Roger Bacon

First published Thu Apr 19, 2007; substantive revision Wed Apr 15, 2020

Roger Bacon (1214/1220–1292), Master of Arts, contemporary of Robert Kilwardby, Peter of Spain, and Albert the Great at the University of Paris in the 1240s, was one of the early Masters who taught Aristotle’s works on natural philosophy and metaphysics. Sometime after 1248–49, he became an independent scholar with an interest in languages, mastering the known Greek and Arabic texts on the science of optics. In 1256/57, either at Paris or Oxford, he joined the Franciscan Order. By 1262 he believed that his university reputation for advanced learning had suffered. And so, he sought the Patronage of Cardinal Guy le Gros de Foulque, Papal Ambassador to England (who later served as Pope Clement IV, 1265–68). On the instruction of the Pope on June 22, 1266, Bacon quickly wrote “an introductory work,” the Opus maius, and the related works, Opus minus and Opus tertium. He set out his own new model for a reform of the system of philosophical, scientific, and theological studies, seeking to incorporate language studies and science studies, then unavailable, at the University of Paris.

In this project, he was partly successful. He wrote a new and provocative text on semiotics, and influenced the addition of perspectiva to mathematical studies (the Quadrivium) as a required university subject. He succeeded in setting out a model of an experimental science on the basis of his study of optics. The latter was used in his extension of experimental science to include new medicines and the general health care of the body. He did this in a new context: the application of linguistic and scientific knowledge for a better understanding of Theology and in the service of the Res publica Christiana. Bonaventure and John Pecham were among his first readers. It is clear that with the possible exception of the uses or astrology and alchemy, Bacon shared in Bonaventure’s project seeking a “reduction” of the sciences to theology. Bacon also found a sympathetic reader and interpreter in the great secular scholar of the Sorbonne, Peter of Limoges (d. 1306). He uses Bacon’s optics for scientific and moral investigation. Bacon through the work of Peter of Limoges may have influenced Raymond Lull. Sometime in the late 1270s or early 1280s, Bacon returned to Oxford, where he completed his edition with introduction and notes of the Secretum secretorum, a Latin translation of an Arabic text on the education of the Prince, the Sirr-al-‘asrar. He believed it to be a work by Aristotle written for Alexander the Great. This work of advice to the Prince points to Bacon’s close connections to the Papal Court through Pope Clement IV, the French Court through Alphonse of Poitiers, and the English Court. His contacts with the Papal Curia were mediated by William Bonecor, Ambassador for King Henry III. Bacon died at Oxford c. 1292.

1. Modern Research on Roger Bacon

There are two modern approaches to Bacon. The first is the study of the physical, metaphysical, and related works of Bacon. Discovered in 1848 by Victor Cousin in Amiens MS 406, these works were edited by Robert Steele and Ferdinand Delorme [OHI, 1905–1940]. With the exception, however, of some new work on the teaching on the soul, Bacon’s concept of matter, the doctrine of experientia/experimentum, and the doctrines of universals and individuation, the doctrine of the heavens, and alchemy, the content of these works has remained largely unstudied until the present time. Indeed, one can argue that “critical” scholarly study of these works has only just begun. In 2013, Silvia Donati made a critical study of Amiens MS 406. She has presented solid arguments for excluding three of the eight philosophical commentaries from the canon of Bacon’s works. They are the Questions on the Physics I-IV, Questions on Metaphysics XI, and Questions on Metaphysics I-IV. These three texts were commonly used in all previous scholarship. And so, great care must now be taken in reading the traditional scholarship on early Bacon where these works have often been referenced.

The second and better known interpretation of Roger Bacon as a scientist is found in nineteenth and twentieth century writers on the history of science and has a solid basis in Bacon’s own work, e.g., the edition of the Opus tertium by J.S. Brewer [OQHI]. Bacon’s Perspectiva (1267) [PRSP, 1996] presents a model for an experimental science that ushered in a new addition to the traditional Quadrivium (arithmetic, geometry, astronomy, music) in the new universities of the Latin West, namely, the study of optics. The university teaching text, “The Common Teaching on Perspectiva,” was written by Bacon’s Parisian colleague,John Pecham. We have critical editions now for the major scientific works of Bacon. SISMEL at Florence, Italy now houses a Roger Bacon research center. It has plans for future critical editions. A new international society for the study of Roger Bacon, The Roger Bacon Research Society has recently been established.

In 1859, William Whewell set the tone for this modern account of “Roger Bacon and the Sciences” (Whewell 1858, p. 245). He viewed Bacon as an advocate of experimentation ahead of his time. In the late nineteenth century, Robert Adamson and many others interpreted Bacon as a philosopher of science in the modern sense of the term. This understanding of Roger Bacon did not begin in the nineteenth century. Already in the late Renaissance, Francis Bacon had characterized Roger Bacon as an exceptional figure among the schoolmen.[1] Francis held that Roger Bacon had set aside the scholastic disputations of his age and engaged in the mechanical understanding of the secrets of nature.

In the 1900s, Thorndike [LT1;LT2] and Duhem [LSDM, III, 442] asserted that the role of observation in Bacon’s science was minimal and added nothing to his idea of a science. This modern read-back of modern experimental method ignored the importance of optics in Bacon’s model for a science (Lindberg, 1997). In recent studies (2006, 2012), Jeremiah Hackett has made explicit the manner in which Roger Bacon served as a foil for Martin Heidegger’s discussions on the originality of modern science as a sign of Modernity. For Heidegger, Bacon did not achieve the post-Galilean and Post-Cartesian discovery of a mathematical projection of nature and the consequent modern experiment. He claimed that it was false to argue, as many had done between 1880 and 1940, that Roger Bacon was the source for the post-Cartesian concept of science. One can argue for the uniqueness of modern scientific method without setting aside the longue duree that led to Kepler. One might note in passing that for Heidegger, Kepler is the true forefather of modern science. In the post-World War II years, A.C. Crombie (1953) argued that the “qualitative” aspects of modern science originated at Oxford in the early thirteenth century, specifically in the work of Grosseteste and Roger Bacon. This interpretation received a critical response from Alexander Koyré (1957) and others. Despite their significantly different philosophical committments, Heidegger and Koyré both shared Husserl’s views on the distinctiveness of the modern mathematical projection of nature as a condition for controlled experimentation. This was seen as a distinctive new phenomenon, a marker of modernity and something quite distinct from ancient and medieval science. It was argued that Crombie read back some aspects of modern scientific method into the works of Grosseteste and Bacon. However, a recent study by Mattia Mantovani has signaled clear connections between Bacon and Descartes’ approach to vision and perception (Mantovani 2020).

Thomas S. Kuhn (1976), however, maintained that Crombie did identify a real methodological connection between medieval and early modern science. More recently, M. Schramm (1998) has argued that Bacon plays a significant role in framing the context for the beginnings of medieval, Renaissance and early modern notions of laws of nature. This discusion has now been taken up for research by Giora Hon and Yael Raizman-Kedar. The studies and editorial work of David C. Lindberg on Bacon’s natural philosophy, for example, the De multiplicatione specierum [DMS] and Perspectiva [PRSP] (1983–1996) have emphasized the need to read Roger Bacon as a medieval scientist and not as an early modern or modern scientist. Thus, it is as a medieval philosopher, scientist, and theologian that he must be properly understood. Despite the polarity generated by two separate modern traditions of interpretation, it should be noted that there is some continuity between the interests of Bacon the Aristotelian commentator and Bacon the writer on science.

2. Life and Works

Bacon remarks in the Opus tertium [OQHI], written c. 1267 that he had devoted forty years to study since he first learned the alphabetum and that no other scholar had worked as much in the Arts and Sciences as he. Some scholars use this text to argue that Bacon was writing about his elementary education and therefore that was born c. 1220 [Crowley (1950), Easton (1952), Lindberg (DMS, 1983)]; others hold that he was writing about his early university education – Alphabetum philosophiae is a term Bacon uses in the chapter from which the following cited text is taken – and thus that he was born c. 1214 [Little (RBE, 1914), Maloney (CSTM, 1988), Hackett (2016), Molland (2004)]. The text reads:

I have labored much in sciences and languages, and I have up to now devoted forty years [to them] after I first learned the alphabetum; and I was always studious. Apart from two of these forty years I was always [engaged] in study [or at a place of study], and I had many expenses just as others commonly have... And it is known that no one worked in so many sciences and languages as I did, nor so much as I did. Indeed, when I was living in the other state of life [as an Arts Master], people marveled that I survived the abundance of my work. And still, I was just as involved in studies afterwards, as I had been before. But I did not work all that much, since in the pursuit of Wisdom this was not required. ([OQHI], 65)

Some time after 1248, he set aside the common scholastic ways of teaching in order to devote time to languages and experimental concerns. Thus, we can see the period from c. 1240–48 as the time during which he lectured at Paris on Aristotle, on Grammar/Logic, and especially on the mathematical subjects of the Quadrivium. And so, depending on the chosen year of birth, the chronology would be as follows: (1) Bacon was born c. 1214, educated at Oxford c. 1228–36, Master of Arts at Paris c. 1237–47/8, Private Scholar 1248–56/7, active again at Oxford c. 1248–51, back in Paris 1251, Franciscan Friar at Paris c. 1256–57 to 1279, returning to Oxford c. 1280, died c. 1292. Or: (2) Bacon was born c. 1220, educated at Oxford c. 1234–42; Master of Arts at Paris c. 1242–47/8, active again at Oxford c. 1248–51, back in Paris 1251, Franciscan Friar at Paris 1256/7 to 1279, returning to Oxford c. 1280, died c. 1292. Further precision on the chronology must await the critical edition of all the works of Roger Bacon and careful scientific study of these works in relation to other thirteenth century scholars.

The Aristotelian Quaestiones are to be found in a single manuscript, Amiens MS Bibl. Mun. 406. The materials found in this manuscript include two sets of questions on the Physics and two sets of questions on the Metaphysics of Aristotle, the questions on the Liber de causis, and the Pseudo-Aristotelian De vegetabilibus. As noted above, three of the questions on the Physics and Metaphysics can now be excluded from Bacon’s canon. A new version of Bacon’s second set of questions on the Physics inter-textually excerpted by another thirteenth-century author has recently been identified by Silvia Donati in Philadelphia MS Free Library, Lewis Europe, ff. 77ra-85rb (Donati 1997). This is an important discovery that has enabled scholars for the first time to carry out a critical-textual study of Bacon’s works on Aristotle’s Physics in the context of the development of English natural philosophy in the period 1240–1300.

The early logical works consist of the Summa grammatica, Summa de sophismatibus et distinctionibus and the Summulae dialectices [=Summulae super totam logicam]. These works show that Bacon is indebted to the teaching of logic at Oxford and Paris in the 1230s and 1240s. They have received much critical study in recent years. They reveal Bacon as a mature philosopher of logic who is representative of terminist and pre-modist grammar and logic. Bacon’s writings on grammar and logic have a connection with the Oxford ascribed Logica cum sit nostra and with the works of William of Sherwood. The logical works are clearly influenced by the teaching in Paris of Robert Kilwardby. They give evidence of Bacon as a philosopher who connects the Logica modernorum with new logical and philosophical problems based on the natural philosophy and metaphysics of Aristotle as commented on by Avicenna and Averroes.

Alain de Libera has argued that the Summulae dialectices is typical of mature works in the philosophy of logic c. 1250 and a little later. If this is the case, can we exclude the possibility that Bacon continued teaching at some University up to ca. 1256/57? He does say that he had a reputation as a scholar and teacher up to that time. Scholars have long held that Roger Bacon was a pioneer in the introduction of the study of Aristotle as interpreted by Averroes and Avicenna to the University of Paris c. 1240. But to this we must add the name of Solomon Ibn Gebirol (Avicebron). During the past ten years or so, research has shown that two Erfurt manuscripts (Amplon. Q. 290 and Q. 312) ascribed to Walter Burley (1274/5–1344) by the Amplonius de Berka in the fifteenth century, actually belong to the first half of the thirteenth century. Rega Wood, the editor of the Physics from the Erfurt MS Amplon. Q 290, has attributed these questions on the Physics and most of the other works in these two Erfurt manuscripts to Richard Rufus of Cornwall, a contemporary and opponent of Roger Bacon [Wood 1997; Wood, IPA, 2003].

