Ancient and Medieval Empiricism
Although empiricism is often thought to be a modern doctrine, it has ancient roots, and its modern forms derive from late medieval developments. This article will begin by outlining three different forms of empiricism. It will examine the Presocratic and Hippocratic origins of the empiricist attitude, and discuss its development in the work of Aristotle, the Hellenistic medical writers, Epicureans, Stoics, and Sceptics. It will then examine the combination of Aristotelian and Augustinian views in the work of thirteenth and fourteenth-century philosophers and theologians, the association between the study of magic and empiricism, the eclipse of the doctrine of divine illumination, and the gradual downplaying of the role of the intellect in the acquisition of knowledge.
Why study these ancient and medieval thinkers? To those who believe that “no conception can be properly understood except through its history” (Comte 1934: 2), the answer will seem obvious. But even those who prefer to engage more directly in philosophical analysis may find these thinkers illuminating. Empiricists have always had difficulty offering an account of key aspects of both everyday and scientific knowledge. They have found it hard to explain how we could know about logical and mathematical truths, causal relations, and (more generally) the modal structure of the world (how things could be). Since we are still faced with these questions, we may be able to learn from the answers our predecessors gave.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. Varieties of Empiricism
- 3. Ancient Empiricism
- 4. Medieval Empiricism
- 5. Conclusion
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There are three questions raised by the title of this entry. The first is whether it is anachronistic. Is empiricism not a modern view? Can we attribute it to ancient and medieval thinkers? The charge of anachronism might, perhaps, be warranted if empiricism referred to a single set of beliefs. As we shall see, however, the term covers a variety of views regarding knowledge (sect. 2). Even among modern thinkers, the empiricism of John Locke (1632–1704) is not identical with that of Francis Bacon (1561–1626), and neither bears much resemblance to the empiricism of Rudolf Carnap (1891–1970), A. J. Ayer (1910–1989), or Hans Reichenbach (1891–1953). Yet all these thinkers have an attitude in common: they adopt a certain “stance” towards knowledge (van Fraassen 2002: 47–48). They all desire to keep factual claims (in the sense of claims regarding contingent matters) closely related to the deliverances of the senses. That attitude has ancient roots. Modern empiricism was not a creatio e nihilo. It revived views already found in the ancient world, particularly among Hellenistic philosophers (Scott 1995: 238), and the particular questions it was seeking to answer arose from late medieval developments.
A second question has to do with the article’s association of ancient and medieval views. The philosophers discussed here are separated by a thousand years. Why bring them together? This question is more easily answered. The intellectual renaissance of the twelfth and thirteenth centuries involved a revival of the work of the ancients. In the field of philosophy this took the form of a rediscovery of the works of Aristotle (384–322 BCE), by way of Latin translations from Arabic sources and Greek texts from the Byzantine world. Indeed much of the philosophical writing of this period was done by way of commentaries on Aristotle. Medieval philosophers were also influenced by writers from a later age, such as Plotinus (205–270 CE), Dionysius the Areopagite (5th–6th century CE), and St Augustine (354–430 CE). But since these writers were themselves influenced by Aristotle’s predecessor, Plato (427–347 BCE), this aspect of medieval philosophy also has ancient roots.
A third question has to do with the scope of the discussion. The tradition of philosophy being discussed here is that which began in the Greek city states of the sixth and fifth centuries BCE. But empiricist views are also found outside of what is (somewhat misleadingly) called the ‘Western’ philosophical tradition. The closest parallels are to be found among the Lokāyata (Cārvāka), one of the nāstika (non-orthodox) schools of Indian philosophy that existed in the sixth and seventh centuries CE. These thinkers are reported to have held that sensory perception is the only reliable means of knowledge and to have rejected the validity of inferences to unobservable entities (Chatterjee & Datta 2004: 54–59). The Buddha (ca. 485–405 BCE) could be said to be an empiricist, insofar as he based his dharma (teaching) on experience rather than authority or reason. But the Buddhist idea of experience is broader than that held by most empiricists (Jayatilleke 1963: 463–64 [para. 793]). The twelve āyatanas (sensory domains) of Buddhist tradition include the mind as well as the bodily senses and meditation is thought capable of producing higher forms of knowledge (the abhijñās) that are independent of sensory perception. Finally, we can find discussions of sense perception within classical Chinese philosophy. Mozi (Mo Tzu, ca. 480–392 BCE), for instance, ranked everyday experience among the three criteria of reliable knowledge (Mozi 35.3), while the more sceptical Xunzi (Hsün Tzu, ca. 312–210 BCE) pointed out how easily the senses are deceived (Xunzi 21.8). But while it would be interesting to explore these traditions, empiricism does not play as central a role in any of them as it does in the history of Western philosophy.
The question of scope also arises when it comes to the subject matter of the article, which is empiricism as a doctrine rather than as a practice. From the very beginning of what the Greeks called “the investigation of nature” (hē peri phuseōs historia), there have been those who studied the natural world by means of careful observation. There were medical writers who observed and recorded symptoms, astronomers who observed the movements of the heavens, and students of music who placed their ears “close [to their instruments] as though trying to hear what their neighbours were saying” (Plato Rep. 531a6–7). These people believed it was important to learn from experience (empeiria, in Aristotle’s Greek). But they did not formulate a theory about learning from experience. It is the theory of learning from experience that will be the focus of the present study.
2. Varieties of Empiricism
“Names of philosophical positions,” wrote W. V. O. Quine, “are a necessary evil” (1995: 251). This is certainly the case with the term “empiricism”: while it is difficult simply to abandon it, it can be misleading. Among historians of early modern philosophy, for instance, the traditional distinction between empiricists and rationalists has fallen out of favour, on the grounds that there are few thinkers who can be clearly assigned to either category (Norton 1981; Loeb 1981: 25–75). The problem here, however, is not the category of empiricism, but its use as a “pigeon-hole” into which one tries to place individual thinkers. Empiricism need not be a global doctrine: a thinker may be an empiricist in one domain but not in another. It is possible, for instance, to be an empiricist about knowledge of the natural world, but a rationalist with regard to a particular area of mathematics (Markie 2015: sect. 1.2). So it is not surprising that individual thinkers are hard to categorize. But empiricism is also an umbrella term: it covers a variety of views regarding knowledge. Even with regard to the one domain, a thinker may be an empiricist in one sense, but not in another. So if we are to use the term, we need to distinguish the different forms empiricism can take.
2.1 Explanatory Empiricism
The first is what I shall call explanatory empiricism, which denies the validity of inferences from observable phenomena to causes that cannot themselves be observed. Perhaps the best known modern example is the empiricism of the physicist and philosopher Ernst Mach (1838–1916). At least for most of his life, Mach rejected the theory of atoms as an example of “hypothetico-fictive physics” (Mach 1992: 136) and would respond to believers in atoms with the words, Habn S’eins gsehn? (Have you seen one?) (Meyer 1992: 151). (For a slightly different view of Mach’s atomism, see Banks 2003: 12–14.) A more recent example is the “constructive empiricism” of Bas van Fraassen, which holds that the aim of science is to produce theories that are empirically adequate, a theory being empirically adequate if “what it says about the observable things and events in this world, is true” (van Fraassen 1980: 12). This view also rules out inferences to unobservable entities (van Fraassen 1980: 72). While this may sound like a modern position, it was held by the first people to call themselves “empiricists,” namely a group of ancient medical writers, who rejected inferences to what is “not evident” in favour of the recording of correlations between types of observable events (sect. 3.3.1).
2.2 Genetic Empiricism
A second form of empiricism is summed up by the Latin slogan nihil est in intellectu quod non prius fuerit in sensu (nothing is in the intellect which has not first been in the senses). We can think of this as a genetic empiricism (Lowe 1995: 189), which makes claims about the origins of our ideas. These claims take two forms. The first of these is what we may call tabula rasa (blank slate) empiricism, which denies the existence of innate ideas or principles of reasoning, holding that both our factual knowledge and the concepts we employ in describing the world are drawn from experience. The modern locus classicus for an empiricism of this kind is the work of John Locke, who famously suggested that the mind is originally “white paper, void of all characters, without any ideas” (Locke Essay 2.1.2). (For the history of this idea, see sect. 3.3.3 and sect. 4.1.) But it also takes the form of what we may describe as a cognitive empiricism. This denies that we have intellectual powers or capacities that can give access to factual knowledge independently of experience.
Cognitive empiricism may seem implicit in the tabula rasa principle that “nothing is in the intellect which has not first been in the senses.” But the two positions are not identical, for one can deny that we have innate ideas or principles while also holding that the mind shapes what the senses provide. As G. W. Leibniz (1646–1716) would later remark, “nothing is in the intellect which was not first in the senses, except for: the intellect itself (nisi intellectus ipse)” (Leibniz NE 1.2). There are two contributions the intellect could make. It could predispose us to understand what we perceive in certain ways. Or it may have the capacity to receive a belief-forming influence from an external source, one not mediated by the senses. (For a medieval version of the latter idea, see sect. 4.2.) A thorough-going cognitive empiricism would deny the existence of either innate dispositions or non-sensory influences in the formation of beliefs. It would hold that the mind forms its beliefs by “selecting, combining, or otherwise manipulating simple ideas of sensation” (Kahn 1981: 407).
2.3 Justificatory Empiricism
A final form of empiricism is what we may call justificatory empiricism. In its strongest form, an empiricism of this kind is indifferent as to the origins of our ideas and can tolerate inferences to unobservable entities. It merely insists that wherever our ideas come from and whatever explanatory claims we make, these cannot be regarded as justified until they have been successfully tested against experience. Within twentieth-century philosophy, this position is associated with a sharp distinction between the “context of discovery” and the “context of justification” (Reichenbach 1938: 6–7), with justificatory empiricists focusing on the latter. For Karl Popper (1902–1994), for instance, the question of how a theory is discovered is irrelevant to its epistemic status; what matters is whether that theory has explanatory power and has withstood severe testing (Popper 1935 [2002: 7–8]). On the face of it, this does seem a recent position. Perhaps no philosopher before Popper would have regarded the origins of an idea as entirely irrelevant to its standing. But there are hints of a modest kind of justificatory empiricism in the work of some ancient and medieval thinkers, who held that factual claims arrived at by deductive reasoning lack credibility if they have not also been tested against experience.
3. Ancient Empiricism
The discussion that follows will employ these categories in order to analyse the thought of ancient and medieval philosophers. Once again, this may be thought to run the risk of anachronism, insofar as such categories are not themselves ancient. Although one school of ancient thinkers did identify themselves as empiricists, no ancient or medieval philosophers distinguished the three forms of empiricism I have described. But this is not a fatal objection. We must be careful not to distort the thinking of ancient or medieval philosophers by forcing it into modern categories, as into a Procrustean bed. Nor should we write intellectual history in a “Whiggish” fashion, interested only in those features of ancient thought that anticipate our own. But as Allen Wood once remarked (a little too paradoxically), “people can mean things they can’t think, and therefore … must be able to express thoughts they can’t have” (A. Wood 2002: 227). When it comes to ancient and medieval philosophers, our modern categories can help highlight aspects of their thought they themselves may never have made explicit.
3.1 The Emergence of an Empiricist Attitude
If we think of empiricism as an attitude, rather than a clearly formulated doctrine, then it dates from the very beginnings of Western philosophy, in the work of some Presocratic philosophers. Some care is needed here, since we know of the Presocratics only through quotations and reports, found in authors who in some cases lived centuries later and who themselves had philosophical axes to grind. One of our major sources, for instance, is Aristotle. But Aristotle was not trying to write a carefully balanced history of philosophy; he was attempting to construct his own system and he sometimes reshaped his predecessors’ views with this goal in mind (Cherniss 1935: 347). Judging from the quotations and reports we do have, it would be difficult to describe the Presocratics as empiricists in practice. There is little sign they engaged in what we would call “empirical research”: acts of observation intended to discover new facts or test hypotheses (Lloyd 1979: 139). Even if they had, many of their claims about the natural world are sweeping and vague: it is far from clear how they could be tested empirically (Barnes 1982: 48). Despite this, some of the Presocratics did express sentiments that provide a foundation on which later empiricist thinkers could build.
