First published Mon Apr 22, 2002; substantive revision Thu Jun 29, 2023

Smiles, walks, dances, weddings, explosions, hiccups, hand-waves, arrivals and departures, births and deaths, thunder and lightning: the variety of the world seems to lie not only in the assortment of its ordinary citizens—animals, physical objects, social creatures of various kinds—but also in the sort of things that happen to or are performed by them. In contemporary philosophy, this view has been a focus of considerable debate, with implications reaching far into the concern of other disciplines as well, above all linguistics and the cognitive sciences. Indeed, there is little question that human perception, action, language, and thought manifest at least a prima facie commitment to entities of this sort:

  • Pre-linguistic infants appear to be able to discriminate and “count” events, and the content of adult perception, especially in the auditory realm, endorses the discrimination and recognition as events of some aspects of the perceived scene.
  • Humans (and, presumably, other animals) appear to form intentions to plan and execute actions, and to bring about events in the external world.
  • Dedicated linguistic devices (such as verb tenses and aspects, nominalization of some verbs, certain proper names) are tuned to events and event structures, as opposed to entities and structures of other sorts.
  • Thinking about the temporal and causal aspects of the world seems to require parsing those aspects in terms of events and their descriptions.

It is, however, unclear to what extent such prima facie commitments add up to an integrated phenomenon, as opposed to separate, independent dispositions. Moreover, even among those who favor a realist attitude towards the ontological status of events, there is significant disagreement concerning the precise nature of such entities. (Their broad characterization as ‘things that happen’, though commonly found in dictionaries, merely shifts the burden to the task of clarifying the meaning of ‘happen’.) One useful approach is to set them against entities belonging to other, philosophically more familiar, metaphysical categories. In the following we review the main contrasts between events and those categories that in the literature have been put forward explicitly as their ontological competitors, or at least as categories exhibiting significant differences with the category of events. Along the way, we shall also review the main conceptual tools that metaphysicians and other philosophers have adopted in their attempts to deal with events, either from a realist or from a non-realist perspective.

1. Events and Other Categories

1.1 Events vs. Objects

Although not undisputed, some standard differences between events and physical objects are commonplace in the philosophical literature. First, there would seem to be a difference in their respective modes of being: material objects such as stones and chairs are said to exist; events are said to occur or happen or take place (Hacker 1982a; Cresswell 1986). Second, there would seem to be differences in the way objects and events relate to space and time. Ordinary objects are supposed to have relatively crisp spatial boundaries and vague temporal boundaries; events, by contrast, would have relatively vague spatial boundaries and crisp temporal boundaries. Objects are said to be invidiously located in space—they occupy their spatial location; events tolerate co-location much more easily (Quinton 1979; Hacker 1982b). Objects can move; events cannot (Dretske 1967). Finally, objects are standardly construed as enduring continuants—they are in time and persist through time by being wholly present at every time at which they exist; events are perduring occurrents—they take up time and persist by having different parts or “stages” at different times (Johnson 1921; Mellor 1980; Simons 2000).

The last distinction is perhaps the most controversial. On the one hand, there are philosophers—from Whitehead (1919), Broad (1923), and Russell (1927) to Quine (1950), Lewis (1986c), Heller (1990), Sider (2001) and many others—who conceive of objects as four-dimensional entities that extend across time just as they extend across space. Some such philosophers would accordingly draw no metaphysically significant distinction between objects and events, treating both as entities of the same kind: an object would simply be a “monotonous” event; an event would be an “unstable” object (Goodman 1951). More generally, the relevant distinction would be one of degree, and while ‘event’ is standardly applied to things that develop and change fast in time, ‘object’ would apply to those things that strike us as “firm and internally coherent” (Quine 1970). On the other hand, there are also philosophers who reject the distinction on the side of events, by construing at least some such entities—e.g., processes—as continuants: what is present at any moment when an apple is decaying or a person is walking down the street is the whole enduring process, not just part of it (Roberts 1979; Stout 1997, 2003, 2016; Galton 2006a,b, 2008; Galton & Mizoguchi 2009; Kassel 2019). This view, in turn, admits of several variants and alternatives, e.g. based on different ways of understanding the notion of a continuant (Steward 2013, 2015) or its relation to the stuff of which a continuant is composed (Crowther 2011, 2018).