Recently, it has also been demonstrated that as Master of Arts at Paris during the period of the First Averroism (c. 1240–48), Bacon had confronted and reviewed some of the major issues concerning the Latin Averroism which eventually produced a major crisis at Paris in the period 1266–77 (Hackett 2005). And, as we will see below, Bacon, in his works from the 1260s, will revisit these topics.

Bacon joined the Franciscan Order about 1256/7; whether he did so at Oxford or Paris is not known. At any rate, he was probably in Paris in the late 1250s and was definitely there in the early 1260s. He had been attracted to the Order by the philosophical, theological, and scientific example of Grosseteste, Adam Marsh, and other English Franciscans. He had personally known Adam Marsh at Oxford c. 1248–51. Because of their over-emphasis of a purported condemnation of Bacon c. 1278, scholars had tended to ignore or tone down Bacon’s very real commitment to his Franciscan way of life. The past ten years have seen new work by Amanda Power (2013) and Timothy J. Johnson (2009, 2010, 2013) emphasize the compatibility of Bacon’s concerns c. 1266 with the mission of the Franciscan Order as presented by Bonaventure and the Franciscan School at Paris.

In answer to the Papal Mandate received in July 1266, Bacon produced some very significant works. The Opus maius, Opus minus, and the related foundational work in natural philosophy, De multiplicatione specierum, the work on burning mirrors, De speculis comburentibus, together with an optical lens, were sent to the Pope c. 1267–68. They were seen as a preamble to a proposed major work on Philosophy. It remains a question as to whether the Opus tertium was sent. Together with these works in the 1260s, Bacon produced the Preface to the Works for the Pope, Communia naturalium, Communia mathematica, Epistola de secretis operibus naturae et de nullitate magiae.

Amanda Power (2013) has provided a masterful interpretation of the new context of Bacon’s post-1266 works for Pope Clement IV. She places Bacon in a Franciscan context within the wider mission of Christendom in its relations with other cultures and religions. The Compendium studii philosophiae can be dated to about 1271. This latter is a largely polemical work on the state of studies at Paris and an apology for his scholarly situation. It does, however, contain an important section on his theory of language and translation. He completed the edition of the important work on medieval politics and statecraft, the Secretum secretorum, at Oxford some time after 1280. It is clear that by 1266 and later, this important work played a major role in Bacon’s understanding of the political uses of the experimental sciences. He also produced an important work on the calendar, the Computus. The Compendium studii theologiae is usually dated c. 1292, but its content does not differ from the concerns of the work in 1266.

One must bear in mind that Roger Bacon in the 1260s is writing as an individual author for a patron, Cardinal Guy le Gros de Foulque (Pope Clement IV, 1265–68). A onetime Master of Arts, he was no longer a teaching Master at the University of Paris. This gave Bacon the freedom to address both philosophical (Aristotle) and theological (Augustine) issues in a manner denied to teachers in the Faculty of Arts, who were limited for the most part to disputations on the texts of Aristotle. He writes self-consciously as a representative of the text-based practices of Robert Grosseteste and in opposition to the new “sentence-methods” of the schools of theology. His polemical writings ca. 1267–68 are centered on the struggles in the Arts and Theology at Paris. The Pope instructed Bacon in 1266 to ignore the rules of his Order and to send him his remedies about matters of some importance. It would appear from the context of Bacon’s works for the Pope that the remedies had to do with educational matters at Paris, which at this time was the foremost university of the Christian commonwealth. The remedies sought must also have concerned geo-political matters as well as the exigencies of Christian missions.

The reception of the life and works of Roger Bacon is complex. Each generation has, as it were, found its own Roger Bacon. Another study by Amanda Power (2006) has provided a thoughtful account of the complex reception of Roger Bacon in England and of the extent to which the image of the Doctor Mirabilis is often colored by the changing controversies of the present down through history.

3. Bacon’s early work on Grammar and Logic

Bacon has a complex notion of grammar. It ranges from the elementary teaching of Latin through “rational grammar” (linguistics) to a knowledge of the sacred “Wisdom” languages. It is also connected with a theory of signs and with the vis verborum, including the magical power of spoken language. One notices continuity between Bacon’s early works on grammar and logic and his later works after 1260 on the theory of signs (De signis).

3.1 Summa grammatica

In this work, Bacon draws directly from the commentary on Priscian (Priscianus minor) by Robert Kilwardby. This is representative of early speculative grammar as it developed in Paris during the first half of the thirteenth century. Bacon’s approach to grammar and logic has a connection with the logic of that of William of Sherwood..

Part one of the Summa Grammatica sets out the rules governing both common constructions with subject and verb and rules governing figurative constructions. The latter include specific accounts of the five figures of construction: antithesis, synthesis, prolepsis, syllepsis, and zeugma. This is borrowed from Kilwardby (Institutiones grammaticae, xvii, 153). In part two, Bacon analyzes the more difficult non-figurative constructions such as impersonals, gerundives, ablative absolutes, interjections. In a third part, he examines sophisms in terms of their subject-matter and ranges from a cursory treatment to more extended treatments typical of a disputed question. In the last section, there is a cursory analysis of some short sentences including adverbial constructions [lupus est in fabula] and some liturgical formulae [patris et filii et spiritus sancti, ita missa est]. The latter are problematic due to their elliptical character. An account of Bacon’s intellectual relationship to Robert Kilwardby can be found in Irène Rosier (1994).

As noted above, a major feature of this treatment of speculative grammar is the fact that the reasoning is closely linked to the Physics of Aristotle (Rosier 1994).[2] This reasoned grammar is based on the belief that “art imitates nature to the extent that it can” (Physics II, 219 4a 21). Borrowing from Aristotle and Averroes and influenced by Robert Kilwardby, Bacon exploits the distinction between the permanent and the successive as the ground of the grammatical distinction between the noun/pronoun and the verb/adverb. He applies this to the definition of grammatical category.

As Irène Rosier-Catach has noted, “The construction of words is conceived as a movement. The verb, the pivot of the sentence, signifies action and movement and needs for that reason two terms, a terminus a quo or principium and a terminus ad quem or terminus (Summa Grammatica 66, 78). On one level, physical conceptualization is used to re-define certain notions. Cases are properties allowing an expression to function as a term of movement (Summa Grammatica 34); in this way, the accusative expresses the terminus ad quem. At a second level, Bacon’s conceptualization allows him to state some very general rules for the combination of categories” (Rosier-Catach 1997, 70).

For example, Bacon argues that both the participle and the infinitive by means of their verbal signification are not sufficiently stable to be a terminus of motion. This is based on the premise that “nothing which is in motion can come to rest in something in motion, no motion being able to complete itself in something in motion.” And, using the principle that “the action is in the patient as in a subject,” he tackles the issue of grammatical agreement. Further, the central principle for the organization of terms is the notion of dependence (dependencia). Hence, the relation of natural dependence between the accident and the subject is reflected in the construction of the adjective with its substantive.

Grammatical reasoning, then, finds itself wedged between physical and logical reasoning. This can be seen in the analysis of the expression, est dies. Why one term and not two? What is the function of dies? In an analysis of motion there are two terms. But in reason, one can see that the one term has two functions that are necessarily present in every assertion. And whereas Logic requires that the subject be different from the predicate, Grammar as a positive science depends on the intellect and will.

The most significant aspect of Bacon’s grammatical analysis is one that will be replicated in his later work on semiotics. This is his intentionalist analysis. The reasons connected to grammatical analysis cannot be discovered or applied mechanically: they are dependent on the signifying intention of the speaker (intentio proferentis). This kind of analysis is found in Robert Kilwardby and in many similar texts on sophisms. As Rosier-Catach puts it, “The correctness of a statement does not depend solely on its conformity with the rules of grammar but equally on its adequateness with its signifying intention. Sometimes indeed, because the speaker wishes to signify some precise idea, he may legitimately distance himself from the normal rules” (Rosier-Catach 1997, 73). Still, this freedom is not absolute; it must be justified linguistically. Even elliptical expressions such as ita missa est have within them the capacity to allow further application of formulas such as cantata, dicta, etc. Thus, to quote Rosier, “The rule-governed nature of language-functions is to be found not only in the common usage but also in those ‘authorized’ variations. It is precisely this principle that Bacon will put to work at the semantic level when he conducts his analysis of Signs [c. 1267]. Beyond the ordinary usage of the sign, derivable from its institution, the speaker always has the liberty to use it in the translated way, the variation being in the majority of cases explainable and for this reason comprehensible by the listener. In other words, language is for man an instrument, a means. This voluntarist/instrumental conception is to be seen likewise in the context of Bacon’s treatment of the magical power of words” (Rosier-Catach 1997, 73–74).

This imporant aspect of “the magical power of words” has again been examined carefully in terms of language study as it relates to the uses of logic in theology by Rosier-Catach (2004). Graziella Federici Vescovini (2011) has now presented a magisterial study of the close connection of philosophy and natural magic in the Middle Ages, accentuating the notion of “the magical power of words” in relation to Bacon and other medieval philosophers. This magical power of words, derived from Alkindi, has a connection with Bacon’s theory of communication in part five of the Moralis philosophia.

Bacon’s Logic (1240s):
  • Summa de sophismatibus et distinctionibus (SSD)
  • Summula super totam logicam (= Sumulae dialectices) (SD)

The late Jan Pinborg has described the terminist logic found in Bacon and his contemporaries as “semantical analysis of a natural language, viz. Latin, built on Aristotelian logic, especially the Sophistici elenchi and the Peri hermeneias, and on the development of grammar. This analysis stressed the truth value of propositions analyzed and its conditions, and therefore displayed what can be called a contextual approach; that is, it was based on the actual function and reference of the term in the proposition to be analyzed. A given word could be used differently, or according to different suppositions, and the rules for these different uses helped to avoid ambiguities. The doctrine of supposition was intended to solve both the relatively trivial ambiguities which arose from confusion of linguistic levels (man is white, man is a species, man is a noun) and ambiguities involved in quantification (or distribution) theory. These problems were primarily solved in terms of reference, since different suppositiones picked out different ranges of individuals.”(Jan Pinborg 1979)

One can see therefore why Bacon, through his concern with the central role of applied logic in guarding against ambiguity, saw the analysis of equivocation as central to the analysis of language. Against the growing Modist tendency to understand parts of grammar as indicative of the objective constituents of things in the world, Bacon stresses the importance of equivocation analysis. Since the imposition of names, the constant change in language use, and especially the ongoing implicit shift of meaning in language are all important for a theory of meaning, Bacon demands contextual language analysis. Here, one might speak of Bacon’s “pragmatic” approach to language theory.

3.2 Summa de sophismatibus et distinctionibus (SSD)

Alain De Libera has provided a very precise summary of Bacon’s place in the history of logic and especially of the two early works just listed. He remarks:

The SSD belongs to a literary genre found in Paris during the first half of the thirteenth century, the Distinctiones sophismatum. It compares with the Tractatus de distinctionibus communibus in sophismatibus accidentibus attributed to Matthew of Orleans, the Distinctiones ‘notandum’, the Abstractiones of Hervaeus Sophista, the tracts on Distinctiones sophismatum as well as ‘anonymous’ treatises described by De Rijk and Braakhuis. Briefly, the distinctiones have the task of listing the rules to be used in the practice of sophisms and setting out the context, while the syncategoremata set out the logical conditions for the proper use of syncategorematic words. (De Libera 1997, 105–106)

Generally, the SSD deals with problems of universal quantification, as for example the uses of the word omnis (’all’). Bacon pays close attention to words that present philosophical difficulties, such as ‘infinite’, ‘whole’, and ‘negation’. The common logical topics are covered. Still, Bacon shows some originality in his treatment of ‘inclusion’ or ‘scope’ in quantification. He also develops the outline of what will become his own contribution in the 1260s, i.e., his analysis of a “production of speech”. Bacon develops this analysis to deal with sentences such as ‘Every animal is either rational or irrational’. Here, his contemporaries invoked a theory of natural sense to account for the provision of semantic information on the basis of the order of the presentation of the terms. But Bacon insists that one must take into account (a) the signifying intention of the speaker, (b) the linguistic expression, and (c) the sense that the listener provides. Bacon presents two basic positions: an expression must have parts that enable the hearer to make an interpretation that will correspond with the intention of the speaker. Thus, the actual expression alone is necessary but not sufficient for an account of the meaning. A linguistic analysis that involves speaker/hearer/expression is also required.