Of particular note are some sayings attributed to the Ionian philosopher Heraclitus (fl. ca. 500 BCE). One fragment reads, “The things of which there is sight, hearing, experience, [these] I prefer” (DK 22B55; Graham 2010: 149). Although the contrast here may be between knowledge by experience and knowledge by hearsay (Kahn 1979: 106), it does suggest a confidence in knowledge that comes from sense perception. It is, however, balanced by another saying, which notes that “poor witnesses for men are the eyes and ears of those who have barbarian souls” (DK 22B107; Graham 2010: 149). This suggests that while the senses do provide knowledge, what they offer needs to be correctly understood. We find a similar attitude in Empedocles (ca. 495–435 BCE), who, while emphasizing the limits of human understanding, encourages his hearers to “understand each thing in the way in which it is clear” (noei d’hēi dēlon hekaston, gleaning what knowledge they can from the senses (DK 31B3; Graham 2010: 343).
Empedocles’s saying can be understood as a response to the work of the Eleatic philosophers, such as Parmenides (ca. 515–445 BCE) and Melissus of Samos (fl. ca. 440 BCE). Parmenides relied on a priori arguments to reach conclusions that flew in the face of experience, while his follower Melissus argued for the unreliability of sense perception on the grounds that its deliverances were contradicted by reason (Barnes 1982: 298–302). Such teachings offered a challenge to the early scientific tradition established by Thales of Miletus (fl. ca. 585 BCE), for they suggested that “the phenomena which science attempts to understand … are figments of our deceptive senses” (Barnes 1982: 305). If there was to be a scientific tradition, it required a defence of sense perception over against pure reason.
Other Presocratic thinkers take empiricism beyond a simple defence of sense perception; they also express suspicion regarding claims that go beyond what can be observed. A key figure here is Xenophanes (ca. 570–475 BCE). Perhaps the best known of his sayings is fragment 34: “No man knows, or ever will know, the truth about the gods and about everything I speak of; for even if one chanced to say the whole truth, yet oneself knows it not; but seeming (dokos) is wrought over all things” (DK 21B34; Kirk, Raven, & Schofield 1983: 179). This is a cryptic saying, made more so by the fact that it lacks a context. But a plausible interpretation holds that in matters inaccessible to perception, we cannot be confident about the claims that are made, since we have no way of independently verifying them (Hussey 1999: 22). Xenophanes’s saying certainly expresses caution about claimed knowledge of the gods. But if the phrase “everything I speak of” refers to Xenophanes’s account of the physical world, it may also refer to knowledge of its underlying principles (Barnes 1982: 139). Yet Xenophanes is no sceptic: he believes that growth in knowledge (broadly understood) is possible. As he is reported to have said, “the gods have not revealed all things to men from the beginning; but by seeking men find out better in time” (DK 21B18; Kirk, Raven, & Schofield 1983: 179). Indeed Xenophanes himself seems to have made bold claims about both the physical world and divinity. His empiricism is limited to the idea that in matters that go beyond what can be immediately experienced we can expect to attain nothing more than “belief [dokos] and verisimilitude” (Barnes 1982: 140).
A striking feature of ancient empiricism is its association with medical writers, and Xenophanes’s caution about knowledge of the unseen is picked up by an early medical writer, Alcmaeon of Croton (fl. ca. 500 BCE), to whom the following fragment is attributed: “Concerning things unseen (peri tōn aphaneōn) the gods see clearly, but so far as men may conjecture (tekmairesthai)… ” (DK 24B1; Kirk, Raven, & Schofield 1983: 339). Once again, it would be foolish to read a body of empiricist doctrine into such a cryptic (and apparently incomplete) remark. Yet it, too, indicates a contrast, not only between what the gods know and men may know (a commonplace of ancient Greek thought), but between knowledge that can be obtained by observation and knowledge of “the unseen”. Yet Alcmaeon himself appears to have made claims regarding “unseen matters” (ta aphanē), not merely (as a medical writer) about the interior workings of the body, but also about the soul and its immortality. So it would be mistaken to regard him as an explanatory empiricist, rejecting inferences to what is unseen. Indeed in its original context, the remark may have suggested that despite the difficulties of knowing what is unseen, careful investigation allows us to make such inferences (Huffman 2021: sect. 2.1). Indeed while tekmairesthai can mean “conjecture”, it can also mean to infer from “signs” (tekmēria), a phrase that would later be used for inferences from what can be observed (sect. 3.3.3)
Staying within the medical tradition, a similar caution about knowledge of “things unseen” can be found in some of the works attributed to Hippocrates (ca. 460–370 BCE). The author of one Hippocratic treatise argues against those who practice medicine on the basis of some general principle or postulate (hupothesis). Medicine, he suggests, does not require a general theory “about human nature” (ho ti estin anthrōpos), of the kind offered by Empedocles and other philosophers (AM 20.1). Such general principles may be required when dealing with with matters that are “obscure and dubious”, such as “the things in the sky or under the earth” (AM 1.3). But medicine differs from such speculative sciences, since its conclusions can be confirmed by experience. Of particular note here is the phrase “the things in the sky or under the earth,” which picks out the main areas of early Ionian science (Barnes 1982: 139; cf. Plato Ap. 18b8–9), regarding knowledge of which the author seems to be expressing caution.
At first sight, this looks like an early expression of explanatory empiricism: a refusal to make inferences to things that cannot be observed. But as in the case of Xenophanes and Alcaemon, it is better regarded as the expression of an empiricist attitude than an empiricist doctrine. Even leaving aside the fact that “the things in the sky” are not strictly unobservable, the same Hippocratic work also speaks of discovering facts about what is inside the body “from evident things outside [the body]” (AM 22.3). In particular, it argues, we can draw conclusions about the body’s internal organs by noting the behaviour of different kinds of observable objects: those that are solid, stretched, spongy, porous, and so on. (The reasoning here is by way of analogy, a common practice among the earliest Greek thinkers [Lloyd 1992: 254–55; Allen 2001: 10–11].) This appears inconsistent with an explanatory empiricism, since it justifies inferences from what can be observed to what is (at least in practice) unobservable.
Talk of discovering what is unseen from what is evident calls to mind the maxim attributed to Anaxagoras (ca. 500–428 BCE): “Appearances are a vision of the invisible” (hopsis … tōn adēlōn ta phainomena) (DK 59B21a; Graham 2010: 309). Not only was this principle employed in the Hippocratic writings, but it was said to have been endorsed by Democritus (ca. 460–371 BCE) (Sextus M VII 1.140). For all his scepticism regarding sense perception (DK 68B6–10; Graham 2010: 592–95), Democritus seemed to think it had an evidential role (Asmis 1984: 345). In particular, he apparently believed it could confirm the atomist theory which Leucippus (fl. ca. 450–420 BCE) had originated and he himself had embraced. There is, however, a difficulty here, as Democritus himself may have realized, for in one report he has the senses utter the following: “Wretched mind, after taking from us your evidence, do you overthrow us? Our fall will be your defeat!” (DK 68B125; Graham 2010: 597). The problem here is that while one can cite observable facts (such as the fact of motion) in support of atomism, that doctrine in turn suggests that appearances are deceptive (Barnes 1982: 559–64), since the world does not appear to be made up of atoms. As another fragment reads, “by convention color, by convention sweet, by convention bitter, but in reality atoms and void” (DK 68B9, 125; Graham 2010: 597). This contrast between what appears to be the case (which we accept “by convention”) and what is actually the case threatens the undermine the atomist’s appeal to the evidence of the senses.
What we find, then, in the work of some of the earliest Greek philosophers is not only the first outline of empiricist doctrines; we also find hints of the difficulties such doctrines would encounter. But to find a clearer statement of an empiricist view of knowledge, we must turn to the work of Aristotle.
3.2 Aristotle’s Empiricism
Aristotle discussed a variety of ways in which human beings can achieve a grasp of reality. In particular, he mentions five ways in which “the soul possesses the truth by way of affirmation or denial” (EN 1139b15–17): art or craft (technē), scientific knowledge (epistēmē), practical wisdom (phronēsis), philosophical wisdom (sophia), and comprehension (nous). These are, however, varieties of knowledge; this remark does not tell us about the origins of what we know. So was Aristotle an empiricist? Answering this question is not a straightforward task. While Aristotle does offer us a description of “systematic theoretical knowledge” (Pasnau 2013: 992)—namely, the Posterior Analytics—he offers us no analysis of knowledge in general (Taylor 1990: 117).
We do know, however, that Aristotle believed the senses to be reliable, and that we must rely on their deliverances for our knowledge of factual matters. Although he insisted that “not everything that appears is true (ou pan to phainomenon alēthes)” (Met. 1010b2–3), he regarded things as they appear (ta phainomena) as the starting point of any inquiry and conformity with them the indication of its success. Although he uses the phrase ta phainomena broadly—it embraces endoxa, “reputable opinions” as well as what is immediately evident to the senses (Owen 1986: 240)—Aristotle regarded sensation (aithēsis) as particularly trustworthy. Each of the senses has its own proper objects (such as color, in the case of sight) and our grasp of these is “is true or [at least] admits the lowest degree of falsehood” (DA 428b18–19; cf. 418a11). Not only is sensation, at this lowest level, trustworthy, but it is our only source of knowledge when it comes to contingent matters of fact. As Aristotle writes, “no one can learn anything at all in the absence of sense” and that even when we are not actively perceiving, our thinking remains dependent on sensory images (DA 432a7–9). Insofar as Aristotle’s view of knowledge insists on both the reliability of the senses and their essential role in the gaining of knowledge, it can be thought of as broadly empiricist.
To gain a better understand of the nature and limits of Aristotle’s empiricism, we must once again make some distinctions. Aristotle can be classed as a genetic empiricist, for he rejects the claim that we have innate ideas or principles of reasoning. He is also, arguably, an explanatory empiricist, although in a different sense from that found among Hellenistic medical writers and Sceptics (sect. 3.3). We can regard him as a modest kind of justificatory empiricist, who believes that scientific theorizing is answerable to what can be observed. But what is contested is whether he can be said to be a cognitive empiricist, given the role of intellectual insight in his account of scientific explanation.
With regard to genetic empiricism, Aristotle rejects the doctrine of innate ideas found in the work of Plato (427–347 BCE). He strongly denies, for instance, that we have innate knowledge of the principles of scientific demonstration (APo. 100a; Met. 993a). This aspect of Aristotle’s empiricism can be illustrated by his attitude to mathematics. For Plato, mathematical objects resemble the Forms—some may in fact be Forms (Shapiro 2000: 54–55)—which occupy a timeless realm distinct from that of the objects of sensation (Rep. 510c1–511b2). They are known, therefore, either by recollection (anamnēsis) or by a kind of direct intellectual intuition. Along with his rejection of innate ideas, Aristotle also rejects this conception of mathematical objects. What the mathematician grasps are real features of perceptible objects, but regarded in a particular way (Lear 1982: 168, 184). They are regarded merely “as” (hēi) having quantity and being continuous or as objects of enumeration (Phys. 193b22–194a10; Met. 1061a28–1061b3, 1077b19–1078a4, 1078a22–28).
