated the idea by considering two approaches to a coin: one aesthetic, which delights just in mere contemplation of its form, and the other practical, which considers what it might purchase. Hutcheson (1726 [2004]) followed Shaftesbury in claiming that the pleasure we take in the beautiful is “distinct from that joy which arises from self-love upon prospect of advantage,” and from any prospect of gaining knowledge (in Cahn and Meskin 2007). Hume (1739–40 [1987]) is a rare exception amongst eighteenth century British philosophers in allowing “that a great part of … beauty … is deriv’d from the idea of convenience and utility” (; cf. Santayana 1896, Zemach 1997).

Early eighteenth century German philosophy of pleasure in perception explicitly classified it as pleasure taken in the perfection of something perfectly suited to its function (Wolff 1719 [2003]; see Section 1.1. above). Moses Mendelssohn (1785 [1979]) retained the centrality of perfection to aesthetic experience, but he also claimed that

We contemplate the beauty of nature and of art, without the least arousal of desire, with gratification and satisfaction. It seems to be a particular mark of beauty that … it pleases, even if we do not possess it, and that is remote from the urge to possess it. (Lesson VII, p. 70, translated in Guyer 2020, section on Mendelssohn)

In an essay dedicated to Mendelssohn (“Attempt at a Unification of all the Fine Arts and Sciences under the Concept of that which is complete in itself” 1785 [1993]), the later aesthetician Karl Moritz extended this idea of disinterest to argue that experience of the beautiful offers you a way of pleasantly forgetting yourself in “unselfish gratification” by thinking of the beautiful object “as something that has been brought forth entirely for its own sake, so that it could be something complete in itself” (trans. Guyer, p. 545).

It was Kant’s conception in the Critique of Judgment (1789) that cemented the place of disinterestedness in aesthetics, and shaped the discourse for the centuries to come. When Kant claimed that pleasure taken in a representation of a beautiful object (as such) is “disinterested,” he meant that this pleasure is “indifferent … to the real existence of the object of this representation” (§1–5). In his system, this is tantamount to saying that this pleasure is unmediated by any desire for the object (cf. Zangwill 1992). This disinterest distinguishes the pleasure that grounds a judgment of the beautiful from the pleasure that grounds a judgment of something as merely “agreeable.” Under a separate heading (not that of “disinterest” per se), Kant added that pleasure in a beautiful object is not based in any attribution of a specific purpose to it. He thus distanced himself from predecessors like Wolff.

One way of interpreting a lack of concern with the “real existence” of the object of an aesthetic experience is to understand that experience as focused on appearances instead. Edward Bullough (1957) espoused a version of this view in 1907 lectures at Cambridge. The idea had a wave of popularity in the mid-20th century (Gotshalk 1947, Urmson 1957, Tomas 1959). The view survives in the influential contemporary work of Martin Seel (2005, p. 24): “to perceive something in the process of its appearing for the sake of its appearing is the focal point of aesthetic perception, the point at which every exercise of this perception is directed.”

A variation of this approach casts aesthetic experience as that which is valued or enjoyed “for its own sake,” as opposed to valuing or enjoying it as a means to some further end (cf. Gorodeisky and Marcus 2018 on “self-containment,” p. 118). Gary Iseminger (2006) denies that any aesthetic experience can be individuated purely in terms of how it feels, since what really makes a state of valued experience aesthetic is a matter of its being valued just for its own sake, and valuing is not just a matter of having a certain feeling. In revision of his earlier (1996a, 1996b) account of aesthetic experience, Jerrold Levinson (2016b) agrees with Iseminger’s view, except he claims that the evaluative component of such appreciation must itself be phenomenological (p.39; cf. Stecker 2005). Both Iseminger and Levinson treat disinterest in this sense as part of what makes aesthetic experience (or appreciation) aesthetic at all (for objections, see Goodman 1968 [1976] p. 242, Meskin 2001, and Carroll 2006).

Some of these views that take aesthetic experience to be valued “for its own sake” depart significantly from the Kantian conception of disinterest. For instance, Roger Scruton’s (1974) conception of the imaginatively inflected perception (e.g. “seeing-as”) essential to aesthetic experience can be based on a desire for an object “for no other reason, where one’s desire is, nonetheless, based on a conception of the thing one wants” (p.147).

Another dominant conception of disinterest in the 20th century was a conception of a certain “aesthetic attitude” one can take voluntary with respect to a natural scene or an artwork—an attitude which consists in detaching one’s practical self from what is perceived in that object. As Zangwill (1992) notes, this notion of disinterest is “unKantian” in its modification of a stance, attitude, or type of attention, rather than pleasure, as disinterested.

In discussion of sublime natural phenomena, Edward Bullough (1912) seems to have been the first to suggest that we can voluntarily put our experience “out of gear with our practical, actual self” as long as we have a certain amount of “distance” from the threatening aspects of these natural phenomena (in Cahn and Meskin, 2007, pp. 244). What is important in the form of an object of such aesthetic attention is that it supports a “marked degree of artificiality” that allows us to take this stance on the object (p.249). This artificiality keeps us engaged in a “personal” but “filtered” way with the emotions of the object of our experience (p.245).

