First published Mon Mar 14, 2016; substantive revision Thu Feb 11, 2021

Through our individual conscience, we become aware of our deeply held moral principles, we are motivated to act upon them, and we assess our character, our behavior and ultimately our self against those principles. Different philosophical, religious and common sense approaches to conscience have emphasized different aspects of this broad characterization. The resulting more specific understandings of conscience will be presented in the sections below. On any of these accounts, conscience is defined by its inward looking and subjective character, in the following sense: conscience is always knowledge of ourselves, or awareness of moral principles we have committed to, or assessment of ourselves, or motivation to act that comes from within us (as opposed to external impositions). This inward looking and subjective character of conscience is also reflected in the etymological relation between the notion of “conscience” and that of consciousness. Only after the 17th Century did “consciousness” start to be used with a distinct meaning referring to the psychological and phenomenal dimension of the mind, rather than to its moral dimension (for an account of the terminological shift, see Jorgensen 2014).

The term “conscience” translates the Latin “conscientia”, which refers to sharing “knowledge” (scientia) “with” (con-), and which in turns translates the equivalent Greek term suneidenai (see Pierce 1955 and Sorabji 2014 for an etymological analysis of the term). The literal meaning of the term does not specify the type of knowledge involved and whom that knowledge is shared with. However, the concept has traditionally been used to refer to moral knowledge (we talk indifferently of conscience and moral conscience) that is shared with oneself. This reference to the self does not rule out that the source of the morality in question be external to the self. For example, it might be God, as in the Christian tradition, or the influence of one’s culture or of one’s upbringing, as in the Freudian theory of the Super-Ego. Reference to the self indicates that, from a psychological point of view, conscience involves introspection, awareness of one’s behavior, and self-assessment. As we shall see, although these aspects often overlap, they are psychologically and conceptually distinct functions.

“Sharing moral knowledge with oneself” might mean and imply different things. As for the object of knowledge, for example, it might refer to knowledge of one’s own conduct in view of an assessment of it against a certain moral standard, or it might refer to knowledge of moral standards or principles themselves. As for the “self” with whom knowledge is shared, it might mean sharing knowledge with a part of the self, as if we were split into two persons (Sorabji 2014: 12), but it might also mean sharing knowledge with an imaginary witness, such as an ideal observer (for instance a god, an imagined moral model, an impartial spectator). Unfortunately, debates in which appeals to conscience are often made—for example the debate about conscientious objection in health care—are often characterized by a lack of clarity as to what it exactly is that we are talking about when we talk about conscience, and therefore about what exactly people are claiming when they put forward a “conscientious objection” to, for example, abortion. In what sense does abortion violate the conscience of a committed Catholic doctor? And is conscience amenable to reason and public discussion, or are appeals to conscience ultimately based on intuitions and private morality? In what sense is a conscientious choice different from a mere moral preference? The notion of conscience is in need of conceptual clarification.

This entry will expound the main features of the notion of conscience as it is used in philosophical discussion, religious teaching and in common language alike. The perspective adopted here will theoretical, rather than historical. The entry focuses on the Western tradition and some examples are drawn from Christian source. The entry is structured around four possible, but not mutually exclusive, ways of conceptualizing conscience. These will be preceded by an introductory section outlining the pluralistic, morally neutral and subjective nature of the concept of conscience. The four main aspects of conscience that will be described are the following. Section 2 discusses conscience as a faculty for self-knowledge and self-assessment. Section 3 presents the epistemic aspect of conscience that allows the formation of moral beliefs, distinguishing the different possible sources of moral principles that inform such beliefs. In section 4, conscience will be described as a motivational force or as the source of our sense of duty, which already presupposes a body of moral knowledge or of moral beliefs. Finally, section 5 will focus on conscience understood as the body of personal core and self-identifying moral beliefs which is often taken to be the basis of moral integrity (Fuss 1964; Wicclair 2011) and of our sense of personal identity (Childress 1979). As discussed in section 6, this last approach to conscience is often used with a political function to advocate freedom of thought and action in liberal democratic societies, for example, as explained in subsection 6.1, through conscientious objection to practices that one would otherwise be professionally or legally expected to perform.

1. Conscience as pluralistic, neutral and subjective

The concept of conscience does not bear any connection with any particular substantial moral view (Broad 1940). The voice of conscience might suggest different principles and different behaviors to different people. In other words, there is no psychological or conceptual relation between conscience and any particular moral belief. However, as will be explained below, in the Catholic tradition the idea of an erroneous conscience is sometimes used to refer to conscience that fails to recognize the true moral laws which it is naturally predisposed to “witness” within our heart. As for secular accounts of conscience, the independence of the notion of conscience from any substantial moral content can be understood in three senses.

First, conscience is a pluralistic notion. To say that a person acted with conscience or that something violates someone’s conscience does not entail anything about what this act consists of or what this person’s moral values are (although it might tell us that conscience is itself a value this person holds dear). To use a metaphor, conscience is like an empty box that can be filled with any type of moral content. As put by Strohm,

conscience has what might be called an “identity problem”—that it possesses no fixed or inherited content of its own, and that it can be hailed and mobilized in defence of one position or equally in defence of its rival. (Strohm 2011: 120)

For example, while some health practitioners raise “conscientious” objection to abortion and refuse to provide the service, someone’s conscience might demand the exact opposite, i.e., to perform abortions in order to respect what is conscientiously believed to be a woman’s right (Joffe 1995).