The expression of the proposition alone is accidental and thus contains only a relative sense. Further, the linear order of the expression does not provide the listener with enough information about the logical form. Knowledge of the logical form requires reference to the mental proposition. This implies that every mental proposition, for both speaker and listener, is an interpretation. The meaning of any statement is a function of the understanding. This presentation of the speech act prepared the ground for Bacon’s mature theory in his post-1260 works, the De signis (DS), Compendium studii philosophiae (CSP), and Compendium studii theologiae (CST).

3.3 Summulae dialectices (SD)

De Libera has placed this work at Oxford c. 1250, but notes the presence of Parisian teachings in the text. The title given in the Seville MS, Summulae super totam logicam, provides a better sense of the nature of the work. To summarize De Libera, this is the mature work of a practiced teacher, not the work of a beginner. It is ahead of other works of the 1240s in the skillful manner in which it examines Aristotle and other newly translated works in philosophy and science. The work is important for two new semantic positions: (1) the doctrine of univocal appellation and (2) the doctrine of “empty classes” in predication. For Bacon, a word cannot be applied in a univocal manner to both an entity and a non-entity. This position will provide Bacon with a basis for his attack on Richard Rufus of Cornwall in his works after 1260, and especially in the Compendium studii theologiae (1292). This attack was not targeted at Rufus alone; it is written in opposition to the common teaching of the time at Paris, according to which a word has a natural meaning and once that meaning is given, it remains a constant. For example, the term ‘Caesar’ can cover both the once living Caesar and the now dead Caesar. Bacon rejects this on the grounds that for him, terms are imposed on “present things” and there is nothing in common between an entity and a non-entity or between the past, present, and future. Hence, Bacon is opposed to the notion of “habitual being”. Thus, terms have present appellation and their reference to the past and future must be accidental. For Bacon, name and signification are imposed on the present object, and these are opened to past and present on the basis of verbal tense. One might call it “supposition through itself for present things”. Another important aspect of SD is the complex theory of determination found in the composition and division of the propositional sense.

The theory of imposition is fundamental to Bacon’s approach (Rosier & de Libéra 1986; Rosier 1994, 123–156). This allows for explicit and tacit changes of imposition of meaning in communication and points to the need for linguistic analysis and careful study of context in order to be strict about univocal meaning. Likewise, an interest in overcoming equivocation and ambiguity figures throughout Bacon’s logical works. Words can, indeed, be extended ‘metaphorically’ to cover non-existing things. In this work of Bacon, one finds a combination of influences from both the Oxford terminist logic and the Parisian pre-modist grammar of the 1240s.

The reader can easily see that this treatment of “all of logic” corresponds to a large extent to what is found in many ‘modern’ logic books prior to the treatment of predicate logic. It would be useful to show the extent to which Bacon’s SD provides a template for later works on the totality of logic, such as the Summa Logica of William of Ockham and subsequent texts up to modern times.

4. Bacon as an Aristotelian Commentator

4.1 Roger Bacon and Richard Rufus: In physicam Aristotelis

Richard Rufus and Roger Bacon were two of the earliest Teachers of Aristotle’s natural philosophy and metaphysics at Paris, c. 1235–50. The recent publication of Richard Rufus of Cornwall’s In Physicam Aristotelis has made available what is certainly a very important text for an understanding of the influence of Aristotle’s Physics on the early tradition of English natural philosophy in the thirteenth century (IPA 2003). Richard Rouse has dated the text of these Physics questions “on the early side of the middle of the century” (Wood, IPA Introduction, 33). Silvia Donati and Cecilia Trifogli have mapped out the complex tradition of named and ‘anonymous’ commentaries on Aristotle’s Physics in 13th century England. (Del Punta, Donati & Trifogli 1996; Trifogli 1997, Donati 1997; Trifogli 2000). As noted above, Rega Wood ascribes the text to Richard Rufus of Cornwall (died c. 1260). She claims that “Richard Rufus was the earliest Western teacher of the new Aristotle whom we know.” He taught Aristotelian physics and metaphysics as a Master of Arts at the University of Paris before 1238. In the apparatus of the edition, Wood notes that these comments on Aristotle’s Physics were later taken up by Roger Bacon in his Questiones on Aristotle’s Physics, and as a result, she sees Roger Bacon as Richard Rufus’s successor as a Parisian teacher of Aristotle’s natural philosophy. As evidence for the influence of Rufus on Roger Bacon, Wood presents a discussion of three topics: (1) projectile motion, (2) the place of Heaven, and (3) the beginning of the world (IPA, 12–28).

4.2 Bacon and Grosseteste: Knowledge, Science and Intuition

Bacon holds that scientific knowledge is twofold: first, there is the “imperfect and confused knowledge” by which the mind is inclined to the love of the good and of truth. This implicit knowledge is innate. Second, there is explicit rational knowledge. One part of this has to do with the knowledge of the principles of science; the other is the knowledge of conclusions. This latter is complete knowledge though it is not exhaustive. Bacon’s account of sense, memory, and experience is more extensive than that found in Grosseteste’s Commentary and reflects his own reading of Avicenna, the medical tradition, and works on optics. Bacon distinguishes experientia from experimentum. Experience (experientia) is the distinct knowledge of singular things, and all animals have this distinct knowledge of singulars. But not all animals have experimentum, that is, a science of principles based on experience. As he puts it, “experience is the distinct reception of singulars under some aspect of universality, as is stated in the text [of Aristotle], but only the universal is grasped by the intellect.” Therefore, only humans and not other animals have experience [experimentum] ([OHI, XI] 16). Many animals have an image (imaginatio) of singular things and live by innate art and industry, naturally knowing how to adapt to changing weather conditions. Human art, however, is acquired and is a science of principles based on experience (experimentum principium).

One can express Bacon’s position as follows: experimentum is the universal source for our discovery of scientific principles. Scientific knowledge, once established, proceeds by demonstration. Experientia designates the simple perception of singulars. Only in a very loose sense can it be used of scientific knowledge. Sometimes, however, these two terms about experience are used interchangeably. In this account, Bacon has not yet come to his later notion of a scientia experimentalis, and the experimental verification (certificatio) of the conclusions of demonstrative knowledge (ca. 1267). He is dealing only with experience as the source of the principles of our knowledge of art and science.]

In other words, at this stage, Bacon is mainly concerned with Aristotle’s definition of experience in the Metaphysics and Posterior Analytics, although one already notices that he relates the Aristotelian subject matter to the discussion in Alhacen’s Perspectiva. Nevertheless, it is also important to note that these Aristotelian concerns with Experimentum are repeated in 1267 at the beginning of Opus majus, Part Six on exprimental science, and thus, Aristotle’s Metaphysics, Posterior Analytics and Meteorology together with the Optics of Ibn al-Haytham will form the necessary philosophical background for Bacon’s laterc. 1266 notions of the experimental sciences.

4.3 Bacon on Matter

In the later (post 1260) Communia naturalium, Bacon gives six meanings for the concept of matter. (1) Matter is the subject of action as when we say that wood is the matter for the action of the carpenter. (2) In the proper sense of the term, matter is that which, with form, constitutes the composite, as in the case of every created substance. (3) Matter is the subject of generation and corruption and has the property of being an incomplete and imperfect thing in potency to being a complete thing. (4) Matter is the subject of alteration since it receives contrary accidents. (5) Matter can be considered as an individual in relation to the universal, the latter being founded in its individual as in a material principle. (6) Matter is the name for that which is gross, as when we say that earth has more matter than fire (Sharp 1930, 127–151).

Form has a certain priority to matter as the end of generation and as the perfection of the material principle. It is the principle of action and of knowledge. In general, for Bacon, matter is not a mere potency. It is an incomplete something (substance) and so for him matter and form are two incomplete substances that integrate to make one individual substance. In this one has a notion of matter as in some sense a positive thing. It is not a nullity. One way to place Bacon’s position on matter is to situate it between the material monism of David of Dinant and the position of Aquinas that matter is a pure potentiality. For Bacon, matter as a being of essence (esse essentiae) has being in itself. For Aquinas, form alone gives being. But for Bacon the being of essence and existence belong together. Matter, therefore, can be a principle of division. Unlike a monist position, Bacon stresses the plurality of matters. The relation of universal and particular with respect to matter and form in Bacon is complex. One notes the influence of Avicenna.

In both early and later works, Bacon objects to the idea that matter is one in number in all things. The background to this issue arises in the 1240s to 1270s of the Fons vitae of Avicebron (Solomon Ibn Gebirol) and from Franciscan discussions at Paris on the nature of the unity of matter. Bacon holds that matter “is not numerically one, but in itself and from itself it is numerically distinct in numerically different beings.” Still, he does not object to a logical unity of matter. For example, matter as potentiality is the original source of the being of contingent things. This is the non-being of the creature in contrast with the being of the Creator. Matter properly speaking is prime matter. This must be distinguished from both natural matter and from artificial matterThus, Bacon will speak of the matter of both corporeal and spiritual beings, and hence of “spiritual matter,” a concept that Aquinas found to be contradictory.

The importance of this hylomorphism in the Franciscan school at Paris has been examined by Anna Rodolfi (2010, 2014). And the complexity of natural matter with reference to generation and also to alchemical process has been set out with care by Michele Pereira (2014). Bacon’s doctrine of matter as a source for the theory of matter in Peter John Olivi has been noted by the editors of Pierre de Jean Olivi Sur le materie (2008). Bacon’s extended account of matter in his early and later works is very significant for the late thirteenth and early fourteenth century discussions of the concept of matter.

In his later works, and specifically in his works on natural philosophy, Bacon presents nature as an active agent. The form or the species is the first effect of any natural agent. The power of the species educes the emergence of the thing from the potency of matter. It does not simply produce a form/species and impose it on the matter. Matter has an active potency, and this is actualized due to the action of the natural external agent. See Michela Pereira, “Remarks on materia natualis”.

4.4 Bacon on Universals and Individuation

Bacon has two distinct treatments of universals and individuation: his early works (1240s) and later in the Communia naturalium (1260s-70s).

In the works from the 1240s, Bacon distinguishes the real universal from the mental universal. Hence, the universal as the ultimate basis of predication is not the species as mental intention. Universals in the primary sense as the basis of scientific objectivity are extra-mental. Bacon’s presentation of this issue is complex. Certainly, he is not a complete Platonist in regard to universals. To the objection that since form is individuated through its matter and whatever exists in things must exist in matter as individuated, but the universal is not such a thing, he replies that a universal is either in the mind or in things; if it is not in the former, it has to be in the latter. A universal arises from common matter and common form and so has no need of being immediately individuated: “And because the common matter and common form exist along with the proper matter and form of individuals, the universal is present in this way in singulars” ([OHI, X] 242–243 = TTUM, 36). Hence, one cannot split apart the common matter from the particular matter or the common form from the particular form of a particular individual.

In one question, Bacon rejects the view that universals are constituted only by the mind. He holds that the universal in and of itself is prior to the knowledge process: “This follows because a universal is nothing other than a nature in which singulars of the same (nature) agree; but particulars agree in this manner in a common nature predicable of them, without any act of the mind” ([OHI, X], 242–243 = TTUM, 36). This sounds Platonic, but in fact for Bacon there are no Platonic universals in a separate world; rather, real universals do exist, but they are found only in and with individual things. There is a mutual interpenetration of common form and matter and proper form and matter such that there is just one individual, and so the common nature is realized in this or that individual. Bacon’s answer to the possibility of a universal being present in a singular is stated as follows:

Only three kinds of being are imaginable: either [being] in and of itself, [being] in the mind, or [being] in things, but a universal is not something that has being in and of itself and stands on its own, because then it would be a Platonic idea; neither [does it have being] in the mind, as we have seen… Again, a universal is a common nature in which particulars agree; but Socrates and Plato and [others] of this sort cannot agree in a common nature which is in them unless the nature [be] in some way duplicated in them, because a universal is nothing other than a common nature extended into particulars and existing in them as duplicated, in which all things truly exist. And thus, without them [the particulars] there can be no universals…. ([OHI, VII, 243–244 = TTUM, 37)

For Bacon, there are two kinds of particular, the determinate here and now particular and the indeterminate particular.