Is Aristotle an explanatory empiricist? Aristotle does accept the need for inferences from what can be observed to facts that are not immediately evident (Asmis 1984: 212–17). As he writes, “to gain light on things imperceptible we must use the evidence of perceptible things” (EN 1104a13–14). It follows that something perceived can serve as a sign of something that we would not otherwise know. Roughness of the tongue, for example, is a sign (sēmeion) of fever (DS 462b26–32); the large size of hailstones is a sign (sēmeion) they have been formed close to the earth (Meteor. 348a33–36). But while knowledge of signs constitutes evidence, it does not, in itself, represent scientific knowledge. Scientific knowledge is knowledge not just of facts, but of their causes. Even if the association between sign and signified is without exception, so that one can infer the latter from the former, such an inference is not the same as offering an explanation. It may be, for instance, that fever is a reliable sign of illness (Rhet. 1357b18–19): all those with fever have an underlying medical condition. But this does not yet constitute an explanation, for it does not yet show that the fever is a necessary consequence of the illness. A sign, in other words, can establish only what Aristotle calls “the fact” (to hoti); showing a correlation between sign and signified does not, in itself, establish the “reasoned fact” (to dioti) (Madden 1952: 372; cf. APo. 78a23).
So when it comes to establishing the “reasoned fact”—the process of scientific explanation—is Aristotle an explanatory empiricist? Would he deny the legitimacy of inferences from observed facts to unobserved (or, perhaps, unobservable) causes? Aristotle is cautious regarding our ability to know about matters that cannot be directly observed. As he writes, when it comes to “matters inaccessible to the senses,” it is sufficient if our investigation arrives at a possible cause (Meteor. 344a5–7). Insofar as he allows inferences of this kind, Aristotle is not an explanatory empiricist. But the phrase “explanatory empiricism” does not quite fit the shape of Aristotle’s natural philosophy. Firstly, explanatory empiricism stands in an epistemological tradition whose central question is “What are we justified in believing?” That tradition has its origins in later, Hellenistic philosophy (sect. 3.3); its concerns are not Aristotle’s (Burnyeat 1981: 136). Second, what Aristotelian explanations appeal to are the “causes and principles (aitia kai archai)”—terms Aristotle uses interchangeably (Witt 1989: 18)—by which phenomena are made intelligible. Some of these “generative factors” (Moravcsik 1975: 622) are inherent in (enuparchousai) the things to be explained, while others are outside (ektos) (Met. 1013a19–20; APo. 93a6–7). Only the generative factors that lie outside the fact to be explained (in the sense of being distinct from it) could be thought of as unobservable entities. The generative factors that are inherent in things are not unobservable in the same sense as atoms (for instance) would be. They may still be “not evident” but in a different sense: it is not always evident that a class of entities share a common nature. Establishing this fact requires “induction” (epagōgē), to which I shall return in a moment.
What about justificatory empiricism? It seems that no ancient or medieval thinker would have endorsed a strong form of justificatory empiricism, which holds that the origins of a theory are irrelevant to its epistemic status. But many did insist that all scientific theorizing was answerable to experience. Aristotle certainly did so. As he remarks, “we should accept what is evident to the senses rather than [mere] reasoning,” and reasoning only if it agrees with the observed facts (GA 760b29–33). He had little sympathy with the idea that the natural world could be explained in an entirely a priori fashion, as Plato sometimes suggests (e.g. Rep. 530b7–8, 531c1–5). He criticizes, for instance, the Pythagoreans for forcing their observations of the heavens to accord with theory, rather than seeking theories that account for what can be seen to occur (DC 293a25–27). Aristotle is particularly dismissive of the Eleatic philosophers, who in their reasoning “transcended sense perception and disregarded it on the grounds of following the argument.” He notes that while their opinions are supported by reason, it would be “almost madness to believe them, when one considers the facts” (GC 325a18–20). The facts in question are those revealed by the senses.
If there is a feature of Aristotle’s thought that may appear to cast doubt on his empiricism, it is the account of scientific explanation found in his Posterior Analytics. (I am assuming this is an account of scientific explanation, rather than an account of how we form everyday concepts [Scott 1995: 109–16].) Aristotle’s conception of scientific explanation is deductive: it involves a derivation of the fact to be explained from first principles, the latter being “true, primary, immediate, better known than and prior to the conclusion, the latter being related to them as effect to cause” (APo. 71b20–24). There has been much debate regarding the role of such demonstrations. A widely-held view is that they are not, for Aristotle, a means of making scientific discoveries. Rather, they are the way in which such discoveries should be presented (Barnes 1994, xii). Indeed Aristotle expressly denies we can discover explanatory principles by way of demonstration, holding that such demonstrations serve merely to make them clear (APo. 93b16–18). This view seems consistent with Aristotle’s practice in his own scientific writings, as well as the methodological remarks found in his biological works. He argues, for instance, that when studying animals “we ought first to take the phenomena that are observed in each group, and then go on to state their causes” (PA 640a15). While we should not confuse Aristotle’s empiricism with that of Francis Bacon (Harari 2004: 35), even his theorizing can be said to begin with what is observed.
It remains true, however, that Aristotle’s ideal presentation of a scientific explanation is that of a demonstration from first principles. Only such a demonstration, he believes, would make clear the necessary connection that constitutes a causal relation. While this ideal is not always attainable (Pasnau 2013: 993), it remains a desideratum. So how does one arrive at those principles? It is at this point that one might question whether Aristotle truly is an empiricist. The principles to which scientific demonstrations appeal are universals: they are properties common to all beings of a particular kind which constitute them as beings of that kind. Aristotle rejects the Platonic idea that such universal properties exist extra rem, independently of the individuals that embody them. So in order to arrive at the principles of scientific explanation we need to recognize the identity of kind among the forms of particular objects and thus the universal that is embodied in each of them (Owens 1966: 168). The process by which we come to grasp the universals required for scientific explanations is known as epagōgē (APo. 99b15–100b15), a term commonly translated as “induction.”
What Aristotle means by induction (epagōgē) is notoriously unclear (Ross 1949: 50; Harari 2004: 33–34), but Aristotle customarily distinguishes induction from syllogistic reasoning, in the sense of demonstration. As he writes in one place, “all our beliefs come either through demonstration [dia sullogismou] or from induction [ex epagōgēs]” (APr. 68b13). The general contrast here is that while “demonstration proceeds from universals to particulars,” induction takes one “from particulars to universals” (Ross 1949: 47; cf. Top. 195a13–14). It is sensation (sense-perception: aisthēsis) that gives us knowledge of particulars (APo. 81b6–7), while knowledge of universals is required for scientific knowledge (epistēmē). So what is epagōgē, process by which we move from perceived particulars to known universals?
Aristotle denies (as we have seen) that the universals that form the principles of a scientific demonstration are themselves to be reached by way of demonstration (APo. 72b19–20; 93b16–18). But a demonstration (sullogismos) is a strong form of argument, in which conclusions follow necessarily from the premises (APr. 24b18–20). So one might think that some weaker form of reasoning could be involved, such as “induction” in our modern sense: a generalization over a collection of particulars. The latter gives rise to the notorious “problem of induction” (sect. 4.2), of which Aristotle shows some awareness (Top. 131b19–36): how can any limited range of observations justify a universal claim? But even leaving this problem aside, there is a serious objection to understanding Aristotle’s epagōgē in this way. The most such a generalization could show that all individuals of a certain class have certain characteristics (APo. 92a37–92b2): that all swans are white, for instance. It could not tell us that this characteristic is essential, one of the features that constitutes a swan as a swan. In any case, Aristotle also suggests that each of the principles of scientific explanation is in some sense self-evident: it “commands belief of itself” (kath’heautēn einai pistēn) (Top. 100b19–22). This seems to exclude the idea that these principles are reached by a process of reasoning.
If we reject the idea that Aristotelian epagōgē is a form of enumerative induction, we might be tempted to think of it as a kind of “immediate apprehension of essences or forms” (Harari 2004: 34), one that occurs in the very process of perceiving particular individuals of a given kind. (This interpretation often goes along with a conception of nous as a faculty of intuition [Kahn 1981: 369], rather than a state of understanding [Barnes 1994: 267–69].) But if epagōgē involves a process of intellectual intuition that goes beyond what sense-perception delivers, it would undercut the claim that Aristotle is a genetic (and, perhaps, justificatory) empiricist. Experience would provide nothing more than the occasion on which the necessary intuitive insight is gained.
So is there a way of understanding epagōgē that allows Aristotle to be thought of as an empiricist? One possible solution begins with Aristotle’s puzzling claim that while “it is the particular that we sense (aisthanetai men to kath’hekaston), sensation is of the universal (hē d’aisthēsis tou katholou estin)” (APo. 100a17–b1). Why is this puzzling? It is puzzling since Aristotle elsewhere states that sensation gives us knowledge of particulars, not universals (APo. 81b6–7). So in what sense can sensation also be “of the universal”? Various solutions to this question have been offered (Hasker & Yurdin 2014: 127–130). One solution starts from a remark found at the beginning of the Physics, where Aristotle writes that the things that are immediately apparent to us (and thus the starting point of inquiry) are “rather confused” (mallon sunkechumena) (Phys. 184a22). Those rather confused things are apparently general facts, for he goes on to remark that “it is the whole that is better known to sensation” (Phys. 184a24–25). This suggests that “we begin by responding perceptually to undifferentiated ‘wholes’” (Gasser-Wingate 2021: 149). Only later, by way of analysis (Phys. 184a22–23), do we come “to recognize the specific nature of that whose generic nature alone is at first recognized” (Ross 1936: 458). On this view, experience (empeiria) already gives us a knowledge of universals, but one that is not yet precise. The “merely experienced” person is responding reliably to the features that unite entities of a kind, but has not yet understood what those features are.
Does this interpretation solve the problems created by an empiricist understanding of Aristotle’s idea of science? One objection is that on an Aristotelian view the principles of scientific understanding must be not merely properties that objects happen to have; they must be properties that objects of this kind necessarily possess (Kahn 1981: 389). Can we explain our ability to grasp such necessary properties without invoking some purely intellectual power of intuition? Some commentators deny that we can. (See, for instance, Gaukroger 1978: 124.) One interesting suggestion is that our grasp of necessary properties could arise from our interaction with things, through our experience of the constraints that the world imposes on that interaction (De Groot 2014: 69). But it is unclear if even this kind of experience can yield the strong sense of necessity that an Aristotelian conception of science demands.
3.3 Hellenistic Philosophy
A philosopher of whom Aristotle was very critical, but who is worthy of mention in this context, is Plato’s nephew and successor Speusippus (ca. 408–339 BCE). Plato’s school, the Academy, eventually became the home of Scepticism (sect. 3.3.4), but before it did so Speusippus had come up with a modified view of the capabilities of sense-perception. While not himself an empiricist—Speusippus speaks of two criteria of truth, of which sense perception is just one (Sextus M VII 1.145–48)—he does suggest that the capacity of sense-perception (aisthēsis) can be enhanced when it is combined with reason (logos). In a way that bridges the Platonic gap between the “intelligible” and the “sensible”, he speak of the resulting synthesis as “cognitive sense-perception” (epistēmikē aisthēsis), which is the faculty that allows us to discern objects and states of affairs (Dillon 2003: 79). It is, however, consistent with Speusippus’s Platonism that he would have regarded knowledge of physical objects as merely “apparent knowledge”; true knowledge was of the eternal mathematical forms that underlay them (Dillon 2003: 80, 82).
For clearer examples of empiricist doctrine we can turn to the thinkers of the Hellenistic age (a roughly 300-year period following the death of Alexander the Great in 323 BCE, although my survey will extend into the second century CE). These include medical writers and Sceptics, Epicurus (ca. 341–270 BCE) and his followers, and the school founded by founded by Zeno of Citium (ca. 332–265 BCE), whose members are known as Stoics. The medical writers and Sceptics offer a sophisticated form of explanatory empiricism. The followers of Epicureans offer a strong view of the reliability of sense perception, which is their “criterion” of truth, making them justificatory empiricists. But they were not explanatory empiricists, since they accepted inferences to what is “not evident” (adēlon), such as the existence and activity of atoms. The Stoics hold to a form of genetic empiricism, in ways that resemble modern uses of the tabula rasa metaphor, and share (broadly speaking) the Epicurean view of the criterion of truth. But at least when it comes to moral notions, they modify their empiricism by insisting that humans are predisposed to form certain beliefs, beliefs about what is just and good. No more than the Epicureans are the Stoics explanatory empiricists: they accept the legitimacy (under certain conditions) of inferences to what is not evident to the senses. The strongest critics of the Stoic view were the Sceptics, who argued that while we can “go along with” what is evident for practical purposes, we should practise suspension of belief (epochē), so as to attain tranquillity of mind (ataraxia).