If a metaphysical distinction between objects and events is granted, then a question arises as to the relation between the entities in the two categories. Objects are prime actors in events; objectless events are uncommon. But so are eventless objects; events make up the lives of objects. In a radical mood, however, one may think of the entities in one category as being metaphysically dependent on entities in the other. For instance, it has been claimed that events supervene on their participants (Lombard 1986; Bennett 1988) as it has been claimed that objects depend for their existence on the events in which they participate (Deleuze 1969; Parsons 1991), or that they exist at any given time just insofar as they participate in some events occurring at that time (Costa 2017). In a more moderate way, one can grant objects and events an equal ontological status but maintain that either objects or events are primary in the order of thought. Thus, it has been argued that a pure event-based ontology would not be sufficient for the success of our re-identifying practices, which require a stable frame of reference of the sort that is adequately provided only by objects (Strawson 1959). A similar asymmetry between objects and events seems to be endorsed by natural language, which has expressions such as ‘the fall of the apple’ but not ‘the pomification of the fall’. However, these asymmetries may be attenuated to the extent that objects, too, may and sometimes must be identified via reference to events. For example, if we track down the father of Sebastian or the author of Waverley, it is by identifying certain events in the first place—of fathering and of writing, respectively (Moravcsik 1965; Davidson 1969; Lycan 1970; Thalberg 1978; Tiles 1981).

1.2 Events vs. Facts

No matter what their relationships, events are naturally contrasted with objects insofar as both are conceived of as individuals. Both appear to be concrete, temporally and spatially located entities organized into part-whole hierarchies. Both can be counted, compared, quantified over, referred to, and variously described and re-described. (It has been argued that our conceptions of these two categories are so closely tied as to be structurally complementary, in that any characterization of the concept event that only mentions spatial and temporal features yields a characterization of the concept object by a simple replacement of temporal with spatial predicates, and vice versa; see Mayo 1961.) Accordingly, events are generally distinguished from facts, too, which are characterized by features of abstractness and a-temporality: the event of Caesar’s death took place in Rome in 44 BCE, but that Caesar died is a fact here as it is in Rome, today as in 44 BCE (Dodd 2009). One could indeed speculate that for every event there is a companion fact, viz. the fact that the event took place (Bennett 1988), but the two would still be categorially distinct. The death of Caesar must no more be confused with the fact that Caesar died than the Queen of England should be confused with the fact that England has a Queen (Ramsey 1927).

According to some authors, this categorial distinction is actually reflected in the different sorts of expressions through which facts and events are referred to in ordinary language. In the terminology of Vendler (1967), ‘Caesar’s death’ is a perfect nominal: the process of nominalization is complete and the expression can only be modified by adjectival phrases (‘Caesar’s violent death’). By contrast, a gerundive such as ‘Caesar’s dying’, or a that-clause such as ‘that Caesar died’, are imperfect nominals that still have “a verb alive and kicking inside them”: they can therefore tolerate tenses and auxiliaries (‘Caesar’s having died’, ‘That Caesar might die’), adverbs (‘Caesar’s dying violently’), negation (‘Caesar’s not dying’), etc. With some qualifications (e.g. McCann 1979), the metaphysical hypothesis would be that, as a norm, perfect nominals stand for events, whereas facts or states of affairs are the referents of imperfect nominals.

Some philosophers, however, conceive of the link between events and facts as being much closer than this—close enough to justify assimilating the two categories (Wilson 1974; Tegtmeier 2000) or at least treating both as species of the same “state of affairs” genus (Chisholm 1970). This has two main consequences. On the one hand, because facts corresponding to non-equivalent propositions are distinct, events conceived of as facts or fact-like particulars are fine-grained entities that cannot be freely re-described or re-identified under different conceptualizations: the fact that Caesar died violently is different from the fact that he died, hence the death of Caesar and his violent death would be two different events (Chisholm 1971), as opposed to one and the same event under different descriptions (Davidson 1969; Anscombe 1979). On the other hand, because linguistic expressions of facts are semantically transparent, a Fregean line of argument could be concocted to show instead that events construed as facts are too coarse-grained, to the point of melting into a single “big” entity (Davidson 1967a). (The argument is known as the “slingshot argument”, following Barwise & Perry 1981; for details, see Neale 2001.)

Other philosophers have insisted on distinguishing events from facts but have given accounts that effectively amount to an assimilation. This is true especially of those theories that construe events as property exemplifications, i.e., exemplifications of properties by objects at times (Kim 1966, 1969; Martin 1969; Goldman 1970; Taylor 1985; Hendrickson 2006). On such theories, events are individual entities. But because they have a structure, a difference in any constituent is sufficient to yield a different event. In particular, a difference in the relevant constitutive property is sufficient to distinguish events such as Caesar’s death, construed as Caesar’s exemplification of the property of dying, and Caesar’s violent death, construed as his exemplification of the property of dying violently (Kim 1976). Again, this makes events virtually as fine-grained as facts. It bears emphasis, however, that this consequence is not intrinsic to the theory of events as property exemplifications. Both Caesar’s death and his violent death could be construed as Caesar’s exemplification of one and the same property P, describable both as a dying and—with greater accuracy—as a dying violently. Thus, even if construed as a structured complex, an event can be coarsely referred to insofar as its names need not be sensitive to this structure (Bennett 1988). In this way, the distinction between events and facts can be reinstated in terms of a firm distinction between semantic and metaphysical aspects (respectively) of the theory of event-descriptions.