Second, conscience is typically a morally neutral concept. Appealing to conscience does not usually add anything to the moral justification of any particular conduct or principle. Unless one is committed to the relativistic idea that your belief (or your conscience) about x being right or wrong is what makes it right or wrong for you to do x (Foot 1979), something is not made morally better or worse, acceptable or unacceptable, simply by being a matter of conscience. For example, the morality of abortion has nothing to do with abortion being conscientiously opposed by some health practitioners or conscientiously supported by others. This neutrality does not exclude, however, that an appeal to conscience can represent itself a reason for respecting someone’s moral views, for example a reason for granting someone a right to object to carrying out certain activities. While appeals to conscience do not typically provide any moral reason in defense of a certain moral stance (unless one is a relativist), they might ground political reasons for respecting individuals’ moral beliefs, such as for example tolerance or pluralism.

Finally, conscience only concerns the subjective dimension of morality. Even assuming that there are ethical values that, in some sense, can be considered objective, conscience only refers to what individuals believe, independently of any external, objective proof or justification. And when people state what they subjectively and conscientiously believe, they acknowledge that other people might (and probably will) subjectively and conscientiously hold different moral views. Thus, when I say that abortion violates my conscience, I am not saying (although I might be thinking) that abortion is morally wrong by some objective standard, and I’m not necessarily trying to convince others that abortion is wrong by some objective standard. I am simply stating what I deeply believe and what I want others to respect as my conscientious belief, regardless of how good or bad the moral reasons I can provide to defend my claims are or appear to be to others (McGuire 1963: 259). In fact, when health practitioners claim conscientious objection to some medical procedures, they are usually not interested in preventing other doctors who hold different moral beliefs from performing the procedure. They are usually only interested in, so to speak, keeping their hands clean according to their subjective moral standard.

These three aspects related to the independence of conscience from particular substantial moral views explain why appeals to conscience to justify one’s behavior are usually made with the expectation that no further reason for the behavior in question be required. As put by Childress, when an agent appeals to her conscience,

[u]sually the agent has given up the attempt to convince others of the objective rightness of his act and is content to assert its subjective rightness. (Childress 1979: 329)

2. Conscience as self-knowledge and self-assessment

When we talk about conscience, we often refer to reflection about ourselves as moral persons and about our moral conduct. Through conscience we examine ourselves, as if we were our own inner judge. The image of an individual split into two persons, one who acts and the other who observes the former’s conduct, reflects the original conception of “conscience” in the Greek world, at least from the 5th century BCE (Sorabji 2014: 12). But such self- knowledge may also be thought of as shared with others inside of us, such as God(s) or other imaginary witnesses (for example an admired philosopher according to Epicurus (Sorabji 2014: 24), or an impartial spectator according to Adam Smith (1759)). The god(s) in question might be the god(s) of a particular religion, such as the God of Christianity, or a postulate of the practical reason, such as in Kant, according to whom reason, in order to be “practical” in the sense of informing moral conduct, needs the idea of a higher authority who sanctions individuals for their actions (Kant 1797).

The role of conscience in this sense is not that of merely gaining knowledge about our behavior or character. The knowledge in question is typically (though, as explained below, not always) the ground for a moral assessment by conscience. When observing one’s behavior, conscience is more like a judge (or sometimes it is identified with the judgment itself) than like a disinterested observer. Thus, for instance, the impartial spectator with which Adam Smith identified conscience, inspired by the Stoic’s notion of conscience as an imagined admired philosopher judging one’s conduct, is not a morally and emotionally neutral observer, but generates a sentiment of approval or disapproval of oneself (Smith 1759 and discussion in Raphael 2007: 34). Even in the Catholic view, where the main characterization of conscience is that of a witness of God’s law in our hearts (as described in section 3), conscience is also presented as “a moral judgment about man and his actions, a judgment either of acquittal or condemnation” (John Paul II 1993: 59). Analogously, in the Kantian view, conscience is conceived of as an inner court (Wood 2008: 184): it is moral self-awareness that allows to apply the moral law suggested by practical reason to our moral conduct, and to judge whether we have complied with the moral law. As Kant defines it in the Metaphysics of Morals, conscience is

practical reason holding the human being’s duty before him for his acquittal or condemnation in every case that comes under a law (Kant 1797 [1991]: 160)


consciousness of an internal court in man. (Kant 1797 [1991]: 189)

This understanding of conscience as an inner court is well illustrated by the story of Huckleberry Finn in Mark Twain’s famous novel (Twain 1884; Bennett 1974). In a well-known episode of the novel, Huck feels guilty and blameworthy for having helped his slave friend Jim to escape from his owner Miss Watson. Blame does not come from some external moral authority, but it is a verdict issued by conscience according to its moral laws. The bites of conscience in Huck’s case were caused by a tension between his feelings supporting what he did and the principles he had inherited from his social environment. At the time when the novel is set, slave-owning was considered a natural type of possession and helping slaves run away meant depriving someone of her private property. This was the “law” (metaphorically speaking) against which Huck’s conscience assessed his behavior.