3.3.1 Medical Writers
The first people to describe themselves as empiricists (empeirikoi) were a group of medical writers of the Hellenistic period. We know of these thinkers only indirectly, through the work of other ancient writers, in particular Galen of Pergamon (129–ca. 200 CE). As medical practitioners, their primary concerns were practical: finding the correct method of diagnosis and treatment. But in discussing these matters they put forward some general epistemological claims, developing the empiricist tendencies already found in the Hippocratic writings (sect. 3.1). In particular, they set themselves in opposition to those whom they called “rationalists” (logikoi) or “dogmatists” (dogmatikoi). What set them apart was a refusal to posit causes beyond those that can be observed.
In spelling out their position the medical empiricists distinguished between two styles of inference. What they rejected was the variety of reasoning they called “analogism” (analogismos), which “starts from what is apparent but ends up with what is entirely unclear” (Galen SB ch. 5). In its place they advocated what they called “epilogism” (epilogimos), which deals “solely with what is apparent,” but can be used “to discover what is currently unseen” (Galen SB ch. 5). The idea here is that while the cause that is inferred may be currently hidden, the inference is based on an association that is, at other times, directly observable. Epilogismos, the empiricists argued, is a form of reasoning used by all human beings, which leads to a consensus, while analogismos leads to disagreement and conclusions that can be neither confirmed nor denied (Galen ME ch. 24).
The tradition of medical empiricism influenced the work of Galen himself, although his preferred method involved the use of both logos (reason) and empeiria (experience). As Galen wrote, “logos alone discovers some remedies, peira [‘experiment’ or ‘trial’] without employing logos [discovers] others, while some require both of them working together” (Galen Op. 13, pp. 886–887; Hankinson 2022: 104). Galen is what I have called a justificatory empiricist in that he believes all factual knowledge to rely on the evidence of the senses, which are assumed to be broadly reliable (Hankinson 2009: 214–15). Galen’s justificatory empiricism is revealed in his conviction that there are philosophical questions that simply cannot be resolved, because perceptual experience gives us no way of adjudicating them. Such questions include whether the world is created or uncreated, whether its extent is finite or infinite, and whether God is corporeal or incorporeal (Hankinson 2009: 228–29). Galen is not, however, an explanatory empiricist, since he thinks there are non-evident causal factors that we can discover. Indeed the proper practice of medicine requires us to discover them (Hankinson 2022: 91). It is for this reason that he opposes the belief of the medical empiricists that experience alone suffices for the practice of medicine. Rejecting, as they do, the search for underlying causes, such practitioners have “no systematic way of determining therapy in cases which are unlike those which they have come across before” (Hankinson 2022: 87).
Galen shares what appears to be Aristotle’s view: that sense perception already gives us a knowledge of the first principles of scientific knowledge, although such knowledge can be made explicit only by reasoned analysis. The reasoning in question is akin to that of a geometer, “working back from a problem … to the axioms from which the problem can be solved, or the facts explained” (Hankinson 2009: 223). The doctor’s craft (technē) therefore involves not just experience but what we may call “reasoned experience” (Hankinson 2022: 104). Such reasoning allows one to discern the conditions under which a therapeutic substance will manifest its powers (van der Eijk 2005: 289–90). Galen refers to experience of this kind as “differentiated experience” (diōrismenē peira) (Galen Op. 11, p. 685), which can allow one to discover causal powers even from a single trial (Hankinson 2022: 106). This idea of differentiated experience brings us very close to the theory (if not the practice) of what we call “controlled experiments” (Singer 2022: 185).
Experience in this context is not passive, a mere reception of sense-data. As in the case of Speusippus’s “cognitive sense perception”, which like the performance of a musician can be improved by practice (Sextus M VII 1.146), the perceptual ability of the skilled practitioner can be improved by reason and effort. Galen’s example of this is his ultimately successful struggle to perceive the systole of the pulse, which reason had taught him must exist (Singer 2022: 171–72). In the case of experience trained by reason and practice, the gap between observable effect and unobservable cause narrows to the point of disappearing. If we use the term “perceiving” broadly (Galen Op. 8, p. 793), trained experience can be said to make manifest the causal factors that produce our experience (Singer 2022: 174).
Such claims seem overly optimistic. Galen fails to take into account the degree to which theory is underdetermined by data. Skilled Chinese physicians, when taking a pulse, “perceived” quite different causal factors, since their perception was informed by a differing kind of medical practice and body of theory (Kuriyama 1999: 25, 37). In this respect, Galen’s philosophy of science faces the same difficulties as Aristotle’s (to which it is closely related). Can it explain how observation could lead to an explanation that is necessarily true, given the evidence (Hankinson 2022: 110)?
As will already be evident, the early medical writers were also philosophers. But among the specifically philosophical Hellenistic schools, the first I shall consider is that of the Epicureans. Epicurus and his followers had little interest in a study of the natural world for its own sake. The Epicurean movement can be regarded as a “secular religion” (Milton 2002: 182), which aimed to achieve a knowledge of nature only insofar as this promoted peace of mind. (For a more vigorous defence of the scientific credentials of Epicureanism, see Asmis 1984.) But in working out their philosophy the Epicureans develop a distinctive form of empiricism. It is, first of all, a genetic empiricism, holding that the evidence of the senses is “the base and foundation” of all our knowledge (Sextus M VII 1.216). But it differs from some other forms of empiricism both in regarding as infallible the immediate deliverances of perception and allowing for the mind to be affected by external objects in ways independent of the five senses. Epicurean empiricism is also more tolerant than that of the medical writers and Sceptics, since it accepts inferences to unobservable causes. It is not, in other words, an explanatory empiricism. Indeed this seems to be the reason why the sceptical Sextus counts Epicureans among the “dogmatists” (Sextus PH 1.3).
In a work entitled On the Criterion or The Canon (Peri kritēriou ē kanōn), Epicurus is said to have argued that all sensations (aisthēseis) are reliable, there being nothing that can refute them (Diogenes Laërtius [DL] 10.31). Sextus sums up this Epicurean doctrine as the view that “all sensed things … are true and existent” (Sextus M VII 2.9). On the face of it, this seems an untenable position. Do our senses not deceive us? Do we not see sticks as bent where they enter water or a distant large object as small? There are two responses an Epicurean can make. The first is to make a clear distinction (comparable to that made by Aristotle [sect. 3.2]) between our sensations and the opinions we form on the basis of what we sense. When it comes to our opinions, Epicurus held that “some them are true and others are false, since they are judgements of ours concerning what appears, and we judge sometimes rightly and sometimes wrongly” (Sextus M VII 1.210). When we make mistakes, in other words, it is not the senses that are to blame. Secondly, the senses are verdical because sensations are not “purely private mental phenomena” (O’Keefe 2010: 100). They are brought about by the objects of which they testify, which emit a continuous flow of images or simulacra (eidōla) from their surfaces (Epicurus Ep. Hdt. 46–51). On this view, the senses are reliably informative, faithfully reflecting the objects that produced them, even if we later attribute to them a false propositional content.
Epicurean empiricism is, however, a relatively tolerant form of empiricism. It is tolerant, first of all, insofar as it does not restrict perception to what is received by way of the five senses. Epicurus and his followers seem to have regarded the mind itself as a kind of “supersense” (DeWitt 1954: 207–9), capable of receiving eidōla on its own account. (This doctrine bears some resemblance to one of the Buddhist beliefs mentioned earlier [sect. 1].) The Epicurean writer Lucretius (ca. 95–54 BCE), for instance, claims that some of the simulacra thrown off by objects are exceedingly fine, such that they can penetrate the body and affect the mind independently of the five senses. This allows him to account for the images we see in dreams, which accurately reflect aspects of the world, although in a manner that deceives us (Lucretius RN 4.722–31, 5.1168–71).
Epicurean empiricism is also tolerant insofar as it rejects what I have called “explanatory empiricism”: it does allow for explanatory inferences to unobservable entities. More precisely, Epicurus speaks of two kinds of inferences from what is perceived to what is currently unobserved. The first is an inference to “that which awaits confirmation” (to prosmenon); the second is an inference to “that which is non-evident” (to adēlon) (Epicurus Ep. Hdt. 38.10). Discussing the views of Epicureans and other dogmatists, Sextus makes a similar distinction (PH 2.97–98). He speaks, firstly, of an inference to something that is “for the moment” (pros kairon) non-evident, but which will become evident in due course. His example is the city of Athens, which (assuming I am not at Athens) will become evident to me if I travel there. This corresponds to Epicurus’s “that which awaits confirmation” (DL 10.34). But Sextus also speaks of entities that are “non-evident by nature (ta … phusei adēla)”, a category that corresponds to Epicurus’s “non-evident.” Some dogmatists, Sextus writes, regards the existence and activity of such as knowable by inference, an example being the Epicurean (and Democritean) belief in atoms moving in the void (Sextus M VII 2.319). Note that Sextus adds to these two a third category: that of matters which are “altogether non-evident” (ta kathapax adēla) (PH 2.97), which even dogmatists agreed could never be known by any kind of inference, his example being whether the number of stars is odd or even.
On the Epicurean view, what kinds of inference could be used to supported belief in unobservable entities? In the case of entities unobservable only “for the moment,” the answer is clear. One can make a conjecture and then test it when the entity in question becomes observable (Sextus M VII 1.212). But in the case of things that are “non-evident by nature,” only indirect confirmation is possible. Epicurus’s view appears to have been that a hypothesis consistent with experience—one that is not “witnessed against”—can and should be accepted (Sextus M VII 1.216). But of course two or more hypotheses may survive this test. Remarkably, Epicurus and his followers seem to have held that in these circumstances they can all be accepted, not just as possible, but as true, being realized at some time or in some place (Allen 2004: 95; cf. Lucretius RN 5.526–33). While this may have seemed plausible in a universe infinite in extent and unlimited in time, it leaves open the question of which of these explanations applies to the particular case we are interested in. Epicurus seems to have held that we should not expect to be able to answer this question, in every case (Ep. Pyth. 86). Nor do we need to do so; the knowledge that an event has some natural explanation is sufficient to free us from a superstitious fear of the gods (Ep. Pyth. 87). (For the more restrictive view that this tolerance of multiple explanations applied only to “explanations of celestial phenomena”, see Sedley 1982: 269–71.)
A second school of Hellenistic philosophy that can be classed as empiricist is that of the Stoics, whose view of knowledge owes much to the thought of the Epicureans (Scott 1995: 162, 185). Picking up (it seems) an image from Plato (Theaetetus 191c9–10), Aristotle had spoken of the mind using a metaphor akin to that of the tabula rasa (DA 430a1). But Aristotle’s use of the metaphor is not identical with that of later empiricists, for what he was speaking of was not so much the initial state of the mind as its capacity to receive knowledge (Polansky 2007: 454). The Stoics’ use of a similar metaphor is more clearly an expression of a genetic empiricism: the idea that we have no innate ideas or principles of reasoning. “When a man is born”, they are said to have claimed, “he has the regent part of his soul like a sheet of papyrus (chartion) well-prepared for making a transcript” (Äetius, Placita 4.11; Mansfeld & Runia 2020: 1591). What complicates the attribution of a genetic empiricism to the Stoics is that they held that certain moral notions—ideas about what is just and good—are acquired “naturally” (phusikōs; DL 7.53). In itself, “naturally” could mean nothing more than arising spontaneously from experience, “without attention or teaching” (Scott 1995: 180–81). But in this context ideas that are acquired “naturally” are distinguished from those acquired “by experience” (kata periptōsin), that is to say, by way of sensation. This suggests something akin to innate knowledge (Scott 1995: 203–204).