Bacon treats the problem of individuation both in the early Parisian lectures and the later Communia naturalium. This has given rise to the issue of Bacon’s realism or his proto-nominalism. Itis addressed in the next section.

4.5 Bacon’s Realism: On the Way to Late Medieval Nominalism?

In the light of the foregoing, a key issue arises in his early works: even if Bacon disclaims being a Platonist with regard to universals, he is clearly a strong external realist. This realism is continued in the Communia naturalium [OHI, 2–4] but with certain important qualifications. This polemical account of the discussion of Aristotle in the 1260s is understood by Bacon as an aid for the study of theology. And now, it is clear that for Bacon, in the intention and execution of nature, the individual has definite ontological priority over genera and species. His account becomes an attack on contemporary positions influenced by Albertus Magnus that would subordinate the individual to the universal. Species and genera are there for the sake of the production of the individual. He states, “In no other field are the authorities in such disagreement.” Even Aristotle seems to contradict himself. Bacon finds a correct answer in the Metaphysics of Avicenna:

There are two kinds of nature, universal and particular, Avicenna teaches in the sixth book of [his] Metaphysics.

Bacon adds,

Universal [nature] is the governing force of the universe [and is] diffused among the substances of the heavens [and] throughout all the bodies in the world; it is [that] in which all bodies agree and through which all are maintained at a certain general level of perfection and well being. This universal nature is the corporeal nature that is designated in the second genus, which is [that of] body, and this nature excludes all incompatible things which are abhorrent to the whole universe, such as a vacuum. ([OHI, II], 92 = TTUM, 85–86)

We see then that Bacon understands universal nature as supervening on a world of distinct individual natures such that corporeal action is contiguous and that a vacuum is excluded. The “particular nature” is the directing power of the species with its individuals, and is divisible into the directive power of the species and of the individual. The example he gives is from embryology: there is the directing power of the species intending the production of the human in general; it intends the production of the individual accidentally. And there is the directing power of the individual, which aims at the determinate individual human as such and mankind in general. As he puts it, “the universal is prior to the particular in [both] the work and execution of nature, but is posterior in intent” ([OHI,II], 93 = TTUM, 87). He then states the ontological priority of the individual over universals as follows:

But if we would speak about the universal nature that is the directing power of the universe, [we should say that] it intends and brings about an individual first and principally, about which there is mention in the Book of the Six Principles. Nature operates in a hidden manner in things: once a determinate man is generated, man as such is generated. And the cause of this is that one individual excels all universals in the world, for a universal is nothing but the agreement of many individuals. ([OHI,II], 94, = TTUM, 86)

He distinguishes the absolute nature of an individual as something absolute, that is, “that which constitutes it and enters its essence.” This absolute nature of an individual is ontologically more important than that by which one individual has some agreement with another. One can notice that Bacon is now writing as a person with a theological interest: “And because all the things which I am treating are for the sake of theology, it is clear through theological reasons that a universal is not [favorably] compared to singulars. For God did not make this world for the sake of universal man, but for singular persons…Therefore, speaking plainly and absolutely, we must say that an individual is prior in nature [to a universal] both in operation and in intent,” and so “…it is necessary that the ranking according to prior and posterior be denominated absolutely and simply from the governing power of an individual…” ([OHI,II], 94–95 = TTUM, 88–89). Bacon knows that he is defending a position in rank opposition to the common view: “Since the whole rabble [at Paris] holds the contrary position, because of certain authorities, the views of the latter must be presented” ([OHI,II], 96 =TTUM, 90).

This account has given rise to opposing interpretations. Theodore Crowley (1950) saw in these passages the beginnings of late medieval nominalism that would find its expression in William of Ockham. Thomas S. Maloney (1985) challenged this reading and argued that the later Roger Bacon, like the earlier Bacon, was not a nominalist but an extreme realist. More recently, Chiara Chrisciani has argued that already in 1964, Camile Berube saw Bacon as the originator of the Franciscan doctrine of the direct intellectual perception of the singular. He also noted the link between Bacon and William of Ockham even though the path of influence was long and complex. She also correctly noted that for Bacon, we have a sense-perception of universals, one quite different from his contemporaries. Following K. Tachau and Y. Raizman-Kedar, Crisciani argues that the universals are materially embodied in the intellect. In a recent study, while agreeing with this position with respect to the material intellect, I argued that it needed qualification. Perhaps we should hold that there are elements of both ‘extreme-realism’ and proto-nominalism in this account in the Communia naturalium. In his important essay on individuation in the fourteenth century, Jorge J.E. Gracia (1991) argues for seeing this text and others as the beginning of the strict tradition of late medieval nominalism.

4.6 Bacon on Body, Soul and Mind: Early Works

Bacon understands the soul to be a spiritual substance in union with the Body. At this early stage, he does not hold the Avicennian notion of a separate agent intellect. In union with the body, the soul has two intellects, potential and agent. The former is directly connected with the sensitive powers and the object of this intellect is the singular material thing. The agent intellect is directed upward and knows spiritual beings in its own essence. For Bacon, there is a kind of confused innate knowledge in the soul. This is not a Platonic idea. It is more like a disposition that inclines the soul towards knowledge of the truth. Still, it is in some sense an innate knowledge of the first principles of knowledge. The agent intellect illuminates the images and frees them from specific material conditions. The universals are then impressed on the potential intellect.

4.7 Bacon on Body, Soul, Mind: Later Works

In his Communia naturalium, Bacon explains that he wrote his account of sensation, the sensitive soul, and perception in the Perspectiva as a criticism of the common teaching of the Aristotelian teachers in the schools. Further, he comes to the conclusion in the Opus maius that the greater philosophers in the Greek, Islamic, and Christian traditions maintained that the Agent Intellect is God, the source and agent of illumination. He now makes this position his own, and attacks those teachers who hold that the agent and the potential intellects are parts of the soul.

Bacon’s short treatise on the soul in CN is titled Distinctio tertia de anima. It provides an interesting window on contemporary debates c. 1267–70 at Paris. It belongs with Aquinas’s masterful polemic, De unitate intellectus contra averroistas and Siger of Brabant on Aristotle’s De anima.

He divides the work into seven chapters: (1) On the production of the parts of the soul; (2) On the Sensitive Soul; (3) On the Unity and Plurality of the Intellectual Soul; (4) On the Composition of the Rational Soul; (5) On the Powers of the Soul: whether they are parts of the soul; (6) On the Vegetative Soul; and (7) On the Parts of the Intellectual Soul.

The first chapter reviews the common teaching since 1250. Having noted that before 1250, all philosophers and theologians held that the vegetative and sensitive souls came to be by way of natural generation and that the intellectual soul came from the outside, Bacon says, “And still to this day (c. 1269–70) the English theologians and all true lovers of wisdom (philosophantes) uphold this position” ([OHI, IV], 282), that is, that the intellectual soul alone is created by God while the vegetative and sensitive souls in the human are produced from the potency of matter in accordance with the laws of nature. He argues that those opposed to this position rely on the Pseudo-Augustine, De spiritu et anima, and on the De ecclesiasticis dogmatibus by Gennadius. Those who follow these sources, he states, hold that “the vegetative and sensitive souls are co-created with the intellectual soul…” He describes this as a kind of ‘folk-psychology’. For Bacon and “all philosophers,” embryology shows that the embryo is nourished and grows prior to the infusion of the intellectual soul. Bacon states the problem as follows:

But if the vegetative and sensitive souls were co-created with the intellective soul, as many moderns teach publicly, then, they would not precede the intellective soul in being. And so these people are forced to claim that one needs a double vegetative and sensitive soul, one that is produced from the potency of matter through the power of nature; the other is created with the intellective soul…But no authorities hold this position, and experts in philosophy, therefore, dismiss it as nonsense. ([OHI, IV], 283)

Henry of Ghent among others advocated this doctrine of the co-creation of souls.

In the second chapter, Bacon attacks some of the leading philosophers at Paris: “But the leaders of the common philosophers at Paris fall into other deadly errors, which the theologians contradict” ([OHI, IV], 284). For about ten years, the leader of the philosophers, “an erroneous and famous man,” held that “prior to the existence of the rational soul, one must presuppose a specific substantial difference educed from the potency of matter which places man in the species of animal, such that the intellective soul does not do so…This is contrary to the philosophy of Aristotle and to all authors” ([OHI, IV], 284–85). A study of the Questiones on De anima indicates the earlier Parisian tradition out of which Bacon is working (Bernardini 2009; see also Bernardini 2014). In the third chapter, Bacon makes explicit the object of his polemic. It is the view commonly ascribed to Siger of Brabant and the so-called Radical Aristotelians (Latin Averroists). Bacon states:

We are concerned with this second proposition on the unity and plurality of the intellective soul. Therefore, they [the Latin Averroists] argue that the intellective soul (anima intellectiva) is one in number among all human beings. Therefore, they cover their error when they are compelled [to respond] stating that ‘through philosophy it is not possible to hold anything else, nor is it possible to have any other position through reason alone, but only through faith alone.’ ([OHI, IV], 286–87)

This is the proposition that is analyzed and critiqued by Thomas Aquinas in his De unitate intellectus contra Averroistas (1269) [TUIA]. It is also closely related to the celebrated doctrine of double truth imputed to the Latin Averroists by their Franciscan opponents. Bacon’s arguments, like those of Aquinas, deal specifically with philosophical reasons for the mistaken positions of the Averroists. The first two arguments are moral arguments: if there were one identical intellect in all humans, the same person would be both virtuous and vicious. The denial that ‘this individual human thinks’ is contrary to both philosophy and faith. This is contrary to the Nicomachean Ethics and would lead to a destruction of moral philosophy.

The remaining arguments hold that the doctrine destroys “the laws of nature,” that is, of natural philosophy and psychology. First, he presents Aristotle’s arguments against the transmigration of souls. Second, he argues that this intellect would be infinitized and in power equal to God. Third, he addresses the important issue of the connection between diverse imaginations and the intellective soul. This could lead to the same person being learned and ignorant at the same time in respect of the same things. Again, injury to the sensory organs can lead to a person becoming insane. If the sensory organs work, the existence of diverse imaginations will not differentiate the intellect in different persons. Fourth, there will be no unified object of knowledge. Bacon distinguishes between the single object of the intellect and the “intelligible species” by means of which we know that object:

For when it will be argued that the species will be multiplied in diverse persons, I concede that the diverse representations of the same thing can be present to diverse persons because the thing itself produces its species according to every diameter, as was proved in De multiplicatione specierum. And so, just as in the diverse parts of the air the species of the same thing are diverse, and come to the eyes of different perceivers, so it is the case with the intellects of different persons. ([OHI, IV], 289)

Thus, he makes a basic distinction between the thing which is the object of knowledge and the representations (intelligible species) by which one knows them. Fifth, Bacon holds that the Averroists leave no room for new knowledge. Sixth, against the Averroist position that all logicians and grammarians must have the one same knowledge, Bacon holds that one must distinguish between the cognitive habit by which the soul knows anything knowable and the object of knowledge in the sense of “the object of knowledge,” which is a unity. Seventh, based on Aristotle’s teaching on the passiones animae (species/concepts), he holds that just as the soul is multiplied, so too will knowledge be multiplied. And so in a real sense, there is distinct and different knowledge in different human beings.

Chapters four to seven on the parts of the soul place Bacon in the context of the Franciscan and Dominican arguments on the parts of the soul. These chapters show that Bacon was very active in the early debates at Paris in which the unity of substantial form in Aquinas was strongly criticized by the Franciscan School. Bacon is so critical of Aquinas’s position that he deems it heretical. He defends the notion of plurality of forms while strongly arguing for the essential substantial unity of the human being. Bacon also uses his remarks to let the reader know that his study of Perspectiva was undertaken to criticize the common teaching on natural philosophy (including psychology) and medicine at the University of Paris.