This story illustrates another interesting feature of conscience as a faculty for self-assessment, i.e., the asymmetry between our confidence in the validity of the moral standards provided by our own conscience and our confidence in the validity of the standards provided other people’s conscience. Huck thinks that what he did was wrong and that it rendered him blameworthy in spite of his feelings, because he thinks that his own conscience provides a correct moral standard, i.e., a standard that he endorses even if some of his feelings or beliefs indicate otherwise. This seems to reflect our common way of relating to our own conscience: we try to adjust our feelings and judgments to our conscience’s standard, rather than vice versa. However, the same does not hold when we talk of other people’s conscience, which is usually taken to indicate their subjective moral standard and does not imply that we are endorsing it. This asymmetry suggests that there is no conceptual relation between the notion of conscience per se and the notion of an objective or correct moral standard; rather, it stresses once more the fact that conscience has merely to do with one’s private morality and one’s commitment to her own morality.

Consistently with this understanding of conscience as self-knowledge and self-assessment, it has been suggested by some that psychopaths—i.e., pathological subjects who display antisocial behavior and systematically act without regard to what they consider to be right or wrong—can be said to lack conscience (Hare 1999). For instance, according to Vujošević (2015), in psychopaths the link between moral knowledge or beliefs and self-directed feelings of condemnation (e.g., guilt) is broken: psychopaths cannot feel the remorse that normal functioning agents feel when they perceive the discrepancy between their moral beliefs and their behavior, and as a consequence psychopaths do not consider themselves accountable for their actions (Gudjonsson and Roberts 1983; Aharoni et al. 2012), although their moral beliefs are often “normal” (Schaich and Sinnott-Armstrong 2013)

As mentioned above in this section, when expressing itself through self-evaluative feelings, conscience might be conceived of as either constituted by such feelings (Fuss 1964) or as occasioning them (Broad 1940).

In the former sense (conscience as constituted by self-evaluative feelings), the feeling is an essential part of conscience. Conscience in this case is better conceived not as a judge who issues sentences, but as a feeling with cognitive content—where the cognitive content concerns the adherence of one’s behavior to a certain moral standard; in such cases, the negative feeling informs me that what I am doing or am contemplating doing is wrong (according to my own moral parameters). In the latter sense (conscience as occasioning self-evaluative feelings), the inner judge, when in tension with one’s conduct, generates negative self-directed feelings (Mill 1861: ch 3). For instance, in Freud the “Super-Ego”—the part of our personality that attends to prohibitions, inhibitions and moral constraints—takes “the form of conscience” to exercise its control over one’s impulses and instincts by producing negative evaluative feelings towards the individual, such as aggressiveness towards the Ego and guilt (Freud 1929 [2000]: 30). As we shall see below in section 4, these self-directed negative feelings play an essential role in fulfilling the motivational function of conscience.

As the characterization of conscience as self-assessment here presented suggests, conscience has most often been associated with negative feelings (Arendt 1971), such as shame, guilt, fear, contrition. While these feelings are typical of the Christian understanding of conscience, they need not be tied to a religious view: for most of us, even in our common language, conscience is something that yields negative feelings more often than not—for example we often talk of the “bites of conscience” or of conscience as causing us “remorse” (which derives from the Latin “remordere”, i.e., “to bite again”). However, a joyful conscience that praises and takes pride of one’s own moral merit can be conceived as well. Examples of joyful conscience can be found for instance in Cicero and some Latin Stoics, most prominently Seneca (Sorabji 2014: 25–30). Also in the Protestant tradition started by Luther we find the idea of a joyful conscience, where joy springs not from pride or self-praise, but from awareness of God’s future remission of sins (Luther 1535; Calvin 1536).

The contrast between the Protestant joyful conscience and the Catholic conscience burdened by negative feelings of guilt and fear was emphasized by Luther when he denounced the “terrorization of conscience” by the Roman Catholic Church. According to Luther, with this terrorization the Roman Catholic Church aimed to reinforce its authority and control over people’ conscience. In fact, conscience in the Catholic tradition can only be relieved from its burden of negative feelings through the confession of one’s sins to a priest and the penitence decided by that priest.

3. The epistemic function of conscience

Along with the previous, non-epistemic conception of conscience, we can also understand conscience as having an epistemic function. In this sense, conscience brings us some form of moral knowledge or moral beliefs—either in an absolute sense, e.g., knowledge of divine laws, or in a relative sense, e.g., knowledge of social norms in one’s culture.

The epistemic role of conscience does not necessarily coincide with the role of epistemic faculties or functions such as reason, intuitions, or senses. In particular, that conscience “brings” us moral knowledge or beliefs does not necessarily mean that it gives us direct access to the source of this knowledge or of these beliefs, as might be the case with reason, intuitions, or senses.

The knowledge we get from conscience, understood as possessing an epistemic function, is often conceived as mediated knowledge. This is not surprising, since, as we have seen, conscience is mostly understood as inward looking, which presupposes that the knowledge to which it gives us access is already within us and that we acquired it through some other process not involving conscience. In fact, on many accounts, conscience does not generate its own moral principles. For example, the moral contents we discover within us can be acquired through divine intervention, as is the case with the laws of nature which, according to Christians, God infuses in our heart. As we are going to see in subsection 3.1 here below, the understanding of conscience as having an epistemic function and as the recipient of mediated knowledge is not exclusive to religious views.