Similar considerations apply to those theories that treat events as situations, in the sense familiar from situation semantics (Barwise & Perry 1983). On such theories, events are construed as sets of functions from spatiotemporal locations to “situation types” defined as sequences of objects standing or failing to stand in a certain relation. But while the formal machinery delivers a fine-grained account, the algorithm for applying the machinery to natural language sentences leaves room for flexibility.

1.3 Events vs. Properties

A third metaphysical category with which events have sometimes been contrasted is that of properties. If events are individuals, then they are not properties, at least insofar as properties are construed as universals. Individuals exist or occur whereas universals recur. However, some philosophers have taken very seriously the intuition that in some cases events may be said to recur, as when we say that the sun rises every morning (Chisholm 1970; Braude 1971; Johnson 1975; Brandl 1997, 2000). If so, then it is natural to think of events as being more similar to properties than to individuals, similar enough to justify treating them as a kind of property—e.g., as properties of moments or intervals of time (Montague 1969), properties of cross-world classes of individuals (Lewis 1986b), or properties of sets of world segments (von Kutschera 1993). For instance, on the first of these accounts, the event of the sun’s rising is the property of being an interval during which the sun rises. As a characterization of event types, this would be uncontroversial and would allow one to construe particular events as tokens of the corresponding type. (One such construal would correspond to the above-mentioned conception of events as property exemplifications.) But to conceive of events as universal properties is to go beyond this uncontroversial fact and to reject the existence of event tokens altogether, even when it comes to “particular” events such as the unique rising of the sun that we witnessed this morning. Rather than an instance of the universal sun rising, such an event would be a universal in its own right, albeit a universal of such a restricted sort and of such a degree of singularity as to be instantiated only once.

One possible view about properties is that they are not universals but rather particulars of a special sort—viz. abstract particulars (Stout 1923) or tropes (Williams 1953). According to this view, the redness of this apple is different from the redness of anything else, not because of its extreme singularity (other things could agree with the apple colorwise) but because it is the redness of this apple. It exists here and now, where and while the apple exists. Likewise, this morning’s rising of the sun would be numerically different from (though qualitatively similar to) any other morning’s rising of the sun. If so, then the view that events are properties becomes compatible with the view that they are spatiotemporally located. An event would just be a particularized property located at some region of space-time (Bennett 1996). (Once again, this conception is closely related to the conception of events as property exemplifications, although the term ‘exemplification’ suggests a construal of properties as universals. Some authors, e.g. Bennett 1988, actually identify the two conceptions; others, e.g. Macdonald 1989, reject the identification on account of the difference between property instances and property exemplifications.)

A variant of the trope conception construes events as trope sequences (Campbell 1981). However, since tropes are particulars, a sequence of tropes at a place may itself be viewed as a trope, hence this variant is best regarded as a specification of what sort of tropes events are. Similar remarks apply to those theories that construe events as relational tropes (Mertz 1996), or even as higher-order tropes (Moltmann 2013).

1.4 Events vs. Times

The intuition that events are properties of times can also be fleshed out in terms of thinner metaphysical commitments, by construing events simply as times cum description, i.e., as temporal instants or intervals during which certain statements hold (van Benthem 1983). On this view, for example, this morning’s rising of the sun is identified by an ordered pair <i,φ> where i is the relevant time interval (corresponding to the descriptor ‘this morning’) and φ is the sentence ‘The sun rises’. Of course, this treatment does not do justice to some of the intuitions underlying the prima facie commitments to events mentioned at the beginning—for instance, events can be perceived but times cannot (Gibson 1975). But because of the availability of fully developed theories of intervals along with fully developed interval-based semantics (Cresswell 1979; Dowty 1979), and because of equally well worked-out traditional theories of instants and instant-based semantics (Prior 1967), such accounts are especially attractive from a reductionist perspective. One might even want to construe events as spatiotemporal regions cum description, distinguishing, e.g., between this morning’s rising of the sun in London and its rising in Paris.

The link between events and times has, however, been explored also in the opposite direction. If events are assumed as a primitive ontological category, then one may dispense with temporal instants or intervals and construe them as derived entities. The most classical treatment of this sort proceeds by construing temporal instants as maximal sets of pairwise simultaneous (or partially simultaneous) events (Russell 1914; Whitehead 1929; Walker 1947), but other treatments are possible. For example, it has been suggested that the mathematical connection between the way events are perceived to be ordered and the underlying temporal dimension is essentially that of a free construction (in the category-theoretic sense) of linear orderings from event orderings, induced by the binary relation x wholly precedes y (Thomason 1984, 1989). Treatments such as these provide a reduction of time in terms of relations among events and are therefore especially germane to a relational conception of time (and, more generally, of space-time). Modal variants (Forbes 1993) as well as mereotopological variants (Pianesi & Varzi 1996) of such views are also available.