The idea that a certain “distance” can make it possible to forget the particularities of one’s own practical situation and thereby allow fuller “participation” in an object of aesthetic experience has been attractive to theorists in various distinct research paradigms. Hans-Georg Gadamer (1960 [2005]) emphasized how “aesthetic distance in a true sense … makes possible a genuine and comprehensive participation in what is presented before us” via “self-forgetfulness” (pp. 124–5). John Dewey (1934 [2007]) wrote that in ‘esthetic’ experience

There is no severance of self, no holding of it aloof, but fulness of participation … so thoroughgoing … that the work of art is detached or cut off from the kind of specialized desire that operates when we are moved to consume or appropriate a thing physically. (p.262; cf. Beardsley 1958 [1981], pp. 288–291)

This conception of disinterest takes it to be not just compatible with but also supportive of a specialized activity (“participation”), and even sometimes takes it to be a product of a personal decision to engage in a certain kind of way with an object of experience.

In the middle of the 20th century, George Dickie levied a famous objection to this interpretation of disinterest in his paper “The Myth of the Aesthetic Attitude” (1964). He wrote:

“disinterestedness” cannot properly be used to refer to a special kind of attention … [it] is a term which is used to make clear that an action has certain kinds of motives … Attending to an object, of course, has its motives but the attending itself is not interested or disinterested … although the attending may be more or less close. (p.60)

Proposed cases of wrongly motivated attention, he suggests, are really just cases of (degrees of) inattention. Levinson (2016b) disagrees, arguing that attending is indeed something that you can do with a motive, and that the motive you have in attending affects your phenomenology. Nanay (2015) picks up this general point and proposes that specifically aesthetic attention is distributed among all the properties of an object (though see Nanay 2016 for complexities).

Langer’s (1953/2007) distinct objection is that the “aesthetic attitude” is too demanding to be an essential part of any aesthetic experience whatsoever: “If the groundwork of all genuine art experience is really such a sophisticated, rare, and artificial attitude, it is something of a miracle that the world recognizes works of art as public treasures at all” (p.324).

These are objections to the interpretation of disinterest in terms of a special attitude or attentive stance one can take on an object. They are not, as such, objections more generally to the claim that disinterest is an essential or even just a necessary aspect of aesthetic experience. That latter claim is still widely popular. But there are a few reasonable ways to resist it.

One concerns the deep personal importance of aesthetic experience. Nick Riggle (2016) argues that our phenomenal appreciation of beauty must be interested in at least a certain sense in order for it to be able to effect the types of personal transformation that it does (cf. Proust 1913–1927 [2003], Nehamas 2007). Another way to resist the emphasis on disinterest is to note the great variety of aesthetic experiences available to us, especially with the staggering diversity of contemporary arts (Adorno 1970 [1997], pp. 10–11).

2.6 Normativity

At least since Kant’s Critique of Judgment (1789) many have thought that aesthetic experience involves a form of normativity—either that an aesthetic experience is the type one should have of certain natural scenes or art objects, or that having some such experience entails thinking that others should have the same experience of that object. Kant certainly made the latter claim. As he put it, an object seems to you to merit a certain subjective response of disinterested pleasure insofar as it sets your faculties of imagination and understanding into a form of free play (see Section 1.3 and Section 2.3 above).

Both Kant and Hume before him (1757 [1987]) took it that aesthetics demanded a reconciliation between two intuitively clashing facts: first, that the way to appreciate an object aesthetically is to feel some way towards it; and second, that such appreciation is merited or deserved. Neither Hume nor Kant thought that beauty was an objective matter, even though we do speak of beauty as though it is a property that inheres in objects (contrast Edith Landmann-Kalischer; see Matherne 2020).

Even though normativity is sometimes tied to objectivity—you should feel or think this about that, because it is an objective matter—this is not so obviously the case in philosophy of aesthetic experience. Objectivity and normativity have a tortured relationship in this discussion.

Consider, for instance, George Santayana’s (1896) take. He presented beauty as “pleasure regarded as the quality of a thing,” i.e. “objectified” (pp. 31–2). To have an aesthetic experience is to feel a form of pleasure not as belonging to one’s mind or body, but rather as if it belonged to the object. This need not involve really thinking that the pleasure really does belong to the object; on the contrary, he claimed, “beauty … cannot be conceived as an independent existence which affects our senses and we consequently perceive” (p.29). For this reason, phenomenological objectification does not make sense of demands that others feel as you do. On his view, such demands are “unmeaning” (p.27). Nelson Goodman (1968 [1976]) later called this “mumbo-jumbo”—“what can this mean?” (p.243). The only way we could make sense of the claim that we feel as though pleasure really belongs to objects themselves is as a claim that objects express pleasure, but not all aesthetic objects do this.