On other accounts of conscience, however, conscience does give us direct access to moral knowledge, for example as an intuition about what is good and what is bad.

Let us examine the two accounts of the epistemic role of conscience in more detail.

3.1 Conscience as a faculty for indirect moral knowledge

In the Christian tradition, starting from Paul, the inward looking character of conscience is emphasized by the metaphor of the witness (Romans 2: 14–15). Conscience does not allow us to acquire the knowledge of the moral law directly from an external source (God in this case), but only to witness the presence of God’s laws within us. Conscience cannot directly contemplate God. The idea of a faculty that gives us indirect, and therefore imperfect knowledge of some external moral authority suits religious traditions very well. For example, the idea that through conscience we discover the true divine laws can also be found in Islam (Geaves 1999: 164).

It is important to note that also in this case, as in the previous understanding of conscience as self-awareness and self-assessment, conscience can be conceived as fulfilling an introspective function, i.e., as being directed towards the self and towards one’s own mental states. Introspection allows one to gain self-knowledge (Schwitzgebel 2014), but since the self which is observed contains the moral law, it is possible to say that the law itself, as part of our self, becomes the object of introspection. Thus, for instance, in his theological writings before his papacy, Joseph Ratzinger said that “something like an original memory of the good and the true (the two are identical) has been implanted in us”, and conscience is

so to speak an inner sense, a capacity to recall, so that the one whom it addresses, if he is not turned in on himself, hears its echo from within. (Ratzinger 1991: 535)

The Catholic Church also makes reference to “the voice of the Lord echoing in the conscience of every individual” (John Paul II 1995: par. 24).

On this account—since conscience is only a witness and does not have direct epistemic access to the source of knowledge, i.e., to God—conscience is considered fallible and actually often erroneous (1 Corinthians 4:4; Aquinas 1265–1274; Butler 1726: sermon 3 (3)). In particular, conscience might fail to correctly interpret the divine laws when applying them to real cases. According to some 13th Century Catholic theologians, such as Philip the Chancellor, Albert the Great and, most notably, Thomas Aquinas, conscience is the act of applying universal principles (i.e., divine laws) to real situations, i.e., it is the conclusion of the practical syllogism whose first premise is a universal principle provided by a separate faculty called “synderesis” (Aquinas, Summa Theologiae, 1 q79; Langston 2000 and 2015; Sorabji 2014: 62–66): as such, conscience can be erroneous in deriving moral conclusions from first principles (Aquinas, On Truth, q17, art. 2, and discussion in D’Arcy 1961: 100–103).

On a secular account, the external source of moral knowledge that instills moral principles in us is not God, but one’s own culture or upbringing. In this case, the moral knowledge in question is typically understood in a relativistic sense: our conscience is the faculty through which the social norms of our culture or the norms of our upbringing are evoked and exert their influence on our moral psychology. These norms explain our moral feelings and our moral choices, but what conscience tells us in this case is the product of social and cultural dynamics over which we have little control. As the case of Huckleberry Finn’s conscience demonstrates, hardly can conscience so understood be credited any moral authority, since our educators or our culture might be highly immoral (for example our conscience might end up drawing on racist or discriminatory principles, such as the ones which supported slavery in Huck’s social environment). And in fact, unsurprisingly, many are rather skeptical or dismissive of the moral authority of conscience, since they see it as mere opinion about moral principles influenced or even determined by one’s own culture (Montaigne 1580: book 1, ch. 22; Hobbes 1651: ch. 7). In this sense, conscience is a merely relativistic notion whose content changes according to social, cultural, and familial circumstances.

3.2 Conscience as a faculty for direct moral knowledge

Contrary to what Montaigne and Hobbes had claimed, Rousseau argued in Emile, or Education that good education can free conscience from the corrupting influences of societies. Actually, one of the aims of education is to render the young autonomous moral thinkers and agents by teaching them how to critically examine and, if necessary, replace received norms (Rousseau 1762; see Sorabji 2014, for a discussion). The idea here is that conscience is what remains of our innate moral sense once we free it from “childish errors” and “prejudices of our upbringing” (Rousseau 1921 [1762]: 253). As Rousseau presents it,

There is therefore at the bottom of our hearts an innate principle of justice and virtue, by which, in spite of our maxims, we judge our own actions or those of others to be good or evil; and it is this principle that I call conscience. (Rousseau 1921 [1762]: 253)

According to Rousseau, then, conscience has a natural tendency to perceive and follow the right order of nature, and a good teacher should help the young’s conscience to do what it is naturally predisposed to do. In Rousseau’s words:

Too often does reason deceive us; we have only too good a right to doubt her; but conscience never deceives us; she is the true guide of man; it is to the soul what instinct is to the body; he who obeys his conscience is following nature and he need not fear that he will go astray… Let us obey the call of nature; we shall see that her yoke is easy and that when we give heed to her voice we find a joy in the answer of a good conscience. (Rousseau 1921 [1762]: 252)

This understanding of conscience as a deeper form of moral knowledge brings us to the second sense in which conscience can be said to have an epistemic role. As well as merely witnessing received opinions or divine laws, conscience can also be conceived as a moral sense giving us direct access to moral principles. Understood in this way, conscience is typically seen as intuitive and influenced by emotions, rather than a reason-based faculty. In particular, 18th Century sentimentalist philosophers often (e.g., Shaftesbury (1711) and Hume (1738–1740)) identified conscience with a moral “sentiment” or moral “sense”. According to Hume’s psychological theory, for instance, “reason is wholly inactive and can never be the source of so active a principle as conscience, or a sense of morals” (Hume 1738–1740: book 3, part 1, section 1). Also on more recent accounts of conscience and of private morality, the dictates of conscience can be understood as expressions of our moral intuitions. According to Thagard and Finn (2011), for instance, “conscience is a kind of moral intuition” (p. 168) that is “both cognitive and emotional”(p.156).