2. Types of Events

2.1 Activities, Accomplishments, Achievements, and States

Philosophers who agree with a conception of events as particulars typically distinguish different sorts of such particulars. A classic typology distinguishes four sorts: activities, accomplishments, achievements, and states (Ryle 1949; Vendler 1957). An activity, such as Anita’s walking uphill, is a homogeneous event: its sub-events satisfy the same description as the activity itself, which has no natural finishing point or culmination. An accomplishment, such as Anita’s climbing the mountain, may have a culmination, but is never homogeneous. An achievement, such as Anita’s reaching the top, is a culminating event (and is therefore always instantaneous). And a state, such as Anita’s knowing the shortest way, is homogeneous and may extend over time, but it makes no sense to ask how long it took or whether it culminated. Sometimes accomplishments and achievements are grouped together into a single category of performances (Kenny 1963). Sometimes achievements have also been called events tout court and all other events have been grouped together into a broadly understood category of temporally extended entities, called processes (Ingarden 1935); the word ‘eventuality’ may then be used as a label covering both categories (Bach 1986).

Some authors introduce aspectual considerations into the taxonomy, drawing on Aristotle’s distinction between Energeia and Kinêsis (Ackrill 1965). The idea is that different verbs describe different types of events: verbs with no continuous form (‘know’) correspond to states; verbs with continuous form for which the present continuous entails the past perfect (‘Anita is walking uphill’ entails ‘Anita walked uphill’) correspond to activities; and verbs for which the present continuous entails the negation of the past perfect (‘Anita is climbing the mountain’ entails ‘Anita has not (yet) climbed the mountain’, at least in the relevant context) correspond to performances (Potts 1965; Taylor 1965; Evans 1967; Mourelatos 1978; Graham 1980). This basic taxonomy can be refined in various ways (see Mittwoch 2019 for an overview) and several linguistically sophisticated theories of verb tense and aspect have been developed on such grounds (see, inter alia, Comrie 1976; Taylor 1977; Dowty 1979; Declerck 1979; Freed 1979; Bach 1981; Mittwoch 1988; Galton 1984; Krifka 1989; Verkuyl 1989; Smith 1991; Giorgi & Pianesi 1998; Kühl 2008). However, the legitimacy of drawing ontological categorizations from such linguistic distinctions has been questioned (Gill 1993).

2.2 Static and Dynamic Events

One may also want to distinguish between dynamic events, such as Anita’s walking, and static events, such as Anita’s resting under a tree. According to some authors, the latter are not events proper because they do not involve any change (Ducasse 1926). In the most abstract construal, a change is an ordered pair of states of affairs: an initial state and an end state (von Wright 1963). More substantial accounts of events as changes describe them as exemplifications of dynamic properties, i.e., properties that an object has by virtue of a “movement” in some quality space (Quinton 1979; Lombard 1979, 1986). However, the question of whether all events should be or involve changes of some sort is controversial (Montmarquet 1980; Steward 1997; Mellor 1998; Simons 2003) and it may be argued that it is ultimately a matter of stipulation—hence of little metaphysical import (Casati & Varzi 2008).

If static events are admitted, the question arises of whether they should be kept distinct from states (Parsons 1989; Maienborn 2019). One plausible assumption is that the distinction between the static and the dynamic aspects of the world is skew to the distinction between states and activities. As there may be static activities, so there may be dynamic states. Walking is a state of Anita’s that is dynamic, as opposed to her state of resting, which is static. The walk itself is an activity of Anita’s that is dynamic, as opposed to the rest she took under a tree, which may be considered a static activity.

2.3 Actions and Bodily Movements

Prima facie, actions are naturally categorized as a subclass of events, namely, animate events. Like all events, actions are said to occur or take place, not to exist, and their relation to time and space is event-like as well: they have relatively clear beginnings and endings but unclear spatial boundaries, they appear to tolerate co-location, and they cannot be said to move from one place to another or to endure from one time to another, but rather extend in space and time by having spatial as well as temporal parts (Thomson 1977). Actions and events appear to be on a par in causal explanations, too: actions can be causes of which events are effects (Davidson 1963, 1967b). Some authors, however, prefer to draw a distinction here and to treat actions as relations between agents and events, namely as instances of the relation ‘bringing about’ (von Wright 1963; Chisholm 1964; Bach 1980; Bishop 1983; Segerberg 1989), or perhaps the relation ‘seeing to it that’ (Belnap and Perloff 1988; Tuomela and Sandu 1994; Horty 2001). On such views, actions are not individuals unless relations are themselves construed as tropes.