This short treatise has the advantage of contextualizing Bacon’s works in the 1260s in terms of the debates on Latin Averroism. It would appear that Bacon, like Bonaventure and Pecham, was an explicit opponent of the young teachers of the Arts at Paris, especially Siger of Brabant. Bacon and Pecham shared the same scientific concerns (Hackett 2013a). And it would appear that Bacon’s treatises such as the Perspectiva were written with this context in mind. Since, as we have noted above, Bacon provided a philosophical critique of the issues concerning Latin Averroism already as a teacher at Paris in the 1240s, we should see his intervention in the debates of 1266–72 as the criticism of an emeritus Professor of Philosophy, now engaged with the theological arguments of the schools at Paris.

5. Bacon’s Later Philosophy: Language Study and Science in the Service of Both Moral Philosophy and Theology

5.1 Background

At the beginning of the Opus maius and related works, Bacon offers a structural critique of scholastic practice in the universities. He favors both language study and science over the “Sentence-Method” as a way of interpreting the texts of Philosophy and of Scripture. And he advocates training in mathematics and the sciences as requirements for students in theology. Second, Bacon’s later works on language and science are written in the specific historical and political context of the Mongol invasion of Europe, the sack of Baghdad in 1258 by the Mongols, and the geo-political situation of a Europe hemmed in by both the Mongols and Islam. His sense of world geography was aided by the travel reports of William of Rubruck [Southern, WVI]. The wider historical context for Bacon’s concerns has recently been outlined by Amanda Power (Power 2013). The overall division of the Opus maius is Platonic/Stoic: language study, natural philosophy/mathematics, morals. The general context is theological and Franciscan: the arts and sciences leading to human well being in this world and the next. It is also clear that Bacon is constructing a “new model” for medieval philosophy, one in which Aristotelian concerns are taken up and transcended in a Neo-Platonism with significant Roman Stoic influence and adapted to moral philosophy and Christian theology. Metaphysics is taken up and completed in Moral Philosophy. The latter becomes the end of linguistic and scientific study. Logic is reduced to mathematics, and the applications of mathematics become central to an understanding of the sciences (Perler 2005). The applications of mathematics can in turn be used in religion and theology. Therefore, in his later works, especially in the Perspectiva and Scientia experimentalis, Bacon will define experientia-experimentum in a distinctly new manner, one that takes up and also goes beyond the use of this term in Aristotle. His new definition advances on his own Questiones from the 1240s. Peter King has recently claimed that Ockham was the first to create this new definition of experientia-experimentum (2003). He is correct that this definition is found in Ockham, but not in claiming that this concept began with Ockham. The concept is formulated in the scientific works of Roger Bacon and is found in a number of Franciscan writers including John Pecham well before the age of Ockham (Hackett 2009).

5.2 Opus maius/Parts One and Two

Before presenting the seven parts of the Opus maius, it is important to note a factor that is absent from the scholarship, that is, how Bacon’s Islamic sources structure this major work. These sources, of course, are integrated with his Greek and Latin sources. Most important here for the architecture of the latter work is the De scientiis of Alfarabi. The division of the sciences and the reduction of the linguistic and natural sciences to moral philosophy is strongly influenced by this text. Part four and the latter section of Part six on prognostication, and Part seven, IV, is influenced by Abu Ma’shar’s Introduction to Astronomy and by his Book of Conjunctions. Part five on Perspectiva is a masterpiece of synthesis of most of the major Greek and Muslim texts on Optics. Especially important are the texts of Ptolemy, Alkindi, and Ibn al-Haytham. This synthesis clearly influences Bacon’s new understanding of an experimental science. And yet in addition to this, one must note that Ptolemy in his Almagest, Optics and Astrology influences Bacon’s understanding of method in the sciences as it impacts the integration of reason and experience. And in the third part of the Scientia experimentalis,Bacon is influenced on the important commentary on Ptolemy’Astrology, namely, the Centiloquium by Abu Ja’far IbnYusuf Ibn Ibrahim. But since Bacon’s De multiplication specierum is acknowledged by him as the key to his Optics, one must note the structural presence of the De Radiis attributed to Al-Kindi. This work provides the basis for his doctrine of species that will be spelled out for the geometry of vision in the Perspectiva. Since the Opus maius and related later works are intended as sketch for a grand linguistic, scientific, philosophical and theological work, one must note the important openness that Bacon has for the science, philosophy and theology received from the Muslim and Jewish worlds. This is very different from the Anti-Arabism and the intermittent Anti-Judaism that would become a central part of Western Renaissance culture after 1300.

Part one examines “the causes of error” in education and is critical of some theological limits on science. These causes are: belief in unworthy authority; long custom; uncritical popular opinion; concealment of academic ignorance in a display of rhetorical wisdom. The polemic is presented as one of conflict among the canon lawyers and theologians at Paris concerning the reception of Aristotle and recent works on Greek and Arabic sciences, especially astronomy/astrology. This is Roger Bacon’s appeal to the Wisdom of the Ancients

Part two contains the pre-Cartesian view of truth and wisdom as a result of a universal revelation to the Hebrews that was transmitted through the Greeks, Romans, and Islam to medieval Christianity. This view would be influential in Philosophy up to the age of Francis Bacon and Descartes. Roger Bacon links it to a doctrine of illumination taken from Augustine, Avicenna, and the commentary on the Pseudo-Ptolemy: Centiloquium. He contrasts the tradition of the great philosophers such as Plato and Aristotle with the mythical traditions from ancient times.

5.3 Opus maius/Part Three: On Language, De signis and Compendium Studii philosophiae

Part three deals with language study, grammar, semantics, and semiotics, and contains Bacon’s general theory of signs. The 1978 discovery by the late Jan Pinborg and his colleagues of De Signis, a missing section of part three, led to intense study of Bacon’s semiotics and the philosophy of language in his later works. Bacon’s proposals are radical.

Bacon’s concerns with language in his later works transgress the disciplinary boundaries of the medieval university. First, he demands that the universities study the Wisdom languages, i.e., Hebrew, Greek, Latin in one list, or Hebrew, Greek, Arabic, and Chaldean in another. He wrote Greek and Hebrew grammars (GGHG). Bacon takes Latin as a model for a natural language, the “mother language” of the West. For Bacon, this language is dependent on Greek and Hebrew. He distinguishes the “vulgar language” or “language of the laity” from the “language of learning” of the clergy. For him, vulgar language cannot be used in learning; it does not have an adequate technical vocabulary.

Bacon’s relative originality consists in the fact that he brings together the semantic and semiotic concerns of both Arts and Theology or, as one might say, Aristotle and Augustine, into a creative synthesis. From Augustine, he carries over significant elements of Stoic Logic. From these concerns, he develops his own novel theory of the sign. In the Communia naturalium, Bacon notes that he had to develop a new logic needed to deal with his new interests in the sciences. Indeed, Bacon uses the words signification and its cognates in a manner quite different from the traditional position.

The commonly used medieval definition of a sign was substitutional or representational: “A sign is that which shows itself to the senses and presents something else to the intellect.” This definition is similar to that of Augustine in De dialectica (p. 86): “A sign is something which is itself sensed and which indicates to the mind something beyond the sign itself.”[3] In this case, the parts of our language are given by either God or the human so that the thoughts of the speaker can be communicated to the mind of the hearer. The expressions in language stand for the thoughts of the speaker and represent them to the hearer. In De signis, Bacon provides the following definition: “For the sign is that which, offered to the senses or to the intellect, represents itself to that intellect, since not every sign is offered to the senses as the common definition of sign supposes. However, on the testimony of Aristotle, another kind is offered only to the intellect.” He states that the passiones anime (concepts/species) are signs of things, and such passiones are habits of the soul and species (representations/intentions) of the thing existing for the soul, and therefore, “they are offered only to the intellect so that they represent external things to that intellect” ([DS], 82). Some interpreters claim that Bacon’s definition of sign is close to that of to that of Augustine in De doctrina Christiana: “For a sign is something that apart from the impression it gives to the senses, also causes something else from itself to be present to the mind.”[4] Augustine gives the examples of animal tracks leading us to think of the animal, smoke leading us to think of fire, human expressions leading to our understanding the mood of a person, and soldiers answering the call of the trumpet in battle and then knowing where to march.

One can see that Bacon in a manner uncommon for his times relates Augustine’s definition of sign to the inferential notion of sign in the works of Aristotle. And so one can also see how Bacon, influenced by Kilwardby and Fischacre, unites the different concerns of the philosopher and the theologian.

Bacon continues and states: “The sign is in the predicament of relation.” This may sound innocent, but in Bacon’s account it has the effect of transforming the traditional relation between a sign and its meaning, either a thing or a concept. The theologians were aware of a twofold relation: that of sign to thing signified and sign to the perceiver of the sign. For the majority of theologians, the first relation is an essential and permanent relation; the latter is accidental and non-permanent. Bacon reverses this. He remarks,

The sign is in the predicament of relation and is spoken of essentially in reference to the one for whom it signifies. For it posits that thing in act when the sign itself is in act and in potency when the sign itself is in potency. But unless some were able to conceive by means of this sign, it would be void and vain. Indeed, it would not be a sign, but would have remained a sign only according to the substance of a sign. But it would not be a definition of the sign, just as the substance of the father remains when the son is dead, but the relation of paternity is lost. ([DS], 81)

And so it is not sufficient that a sign have reference to what it signifies (accusative) in order to be a sign; it is also required that it have an interpreter (dative) for whom it signifies. In medieval theology, the thing signified (accusative) has priority, and was true even if there were no interpreters. The notion of this two-way relation is found in Bonaventure, Rufus, and Fishacre among others, and the thing signified holds ontological priority over the relationship of sign to perceiver.

For Bacon, the communicative relation to a hearer is basic, and the relation to the thing signified is important but secondary in the whole context of communication. The common theological teaching held that the relation of sign to thing signified is primary and fundamental. Once a name has been instituted, it does not change (Maloney 1983b). And so, the name ‘Caesar’ can be used of both the living and the dead Caesar. Against Rufus and Bonaventure, Bacon held that this introduced ambiguity into language. Even in the case of ordinary signs such as that of a tavern, they remain a sign only potentially if there are no customers or staff.

Bacon’s own classification of signs introduces distinctions that reflect an integration of Augustine and Aristotle:

Natural Signs
Signifying by concomitance, inference, and consequence
Signifying by configuration and likeness
Cause and effect
Intentional Signs purposefully generated
Signifying conventionally by means of a concept
Linguistic signs by way of imperfect deliberation: interjections
Linguistic signs by way of perfect [completed] deliberation: other parts of speech
Non-linguistic signs (language of gestures, monk-signs, sign-boards)
Signifying naturally, in the mode of affect
Products of the sensitive soul: animal sounds
Products of the rational soul: groans, exclamations, cries of pain[5]

The distinction between 1 and 2 is taken from Augustine’s De doctrina Christiana. Bacon himself claims that he worked out the typology himself prior to finding it in Augustine’s great work on interpretation. Modern scholars, however, believe that he must in some way have borrowed it from Augustine (Maloney 1995). The distinction between 2.1 and 2.2 is taken from the Aristotelian tradition as handed down by Boethius. Type 1 signs occur naturally as part of the agency of nature. Type 2 are signs only because they have been willfully created as such by deliberation; included here are linguistic and non-linguistic signs. However, Type 2.2 are designated ‘natural’ in a sense that is different from Type 1. These sounds and groans are products of nature and happen instinctively but in an “animate” action.

Interjections are a problem. They are parts of language, conventional signs, and so conceptual, yet they are emitted suddenly and often due to pain. They are similar in a way to the groans of animals (Type 2.2). This discussion is common to writers on grammar and logic from the 1240s, especially in the works of Richard Kilwardby and similar authors.

The signs in 1.1 on natural consequence indicate that Bacon has integrated not only Aristotle and Augustine but also the work of Averroes on the Rhetoric of Aristotle. Thomas S. Maloney has argued that Aristotle’s De anima plays an important role in Bacon’s distinction between signs by nature and signs by intention (Maloney 1983a). Bacon provides an analysis of ambiguity and equivocation in the De signis and Compendium studii theologiae (Maloney 1984).