There is, however, more than one way of thinking about innate knowledge. A claim to innate knowledge could mean that we are born with certain ideas already implanted in our minds, or it could mean simply that we have a disposition to form certain beliefs when presented with the right experience (sect. 2.2). Stoic innatism with regard to moral notions is better understood as the second of these: a dispositional innatism. One way in which they expressed this idea was to say that “nature gives us uncorrupted starting points” (hē phusis aphormas didōsin adiastrophous); it is external influences that lead human beings astray (DL 7:89). On this view, “we are naturally disposed to form certain patterns of behaviour” (Scott 1995: 206). But in order to form the morally correct pattern of behaviour, we must be predisposed to form correct moral beliefs. One can argue that this does not violate the tenets of a genetic empiricism, since on the Stoic view the mind is not entirely passive in forming ideas. Under the influence of experience it “inscribes for itself” (enapographetai) certain notions on the blank sheet of papyrus (Äetius, Placita 4.11; Mansfeld & Runia 2020: 1591). It is consistent with such a view to say that the mind is predisposed to write one thing rather than another (Scott 1995: 207–8).
In addition to this modified form of genetic empiricism, the Stoics also embraced a justificatory empiricism, in which the presentation (phantasia) of a thing is the criterion by which the truth about it is known (DL 7.49). But they held that not just any presentation can play the role of a criterion, only one that is “apprehensive” (katalēptikē; Annas 1990: 189 n.18). An “apprehensive” presentation is “one caused by an existing object and imaged and stamped … in accordance with that existing object, of such a kind that it could not be caused by a non-existent object” (Sextus M VII 1.248; see Reinhardt 2023: li–lii). The question this raises is: how do we know which presentations are “apprehensive” (and thus a reliable criterion)? The Stoics had already recognized that an apprehensive presentation required certain conditions to be in place, particularly regarding the state of mind of the person who receives the presentation (Annas 1990: 191). But it seems that under pressure from the Sceptics (Reinhardt 2023: xcix) the later Stoics suggested that an apprehensive presentation was a necessary but not sufficient criterion, since it was subject to a further condition. “An apprehensive presentation”, they argued, “is the criterion of truth provided that it has no obstacle” (Sextus M VII 1.253). An “obstacle” (enstēma) is some fact about the circumstances that makes a person reluctant to believe what the presentation suggests (Sextus M VII 1.254). If, for instance, we were to see a person who was actually present, but we had good reason to believe she was elsewhere, the proper move would be to withhold assent (Reinhardt 2023: c n.288).
Were the Stoics what I have called “explanatory empiricists”, denying the legitimacy of inferences to unobserved (or, perhaps, unobservable) entities? A Stoic argument regarding divination defends the practice on the grounds that we can observe the reliability of certain signs even if we cannot explain why they are reliable (Cicero Div. 1.12–16), a defence that reminds one of the views of the medical empiricists (Allen 2001: 163). There is also evidence of Stoic caution about inferences to what is “not evident” (adēlon). The Stoic thinker Strabo (ca. 64 BCE–24 CE remarks of Poseidonius (ca. 135–51 BCE) that the latter’s philosophy is too influenced by Aristotle in its “aetiologizing” (aitiologikon), a practice that “our school avoids because of the concealment of causes” (dia tēn epikrupsin tōn aitiōn) (Strabo Geog. 2.3.8). This is consistent with a remark attributed to the leading Stoic thinker Chrysippus (ca. 280–208 BCE). When discussing the location of the ruling part (hēgemonikon) of the soul—a matter the Stoics regarded as “non-evident by nature” (Tieleman 1996: 271)—Chrysippus is reported to have said that there are no “sure signs” (tekmēria) from which one could infer a conclusion (Arnim SVF 2.887; Galen Op. 5, p. 268). This remark reflects Aristotle’s usage of tekmērion to refer to a sign from which one can arrive at a necessary conclusion (Rhet. 1357b4–5). As we shall see in a moment, Chrysippus did arrive at a conclusion, but his remark suggests a greater caution about such inferences that we find in the more rationalist thinker, Galen (Allen 2001: 165).
Despite this caution, the Stoics were not explanatory empiricists: they went beyond what the medical empiricists would permit. Like the Epicureans, they allowed for inferences to what is “non-evident by nature”, an idea that laid them open to attack from the Sceptics. An example commonly attributed to the Stoics (although see Sedley 1982: 241) is the inference from the observable fact of sweat passing through the skin to the existence of “invisible pores (noētoi poroi)” (Sextus PH 2.140). Some such inferences—demonstrations (apodeixeis) in the strict sense—were based on rational insight into the nature of things, a notion that resembles the Aristotelian ideal, to which the Stoics seem to have become increasingly sympathetic (Allen 2001: 178–79, 182). But on other occasions the Stoics appear to have been satisfied with evidence that was merely “plausible” or “persuasive” (to pithanon), that is to say, evidence that “leads us to assent”, even though the conclusion may be false (DL 7.75). At least in some contexts, to pithanon (the plausible) is synonymous with to eulogon (the reasonable) (Allen 2001: 166). Using the latter term, Philodemus (ca. 110–30 BCE) attributes to a Stoic philosopher—probably (pace Hankinson 2003: 79) Dionysius of Cyrene (fl. ca. 150 BCE) (Allen 2001: 207)— the idea that “it is sufficient, concerning … things … which derive from experience, for us to be convinced in accordance with what is reasonable (kata tēn eulogian)” (LS 42J). The example offered in this context is that when we set sail in summer it is reasonable to believe we will arrive safely.
There is, however, a debate regarding the role of merely plausible considerations in Stoic epistemology. A first view is that merely plausible considerations are sufficient to guide our action, although they would not justify a claim to knowledge (Burnyeat 1982: 237). A second is that where certainty is unobtainable, merely plausible (in the sense of probable) considerations can justify a claim to knowledge (Gould 1971: 135). A third is that we can start with what is merely plausible and through the clarification and mutual corroboration of such insights arrive at the apprehension (katalēpsis) of a truth (Tieleman 1996: 284). (For a discussion of the role played by mutual corroboration in the Stoic conception of knowledge, see Annas 1980: 101–103.) Either the second of the third of these interpretations would explain Chrysippus’s willingness to argue that the location of the ruling part of the soul is the heart, despite the absence of “sure signs”.
As I suggested a moment ago, it was the Sceptics of the Pyrrhonian school, as represented by the writings of Sextus Empiricus (ca. 150–225 CE), who most vigorously contested the Stoic view. The aim of the Sceptics was not to achieve knowledge of the natural world, although Sextus’s title empiricus suggests an association with the Hellenistic medical school of the same name. Their aim was to attain “tranquillity in matters of opinion” (kata doxan ataraxia) (Sextus PH 1.15). Nor could Pyrrhonian Sceptics have a theory of knowledge, for to have a theory of knowledge would entail holding beliefs, and their aim (more radical than that of modern sceptics) was the suspension of belief (Annas & Barnes 1985: 7). One might argue that Pyrrhonian Scepticism was compatible with belief in a minimal sense of the word (Smith 2022: 289–92). But this seems to have meant nothing more than “going along with” the impressions that are forced upon us (Sextus 2000: 61 n. 253) – even the sceptic can admit to feeling cold (Sextus PH 1.13) – without any “inclination towards” (aneu prospatheias) what is being affirmed (Sextus PH 1.230).
Sextus does, at times, appear to endorse empiricist views. He remarks, for instance, that “if the senses cannot apprehend external objects, neither can the mind” (Sextus PH 1.99), since the senses are the mind’s “guides” (hodēgoi) (Sextus PH 1.128). This looks like a variety of genetic empiricism, denying that the mind is “innately equipped with a set of concepts” (Annas & Barnes 1985: 116). But not only would an empiricism of this kind entail holding a philosophical doctrine (which a Pyrrhonian Sceptic ought to avoid), but Sextus’s “modes”—his ways of inducing suspension of judgement—have the general pattern of contrasting appearances, showing that we have no reason to accept one rather than another (Annas & Barnes 1985: 25). So (pace Smith 2022: 260) it would be surprising if Sextus were here endorsing empiricism. He is more likely to be mentioning a view taken for granted by his “dogmatist” opponents in order to undercut their beliefs, a practice that is common in his writings.
Among his criticisms of dogmatist views, Sextus includes a critique of induction (epagōgē), which assumes that epagōgē is simply a process of enumerative induction. As we have already seen (sect. 3.2), this is unlikely to be what Aristotle understood by the term. But given this understanding of induction, Sextus is quick to point out its inadequacy. Those who follow this procedure must survey “all the particulars or some of them.” If they survey only some, the induction will be insecure, since it may be that some of the omitted particulars lack the feature in question. But if they try to survey all, “they will labour at an impossible task, since the particulars are infinite and indefinite” (Sextus PH 2.204). The argument is not strictly sound, since there are cases in which we know (or believe we know) all the instances. An example that would later be offered by John Buridan (1295–1358) is that of a proposition regarding all the (six) planets (SD 6.1.5). But if we set aside such instances, Sextus’s challenge anticipates what would later be called “the problem of induction”. The Stoics had had a response to this challenge, which is that the world is governed by a divine reason, which guarantees its orderliness and predictability (Allen 2001: 165). But it was not a response likely to satisfy a sceptic, ancient or modern.
On the face of it, the Sceptics’ project of living without belief seems impossible. One might argue, with David Hume, that “all human life must perish”, if the principles of ancient scepticism were “universally and steadily to prevail” (Hume 1902: 160 [§128]). But Sextus’s response to this problem was remarkably close to that offered by Hume (Smith 2022: 197), namely that we can (in practice) rely the observed association of particular kinds of events. The question here is whether this broadly empiricist attitude is consistent with Pyrrhonian Scepticism.
A key distinction here is that which Sextus makes between two types of sign: the “commemorative” or “recollective (hypomynēstikon)” and the “indicative (endeiktikon)” . An indicative sign is thought to signify some reality that has not directly been observed. It does so on account of what Sextus calls “its proper nature and constitution” (Sextus PH 2.101). The idea here seems to be that of a necessary connection between the sign and what it indicates, known by reason rather than by experience. The inference from movement to the possession of a soul, for example, makes use of an indicative sign, for the soul can never be directly observed. In Sextus’s view, inferences of this kind cannot be justified. (If Sceptics were to allow themselves to hold a philosophical doctrine, this would be an instance of explanatory empiricism.) Sextus is, however, happy to endorse the use of commemorative signs, which are based on nothing more than the past experience of the association of two kinds of phenomena. Smoke, for instance, is a commemorative sign of fire; a scar is a commemorative sign that the bearer has received a wound (Sextus PH 2.102).
On the face of it, this looks inconsistent with Pyrrhonian Scepticism, since it appears to involve holding a belief (such as “this is smoke”) and the making of an inference (such as “smoke, therefore fire”). But Sextus suggests that neither belief (in the sense of adherence to the truth of a proposition) nor inference (in the sense of a logical operation) is required. He argues that if reliance on commemorative signs did involve inferences, you would expect those who had no knowledge of logic to be less skilled in the relevant activities. But, as he writes, “illiterate helmsmen and farmers with no experience of dialectical principles are expert judges of signs” (akrōs sēmeiountai), being able to predict (in one case) a coming storm or calm weather and (in the other) a good or a poor harvest (Sextus M VII 2.270). Indeed, even non-human animals gain knowledge in this way. As Sextus writes, “the dog, when it tracks an animal by its footprints, is actually using signs” (sēmeioutai), although it is not making inferences. In Sextus’s words, “it does not formulate the judgement ‘if this is a footprint, a beast is here’” (Sextus M VII 2.271). One way of understanding this is to say that just as we cannot avoid “going along with” certain sense impressions, so we cannot avoid being influenced by such observed correlations. If this deflationary interpretation is correct, a reliance on commemorative signs would be consistent with Sextus’s scepticism.