Whether or not actions are treated as events, one might be tempted to distinguish between actions proper (such as Anita’s raising of her arm) and bodily movements (such as the rising of Anita’s arm), or between intentional actions (Anita’s walk) and unintentional ones (Anita’s fall). For some authors, this is necessary in order to explain important facts of human behavior (Montmarquet 1978; Hornsby 1980a,b; Searle 1983; Brand 1984; Mele 1997). It has been argued, for example, that the relationship between an action and the corresponding bodily movement is not one of identity but, rather, an asymmetric relation of generation (Goldman 1970), or of mereological inclusion (Thomson 1977), or of physical constitution (Evnine 2016), or of embodiment (Fine 2022). Or perhaps the relationship is more complex: all actions would be sequences of the form volition-cause-bodily movement (Moore 1993), or structured events that begin in the brain and end with the body’s moving (Smith 2021). However, it has also been argued that such distinctions do not pertain to metaphysics but rather to the conceptual apparatus by means of which we describe the realm of things that happen. On this view, an arm raising is just an arm’s rising under a mentalistic description (Anscombe 1957, 1979; Davidson 1971; Sher 1973).

2.4 Mental and Physical Events

A similar story applies to the distinction between mental events (Anita’s decision to wear boots) and physical or physiological events (such and such neurons firing). One may think that this distinction is real insofar as events of the latter sort are expected to fall naturally into the nomological net of physical theories whereas the former seem to escape it. But one may also want to resist this line of thought and maintain that the distinction between the mental and the physical concerns exclusively the vocabulary with which we describe what goes on. These options have important ramifications for various issues in the philosophy of mind—e.g., issues of mental causation (Heil & Mele 1993; Walter & Heckmann 2003; Gibb et al. 2013). If the distinction between mental and physical events is ontologically significant, then the question arises of how these two sorts of event causally interact with each other, leading to various forms of nomological or anomalous dualism (Foster 1991). By contrast, the claim that the distinction is purely semantic is congenial to a monist position, whether nomological or anomalous (Macdonald 1989).

Anomalous monism has been popular especially among philosophers who accept a particularist conception of events as widely redescribable entities, for such a conception allows one to accept the materialist claim that all events are physical (regardless of whether one describes them in mentalistic terms) while rejecting the seeming consequence that mental goings-on can be given purely physical explanations (precisely because only a physicalistic vocabulary is suited to such explanations) (Nagel 1965; Davidson 1970, 1993). Some authors, however, have argued that this line of argument falls prey to the charge of epiphenomenalism, to the effect that mental events would lack causal or explanatory powers altogether (Honderich 1982; Robinson 1982; Kim 1989; Campbell 1998, 2005; Welshon 1999).

2.5 Negative Events

Events are things that happen. In some cases, however, the same sort of prima facie evidence that suggests a realist attitude towards such things might suggest a similar attitude towards things that do not actually happen, including “negative actions” of various sorts (Danto 1966; Ryle 1973). We speak of Anita’s walk with the same easiness with which we speak of the talk she did not deliver, the nap she did not take, the party she failed to organize; we seem to quantify over such things, and we normally engage in causal talk that seems to refer explicitly to negative causes, as when we reason that Anita’s failure to turn off the gas caused an explosion, or that her omitting the cutlery from the wedding list made Susan angry. Some authors take such evidence at face value, drawing a distinction at the ontological level: a good inventory of the world ought to include “negative” events and actions along with ordinary, “positive” ones (Lee 1978; Vermazen 1985; De Swart 1996; Przepiórkowski 1999; Higginbotham 2000; Mossel 2009; Silver 2018; Bernard & Champollion 2018). Others dissent: we often speak as though there were such things, but deep down we want our words to be interpreted in such a way as to avoid ontological commitment. Thus, either we are just engaging in mere counterfactual speculations, or else the putative negative events are just ordinary, positive events under a negative description: ‘Anita’s omitting the cutlery from the wedding list’, for example, would refer to her drawing up a wedding list that contains no cutlery, ‘Mary’s not moving’ would describe Mary’s working hard to master urges to move, etc. (Mele 2005; Varzi 2008). The latter view can also be construed in metaphysical (as opposed to semantic) terms, at least in some cases: for x to omit to φ (refrain from φ-ing, etc.) at t would be for x to ensure, through their actual behavior, that they do not φ at t (Payton 2016, 2018).

The case of negative causation is especially challenging, not last because of the link between causation and such ethical and legal matters as passive killing (Bennett 1966; Green 1980; Foot 1984), good Samaritanism (Kleinig 1976) and, more generally, moral responsibility (Weinryb 1980; Walton 1980; Williams 1995; Fischer 1997; Clarke 2014). Here it is also customary to introduce finer-grained discriminations, distinguishing several ways in which an agent may fail to do something, e.g. (trying and) not succeeding, refraining, omitting, and allowing (Brand 1971; Milanich 1984; Hall 1984; Bach 2010). At least with regard to some such ways, it is very tempting to endorse a realist ontology. If so, the difficulty naturally arises of how and where to draw the line. For example, the realist about omissions will have to find a principled way of refraining from treating all omissions, including non-salient ones, as causes (Gorr 1979; Lewis 1986a, 2004; Thomson 2003; Menzies 2004; McGrath 2005; Sartorio 2009; Bernstein 2014). On the other hand, the antirealist will have to explain how one can account for such causal talk while holding on to the view that every causal situation develops from “positive factors alone” (Armstrong 1999). Some would insist that every alleged case of negative causation can be described in terms of positive causation (Laliberté 2013). Others—the majority—would resist ontological commitment by recasting the logical structure of the relevant causal claims in suitable ways, e.g. as causal statements about events that are counterfactually described (Hunt 2005), or as “quasi-causal” claims about what would have been a cause if the omitted event had happened (Dowe 2001), or as mere causal explanations in which the explanans does not stand to the explanandum as cause to effect (Beebee 2004; Varzi 2007; Lombard & Hudson 2020).