5.2.1 Bacon and the Semiotic Triangle

In the traditional semiotic triangle inherited from Plato and Aristotle, the sign is a symbol and symptom of the passiones animae (concepts/species) in the soul and the latter in turn have a relation of similitude to extra-mental things. And so the relation of sign to thing is indirect. Bacon gets rid of the mediation of concepts/species and has the sign refer directly to the object. In this way, Bacon substitutes an extensional relation for an intensional relation. Words can directly refer to individual things, be they single objects in the world, mental objects, or philosophical concepts. Primarily, then, words refer strictly to the present object. Reference to past or future objects will require the extension of univocal terms by means of analogy or metaphor. Simply because a sign exists, it will not follow from that alone that the object of the sign exists. As we saw above, without the interpreter of the sign, a sign is a sign in name only or potentially. Bacon does not deny the existence of the concept/species, but notes that a second imposition of meaning is required to name it. As Umberto Eco puts it, “Bacon definitely destroys the semiotic triangle that was formulated since Plato, by which the relationship between words and referents is mediated by the idea, or by the concept, or by the definition” (Eco 1989, 61). The relation of sign to concept is reduced to that of a symptom, which is no longer a symbol. Here one can see the preparation of the ground for the semiotics of William of Ockham and late medieval nominalism.

5.4 Opus maius/Parts Four, Five and Six: Mathematics and Philosophy of Nature (De multiplicatione specierum, Perspectiva, Scientia Experimentalis)

Parts four, five, and six of the Opus maius present the main themes of Bacon’s contribution to scientific education. It is important to see his main contribution to science as one who advocated “scientific education” in an Arts Faculty that was predominantly dedicated to linguistic arts. Bacon had a very wide reading knowledge of most of the newly translated work from Greek, Jewish, and Islamic Philosophy and Science. His major claim to fame in science is that he is the first Latin Western thinker to comprehend and write on most of the ancient sources of optics. In brief, he initiates the tradition of Optics/Perspectiva in the Latin world. This tradition would be formulated as teaching text by his contemporaries Pecham and Witelo. Bacon’s optics was also read and commented on in 14th century Italy by, especially by Lorenzo Ghiberti. It was known to and used by Leonardo Da Vinci. And it was part of the tradition of learning that led to Kepler and Descartes. In his Perspectiva and De scientia experimentali, Bacon outlines a sketch for a scientific method, one that takes optics as the model for an experimental science. In fact, he succeeded in his endeavor in that Perspectiva was added to the four traditional university subjects of the quadrivium: arithmetic, geometry, astronomy, music.

Opus maius, Part four, deals with mathematics and the applications of mathematics. Bacon presents reasons for a reduction of logic to mathematics (a kind of reversal of modern logicism) and sees mathematics as the key to an understanding of nature (Perler 2005). Clearly, he is proclaiming the “usefulness” of mathematics for knowledge; he is not doing mathematical theory. And the branch of mathematics that is important here is geometry. He applies it in detail in the optical works edited by Lindberg. Following his abbreviation of the De multiplicatione specierum in part four of the Great Work, which shows how mathematics might be applied to physics, he deals with the application of astronomy/astrology to human affairs, the uses of mathematics in religious rites as in chronology, music, symbolism, calendar reform, and geographical knowledge, and a resume of astrology (Rutkin, 2019). It used to be thought that Bacon was a Platonist in his view of the absolute priority of mathematics. More recently, that view has been seriously qualified. He does not reduce physics to mathematics. Indeed, his explicit work on mathematics, the Communia mathematica, is not an exercise in mathematics, but a presentation of the “common notions” that are important for a variety of mathematical practices. Bacon himself acknowledges those who were better mathematicians, namely, John of London, Pierre de Maricourt, and Campanus of Novara (Molland 1997). In general, Bacon is more interested in how mathematics can contribute to knowledge of the world as an aid to missionary activity. He sent a map of the world to the Pope.

Bacon was very interested in the applications of astronomy/astrology to human events. Federici Vescovini (2011) has now provided the essential context and linkage between medieval magic and philosophy, enabling scholars to grasp the dimensions of fate and freedom as understood by medieval philosophers and theologians. Although committed to freedom of the will, Bacon held to a deterministic notion of causation in nature based on the Introductorium Maius in Astronomiam of the Islamic authority on Astrology, Abu Ma’ Shar (Albumassar), on the De radiis of al-Kindi, and on the Centiloquium by Pseudo-Ptolemy (Ahmed Ibn Yusuf). And since he held to a doctrine of universal radiation in nature, he had to account for the influence of the heavens on the human body and hence indirectly on the human mind. Much of the polemic in his later works consists of a justification of this interest in an astrologically necessitated universe in the face of traditional theological objections. These works play a big role as background for his natural philosophy in De multiplicatione specierum. He was also interested in alchemy. It was his determined interest in some of these areas of study that led to disagreement with his superiors in the Franciscan Order, specifically, Bonaventure.

5.4.1 The Philosophy of Nature

Bacon’s treatise De multiplicatione specierum, his major later work on physics, written before 1267, is closely related to the study of light, vision, and perception in the Perspectiva. David C. Lindberg (DMP, Introduction) has noted that Bacon takes Grosseteste’s physics of light, a development of Al-Kindi’s universal radiation of force, out of its metaphysical background and develops a universal doctrine of physical causation.

Lindberg had already traced the history of the emanation theory of light from Plotinus to Bacon. Lindberg notes the influence of al-Kindi’s work on the rays of the stars but does not cited detailed evidence. What Bacon achieves is a comprehensive theory of physical force divorced from psychological, moral, and religious interpretation. As Lindberg puts it (DMP, Introduction), in this work, Bacon does not formally examine divine illumination of the intellect, universal hylomorphism, the plurality of forms (properly qualified), and the separability of soul. He restricts himself to presenting a full theory of the physics of light. Species is the first effect of any natural agent. As Lindberg puts it (DMP, Introduction), “This is a complete physical and mathematical analysis of the radiation of force--and, thus, of natural causation.”

The use of ‘species’ in this account is not that of Porphyry’s logic or the perceptual notion of likeness. It is“the force or power by which any object acts on its surroundings.” It denotes “al-Kindi’s universal force, radiating from everything in the world to produce effects.” As Bacon himself notes,

species [force, power] is the first effect of an agent…the agent sends forth a species into the matter of the recipient, so that, through the species first produced, it can bring forth out of the potentiality of matter [of the recipient] the complete effect that it intends ([DMS], 6–7). This is a universal theory of natural causation as the background for his philosophy of vision and perception. Most importantly, species is a univocal product of the agent. The first immediate effect of any natural action is definite, specific, and uniform. This production is not the imparting or imposition of an external form. The effect of the species is to bring forth the form out of the active potency of the recipient matter. (DMS, 6–7)

Al-Kindi’s De radiis, his optics, and that of Ibn Al-Haytham form the background to this teaching on species.

This also leads to an attempt to provide separate domains for material and spiritual being. Bacon is adamant on this point: spiritual and material being are entirely separate. Natural causation occurs “naturally,” according to regular processes or laws of nature. There is no “spiritual being” in the material medium as was commonly taught by other scholastic philosophers. That is, Bacon objected to the use of the term ‘spiritual being in the medium’. No, for Bacon, universal causation is corporeal and material, and matter itself is not just pure potentiality but is rather something positive in itself. So, in terms of explaining ‘spiritual/intentional being’ in the medium, Bacon is of the view that the introduction of such terms muddy the waters, especially if you are trying to come up with a comprehensive doctrine of physical force. Hence, the general philosophy of nature prepares the theoretical ground for the specific application of mathematics to matters of vision and perception. It also allows for and requires a metaphorical extension of these terms to moral and religious domains.

Recent scholarship on Bacon’s philosophy of nature, especially that of Yael Raizman-Kedar (Raizman-Kedar, 2009; Raizman-Kedar, dissertation, University of Haifa, 2009) places great emphasis on the importance of the concept of species for Bacon’s account of perception and mind. She is correct to note that Bacon places a kind of natural activity in the mind via species. This leads in her view to natural species having a direct role in intellectual activity as such. One could speak of the direct presence of material, corporeal species in the intellect itself (see section 5.2 above for Bacon’s complex discussion of the role of signs in animal and human knowing). Here, and also in the Perspectiva, we can see the importance of the cogitative sense, as it takes on an administrative role in animals analogous to reason in human beings. But in this life, for Bacon, human beings cannot know things in the world without the presence of species in the mind. Species as the expression of universal agency act naturally in nature and in the mind in a certain limited sense. Yet, Raizman-Kedar claims, “the very same species issued by physical objects operate qua material species within the intellect as well.” She also claims that the concept of divine illumination plays a secondary role in the acquisition of knowledge, and that Bacon

regarded innate knowledge as dispositional and confused, the species, representing their agents in essence, definition, and operation, arrive in the intellect without undergoing a complete abstraction from matter and retaining the character of agents acting naturally. In this way, Bacon sets the intellect as separate from the natural world not in an essential way, but rather in degree (my italics), thus supplying a theoretical justification for the ability to access and know nature. (Raizman-Kedar, 2009, 131; after 2012 the author writes as Kedar)

Raizman-Kedar correctly stresses the central role of species (material/corporeal) in the acquisition of intellectual knowledge of material particular things in the world. Further, she carefully distinguishes between the role of hearing and sight in the knowledge process.

Hackett (2018c) raises questions about this conclusion. He points to a significant problem with the translation of a central passage in Perspectiva in support of this position. Further, by placing Bacon alongside his confrère, one can see that the doctrine of divine illumination plays a central role in both pure intellectual knowledge, moral knowledge and knowledge of the natural world. Yes, the material species are a necessary but not a sufficient element in the acquisition of pure intellectual knowledge. Without the illuminative process within from above, pure intellectual vision is blocked. It is not at all clear that one can claim that Bacon is a material monist. Bacon’s separation of the account of physical species in the DMP could lead one to think he has to be a material monist, even with regard to species in the medium, sense, and reason. And there is one sense in which this is true. But in the end, as he states in both the DMP and the PRSP, matter and spirit are two entirely separate kinds of substance. Hence, at a deep level, Bacon is a substance dualist (medieval version).

5.4.2 The Perspectiva and De speculum comburentibus (1266–67)

In his Perspectiva and related works, Bacon presents his model for a careful and detailed application of mathematics to the study of nature and mind. In imitation of the De aspectibus of Alhacen (Ibn al-Haytham), he provided an application of geometry to vision that within the terms of reference of his times was successful. But he is critical of both Alhacen and Ptolemy. He sees himself as answering some of the optical problems not solved by either author.

Bacon’s approach to vision and perception, however, is not an exercise in modern mathematical optics. It should be seen as the sketch of a physics of light as the basis for a philosophy of perception and mind. The account of visual perception in terms of natural philosophy, medicine, and philosophy of mind is found in Parts one and a section of Part two. The account of Perspectiva sets out a consideration of direct, reflected, and refracted rays, and at the end of Part three concludes with the application of geometrical models for moral and religious considerations. The analysis of natural vision provides analogies and descriptions for an understanding of divine influence.

Part one and also distinctiones one and two of Part two deal with the structure of the eye, problems of vision, and visual errors. The aim is psychological and epistemological, that is, Bacon sets out the conditions for certifiable/verifiable and certain perception. The theory of the eye is taken from the Galenic tradition handed down in Constantine the African’s translation of Hunyan Ibn Isaq and from Avicenna and Alhacen. For this tradition, vision occurs when the crystalline humor is altered by the intromission of visual species from the object. Vision is completed when the species proceeds through the vitreous humor to the optic nerve and through this to the common nerve. It is here that a common visual judgment is made. Throughout the text, Bacon makes reference to the kind of visual knowledge possessed by animals, especially in the context of a discussion of the cogitative sense. Bacon follows Ibn al-Haytham and imposes a geometrical model on the eye, enabling him to give a geometrical account of radiation through the eye. How then does one avoid confusion in vision and gain verifiable clarity? For Bacon, the perpendicular ray is primary; the other rays are treated as cases of indirect vision, refracted in the rear surface of the crystalline humor.