Once again, there are reasons to doubt the epistemic and moral authority of conscience so understood. A lot of work in recent moral psychology aimed at understanding moral disagreement has suggested that there are seemingly irreconcilable differences in fundamental moral intuitions and emotions among people with different worldviews (e.g., Haidt 2012; Greene 2013). These differences in fundamental moral intuitions seem to undermine the epistemic status of conscience and, with it, conscience’s moral authority, not least because most of our moral intuitions seem, according to these recent developments in moral psychology, not to be amenable to revision in light of new evidence or new good reasons. Reasoning, on any plausible account, should be an important part of morality; however, what our conscience tells us may have little to do with reasons and evidence. Theoretical work in moral psychology (e.g., Haidt 2012; Graham et al. 2009; Haidt 2001), supported by evidence from neuroscience (Greene 2013), suggests that our most fundamental moral beliefs might be based on intuitions and emotions over which our rational capacities have little control. If this account is correct, then we have reasons to be skeptical about the possibility of affecting, let alone changing, people’s conscientious beliefs through dialogue, public discussion and reason giving. Psychological research has focused particularly on the differences between liberal and conservative thinking. For example, it has been suggested that conservative moral and political views are often founded on certain specific emotions, e.g., disgust or fears, and specific intuitions, e.g., intuitive opposition to perceived violations of purity and to authority subversion, whereas liberal views are often driven by other specific emotions, e.g., anger, and intuitions, e.g., intuitive rejection of fairness violations or liberty infringements (Haidt 2001 and 2012). If conscience simply is the expression of moral intuition, and if individuals have significantly different and irreconcilable moral intuitions, then individuals also have significantly different and difficult-to-reconcile conscientious moral consciences.

4. Conscience as motivation to act morally

Conscience can also be conceived as our sense of duty. According to this understanding, conscience motivates us to act according to moral principles or beliefs we already possess (e.g., D’Arcy 1963; Childress 1979; McGuire 1963; Fuss 1964). Conscience so understood “establishes a general sense of moral obligation in the individual’s consciousness” (Fuss 1964: 116). The subjective character of conscience implies that the motivational force must come entirely from within the individual, as opposed to sanctions from an external authority.

A powerful motivational source is represented by the feelings that conscience generates in its self-assessment function. As we said at the beginning, the different understandings of conscience presented here are not necessarily mutually exclusive. Conscience as self-assessment and conscience as motivation to act morally constitute a good example of perspectives on conscience which are not only consistent with one another, but which actually complete one another. In Kant, for example, the theory of conscience can be seen as “a motivation theory set in the context of a reflection theory” (Wood 2008: 183): As Wood interprets the Kantian notion of conscience, “conscience is a feeling of pleasure or displeasure associated with myself” that arises when I comply or don’t comply with moral principles and that motivates me to act in one sense rather than the other when the feeling accompanies the contemplation of a certain course of action (Wood 2008: 183–184). Conscience for Kant is therefore not only an inner court, but also the source of our sense of duty in that it takes the judgments of the inner court as motivation to act morally (Kant 1797 [1991]: 161).

More generally, as we have seen in section 1, conscience’s self-assessment often produces remorse or other negative feelings (guilt, shame, fear, and so on). Our desire or tendency to avoid this form of self-punishment can have motivational force towards acting morally. Thus, for instance, according to Childress the motive for acting morally that defines conscience is “in part, avoidance of a sanction imposed by the self on itself” (Childress 1979: 328).

Consistent with this philosophical view are studies in developmental psychology suggesting that the emotion of guilt, which is typically seen as one of the products of conscience as self-assessment, is “the motivational engine that infuses misdeeds with negative personal valence” (Kochanska and Aksan 2006: 1589). Transgression generates anxious feelings in most children, and these negative feelings help children suppress future wrongdoing and internalize the relative moral norms (Damásio 1994, as reported in Kochanska and Aksan 2006: 1595).

However, at the same time, the negative self-directed feelings must themselves be generated by previous experience of tension between our action and a pre-existing sense of duty. Although it might seem that we are stuck in an infinite regress, where sense of duty and negative self-directed feelings presuppose one another, this need not be the case. It is possible to conceive of an external or independent source of that most fundamental sense of duty that constitutes our conscience, such as for example our moral education and upbringing (Mill 1861: ch. 3). But the sense of duty that identifies a conscientious person can also be conceived as a primitive function, an innate disposition which is not explained by any other more fundamental mechanism. In Kant, for instance, “every human being, as a moral being, has a conscience within him originally” (Kant 1797 [1991]: 160), and conscience is one of the four “natural predispositions of the mind (…) for being affected by concepts of duty”, the other three being moral feeling, love for one’s neighbors, and respect for oneself (Kant 1797 [1991]: 160).