3. Event Metaphysics and Semantics

3.1 Existence

As mentioned in the Introduction, one finds a prima facie commitment to events in various aspects of human perception, action, language, and thought. In the contemporary philosophical literature however, the main line of argument offered to back up this commitment comes from considerations of logical form. Not only does ordinary talk involve explicit reference to and quantification over events, as when one says that Caesar’s death was violent or that two explosions were heard last night. Ordinary talk also seems to involve several ways of adverting to events implicitly. Adverbial modification is a standard example (Reichenbach 1947; Prior 1949; Kenny 1963). We say that Brutus stabbed Caesar with a knife. If this statement is taken to assert that a certain three-place relation obtains among Brutus, Caesar, and a knife, then it is hard to explain why the statement entails that Brutus stabbed Caesar (a statement that involves a different, two-place relation). By contrast, if we take our statement to assert that a certain event occurred (namely, a stabbing of Caesar by Brutus) and that it had a certain property (namely, of being done with a knife), then the entailment is straightforward (Davidson 1967a; Parsons 1985). Similarly for static events, as with the inference from ‘Brutus is in the park under the tree’ to ‘Brutus is in the park’ (Parsons 1988). These reasons do not constitute a proof that there are such entities as events. But they are telling insofar as one is interested in an account of how it is that certain statements mean what they mean, where the meaning of a statement is at least in part determined by its logical relations to other statements. For another example, it has been argued that singular causal statements cannot be analyzed in terms of a causal connective (essentially for reasons having to do with the above-mentioned slingshot argument) but rather require that causation be treated as a binary relation holding between individual events (Davidson 1967b). A third example involves the semantics of perceptual reports with naked infinitive complements, as in ‘Cassius saw Brutus flee’, which is analyzed as ‘Cassius saw an event that was a fleeing by Brutus’ (Higginbotham 1983; Vlach 1983; Gisborne 2010). Still a fourth example involves the logical form of statements with plural subjects, such as ‘Brutus and Cassius lifted a heavy stone (together)’, which is analyzed as reporting, not the exploits of a “plural object”, but rather an event involving more than one agent (Higginbotham & Schein 1986; Schein 1993; Lasersohn 1990, 1995; Landman 1996, 2000). Many more such arguments have been offered, also by authors working within different programs in linguistics (Parsons 1990; Peterson 1997; Rothstein 1998; Link 1998; Higginbotham et al. 2000; Pietroski 2005; Mittwoch 2005; van Lambalgen & Hamm 2005; Robering 2014).

On the other hand, some philosophers have been dissatisfied with this sort of “existential proof” and have argued instead that all talk that seems to involve explicit or implicit reference to or quantification over events can be paraphrased so as to avoid the commitment. For example, it has been argued that a term such as ‘Anita’s walk’ goes proxy for the corresponding statement ‘Anita walked’, so to say that Anita’s walk was pleasant is just to say that Anita walked pleasantly (Geach 1965). Similar paraphrases have been offered to deal with the case of explicit quantifier-phrases such as ‘two explosions’ as well as with the implicit event quantification that lies behind adverb-dropping inferences (Parsons 1970; Clark 1970, 1974; Schwartz 1975; Fulton 1979; Graves 1994), singular causal statements (Horgan 1978, 1982; Wilson 1985, Needham 1988, 1994, Mellor 1991, 1995), and so on. On the face of it, it appears that questions of logical form leave the existential issue undecided, at least insofar as an event-committing analysis automatically turns into an eliminativist paraphrase when read in the opposite direction (and vice versa). Even the absence of suitable paraphrases may be seen as a mere linguistic limitation that should not force us to “accept” events into our ontology (Melia 2000), just as avoiding commitment via paraphrase may not be a reason to “reject” them (Goldwater 2023).

3.2 Identity

Another issue that appears to be undecided concerns so-called identity criteria for events, which has been the focus of an intense debate (Bradie 1983; Pfeifer 1989; Mackie 1997). Is Anita’s walk the same event as her pleasant walk? Was Brutus’s stabbing of Caesar the same event as his killing of Caesar? Was it the same as his killing of the last Roman dictator? Was it the same as the one and only assassination that took place in the Roman Senate on the Ides of March, 44 BCE? (Or again, with reference to the conceptual distinction between actions and bodily movements: is someone’s raising of their arm the same event as the rising of their arm?)