In a certain respect, Santayana’s claims of phenomenological objectification are less mysterious than claims of actual objectification of subjective feeling in other aesthetic systems. The early empathy theorist Robert Vischer (1873 [1994]) claimed that the artist “translate[s] the indefinability and instability of mental life, as well as the chaotic disorder of nature, into a magnificent objectivity, into a clear reflection of a free humanity,” and thus generates an item whose investment with emotion has a form of universal validity (pp. 116–17, emphasis added). Around this time, many of those who take aesthetic experience to focus on emotional expression spoke of emotion “objectified” in objects, in a way that was then inseparable from the embodiment of that emotion in the physical form (Bosanquet 1892 [1904], p. 34; Ducasse 1929, p. 111; Dewey 1934 [1980], p. 248; Cassirer 1944, pp. 142–4). Insofar as feeling can literally be manifested in these physical forms, it is simply a matter of appreciating qualities an object really has that you should appreciate such expression and feel certain emotions in their presence (see Section 1.4.4).

Newer descendants of this view treat normativity in aesthetic experience as derived from the correctness of seeing-as (or otherwise perceiving-as). When Kendall Walton (1970) noted that the assignment of a category to an artwork affects the expressive properties you experience it as having, he was careful to note that only some category assignments are correct (p.356ff.). Roger Scruton (1974) went out on a limb to claim that even though seeing-as (and other perceiving-as) is a matter of imagination (see Section 2.3), there are nonetheless right and wrong ways to apply your imagination to an object of your attention. Such choices in imagination “involve a sense of their own ‘correctness’ or appropriateness to an object” (pp. 138–9).

Kant (1789 [1987]), Vischer (1873 [1994]), and others took aesthetic normativity to be universal: it’s true that everyone ought to feel a certain way about an object, given that the features that ground that feeling are themselves universal among people. Others—including Scruton and the empathy theorist Herbert Langfeld (1920)—are less sanguine about the prospect of universal agreement; they variously relativize the normative demands that objects make upon us to feel certain ways (Kennick 1958, Goldman 1995, Levinson 2006a, Matthen 2018). A few personalize the specific demands that artworks or natural scenes can make on our emotions and feelings as individuals (Moran 2004; Nehamas 2007; Riggle 2016; cf. Nietzsche 1882 [1974] §290–299 and Landy 2004 on Proust 1913–1927 [2003]).

A demand for someone to have a certain subjective experience of an object only makes sense if they already can have such an experience, or at least could cultivate their capacity to have such an experience. This capacity has long been called “taste” (cf. Korsmeyer 2013). The resonance with a form of sensation is no accident. Various eighteenth-century British philosophers (notably Hutcheson 1726 [2004], Hume 1739–40 [1987], and Reid 1785 [1969]) made sense of this capacity as a form of “internal sense,” whose inputs were reliant upon the representations provided by sensation. Lively contemporary discussion amongst French social elites considered the extent to which taste was innate or acquired (Bouhours 1671 [1705], Du Bos 1719 [1748], Marquise de Lambert 1748 [1770]; see also Montesquieu, Voltaire, and d’Alembert’s 1757 and Diderot’s 1751 entries into the Encyclopédie, Diderot and d’Alembert, 1751–1765).

Many contrasted this quasi-sensory faculty with that of reason (Bouhours 1671 [1705], Du Bos 1719 [1748], Marquise de Lambert 1748 [1770], Montesquieu, Voltaire, and d’Alembert 1757), although others claimed in a post-Cartesian rationalist vein that an object’s beauty was primarily judged through the faculty of reason (de Crousaz 1714 [2000]; André 1741), and even claimed that it was possible to codify contributors to beauty in general principles (De Lambert, Voltaire, Diderot 1751). Kant (1789) notably denied that any such general principles of taste could possibly be formulated or used to reason to the conclusion that something is beautiful.

In the 20th century, the debate over principles of taste saw a resurgence. Those who deny the existence of any general principles of taste are “particularists,” and those who accept them “generalists.” Notable 20th-century particularists include Croce 1938 [2007], Collingwood 1938 [1958], Gallie 1956, Isenberg 1949, Sibley 1974, 1983, Mothersill 1988, and Goldman 2006 (cf. Kant 1789 [1987] §34–35). Notable generalists include Beardsley (1958 [1981], 1970 [1982]) and Dickie 2006. While generalists like Beardsley think that we can dispute matters of taste in reasoned argument particularists generally work to make sense of more subtle forms of interpersonal communication about experience (see Isenberg 1949, Hopkins 2004, Mothersill 1988, Sibley 2001, Cavell 1965 [2007], Wollheim 1968 [1980]).

There is a new efflorescence of philosophical research into aesthetic normativity, much of which profits significantly from cross-comparison of various normative domains (Eaton 2001; Cross 2017, forthcoming; Hanson 2018, Lopes 2018, 2021, Gorodeisky and Marcus 2018; Gorodeisky 2019, 2021, Kubala 2021, Dyck 2021, Whiting 2021, forthcoming, Riggle, forthcoming; see King 2022 for an overview).


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