4. Medieval Empiricism
It is hardly surprising, given the influence of Christianity, that neither ancient Scepticism nor Epicureanism found much of a following among medieval thinkers. Stoicism was influential, but more for its moral teachings than for its view of knowledge. However, the attitudes associated with the medical empiricism of the Hellenistic age did not entirely disappear: we find at least hints of these among late medieval writers. A striking example is the polemical work Antipocras by Nicholas of Poland (fl. 1278). While himself an educated man, trained within the scholastic tradition and assocated with the medical school at Montpellier, Nicholas advocated a medical practice based on experience, praising the knowledge of common people over against that of the scholars. This may have been a reaction to the more theoretical style of medicine developing at Montpellier as a result of the discovery of works by Galen and some Arab writers (Eamon & Keil 1987: 195). But for evidence of more general empiricist doctrines, we must turn to the followers of Aristotle.
4.1 Varieties of Medieval Empiricism
The medieval followers of Aristotle shared his confidence in the reliability of the senses. Thomas Aquinas (1225–1274), for example, follows Aristotle in holding that sensation is not deceived with regard to its proper objects, such as colours and sounds (ST 1a 17.3), provided that the sense organs are functioning properly and in the right circumstances (Pasnau 2002: 188–89).
Did medieval philosophers embrace a form of genetic empiricism? The Latin phrase characterizing an empiricism of this kind—nihil est in intellectu quod non prius fuerit in sensu (nothing is in the intellect that was not first in sensation)—was something of a commonplace. It is found (in variant forms) in the work of Bonaventure (1221–1274), where it is attributed to Aristotle, Aquinas, Matthew of Aquasparta (ca. 1240–1302), and Duns Scotus (1266–1308) (Cranefield 1970: 78–79). Not all accepted the idea, as we shall see, but Aristotelians generally took it for granted. Aquinas follows Aristotle (DA 432a7–9) in holding that all the objects of our understanding “have their being in the objects of perception,” rather than in some separated, Platonic realm. It follows that “without sense perception no one can either learn anything new, nor understand matters already learned.” Even when we are thinking about something we already know, our thought is always accompanied by an image (a “phantasm”), which is a likeness of something that can be perceived (Aquinas In DA 3.13 [para. 791]).
But even when medieval writers speak of the mind as a tabula rasa, we should not attribute to them the kind of genetic empiricism later found in the work of John Locke. The blank tablet of which medievals speak, following Aristotle (DA 430a1), is what they called the “passive” or “potential” intellect, which was only one element in the process of cognition (sect. 4.3). When it comes to the larger picture, medieval philosophers sometimes combine the Aristotelian idea that all knowledge comes through the senses with an Augustinian view, which speak of divine illumination (sect. 4.2), or with the idea of innate knowledge. Even Aquinas held that we have a kind of innate capacity, ultimately given by God, to grasp the first principles of scientific knowledge (Pasnau 2002: 307–8). This is probably best thought of as a kind of a dispositional innatism: we are disposed to form certain ideas when presented with the right kind of experience.
At times Aquinas seems to go further. He writes, for instance, that our knowledge arises “partly from within and partly from without” and that there is some truth in the idea that “we already know that which we learn” (Aquinas DV 10.6). Once again, however, this looks like a dispositional innatism: the principles we employ in forming our beliefs are implicit in the structure of the mind and its operations (Allers 1942: 58) (see sect. 4.3). Other writers are clearer in combining the tabula rasa idea with a commitment to the idea of innate knowledge. Roger Bacon (1215–1292), for instance, suggests that the human soul is created with the species (aspects or forms) of all things within it, which reflects an Augustinian conception of knowledge. But since the soul’s union with the body hinders our access to this knowledge, the human mind (as potential intellect) can be described as a “blank slate” (tabula nuda or rasa) (Bacon In Phys. pp. 7, 9; R. Wood 2007: 54). A similar view is found in the work of Robert Grosseteste (ca. 1165–1253), who also combines a modified Augustinian belief in divine illumination (sect. 4.2) with the Aristotelian idea that we gain knowledge of scientific principles from experience (van Dyke 2009: 688–89).
While these look like puzzling combinations of empiricist and non-empiricist views, their rationale will become clear shortly (sect. 4.3). But alongside this qualified genetic empiricism, we also find expressions of a justificatory empiricism. In particular, the work of Roger Bacon sets out two forms of justificatory empiricism, both of which fall under the heading of what he calls scientia experimentalis. The first involves confirming well-founded deliverances of reason by “trying them out,” as it were, for oneself (Hackett 2015: sect. 5.4.3). Bacon’s rationale for urging this kind of testing is that arguments alone are insufficient to convince us of the truth of any practical matter. “Reasoning,” he writes,
draws a conclusion and forces us to grant it, but it does not confirm it nor remove doubt so that the mind may rest in the knowledge of the truth, unless this is found by way of experience. … For if a man … should prove by way of adequate arguments that fire burns and harms and destroys things, still the mind of the hearer would not rest on this account nor would such a person avoid fire before he had placed his hand or some combustible material in fire, so that he might test by experience [ut per experientiam probaret] what the argument had taught. (Bacon OM 6.1)
It follows (in a phrase for which Bacon has become famous) that “without experience nothing can be sufficiently known” (sine experientia nihil sufficienter sciri potest) (OM 6.1).
A second form of justificatory empiricism holds that some beliefs can be defended only by reference to experience, there being no arguments from prior principles that can be adduced in their support. These include, first of all, matters within the domain of the other sciences which mere reasoning could never have revealed, such as the practical discoveries made by alchemists (Bacon OM 6, 2a prae.). But there are also matters that fall outside the domain of any speculative science, fields of inquiry in which scientia experimentalis “by its own power investigates the secrets of nature” (Bacon OM 6, 3a prae.). To appreciate what this kind of investigation entailed, we need to understand the class of phenomena to which it applied: that of the secrets of nature.
The domain of natural philosophy was “the common course of nature” (Biard 2001: 79, 80): it dealt with what occurred (in Aristotle’s phrase) “either always or for the most part” (ē tou aei ē tou hōs epi to polu) (Met. 1027a21–22). But there existed phenomena that fell outside this domain, namely miracles and marvels. Miracles, in the strict sense, were supernatural occurrences, which fell in the domain of theology. But marvellous phenomena were often thought of as “preternatural,” that is to say, as brought about by occult but natural properties and powers (Daston 1991: 95–100). Such powers included the influence exercised by the heavenly bodies on earthly affairs, as well as mysterious properties of sublunary entities, such as the lodestone. These powers were occult in the sense of being hidden. But they were also mysterious in that their workings were not explicable in terms of what Aristotelians believed to be the four simple substances (earth, air, fire, and water) and their associated primary qualities (the hot and the cold, the moist and the dry) (Pasnau 2011: 44). It is for this reason that they could not be proved to exist by demonstrative arguments, but could be known only by experience. This gave rise to a particular form of empiricism associated with the study of “natural magic.”
An example can be found in the work of an author already mentioned: Nicholas of Poland, the radical medical empiricist of Montpellier. In his Antipocras, Nicholas claims that although the presence of a divinely given power in the most humble of objects cannot be proven by reason, it “is made evident by its effect” (hoc patet effectu) (Nicholas of Poland Ant. ll. 202–3). In this respect Nicholas seems to have been influenced by another work more closely associated with magic, the De mirabilibus mundi. This states that there are “certain effects manifest to the senses to which we can assign no reason,” as well as effects known only by way of reason. The marvellous powers of natural objects belong to the former category, which are known by way of practical experience (per experientiam) (Ps-Albertus PA-DM para. 49–50). While this work was falsely attributed to Albert the Great (ca. 1200–1280), Albert himself adopts a similar line when defending the mysterious powers of certain stones: these, too, are known “most convincingly by experience,” although they lack a scientific explanation (A-DM 2.1.1).
When medieval writers speak of knowing matters per experientiam (by experience), they are understanding the term experientia very broadly. The same may be said of the term experimentalis, so that the phrase scientia experimentalis should be translated as “experiential knowledge” rather than “experimental science.” Although Bacon’s scientia experimentalis did include practical procedures (experimenta), as were used in alchemy, as well as the use of instruments (as in the study of optics and astronomy), it also included simple observation as well as reliance on second-hand reports of dubious value. (We are still a long way from the motto of the seventeenth-century Royal Society: nullius in verba, “take no man’s word for it.”) Nor is there any consistent link with quantification. In only a few fields, such as astronomy, are the procedures employed by natural philosophers associated with careful measurement.
In the century following Bacon’s work, we do find the development of what we may call “quantified concepts,” particularly in the study of local motion. We find this, in particular, in the work of the Oxford calculatores associated with Merton College, who are perhaps best known for their formulation of the “mean speed theorem.” This was the idea that
a uniform acceleration produces the same … distance travelled in a given time, as a uniform velocity equal to the instantaneous velocity at the middle instance of the time of acceleration. (Crombie 1961: 153)
But while such developments mark a break with the Aristotelian tradition of a purely qualitative physics, they remain largely theoretical. While the discussions giving rise to the mean speed theorem emerged from everyday observations of falling bodies, the theorem itself was proven arithmetically and geometrically (Clagett 1959: 256, 259–60). The principles developed were not “operationalized,” that is to say, expressed in forms that would allow for experimental testing (Clagett 1959: 206). Their experimental testing had to await Galileo’s inclined plane experiments (Crombie 1961: 153–54).
This broad understanding of experience is evident, too, in medieval conceptions of the origin and scope of perceptual knowledge. With regard to the origins of such knowledge, later empiricists would focus almost exclusively on the five “exterior senses.” But medieval authors, following Avicenna (Ibn Sīnā; 980–1037), commonly list up to five “interior senses” (Bates 2010: 138–39) alongside the exterior ones. Aquinas reduces these to four: the common sense, the imagination, the vis aestimativa (or cogitativa), and the sense memory (Aquinas ST 1a 78.4). The work of these interior senses involves an active role in shaping our perceptions, even those of our physical environment. The mind, in other words, is not entirely passive, even at its basic levels of operation. The vis aestimativa, for instance, refers to the power that even non-rational creatures have of making judgements about what is dangerous or useful: it shapes our perceptions by adding an evaluative component.
With regard to the scope of experience, this was generally thought to include knowledge of our own interior acts. That we have some kind of immediate access to such knowledge was “one of the truisms of Augustinian thought” (Leff 1975: 28). Its mechanism was unclear—Scotus says simply that we know these things “by way of a certain sense, that is, an interior perception” (quodam sensu, id est, perceptione interiore) (Scotus Ord. IV d. 43, q. 2)—but its existence was not in doubt. As an anonymous scribe wrote in the margin of one of Ockham’s manuscripts, the idea that “there is nothing in the intellect unless it was formerly in the [exterior] senses” applies to “external objects, not to its own acts” (Leff 1975: 28 n.116). In Bacon’s work, this focus on inner experience is taken a step further, insofar as his conception of experience embraces not only our everyday mental states, but also spiritual states up to and including “raptures” in which people have visions of things “of which it is not lawful for human beings to speak” (Bacon OM 6.2). These are experiences brought about by the grace of God, rather than any purely natural process of cognition.