Some philosophers take these to be metaphysical questions—questions whose answers call for adequate identity criteria, which must be provided before we are allowed to take our event talk seriously (cf. Quine 1958: “No entity without identity”). In this sense, different conceptions of events tend to suggest different answers, and widely varying ones. In the influential terminology of Thalberg (1971), we find at one extreme the radical “unifiers”, who take events to be as coarse-grained as ordinary objects (Lemmon 1967; Quine 1985), while the other extreme corresponds to the radical “multipliers”, who take events to be as fine-grained as facts (Kim 1966; Goldman 1971; Chisholm 1971). In between we find several moderate variants. Davidson (1969), for example, relies on a criterion of causal extensionality: x and y are the same event if and only if they have the same causes and the same effects. This allows him to identify the killing of Caesar with his stabbing while distinguishing between, say, the rotation and the heating up of a metal ball that is simultaneously rotating and heating up. (Strictly speaking, this criterion is formally circular, or impredicative, if causes and effects are themselves treated as events—as noted by Sher 1974, Wilson 1974, and others, including Quine 1985—and Davidson 1985 eventually rejected it.) Other “moderate” identity criteria deliver slightly different verdicts, relying e.g. on mereological, locational, modal, or hierarchical considerations, inter alia (Davis 1970; Thalberg 1971; Thomson 1971; Beardsley 1975; Brand 1977; Cleland 1991; Savellos 1992; Engel 1994; Unwin 1996; Jones 2013).

There are, however, philosophers who take questions of identity to be mainly semantic questions—not metaphysical questions but questions about the referents of our event-referring expressions. No metaphysical theory, it is said, can settle the semantics of ordinary event talk, hence there is no way of determining the truth or falsity of an event identity statement exclusively on the basis of one’s metaphysical views. Which events a statement speaks of depends heavily (more heavily than with ordinary material objects) on local context and unprincipled intuitions (Bennett 1988). If so, then the whole identity issue is undecidable, since one is demanding metaphysical answers to questions that are in large part semantical.

3.3 Essence

Lastly, there is an array of questions that arise in relation to the modal profile of events. Could Brutus’s stabbing of Caesar—that particular event that took place at the ides of March, 44 BCE—have taken place at a different time? Could it have taken place somewhere else than in the Senate at the Curia of Pompey in Rome? Could it have been less violent than it was? Could it have been something else than a stabbing, e.g., a poisoning? Could it have been done by someone else than Brutus, or could it have had a different victim than Caesar?

Questions such as these, and more generally questions about the essential features of an event, arise naturally and play a crucial role in the context of counterfactual thinking. Yet it appears that the answers will depend crucially on one’s metaphysical standpoint. For example, philosophers who endorse a reductionist metaphysics of events à la Kim (1966, 1969) tend to be essentialist about all these features: if event e is an exemplification of property P by objects o1, …, on at time t, then it is necessarily so—and ditto for other reductionist metaphysics, such as Lombard’s (1979, 1986). On such views, the actual occurrence of an event is a contingent matter, but it isn’t a contingent matter whether an actually occurring event has the features it has. Others feel differently, arguing that a lot depends on how we erect the relevant de re/de dicto distinctions in the way events are individuated (Forbes 1985), to the point that some may even think that events have no individual essences except perhaps for their “rarified and elusive” haecceities (Lycan 1987). (That events have haecceities, or thisnesses, is itself a controversial matter, though see e.g. Berckmans 1995 and Diekemper 2009.) Moreover, the questions themselves are open to a number of qualifications. For example, with regard to time, we may want to distinguish the question of whether an event could have occurred wholly earlier or wholly later than it actually did (Lombard 1982) from the question of whether it could have occurred more quickly or more slowly (Bennett 1987; Lombard 1992, 1995). With regard to an event’s participants, we may want to distinguish between, say, an action’s agent and its essential subject: perhaps Brutus’s stabbing of Caesar could not have been done by someone else than Brutus, but surely the hand with which Brutus held the knife played a different, more essential role than his left ear lobe (Lombard 1981, 1986; Carter 1989). And so on.

There are also questions about an event’s essence that arise naturally by analogy with questions about the essence of other entities, beginning with objects. For example, just as one may wonder whether objects can be contingently identical, one may wonder whether the relationship between, say, certain pain-events and the corresponding brain-events is one of contingent identity (Teichman 1967; Feldman 1974; Maxwell 1979). Just as we may wonder whether objects have their origin essentially, so we may wonder whether events have their causes essentially (van Inwagen 1978; Carter 1979; Lombard 1986; Hughes 1994). Just as we may wonder whether objects have their parts essentially, so we may ask whether events could have been composed of different parts than the ones they actually have (Thomson 1977; Carter 1979; Hornsby 1997; Allen 2005; Daniels & Goswick 2017). And just as we may wonder whether an object’s topological structure and relations are essential to its being the object it is, so we may wonder whether, say, a continuous event could have been discontinuous, or whether two successive events, such as a process and its culmination, are connected as a matter of necessity or only contingently (Casati & Varzi 2000).