Negative feelings and sense of duty are not always successful in prompting agents to do what their moral principles require. But the “bites of conscience”, or just the prospect of bites of conscience, act as motivational force towards aligning our future behavior to those norms. Of course, positive feelings associated with conscience might also have a motivational force. For example, as seen above, Kant associated conscience also with positive feelings about oneself when the agent recognizes he has acted according to his sense of duty. Rousseau, alongside the epistemic account of conscience presented above, also provides in Emile a motivational account of conscience based on positive feelings: while reason gives us knowledge of the good, it is conscience, through a sentiment of love for the good, which motivates us to behave morally (Rousseau 1762).

5. Conscience, self-identifying moral commitments, and moral integrity

The subjective character of conscience delimits a sphere of personal morality that is an essential part of our sense of personal identity, understood as our sense of who we are and of what characterizes qualitatively our individuality (for instance, our character, our psychological traits, our past experience, etc.). My conscience is what makes me this particular individual in a social and cultural context that I want to keep separate from me.

This private space in which the individual finds her own sense of identity often grounds the political use of the notion of conscience. Thus, many people claim the right to stick to their conscience—particularly by advancing so called “conscientious objection”—when social expectations or legal obligations would demand otherwise. These political appeals to conscience are usually made on the basis of two principles. The first is the principle of respect for moral integrity, which finds its justification in the close relationship between the notions of conscience and of moral integrity on one side (Childress 1979), and the sense of personal identity on the other. The second principle often invoked in the political uses of “conscience” is the principle of “freedom of conscience”. The former will be discussed in this section, and the latter in the next section.

The concept of personal identity in the sense in which the notion is used here—i.e what defines me as this particular person in a qualitative sense—is intimately related to the notions of conscience (Wicclair 2011; Childress 1979) and of moral integrity, and more specifically to the “identity view of integrity” (Cox et al. 2013; Williams 1973 and 1981). According to this view, for people to have integrity means to remain faithful to “identity-conferring commitments”, i.e., “commitments that people identify with most deeply, as constituting what they consider their life is fundamentally about” (Cox et al. 2013). This identity-conferring aspect of one’s morality is exactly what some people call “conscience”. According to Childress, for example,

[i]n appealing to conscience I indicate that I am trying to preserve a sense of myself, my wholeness and integrity, my good conscience, and that I cannot preserve these qualities if I submit to certain requirements of the state or society. (Childress 1979: 327)

Conscience as self-identifying can be understood in two ways. It can be thought of either as a set of core and self-identifying moral beliefs that are “integral to an agent’s understanding of who she is (i.e., her self-conception or identity)” (Wicclair 2011: 4), or as a way of approaching and relating to such moral beliefs, i.e., a “commitment to uphold one’s deepest and self-identifying moral beliefs” (Sulmasy 2008: 138) and “a mode of consciousness in which prospective actions are viewed in relation to one’s self and character” (Bluestein 1993: 294).

Conceived in either way, conscience is an essential part of our understanding of what kind of person we are, and this is taken to be a reason for warranting protection of conscience and conscientious objection in different contexts, particularly in the health care professions (Wicclair 2011: 25–26; Bluestein 1993: 295).

We have seen above that there is a sense in which, according to some, psychopaths can be said to lack conscience (Hare 1999): psychopaths are not capable of connecting their moral knowledge to their conduct through the feelings of guilt and disapproval which conscience, on some accounts, produces. Interestingly, according to some psychologists, psychopaths are also less likely to base their sense of personal identity on moral traits than normal functioning individuals (Glenn et al. 2010). More recent psychological studies have suggested that people tend to link the identity of others not so much to their memories, as traditionally believed, but to their morals: it is the loss of one’s moral character and moral beliefs, rather than of one’s memory, that leads us to say that a certain individual is not the same person anymore (Strohminger and Nichols 2015). These findings provide empirical support to the idea that conscience is essential to one’s sense of personal identity and to attributions of personal identity

6. Freedom of conscience

Some people have suggested that appeals to freedom of conscience tend to be more vigorously put forward and more effective in contexts where political or religious structures lose power or moral authority. Thus, for instance, according to C.A. Pierce:

conscience only came into its own in the Greek world after the collapse of the city-state. The close integration of politics with ethics, with the former predominant, was no longer possible: there was no sufficiently close authority, external to the individual, effectively to direct conduct. Consequently, as a pis aller, men fell back on the internal chastisement of the conscience as the only authority. (Pierce 1955: 76)

The same can be said for 17th Century England, with its crisis of religious authority and the frequent appeals to freedom of conscience in the philosophical and political literature of that time (Childress 1979: 326).

There are three main arguments that can be used to defend a principle of freedom of conscience. Two of them are frequently found in the 16th and 17th Century philosophical literature: they are the “argument from ineffectiveness or hypocrisy” and the “argument from ignorance” (Sorabji 2014: 139). A third argument, which might be called “argument from legitimization”, was put forward by John Stuart Mill. Let us examine them in order.

a) The argument from ineffectiveness or hypocrisy is based on the relevance of the distinction between beliefs and acts for the definition of conscience. According to this argument, it is not possible to compel someone to believe or to not believe something, i.e., to change one’s conscientious beliefs. All we can do is compel people to act as if they believed something, which would be a hypocritical behavior. Therefore, if some authority aims to convert people or to change people’s moral views, prohibiting the free expression, through actions, of one’s conscience would not serve this purpose.