Bacon is next concerned with optical illusions, inverted images, magnification, vision of distant objects, the moon illusion, and such matters. He seeks in a rational and experimental manner to solve the puzzles found in Ptolemy, Alhacen, and others. Still, he is a child of his sources, which do not provide him with the more advanced data and mathematical method that arose only later, in the seventeenth century. But they do provide him with a functional qualitative geometry of the eye and vision based on the best Greek and Islamic science. Bacon is committed to an intromission theory of vision, though he combines it with an extramissionist theory that avoids the anthropomorphisms of earlier extramissionist theories. He uses the latter theory mainly to emphasize the active role of the eye in vision.

In Parts two and three, he is to some extent successful in applying geometry to problems of direct, reflected, and refracted vision. He moved the study of these matters to a new level. The geometrical arguments are worked out with careful diagrams and various appeals are made to “experimental” conditions. What are these conditions? Some of them are simple thought-experiments or even reports of actual experiments from earlier writers. It seems clear, however, that Bacon himself did experimental work with pinhole images, lenses, and discrete observations. This does not lead to a pure geometrization of nature, however, and he inevitably falls back on physical, perceptual, and metaphysical arguments. One might argue that he lacks the notion of infinity that is present in modern geometry.

Bacon introduces another important item for science. He refers to the “laws of reflection and refraction” as leges communes nature. In his account of nature in Communia naturalium and the later works in general, Bacon’s view is that a general law of nature governs universal force. This universal law of nature is imposed on a world of Aristotelian natures. This notion would have a significant future in experimental science.

This concept of a universal law of nature has been highlighted by M. Schramm (1998). It has now been taken up by Yael Raizman-Kedar and Professor Giora Hon, who are studying the development of universal laws of nature from Roger Bacon to the Early Modern Period.

Bacon ends Part three with an account of how a better understanding of natural phenomena could lead to a more accurate knowledge of the natural phenomena mentioned in Scripture. He finds in visual phenomena significant metaphors and analogies for use in moral and religious teaching. A solution to David C. Lindberg’s queries about Bacon’s attempt to combine elements of the intromissionist and extramissionist theories of vision is addressed here. At one level, it seems to be an akward combination of two conflicting theories of vision. This combination can be understood when one notes that Bacon is making use of the important issue of grace and free will issue as the moral-religious background for his discussion of vision. In other words, genuine theological concerns influence the manner in which Bacon constructs his analysis of vision in the Perspectiva. Thus, the analyses of Ptolemy and Alhacen had to be synthesized within a definite theological framework.

Direct evidence of Bacon’s influence here in making science available for an educated public is seen in the use of his work by Pierre de Limoges in his influential text, De oculo morali (On the Moral Eye), written at Paris between 1275 and 1289. MS Paris, BN Lat. 7434, owned by Pierre de Limoges, contains an early copy of Bacon’s Perspectiva. All of this suggests Pierre de Limoges,(magnus theologus et astronomus) as a very early reader of Bacon’s works (Newhauser 2001). Both are genuinely committed to theimprovement of the task of the preacher. Here, we see the priority for Bacon of preaching over theology, or rather, the latter is in service to the former (Johnson 2009).

5.4.3 On the Nature of Experimental Science: De scientia experimentali (1266–67)

Presupposing the Perspectiva, in De scientia experimentali and in related works on the halo and on burning mirrors Bacon situates this new scientific practice as a desired area of study in the medieval university. It is consequent on the study of Perspectiva. Starting from Aristotle’s account of empeiria (experience), Bacon argues that logical argument alone, even when it originates from experience, is not sufficient for the “verification of things”. Even arguments that have their origins in experience will need to be verified by means of an intuition of the things in the world. He distinguishes scientific argument from moral and religious mystical intuition, although he does allow for the notion of a revealed intuition in science. It is this element that clearly separates Bacon’s practice from that of modern science. Just as in his concern with the certification of language to gain individual reference, so too in science, Bacon clearly wishes to have a way of certification for knowledge of the individual.

His aim is to provide a method for science, one that is analogous to the use of logic to test validity in arguments. This new practical method consists of a combination of mathematics and detailed experiential descriptions of discrete phenomena in nature. It would be distinguished from the conjurations of magic and from moral and religious belief. It would also be different from philosophy of nature and from broad optical knowledge. These two areas are important for experimental science, but they constitute general principles, so that in themselves and without experiment, they do not provide access to minute, detailed experiments. Nevertheless, for his description of the first example of an experimental science, the study of the rainbow, Bacon depends on the accounts handed on by Aristotle, Seneca, and Avicenna. He is not uncritical of these accounts.

One source for Bacon’s methodology in an experimental science has been overlooked by the scholarship. It is clear to all that Bacon made much use of and privileged Ptolemy’s Optics. What has been missed is that Bacon was also influenced by Ptolemy’s methodology in the introductory chapter to the Almagest. The combination there of experience and geometrical reason is in some respects different and more detailed than in Aristotle’s scientific methodology. And so even as Bacon uses Aristotle’s texts, he is employing the methodological assumptions of Ptolemy.

Further, Bacon’s very close connection of experience and reason is influenced by his concerns with medical matters. (Roger Bacon, De erroribus medicorum). This text provides a wider discussion of Chapter one of Opus maius, Part six.

The context for Bacon’s writing on topics from the Meteorology of Aristotle came from the presence in Paris of the new translation of this work from Greek into Latin. With the recent critical edition of the Aristoteles Latinus version of the Meteorology, it is clear that Bacon is deliberately offering a criticism of William of Moerbeke’s translation. Bacon contends that the translations are not adequate and that the translator did not know the required sciences, especially Perspectiva, proposing instead a more accurate mathematical analysis of the phenomenon of the rainbow.

Bacon’s own important contribution is to be found in his calculation of the measured value of 42 degrees for the maximum elevation of the rainbow. This was probably done with an astrolabe, and in this, Bacon advocates the skillful mathematical use of instruments for an experimental science. That Bacon had mathematical competence in this field can be seen in his account of the halo in the Opus tertiium (OQHI) and in his complex arguments in De speculis comburentibus. Bacon takes up Grosseteste’s theory of refraction and tries to work out the difficulties in the latter. It would appear at first glance that Bacon is rejecting the notion of refraction out of hand (Lindberg 1966), but in fact he is only demonstrating that refraction as formulated by Grosseteste did not make experimental or rational sense. Bacon knew the rules governing the geometry of refraction. Important here is his emphasis on the role of individual drops of water for the process of reflection and refraction. The new research on the De iride of Grosseteste by Cecilia Panti and the other editors of the Oxford/Durham Robert Grosseteste project will shed much light on these matters. A correct account of the rainbow would be summarized some forty years after Bacon in the De iride of Theodoric of Freiberg (d. c. 1307) [TFT], with his account of a single reflection and double refraction in single drops of water.

A second task for experimental science is the discovery by ‘experience’ alone of instruments (e.g., the armillary sphere), new medical cures, chemical discovery, and military technologies. An important item here is the discovery of magnetism. It would seem that Bacon is reporting on the actual experimental work of Magister Petrus Peregrinus (fl. 1260–77), author of De magnete, who is lauded in the Opus tertium as the only worthwhile “experimentalist” at Paris (see Silvia Nagel 2012). Bacon has been lauded down the centuries for his medical learning, but recent scholarship has limited the number of works attributed to Bacon. Still, it is important to note that he did draw on medical practice to set out rules and procedures. Here, the recent research of Agostino Paravicini-Bagliani (1991, 2000) shows that Bacon shared these interests with other outstanding scholars such as Peter of Spain (Pope John XXI). The very concept of the ‘prolongation of life’ so forcefully proposed by Bacon in his later works found very receptive readers at the Papal Curia in Viterbo. The Papal Curia had by 1266 become a center for medical and scientific study. The third task is that of the prognostication of the future on the basis of astronomical/astrological knowledge. This section, depending on Pseudo-Ptolemy, Centiloquiium and Abu Ma’shar notes that this revelatory divination is earier and more available than the more complex regular astronomy that requires constant observation and the skillful uses of Tables and Instruments. These are not always readily available.

The conclusion to the De scientia experimentali is important. Bacon presents the ideal of the “philosophical chancellor”who will organize science and its technological products for the benefit of Res publica Christiana. In this, he is influenced by the important “Mirror of Princes” from the Islamic World, the Sirr-al-‘asrar (Secretum secretorum) (OHI, V). Stewart C. Easton (1952) proposed that this work was the guiding vision for Bacon’s reform of science. Williams (1994) has argued that Bacon completed the edition of this work after his return to Oxford ca. 1280 or a few years before that date. Still, there is much cross reference between this work and Bacon’s writings in Paris ca. 1266–71.

David C. Lindberg (1997) has given a succinct summary of Bacon’s model for an experimental science [RBS]. He sees four main aspects. First, Bacon’s perspectival theories were not his own creation. He took the best available materials from Greek and Islamic scholars and produced his own synthesis. Second, there is much evidence that Bacon himself did mathematical work and experiments with visual phenomena such as pinhole images and measurement of the visual field. Third, as seen above, Bacon correctly calculated the maximum degree of elevation for the rainbow. Fourth, the experiments in Bacon, especially in the Perspectiva served “theoretically significant functions” by supplying observational data that required explanation in terms of a given optical theory. The usual role of experiment in Bacon is to “confirm, refute, or challenge theoretical claims.”

One might have expected Bacon to have given equal treatment to astronomy, but in this field he was a child of his time. He reports on the accounts of Aristotle, Ptolemy, and Alfraganus (OHI, IV). He discusses the pros and cons in scholastic, but does not advance the field as he did for Perspectiva.

5.5 Opus maius/Part Seven: Moralis philosophia

Bacon’s Moralis philosophia (= Opus maius, VII = RBMP) comprises the philosophy of religion, social philosophy, a theory of the virtues, an astrological-sociology of religion and cultures, and an account of argument and rhetoric.

Bacon describes the object of moral inquiry as follows: “This science is preeminently active, that is, operative, and deals with our actions in this life and the other life” ([RBMP], 3). It is focused on human action. Of course, many human actions deal with issues that are the concern of the natural and linguistic sciences. Bacon notes that these sciences are active and operative but concerned “…with artificial and natural works which refer to the speculative intellect, and they are not concerned with those things which refer to the practical intellect, which is called practical because it exercises operations of good and evil” ([RBMP], 3). These works of the human being (operabilia) are “…more difficult to know than the objects of speculative knowledge.” These include “…the highest truths concerning God and divine worship, eternal life, the laws of Justice, the glory of peace, and the sublimity of the virtues” ([RBMP], 247). For Bacon, the human ability to deal with these topics is affected by a certain corruption of the human will.

Moral science has two parts. The first is speculative, dealing with ultimate moral truths. The second deals with the process of moral persuasion: “The practical part is related to the first part as the curing of the sick and the conserving of health, which are treated in practical medicine, are related to that part of medicine which teaches what health is…” ([RBMP], 248).

Part one deals with the object and method of morals science and with an outline of a philosophical anthropology based on Platonic, Aristotelian, and Stoic texts in which Bacon argues for an Augustinian view of the place of human beings in the world. This includes a section on metaphysical proof for God’s existence. And the ancient source texts are treated as testifying to the universal religion of Christianity. Part two is a very brief outline of the structure of social life, taken from Avicenna.

Part three, the most substantial in the book, is concerned with virtue and vice. Bacon’s own text for this part of the Opus maius still exists and one can see his personal editorial remarks in the margins. He did not have time to write a formal treatise, and so he presents an anthology of texts from Seneca and excerpts from Cicero with comment. This is preceded by a brief resume of Aristotle on the virtues. But it is clear that Bacon favors the image of the Stoic wise person as his model for virtue. Bacon places great emphasis on magnanimity as a virtue for the Prince and Prelate. Magnanimity of the greatest of the natural virtues. And it must not be confused with Christian humility. This distances Bacon from Bernard of Clairvaux and Bonaventure. For Bacon, Christian humility has its own distinctive role reflecting the relation of the human to the cosmos and to God. Above all, Bacon is concerned with reproducing as much of the Aristotelian and Stoic accounts of virtues as possible, and he is concerned with making the Dialogues of Seneca known to Pope Clement IV. In particular, he is most of all concerned with Seneca’s De ira, which he regards as a fundamental text for the moral instruction of princes and prelates. Certainly, Bacon, as he does in the Secretum secretorum, presents himself as a moral advisor to Princes.