I have been arguing that medieval thought included a qualified form of genetic empiricism (to which I shall return) and a distinctive form of justificatory empiricism, coupled with a broad understanding of “experience.” What about explanatory empiricism? Insofar as medieval natural philosophy was influenced by Aristotle it shared his view of scientific explanations. For the most part these did not invoke unobservable entities that are distinct from the explanandum, but generative powers that stem from very nature of the object being investigated (sect. 3.2). Medieval thinkers did not deny that we could know about unobservable entities. God, after all, was an unobservable entity, and thinkers such as Aquinas thought that “natural reason” could know something about God, albeit by way of analogy. (William of Ockham [ca. 1285–1347] would later downplay the extent of such knowledge, without dismissing it altogether [Leff 1975: 382–98].) But there were limits to what we could know about the unobservable features of the natural world (Hutchison 1982: 235–36). Aquinas, for instance, appears to endorse Aristotle’s view that when it comes to matters that are “not manifest to the senses” (immanifesta sensui) we should not demand “a certain and necessary demonstration”; a merely possible explanation may be the best we can achieve (Aquinas In Meteor. 1.7 [lect. 11]). One could regard this as a very modest kind of explanatory empiricism.
One late medieval writer did embrace a stronger version of explanatory empiricism. This was Nicholas of Autrecourt (1299–1369). Nicholas’s central idea is that (outside of the articles of faith) we can have certain knowledge only of propositions whose denial would result in a contradiction. But since we can, without contradiction, affirm the existence of something while denying the existence of that which is thought to be its cause, we can have no certain knowledge when it comes to causation. In a similar way, we cannot infer the existence of an underlying substance from appearances of things (Thijssen 1987: 243–44). More generally, Nicholas writes, “from the fact that something is known to be, it cannot be inferred evidently … that there is some other thing” (Letter to Bernard 2, §11 [p. 65]). These observations amount to a vigorous attack on the Aristotelian ideal of scientific understanding: the idea that we can (at least in principle) have certain knowledge of the essences of things (Stiefel 1992: 299).
Nicholas remains an empiricist rather than a thorough-going sceptic, for he believes that we cannot, without contradiction, deny what appears to be the case. I cannot, for example, affirm both that a “white patch appears to me and that it does not appear to me” (Copleston 1974: 253). The problem is that this certainty is limited to appearances; it does not extend to the things themselves. To escape from scepticism, Nicholas has to revert to merely probable knowledge. As he writes “if we have any certainty about things, it is probable that everything that appears to be is (omne illud quod apparet esse sit), and that everything that appears to be true is true (omne illud quod apparet esse verum sit verum)” (EO p. 228). This merely probable knowledge is itself conditional: it holds on the condition that “we have any certainty about things.” What makes Nicholas confident this condition is fulfilled is his firm conviction regarding “the goodness and purposiveness of things” (Weinberg 1948: 127), a view that reminds us of the Stoics (sect. 3.3.4 Nicholas believes that “since falsehood is an evil of the intellect, the complete goodness of the universe would have to be denied if the human desire to know were eternally thwarted” (Weinberg 1948: 193). But this principle of goodness is itself a matter of merely probable knowledge (Weinberg 1948: 127–28).
4.2 The Eclipse of Divine Illumination
I have already noted a certain ambivalence among medievals writers regarding what I have called genetic empiricism, insofar as they combine the idea of a ‘blank slate’ with that of an innate capacity of the mind to form ideas. Some medievals, as we saw, went further, holding that the mind was incapable of attaining scientific knowledge without a divine illumination. It is time to look more closely at this idea of divine illumination: the reasons why it was held and its gradual decline.
Followers of St Augustine shared Plato’s doubts about the capacity of sense perception, in particular about its ability to give rise to scientific knowledge. Such knowledge, they held, did not arise from sense perception alone; it required a further input, provided by God himself: a divine illumination. This can be a difficult idea for a modern reader to grasp, since it is easily confused with another belief, which has to do with a supernatural source of knowledge accessed by faith. The two are analogous, insofar as they both involve a divine initiative. The act of faith requires a divine initiative “on the volitional side,” to enable us to accept propositions as divinely revealed. The doctrine of divine illumination also speaks of a divine initiative, but that initiative is directly cognitive rather than volitional (Pasnau 2015: sect. 1). It holds that divine illumination is required for a number of apparently ordinary cognitive activities, which are engaged in by believers and non-believers alike.
While this doctrine has theological roots, it was also motivated by two features of human knowledge. The first has to do with those principles of thought that appear to be necessarily, not contingently, true. These include mathematical truths and principles such as that of non-contradiction or sufficient reason. While such principles are essential to thought, it is difficult to see how they could be derived from sense perception. (Aristotle had provided an empiricist account of the origin of mathematical ideas [sect. 3.2], but this was, and remains, contested.) A second motivation was related to the Aristotelian ideal of science. Scientific understanding (epistēmē, or scientia), as we have seen, involved a grasp of the essential properties of perceived objects. But this, too, involves a kind of insight that can seem to lie beyond the capacity of the senses (sect. 3.2). Advocates of divine illumination argued that these kinds of knowledge were possible only because the human mind has access to the mind of God. More precisely, it was possible only because God bathed the human mind in his own, uncreated light. This allowed it not only to grasp necessary truths, but to understand the essences of created beings by reference to their exemplars in the divine mind.
The development of medieval empiricism involved a rejection of this doctrine. It is already opposed by Aquinas, who holds that that the human mind requires a special divine illumination only for those matters that entirely exceed its natural powers, which are known by divine revelation (Aquinas ST 1a 2ae 109.1). But the most vigorous rejection of the doctrine is to be found in the work of Duns Scotus, who opposes the (modified) illuminationist teaching found in the work of Henry of Ghent (ca. 1217–1293).
Henry’s version of the illuminationist doctrine was already influenced by Aristotelian thought (Marrone 1985: 145; 2011: 24), which in this context took the form of a desire to attribute as much as possible to the power of the human mind. But Henry was reluctant to attribute all we know to our unaided powers. In particular, he made a distinction between knowing what is true (id quod verum est) about an object and knowing its truth (eius veritatem). The first is a very basic level of knowledge, existing even in non-human animals. It does grasp its object as a something distinct from the knower, but fails to grasp its essential characteristics. Such knowledge is not sufficient for science, which requires a grasp of what the object truly is (quid sit in rei veritate) (Henry of Ghent Summa 1.2). The latter kind of knowledge requires access to the exemplar of the object in the divine mind, something only God can give.
It is this idea that Duns Scotus opposes. He would not, of course, have opposed the idea that the human mind was created by God and thus owes all its powers to God. (Scotus was, after all, a theologian.) But he did deny that scientific knowledge involved a special divine illumination. His argument proceeds in two stages. He insists, first of all, that Henry’s restrictions on the powers of the human mind, rather than leading to scientific certainty, lead inevitably to scepticism. If the human mind is naturally incapable of grasping these truths, then no amount of divine light will help it. He then argues that there are four kinds of naturally attainable knowledge that give rise to the certainty required for science. There is, first of all, knowledge of “matters knowable in an unqualified sense,” such as the fact that a triangle has three angles equal to two right angles. The second is knowledge of “matters knowable through experience,” such as that the moon is eclipsed. The third is knowledge of “our own actions,” such as the fact that I am awake. The fourth is knowledge of “matters we are currently aware of through the senses,” such as that the object in front of me is white (Scotus Ord. I dist. 3, pars 1, qu. 4, adnot.).
Perhaps the most critical of these is knowledge through experience, for it relates to the way we grasp the principles of scientific explanation. Scotus’s suggestion is that we can know these principles through repeated exposure to particular instances. As he writes,
even though a person does not experience every single individual, but only a great many, nor does he experience them at all times, but only frequently, still be knows infallibly that it is always this way and holds for all instances. He knows this in virtue of this proposition reposing in his soul: “Whatever occurs in a great many instances by a cause that is not free, is the natural effect of that cause.” (Scotus Ord. I dist. 3, pars 1, qu. 4)
Scotus seems to regard this proposition as self-evidently true. But as Nicholas of Autrecourt would point out, it merely begs the question (Thijssen 1987: 249). In any case, Nicholas writes, if Scotus means by a cause “that which brought an effect in a great many instances in the past and will do so in the future,” then there is a problem. For “even if something has brought about an effect in a great many instances, it is still not certain it will continue to do so” (EO p. 237; Thijssen 1987: 249 n. 44). So we cannot, with certainty, form general statements on the basis of the kind of observations to which Scotus appeals. (This is, of course, the very problem of induction to which Sextus Empiricus had referred [sect. 3.3.4].) Even if we could formulate such general statements, we could not be certain that they embody causal claims. It is true that at least one contemporary, John Buridan, would weaken the traditional Aristotelian idea that a scientific explanation should make its conclusion necessary (Grant 2010: 237). But the issue Nicholas raised would remain a challenge to even Buridan’s more relaxed ideal of scientific knowledge.
We shall come back to this question (sect. 4.3), which was made more pressing by the nominalism of Scotus’s successor, William of Ockham. But even if Scotus had no satisfactory alternative to the doctrine of divine illumination, that doctrine was soon eclipsed. By the mid-fourteenth century, it seems to have been no longer considered a viable option. While the idea did not entirely disappear—it re-emerges, for instance, in the work of Nicolas Malebranche (1638–1715)—its rejection by late medieval thinkers marked an important step on the road to a more thorough-going empiricism.
4.3 A Cognitive Empiricism
I shall conclude this discussion by returning to the strong form of genetic empiricism that I have called “cognitive empiricism”: the idea that the mind has no access to sources of knowledge that are independent of the senses. It is clear that advocates of the doctrine of divine illumination would not count as cognitive empiricists. But what about those who rejected this doctrine? One might question whether even they were cognitive empiricists, for the same reason one might ask this question of Aristotle. While recognizing that all factual knowledge dervives from the senses, they attributed to the mind a remarkable ability to grasp the universals embedded in the singular objects of sense perception. What we see in the work of William of Ockham is a downgrading of this power, which goes hand-in-hand with a rethinking of the idea of universals. Ockham’s work thus laid the foundations on which early modern empiricists would build.
The power of the mind to grasp universals was traditionally attributed to what was called the “agent intellect,” the intellect as active or productive. The idea of the agent (or active) intellect is one of the most complex and contested aspects of medieval epistemology. It has its origins in some cryptic remarks made by Aristotle (DA 430a10–19), in which he distinguishes between two aspects of the mind. There is the mind as “that which becomes all things” (nous tōi panta ginesthai) and there is the mind as “that which makes all things” (ho … tōi panta poiein). Behind these descriptions is the idea that the mind “becomes” the object of its knowledge, in the sense of taking on its intelligible form without the matter in which it was originally embodied. The mind as passive—as that which becomes all things—stands in relation to the mind that makes all things in the same way that prime matter, which is pure potential, stands in relation to its shaping principle. Aristotle describes the mind as active or productive—the nous poiētikos, to use a phrase coined by his commentators—in terms that suggest something immaterial: it is “separable, unmixed, and impassible.” This may be because it is not so much a substance, as an operation or function; indeed Aristotle describes the nous poiētikos as “by nature activity” (tēi ousiai … energeia).
As that last interpretive remark suggests, this passage demands commentary and commentators disagreed about how it was to be understood. (For a classic survey, see Brentano 1992.) Broadly speaking, there were two views. The first held that the agent intellect was separate from each human mind, such that the intelligible forms “flow” from this immaterial entity into the mind to produce an act of understanding. This was the view held, in two quite different forms, by Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna) and Ibn Rushd (Averroës) (1126–1198). Such a view implies that there is only one agent intellect, common to all human beings, which may or may not be identified with God himself. (When it is identified with God, this view closely resembles the Augustinian doctrine of divine illumination.) The alternative idea, vigorously defended by Aquinas, held that both the agent intellect and the potential intellect are aspects of the human mind. Even among those who held that latter view, there were different ways in which the agent intellect was thought to produce knowledge. In some versions of the doctrine (such as Aquinas’s) the agent intellect was thought to abstract the intelligible forms from the images produced by the senses. In other versions, the input of the senses was little more than the occasion on which the agent intellect drew on its own innate resources, in the process of which the mind could be thought of as enlightened by God. Thomas of York (d. ca. 1260), for instance spoke openly in this context of innate ideas and of a knowledge that came “from above and not from the senses” (Bowman 1973: 265).