This line of argument was often put forward by early Christians, most notably Christian apologist Tertullian, to defend their freedom to practice their cult in a time where they were persecuted by Roman governors: their claim was that forcing them to abandon the Christian cults would have no effect on their conscience. The same line of argument can also be found in Locke’s works on toleration, the Essay Concerning Toleration of 1667 and A Letter Concerning Toleration of 1689.

However, Christians did not seem to believe in the force of this argument, and more generally in the principle of freedom of conscience, when, later on, they attempted to justify the violent persecution of heretics (those who revise their religious dogmas) and apostates (those who abandon their religion) and their forced conversion (Clarke 2014: 118–123). Two main justifications have been given by Christian theologians for the forced conversion of heretics and apostates.

One can be found, among others, in Aquinas and Calvin, who thought that violent persecution is justified because heretics’ mistaken views would exert great influence on many ordinary people. By departing from the Christian doctrine, these people would be condemned to eternal damnation in the afterlife, and Christians have a duty to save as many people as possible from eternal damnation (Clarke 2014: 120–121).

A second type of argument in defense of violent persecution is the one offered by Augustine (5th Century). He argued that compelling people to follow the true religion—by which he meant persecuting heretics—could open their eyes to the truth (Sorabji 2014: 49–50). This thesis implies that sometimes conscience, even if we confine it to matters of inward conviction and not to behavior, can be influenced by some external imposition.

This latter approach based on the idea of bringing the truth to conscience by “freeing” conscience from error is consistent with the Catholic peculiar understanding of the notion of freedom of conscience. Philosophically speaking, “freedom of conscience” is typically understood as an individualistic concept that allows for a plurality of moral and religious views (Strohm 2011: 90). For the Catholic Church, however, authentic freedom is inseparable from the notion of truth. Inspired by the works of the English theologian and cardinal John Henry Newman, Joseph Ratzinger writes that in the Catholic view “truth” is the middle term that reconciles authority of God and subjectivity of conscience: the latter, when authentically free, cannot but reveal the truth established by the former (Ratzinger 1991). Since, as we have seen above, in the Catholic view reason alone can’t create its own values, which are instilled by God into humans’ hearts, “human freedom finds its authentic and complete fulfillment precisely in the acceptance of that law” of God (John Paul II 1993: par. 35). So when practical reason is free to exercise its “participation” (John Paul II 1993: sec. 40) in the divine law, then “in the depths of his conscience, man detects a law which he does not impose upon himself, but which holds him to obedience” (Paul VI 1965: par. 16).

In any case, it is not necessary to dismiss the argument from ineffectiveness in order to justify imposing norms and practices that might violate individuals’ conscience. Actually, the same argument from ineffectiveness can be used to support the imposition of policies that might conflict with individuals’ consciences. On the basis of the idea that conscience is merely a matter of private beliefs, not of action, some authors have argued that compelling people to follow certain rules even against their conscience would not constitute a violation of their freedom of conscience, and is therefore justifiable. This was the line of argument pursued, for example, by Thomas Hobbes (1651: chapter 40), Baruch Spinoza (1670: chapter 20) and John Locke (1660), who argued that the State has the power to enforce certain practices even when citizens claim that it would violate their conscience, in order to protect social order.

b) The “argument from ignorance”, which might be better labeled “argument from humility”, is based on a skeptical approach to the content of conscience. The possibility exists that what we conscientiously believe is wrong and that those holding conscientious beliefs opposite to ours are right. Therefore, there is a reason for not forcing anyone to believe in something or to engage in behaviors that might turn out to be morally wrong. The argument from ignorance or humility started to be put forward quite frequently, and most prominently by Pierre Bayle (1686–1688), after the Catholic Church lost a significant proportion of its religious and moral authority following the Protestant reform in 16th and 17th Century—which was defined by Keith Thomas (1993) as “the age of conscience”. It was at that time that we assisted to the “secularization of conscience” in the modern era (Strohm 2011), although the phenomenon would be better conceived of as a “re-secularization”, since conscience was not related to the voice or the authority of God in the Greek world.

The same argument from ignorance or from humility is also put forward by John Locke in his Second Letter Concerning Toleration. Locke had to rely on this argument as an alternative strategy to defend freedom of conscience after the Anglican priest Jonas Proast pointed out that compulsion can actually change personal beliefs (as Augustine had argued), and that therefore the argument from ineffectiveness that Locke had used in his first Letter fails (Sorabji 2014: 151).

A version of the argument from ignorance can also be found in contemporary defenses of conscientious objection in an age where pluralism of worldviews is acknowledged and actually supported. For example, Sulmasy appeals to epistemic humility as “true basis of tolerance” (Sulmasy 2008: 144) in his arguments in support of a right to conscientious objection in health care.

c) Finally, the third argument in defense of freedom of conscience is what I have called above the “argument from legitimization”. John Stuart Mill (1859) defended freedom of conscience by appealing to the idea that allowing the free expression of any opinion, and particularly mistaken opinions, would allow truth to emerge more clearly and would provide us with a justification for acting upon our own beliefs, once they have been assessed against others’ opinions. As put by Mill,

[c]omplete liberty of contradicting and disproving our opinion, is the very condition which justifies us in assuming its truth for purposes of action; and on no other terms can a being with human faculties have any rational assurance of being right. (Mill 1859: ch. 2)

6.1 Freedom of conscience and conscientious objection today

Freedom of conscience is today protected by the United Nations Universal Declaration of Human Rights, which reads: “Everyone has the right to freedom of thought, conscience and religion” (art. 18).