Part four provides an astrological sociology of human nations or “sects”, relying on the moral/political account of al-Farabi and on the astrological views of Abu Ma’shar (Albumassar). Bacon had a wide knowledge of the world including the customs of the Mongols, and so he compares Mongol, Jewish, Arab, and Pagan civilizations.

Part five deals with the role of rhetoric in moral persuasion. Bacon is convinced that rhetoric is closely connected with logic, and believed that the university system failed by teaching only grammar and logic (linguistics). The omission from the university curriculum of rhetoric and poetics, as found in Aristotle and as interpreted by al-Farabi and Averroes, was in Bacon’s view a mistake. He knows the latest translations and remarks:

But al-Farabi has presented to us the meaning of this kind of argument, and Avicenna, al-Ghazali, and Averroes have done likewise. Because of this, one ought to present an account of the nature of poetic argument, and it falls to logic alone to compose such a book, since the composition of argumentation pertains to logic alone…The appropriate presentation of this argument is found in [my] Moralis philosophia, and in its use, and likewise in theological proofs and doctrines; and in such moral matters, this kind of argument moves a [person] much more than does a demonstrative argument since it has much greater power. And I have already composed a treatise on this [rhetorical-poetic] argument in my works on logic, and I have shown there what is proper to this science. ([OHI, XVI], 16–17)

He continues and notes that according to Aristotle and al-Farabi, this argument makes use of appropriate language so that the self can be led to virtue and to overcome of vice. He then links up the Greek and Islamic sources with the regular sources in the Latin tradition such as Cicero, Seneca, and Augustine. And he distinguishes carefully between demonstrative, dialectical, and rhetorical forms of argument.

5.6 Bacon’s Political Philosophy: the Secretum secretorum

Bacon devoted considerable time to the study of this work, the Latin translation of the Arabic work on statecraft in the tradition of Mirrors for Princes entitled Sirr-al-‘asrar. He worked on the text at Paris and completed the edition of this text with introduction and notes at Oxford after his return there from Paris c. 1280. This is the most important text on government and the education of the Prince prior to the writing of The Prince by Machiavelli. The work is divided into four parts. Part one begins with the letter of Alexander to Aristotle and deals with the king’s maintenance of the kingdom. It deals with virtues, largesse, and gifts. It is an account of the behavior expected of a King. Part two deals with health care, medicine, and the origins of the sciences. Part three deals with alchemy and with the human emotional structure. Part four deals with physiognomy and anthropology. Bacon’s introduction is substantial, consisting of seven chapters. It is closely connected with his account of astrology in Opus maius, part four, and with scientia experimentalis in part six. His sources are mostly Islamic and include the De radiis and De aspectibus of al-Kindi and the introduction to astrology of Abu Ma’shar. Bacon proposes a kind of statistical predictive astrology, and so has to deal explicitly with the issue of freedom and determinism. He objects to a kind of infallibilist necessitarianism and thinks that provided “possibility” and “contingency” can be guarded, one can predict what can happen in nature and in human society (due to the effects of the elements on temperament) in a general manner. Thus, the ruler will have need of the astrologer who will function as a kind of doctor, psychologist, sociologist, and political theorist. This is a far cry from a contemplative ethics. It is significant that in the work entitled Errores philosophorum ascribed to Giles of Rome, a contemporary of Bacon at Paris, many of Bacon’s sources are severely criticized. In the De regimine principium (1280s), Giles, unlike Bacon, provides a moral education for the prince that is entirely based on Greek and Latin sources, especially on Aristotle.

The idea of secrecy and secret books associated with Roger Bacon continued into the Renaissance (Kavey 2007), with the depiction of Roger Bacon on stage in a drama by Robert Greene.

6. Conclusion

It will be clear from this account that Roger Bacon was an important teacher of the Arts at Paris in the 1240s. He was ahead of his time in the vigorous manner in which he integrated the new Aristotle with the traditional Latin traditions of grammar and logic. He taught for a long period in the Arts. He later called himself an expert in the philosophy of Aristotle as interpreted by Avicenna and Averroes. And we should also add Avicebron (Solomon Ibn Gabirol). By 1248–49 he seems to have become an independent scholar. He then, it would seem, returned to England, where, under the influence of Adam Marsh, friend of Robert Grosseteste, Bishop of Lincoln, he was attracted to interests associated with both scholars: language study including the learning of ancient languages, experimental concerns such as optics and experimental science, and a renewed critical study of the text of Scripture. When Bacon returned to Paris in the 1250s, he was to oppose what had become a profound change in the methodology of university learning, that is, the introduction of the “Sentence-Method” into the study of theology. For Bacon, this was a destruction of practices that he associated with Robert Grosseteste. Taking up the flag of the Bishop of Lincoln (d. 1253), he became the great critic of the Parisian mode of doing philosophy and theology. As we saw above, Bacon was already by 1266 very concerned with the new heterodox interpretations of Aristotle found in the Faculty of Arts. His later works for Pope Clement IV must be read in the context of the Parisian debates on Latin Averroism (1266–1277).

The later Roger Bacon has a good knowledge of the geography and history of the world and an awareness of geo-politics. In this context, he devoted much time to the important work on the education of the Prince, the Secretum secretorum. He may have returned to Oxford c. 1280, if not before. There, he completed his edition, with notes and introduction, of this work. In his last work, the Compendium studii theologiae (c. 1292), he repeats some of the main arguments from the 1260s against Richard Rufus of Cornwall. Roger Bacon sets out themes in his philosophy of language, philosophy of nature, and moral philosophy and theology that would influence fourteenth century writers such as Duns Scotus and William of Ockham, among others. Jeremiah Hackett examines the influence of Roger Bacon on the philosophy of mind in John Pecham (Hackett 2018c). Bacon’s influence on the fourteenth century has been documented by Katherine H. Tachau (1988). He is much more important for the philosophy of the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries than has hitherto been recognized. The editors of Peter of John Olivi on matter have noted the appropriation by Olivi of Bacon’s teaching on matter. Doninique Demange and Yael Kedar have demonstrated Peter John Olivi’s critical appropriation of Bacon’s theory of Vision and his natural philosophy (Demange & Kedar, 2020). Jeremiah Hackett (2018a) has suggested that in the early to mid-1260s, Olivi may have been the Iuvenis Johannes, Bacon’s star student. Recently, Mattia Montovani has written a very important study on the importance of Bacon’s theory of vision for the new Cartesian discussions of vision in the early 17th century. It is a study of major significance for the influence of Bacon on early modern philosophy. (Montovani 2020) As noted above, the newly formed Roger Bacon Research Society will in the near future do much to further the study of the scientific, philosophical and theological works of Roger Bacon.


Primary Sources

Roger Bacon’s Work

[OQHI] Opera quaedam hactenus inedita (=Opus tertium, Opus minus, Compendium studii philosophiae, Epistola de secretis operibus Artis et Naturae, et de nullitate Magiae), ed. J. S. Brewer, London, 1859; reprint 1965, Nendeln, Lichtenstein: Kraus.
[OMB] Opus maius, 3 Vols., ed. John Henry Bridges, Oxford and Edinburgh. (Vols. 1 & 2, Oxford 1897; Vol. 3 with corrections, Edinburgh, 1900; reprint, Frankfurt: Minerva, 1964).
[UFRB] F. Gasquet, “An Unpublished Fragment of Roger Bacon,” in The English Historical Review, 1894, 495–517; Epistola Fratris Rogeri Baconi, ed. and trs., P. E. Bettoni, Milan, 1964.
[GGHG] The Greek Grammar of Roger Bacon and a Fragment of His Hebrew Grammar, ed. Edmund Nolan and S. A. Hirsch, Cambridge University Press, 1902.
[OTFD] Opus tertium: Fragment, ed. Pierre Duhem, Quarrachi, 1909.
[OHI] Opera hactenus inedita (Vol. I-XVI), ed. Robert Steele, Oxford, 1909–1940.
[CSTR] Fr. Rogeri Bacon Compendium Studii Theologiae, ed. Hastings Rashdall, Aberdeen University Press, 1911.
[OTFL] Part of the Opus tertium of Roger Bacon, including a Fragment Now Printed for the First Time, ed. Arthur George Little, Aberdeen University Press, 1912; reprint, Farnborough, U.K.: Gregg Press, 1966.
[WFB] The Works of Francis Bacon, ed. J. Stebbing, R. L. Ellis, D. D. Heath, London: Longmans, 1870; reprint, Garrett Press Inc., New York, NY, 1968.
[TUIA] Thomas Aquinas, Tractatus de unitate intellectus contra Averroistas, ed. Leo W. Keeler, Rome: Gregorianum, 1946.

Modern Critical Editions

[RBMP] Rogeri Baconis Moralis Philosophia, ed. Eugenio Massa, Zurich: Thesaurus Mundi, 1953.
[DS] “An Unedited Part of Roger Bacon’s ‘Opus maius’: ‘De signis,’” ed. K. M. Fredborg, Lauge Nielsen, Jan Pinborg, Traditio 34 (1978), 75–136.
[SD] Summulae dialectices, ed. Alain de Libera, “Les Summulae dialectices de Roger Bacon,” Archives d’Histoire Doctrinale et Littéraire du Moyen Age 53 (1986): 139–289, 54 (1987): 171–278.
[CSTM] Compendium studii theologiae, ed. Thomas S. Maloney, Leiden: Brill, 1988.
[DMP]/[DSC] De multiplicatione specierum and De speculis comburentibus, ed., David C. Lindberg, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1983.
Thomas S. Maloney, Compendium of the Study of Philosophy, Oxford University Press for The British Academy, 2018 [Auctores Britannici Medii Aevi, 32]
Nikolaus Egel, Edition and Translation, Roger Bacon: Opus Tertium, Hamburg: Felilx Meiner Verlag, 2019.
[TFT] Theodoric of Freiberg, Tractatus de iride et de radialibus impressionibus, eds. L. Sturlese/M.R. Pagnoni-Sturlese, in Corpus Philosophorum Teutonicorum Medii Aevi, II, 4, 1985, 95–286.
[PRSP] Perspectiva, ed. David C. Lindberg, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1996.


[MOA] Stanton J. Linden, The Mirror of Alchemy, New York: Garland Press, 1992.
[TTUM] Thomas S. Maloney, Three Treatments of Universals by Roger Bacon, Binghamton, New York: MARTS, 1989.
[RBASL] Thomas S. Maloney, Roger Bacon: The Art and Science of Logic, Toronto: PIMS, 2009.
[RBOS] Thomas S. Maloney, Roger Bacon: On Signs, Toronto: PIMS, 2013.
Nilolaus Egel and Katherina Molner, Roger Bacon: Opus maius, Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag, 2017.
Nikolaus Egel, Roger Bacon: Kompendium fur das Studium der Philosophie, Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag, 2015.
Pia A. Antilic-Piper, Opus Maius (Selected Texts), Latin-German, Freiburg-Basel-Wein: Herder Verlag, 2008.
V.Sorge and F. Seller, Filosofia, scienza, theologia dall’ Opus Maius, Rome: Armando Editore, 2010.
Francesco Bottin, Ruggero Bacone: La Scienze Sperimentale-Lettere a Clement IV- I Segreti Dell’Arte E Della Natura, Milan: Rusconi, 1990.
Carlos Arthuro R. Do Nascimento et al., Rogerio Bacon, Obras Escolhides, Porto Alegre, Braganca Publista, 2006.

Richard Rufus of Cornwall

[IPA] Richard Rufus of Cornwall, In Physicam Aristotelis, Rega Wood (ed.), Oxford University Press, for The British Academy, (ABMA, XVI), 2003; See Stanford University Richard Rufus of Cornwall Website, Dir. Rega Wood

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  • –––, 1997, “Roger Bacon’s Knowledge of Mathematics,” in Hackett 1997a, pp. 151–174.
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