The second of these views, in particular, seems incompatible with both a tabula rasa and a cognitive empiricism. So it is not surprising that the development of a more thoroughgoing cognitive empiricism went hand-in-hand with with an effective abandonment of the idea of the agent intellect.
The work of the agent intellect had seemed essential because of a widely held view regarding the object of knowledge. This held that while the senses deal with particular individuals, the intellect can grasp only their universal properties. As Aquinas writes, citing Aristotle (APo. 87b37–39), “sense has to do with particulars, whereas intellect has to do with universals” (sensus particularium, intellectus … universalium) (Aquinas In DA 2.5 [sect. 284]). (The idea that the intellect has direct knowledge only of universals seems distinctively Aristotelian; it was not shared by other ancient philosophical schools [Normore 2007: 114].) Aquinas’s reason for holding this view is that the intellect, as an immaterial substance, cannot directly grasp material singulars. Intellectual knowledge therefore requires the work of the agent intellect, abstracting the immaterial intelligible forms from the perceptible forms grasped by the senses. We do, of course, know singular objects, for all the objects of sensation are, ultimately, singulars. But in Aquinas’s view, the intellect knows these objects only indirectly, by directing its attention back to the images yielded by the senses and linking these with the associated general concept (Aquinas ST 1a 86.1).
William of Ockham, on the other hand, holds what Aquinas expressly denies: that “the singular object is that which is first known, in a manner simple and proper to itself” (Ockham Quodl. I qu. 13). He holds, too, that the immateriality of the intellect is no barrier to this, since the relation involved is a merely intentional one (Ockham Ord. I dist. 3, qu. 6; In Phys. 1.1 [sect. 2]). Ockham, however, goes further in denying the very existence of universals. All Aristotelians, of course, denied that universals exist extra rem (distinct from singular objects). But Christian Aristotelians such as Aquinas continued to regard the similarities between individuals of a given kind as the product of a common idea, which existed ante rem (before the existence of particular objects) in the mind of God (Aquinas ST 1a 15.2). As aspects of the divine mind, these were thought to share in the divine nature. Indeed they were nothing less than “the divine essence as imitable outside itself” (Klocker 1980: 357). This gave the natural kinds discoverable by science a metaphysical grounding. While paying lip service to the Augustinian notion of ideas in the divine mind, Ockham reduced these to the ideas God has of individual objects in the act of creating them. These ideas refer, in the first instance, to the creatures themselves: the only reason for positing them is that when God creates he knows what he is doing (Deus est rationabiliter operans) (Ockham Ord. I dist. 35, qu. 5). It follows, as Ockham writes, that
no universal … exists in any way outside the mind and anything that can be predicated of many is by its nature in the mind either psychologically [subiective] or logically [obiective], and … no universal is of the essence or nature [de essentia seu quidditate] of any substance. (Ockham Ord. I dist. 2, qu. 8)
This means that the features that unite entities of a kind, which are expressed in the general propositions of science, no longer have a metaphysical foundation. While this view is generally described as “nominalist,” it is more accurately characterized as “conceptualist,” since the “names” to which universals were reduced were nomina mentalia (mental names), or (as we would say) concepts (Maurer 1999: 63–64). But with this qualification in mind, I shall continue to refer to it as “nominalist.”
What implications does this have for the idea of the agent intellect? Despite his nominalism, Ockham continues to believe that there are real similarities lying behind our classificatory schemes, rejecting the idea that these are entirely matters of convention (Ockham Ord. I dist. 2 qu. 8). But although real similarities exist, they are not expressions of common essences or natures. Coupled with the idea that the mind has an immediate grasp of singular objects, it follows that a special faculty was not longer required in order to abstract the universal from the particular. It was enough for the mind to be able to identify similarities among particular individuals. (Note that the status of these similarities then became a problem, which Ockham may never satisfactorily have resolved [Goddu 1984: 92–93].) So it comes as no surprise to discover that Ockham denies any real distinction between the agent intellect and the potential intellect. “The same intellect,” he writes, simply “has different names” (Ockham Ord. I dist. 3, qu. 6). Since there was now no distinctive task for the agent intellect to perform, Ockham could wield his famous razor to abandon the idea that it represented a distinct power of the mind (Ockham Rep. II qu. 20).
There is another dimension to the empiricism of this period, which is a new emphasis on experience as a means of discovering causal relations. Any Aristotelian, of course, would have agreed that we know of causal relations by means of experience. But what we find in the work of Scotus and Ockham is a particular focus on this idea, coupled with descriptions of how one may isolate particular causes. Historians have long associated this with a renewed emphasis on God’s absolute power and the idea that the order of the world depends entirely on his will, which makes that order radically contingent and discoverable only a posteriori (Foster 1934: 464–65; Henry 2009: 88). It is, however, difficult to find a contemporary expression of this idea and it has recently been contested (Harrison 2002: 63–64). Nor should one overstate the degree of novelty in the thought of Scotus and Ockham. Grosseteste had already outlined the idea of a controlled experiment (Lewis 2013: sect. 11), which itself had been anticipated in the work of Galen (sect. 3.3.1). Interestingly, Grosseteste’s example had also been a medical one: he notes that we can come to know that scammony (convulvulus scammonia) purges red bile by administering it “after all other causes purging red bile have been isolated and excluded” (Grosseteste In APo. 1.15; Crombie 1953: 74). It is true, however, that more detailed accounts of how to isolate causal relations are found only in the late thirteenth and fourteenth centuries. Scotus outlined several such methods (Vos 2006: 312–19), all of which involved separating out possible causes and testing them by seeing in which cases the effect follows. At one point, for example, Scotus writes:
How, from perceptible effects, does one arrive at knowledge of the cause? I respond, by dividing thus: in [a situation of type] A are present [factors] B, C, D, if you wish to know which of D, B, or C is a cause, consider the case where you find B without C. If then D follows B and not C, then in [a situation of type] A, B is the cause of D. (Scotus In Met. I qu. 4)
Ockham picks up on this idea. He does not deny that we can know of some causes by simple reasoning, on the basis of self-evident or well-established metaphysical principles. We can know, for instance, that the will causes its own acts (Ockham Ord. I dist. 1, qu. 3) or that there exists a first conserving cause of this world (Ockham Ord. I dist. 2, qu. 10]). But when it comes to the discovery of causes within the natural world, we must rely on observation. If a causal agent is of a very specific kind (in Ockham’s terms, known by way of its species specialissima), just one observation will suffice. A single observation of a particular kind of herb curing a particular illness, for example, can safely be generalized. It can be generalized on the basis of the principle that “all agents of the most specific kind will bring about effects of the same nature” (Ockham Ord. I prol. qu. 2). If the suspected cause is of a more generic kind, then many instances will be needed (Ockham Ord. I prol. qu. 2). But in either case, the process is thoroughly empirical: it involves the isolation of causal factors by way of experience. As Ockham writes,
although I do not intend to make any general claim about the nature of immediate [secondary] causes, I shall say what suffices for something to be an immediate cause, namely that when it is present there occurs the effect, and when it is not present … the effect does not occur. And everything that has this character with respect to another is the cause of that other … That this is sufficient for one thing to be the cause of another, seems manifest. Because if not, there remains no way of knowing something to be the cause of something else. (Ockham Ord. I dist. 45, qu. 1)
It is tempting to see this as a reduction of the idea of causation to that of the regular association of kinds of events. One could even argue that such a view would be a logical consequence of Ockham’s nominalism (Klocker 1980: 351). But Ockham’s point here seems to be epistemological, not metaphysical: this is how we discover a cause (Adams 1979: 23). It follows that the only kind of cause we can discover is that which produces a novel (and therefore observable) effect. Without such an effect, there would (once again) be no way of knowing something to be a cause (Ockham Sum. II 3). Coupled with the effective abandonment of the idea of the agent intellect, this brings us very close to a thoroughgoing cognitive empiricism.
Those sympathetic to empiricism may be inclined to portray this history as a progress from darkness to light. But a moment’s reflection suggests it deserves a more cautious evaluation. These ancient and medieval thinkers certainly laid the foundations on which early modern and modern empiricists would build. But they also bequeathed a series of problems, some of which have never been satisfactorily resolved.
There are, first of all, the problems faced by the Epicureans, who were genetic but not explanatory empiricists, favouring the atomist theory of Leucippus and Democritus. As Democritus seems to have realized, while the atomist doctrine can be supported by observable facts (such as the fact of motion), once formulated it seems to undercut a belief in the reliability of such observations. At the very least, it suggests a distinction between what would later be called “primary” and “secondary” qualities, narrowing the range of the kind of experiences to which natural philosophers would appeal.
The Epicureans also seem to have come up against another enduring problem: that of the underdetermination of theory by data. If the senses cannot directly “bear witness” to the existence of what cannot be observed, being able only to bear witness against it, there may be a number of apparently equally acceptable hypotheses about the unobservable. One could argue, as Epicureans seem to have done, that these should all be regarded as true, in the sense of being realized somewhere and at some time. But this seems unsatisfactory when it comes to explaining particular events.
More broadly, there is the problem of just what experience can show. Can experience be a source of mathematical or logical knowledge? Can it reveal the causal relations that are traditionally regarded as the goal of science? Aristotle, as we saw, seems to have held that the mind has the power of identifying the causal powers that belong to particular kinds of entities. But it was never clear that experience alone could achieve such an insight. Medieval discussions of the “agent intellect” tended to regard it as an external power, or, at least, a human faculty that participates in a divine light. Thinkers such as Henry of Ghent went further, embracing the Augustinian idea that an act of divine illumination is required on each occasion we attain such insights. Under the impact of Aristotelian naturalism this idea was abandoned, but without (it must be said) any clear alternative.
Later empiricists could (and did) follow Ockham in denying that there are universals to be discovered; they professed to be undisturbed by the fact that we cannot grasp the “real essences” of the objects we perceive (Locke Essay 3.6.9). But the problems of empiricism did not go away. Even one of the empiricist’s favorite ideas—the “covering law” account of scientific explanation—assumes we can arrive at true generalizations, propositions that apply to all members of a particular class. But for those who take Ockham’s nominalism to its logical conclusion, a law of nature can be nothing more than a contingently true proposition. Since the similarities that fix class membership have no metaphysical grounding, not being based on a shared nature, we cannot know the truth of the law by any kind of rational insight. The only way of testing such a proposition is by observation. It is at this point that there arises the “problem of induction,” first discussed by Sextus Empiricus and picked up by Nicholas of Autrecourt, but made famous in the eighteenth century by David Hume.
In our own time, the wheel has turned. On the one hand, talk of “essences” and necessary truths has become fashionable again, at least in some circles (Haldane 2018). In particular, if we want to distinguish laws of nature from accidental generalizations, contingently true propositions do not seem sufficient for science. Laws of nature on this view must embody modal knowledge, particularly as this relates to contrary-to-fact conditionals (Armstrong 1978: 274). This brings us back to Aristotle, for his conception of scientific knowledge (epistēmē) involved knowing that given a posited cause, the fact to be explained cannot be otherwise (APo. 71b11). The problem for the empiricist is: How can sense perception yield modal knowledge of this kind? On the other hand, William of Ockham’s nominalism can be thought to anticipate the work of contemporary thinkers who would “lower the bar” (as it were), no longer demanding that we gain knowledge of what is necessarily the case. Taken to its logical conclusion, Ockham’s view can be thought to hold that the “universals” that were the goal of Aristotelian science are no more than “sets of competencies in classifying things together”, which have no grounding outside the practices in which we engage (King 2003: 225). (For a less sceptical reading of Ockham, see Colvert 2000: 265.) Is a radical nominalism of this kind tenable? The question has not yet been answered.
This article began with the observation that we should not approach ancient thinkers in a “Whiggish” fashion; nor should we force their thought into modern categories. But what this history shows is that there is no need to do so. Once we understand what these thinkers were saying, we can see that we are still grappling with the issues they raised.
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