According to Strohm, this article should not be taken to imply freedom to act according to one’s conscience, but it only refers to “matters of inward conviction” (Strohm 2011: 88). If this interpretation is correct, article 18 does not seem to raise any interesting philosophical or practical problem today, as very few people today would deny freedom in matters of inward conviction. More problematic is the moral and political debate about the freedom to act, or to refrain from acting, according to one’s conscience, especially where there are professional roles or legal obligations that would demand otherwise. In fact, appeals to conscience and freedom of conscience are often deployed to claim and justify “conscientious objection” to certain activities that someone would otherwise be required to perform.

One example is conscientious objection to the military service where conscription is in place. Although originally conscientious objection to war was mainly a religious issue (the Quakers were the most famous group of conscientious objectors to war), in more recent times the objection to war has been put forward and granted without explicit reference to any religious justification (Moskos and Chamber 1993).

As most States have now abolished conscription, appeals to freedom of conscience and to conscientious objection today can be found mainly in debates in medical ethics with regard to health practitioners who conscientiously object to performing medical procedures they morally oppose, such as abortions (for overviews of the debate in medical ethics, see Wicclair 2011; Wester 2015).

According to those who are against a right to conscientious objection, professional obligations trump any value conscience might have and any principle that might justify conscientious objection qua conscientious (e.g., Savulescu 2006; Giubilini 2014 and 2017, Savulescu and Schuklenk 2017); according to defenders of conscientious objection, professionals’ conscience must be protected to the largest extent possible, i.e., up to the point where respecting conscience would significantly jeopardize physical or psychological health of patients (e.g., Sulmasy 2008; Wicclair 2011), a compromise that, depending on circumstances—for example a too high percentage of objecting practitioners which would make it nearly impossible to refer patients to non-objecting doctors—might be very difficult to achieve (Minerva 2015). Between these two stances, there are positions that are neither for nor against conscientious objection in principle, but pose tighter restrictions to those who advance conscientious objection (McLeod 2020), for example the requirement to provide reasons for the objection, and to submit such reasons to public scrutiny or experts’ assessment of the reasonability of one’s objection (Card 2007, Card 2020), or the qualification that objection can only be justified if consistent with the internal values of the profession (Wicclair 2000; Deans 2013).

However, if it is the validity or the soundness of the reasons provided which is considered relevant for the justification of conscientious objection, it seems that the value of conscience and the principle of freedom of conscience are no longer at stake. What makes an objection good or bad, acceptable or unacceptable, has nothing to do with its being conscientious, unless we add a “genuineness requirement” (e.g., Meyers and Woods 1996) to an assessment of the legitimacy of a conscientious objection, whereby professional need to demonstrate that the moral beliefs at stake are deeply and sincerity held. The interesting question in this case would be whether a test can be devised that can reliably track genuine conscientious objections.

7. Conclusion

There is no such a thing as the notion of conscience, both in a philosophical and in a psychological sense. As we have seen, the concept of conscience has been given different interpretations throughout history, sometimes on the basis of underlying systematic philosophical theories of the mind and of morality, and sometimes serving religious or political purposes.

This lack of uniformity is not only a problem for historians and theoretical philosophers. Because it cannot be immediately clear what we are talking about when we talk of conscience, of freedom of conscience, or of conscientious objection, it is important that clarity is made every time conscience is appealed to in different branches of applied philosophy (particularly medical ethics) and in public debates alike.

This entry has presented a conceptual map, rather than a historical account, of conscience, which can provide some guidance for those engaged in this clarificatory task. One of the benefits of clarifying concepts, and clarifying them in the different circumstances in which they are used, is their subsequent demystification.

Conscience needs to be demystified, since it is one of those concepts that tend to elicit reverence rather than questions or an interest in further inquiry. As seen above, appeals to conscience often replace reason giving and are made with the expectation that no further reason for one’s decisions and positions is requested. This attitude is also displayed in many legislative approaches dealing with the notion of conscience; in particular, legislations about conscientious objection in health care typically grant doctors a right to object to performing certain professional activities (e.g., conscientious objection to abortion) without requiring them to provide reasons for their objection, let alone submitting reasons to some form of assessment.

This entry has distinguished four main understandings of conscience, drawing on the philosophical tradition of the concept. Whether the concept is to be understood as a faculty for self-knowledge and self-assessment, or as having an epistemic function in the sphere of morality, or as a motivational force, or again as a set of self-identifying moral beliefs, or a combination of any of these characterizations, it is important to have clear in mind what exactly we are talking about when we talk of conscience and of freedom of conscience in each circumstance.

Far from being a conversation-stopper, conscience can only find its proper place in philosophical and in public discussion if its philosophical and psychological aspects are teased out, defined and assessed. Appeals to conscience can only be part of philosophical, political, and legal discussion if they are seen as the start, not the end of discussions.


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