Finally, as with every question concerning matters of possibility and necessity, a lot will depend on how we understand modality in the first place. In the case of objects, different frameworks are available to account for their de re modal profile, including frameworks that differ significantly with regard to whether transworld identification is a matter of strict transworld identity or a mere counterpart relation. When it comes to events, similar options present themselves and there is no obvious reason to think that they should be handled in a parallel fashion. Kripke (1972), for instance, is a transworld identity theorist in both regards but Lewis is a counterpart theorist with regard to objects (1968) and a transworld identity theorist with regard to events, at least in his account of causation (1973). Only recently the counterpart-theoretic framework has been endorsed for objects and events alike (Schaffer 2005; McDonnell 2016; Kaiserman 2017). Among other things, it is claimed that such a unified framework allows for a better account of the context-sensitivity of much modal and causal talk, e.g. with reference to various puzzles of preemption and redundant causation. Its essentialist consequences, however, must be carefully evaluated: short of assuming that every object and event could have at most one counterpart in any world, the very idea that, say, the death of Caesar is necessarily of Caesar becomes problematic (Hazen 1979).



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Further Readings

  • Altshuler, D., 2016, Events, States and Times: An Essay on Narrative Discourse in English, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Arsenijević, B., Gehrke, B., and Marín, R. (eds.), 2013, Studies in the Composition and Decomposition of Event Predicates, Dordrecht: Springer.
  • Bennett, J., 1995, The Act Itself, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Bohnemeyer, J., and Pederson, E., 2011, Event Representation in Language and Cognition, New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bott, O., 2010, The Processing of Events, Amsterdam: John Benjamins.
  • Demonte, V., and McNally, L. (eds.), 2012, Telicity, Change, and State: A Cross-Categorial View of Event Structure, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Dölling, J., Heyde-Zybatow, T., and Schäfer, M. (eds.), 2008, Event Structures in Linguistic Form and Interpretation, Berlin: de Gruyter.
  • Eckardt, R., 1998, Adverbs, Events, and Other Things: Issues in the Semantics of Manner Adverbs, Tübingen: Niemeyer.
  • Faye, J., Scheffler, U., and Urchs, M. (eds.), 2001, Things, Facts and Events, Amsterdam: Rodopi.
  • Gisborne, N., 2019, Ten Lectures on Event Structure in a Network Theory of Language, Leiden: Brill.
  • Kanzian, C., 2001, Ereignisse und andere Partikularien. Vorbemerkungen zu einer mehrkategorialen Ontologie, Paderborn: Schöningh.
  • Maienborn, C., and Wöllstein, A. (eds.), Event Arguments: Foundations and Applications, Tübingen: Niemeyer.
  • Martin, R. M., 1978, Events, Reference and Logical Form, Washington (DC): Catholic University of America Press.
  • Payton, J. D., 2021, Negative Actions: Events, Absences, and the Metaphysics of Agency, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Radvansky, G. A., and Zacks, J. M., 2014, Event Cognition, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Rappaport Hovav, M., Doron, E., and Sichel, I. (eds.,) 2010, Syntax, Lexical Semantics, and Event Structure, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Rothstein, S., 2004, Structuring Events. A Study in the Semantics of Lexical Aspect, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Schilder, F., Katz, G., Pustejovsky, J. (eds.), 2007, Annotating, Extracting and Reasoning about Time and Events, Berlin: Springer.
  • Shipley, T. F., and Zacks, J. M. (eds.), 2008, Understanding Events: From Perception to Action, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Stoecker, R., 1992, Was sind Ereignisse? Eine Studie zur analytischen Ontologie, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Stout, R. (ed.), 2018, Process, Action, and Experience, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Tenny, C., and Pustejovsky, J. (eds.), 2000, Events as Grammatical Objects: The Converging Perspectives of Lexical Semantics, Logical Semantics and Syntax, Stanford (CA): CSLI Publications.
  • Truswell, R., 2011, Events, Phrases, and Questions, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • ––– (ed.), 2019, The Oxford Handbook of Event Structure, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • van Voorst, J., 1988, Event Structure, Amsterdam: John Benjamins.
  • Vermazen, B., and Hintikka, M. B. (eds.), 1985, Essays on Davidson: Actions and Events, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Zacks, J. M., 2020, Ten Lectures on the Representation of Events in Language, Perception, Memory, and Action Control, Leiden: Brill.
  • Zucchi, S., 1993, The Language of Propositions and Events. Issues in the Syntax and Semantics of Nominalization, Dordrecht: Kluwer.

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