Erotic Art

First published Wed Aug 20, 2014; substantive revision Tue Feb 7, 2023

What is erotic art? Do all paintings with a sexual theme qualify as erotic? How to distinguish between erotica and erotic art? In what way are aesthetic experiences related to, or different from, erotic experiences and are they at all compatible? Both people and works of art can be sensually appealing, but is the beauty in each case substantially the same? How helpful is the distinction between the nude and the naked? Can we draw a strict line between erotic art and pornography? We tend to think of art as complex and of pornography as one-dimensional, but how compelling is that differentiation? Pornography is often considered harmful, objectifying, and exploitative, but to what extent is erotic art immune to moral criticism of this sort? In addressing such questions this entry will provide an overview of current philosophical debates on erotic art. It will also place those debates in historical perspective and, in the closing section, explore some important avenues for future research.

1. What is Erotic Art?

1.1 A Definition of Erotic Art

In Sex and Reason, Richard Posner proposes to use the word “erotic” to describe

presentations and representations that are, or at least are taken by some viewers to be, in some sense “about” sexual activity. (Posner 1994: 351)

This characterization needs some narrowing down if one wants to arrive at a definition that captures the extension of what we ordinarily think counts as erotic art. For one thing, an extensionally adequate definition should exclude scientific-behavioral studies or medical illustrations of sexual activity (which tend to be neither erotic nor artistic in nature). Furthermore, it’s not the case, simply because some viewers take a painting or a sculpture to be about sexual activity, that we are ipso facto dealing with an erotic representation. Someone who is unfamiliar with the story of the Christian Bible might take a crucifixion painting to be a depiction of a sado-masochistic act, but that would be insufficient grounds to call, say, Tintoretto’s Crucifixion (1565) a work of erotic art.

Peter Webb’s definition of erotic art as

art on a sexual theme related specifically to emotions rather than merely actions, and sexual depictions which are justifiable on aesthetic grounds (Webb 1975: 2)

is already closer to the mark. But even though Webb’s emphasis on emotions is understandable from an etymological point of view—the term “erotic” derives from the Greek word “eros” meaning love or passion—he does not succeed in spelling out the necessary or sufficient conditions for erotic art. Man Ray’s photograph The Prayer (1930) shows only the hands, feet, and buttocks of a woman; it is not a sexual depiction in the strict sense and there is no show of emotions. Still, it is widely considered to be an erotic masterpiece. Conversely, Ian McEwan’s novella On Chesil Beach, set in the early 1960s and telling the story of a wedding night that goes horribly wrong, does qualify as “art on a sexual theme related specifically to emotions” and yet it would be misleading to label it as erotic literature.

Instead of claiming that erotic art is about sexual feelings or desires, one could say that erotic art elicits sexual feelings or desires. But this characterization would also be too broad. A pious Madonna and Child painting may elicit sexual feelings or desires in some people, but that in and of itself does not make it erotic art. The intention to be sexually stimulating appears crucial, as Jerrold Levinson acknowledges in his definition of erotic art as

art which aims to engage viewers sexually through explicit sexual content, and that succeeds, to some extent, in doing so. (Levinson 2006: 252)

But does erotic art need to be explicit? Take Nobuyoshi Araki’s famous close-up photograph of a woman’s eye, sometimes entitled The Look. The artist has tilted the picture 90 degrees to make it suggestive of female genitalia, thereby soliciting sensuous feelings and associations in spectators. It is highly erotic, though it has no explicit sexual content.

A more adequate definition, and one that will be adhered to in this article, is the following: erotic art is art that is made with the intention to stimulate its target audience sexually, and that succeeds to some extent in doing so. This raises the further question what sexual stimulation precisely entails. According to Guy Sircello (1979: 119) it is the inducing of sexual feelings where the latter might be (1) feelings in our sexual parts, or (2) feelings in other erogenous parts—typically generated by or generating feelings in sexual parts. However, a kick below the belt will give a man certain feelings in his sexual parts, but not of the sort that erotic art is supposed to bring about. So, an important qualification is needed. Sexual stimulation is probably best understood as the inducing of sexual feelings, desires and imaginings, that would generally be regarded as pleasant in themselves. Alternatively, one could adopt Matthew Kieran’s nutshell definition of erotic art as art which “essentially aims at eliciting sexual thoughts, feelings and associations found to be arousing” (2001: 32).

1.2 Some Further Distinctions

Levinson (2005) makes a useful distinction between erotic art and what he calls erotica, that is, images intended to sexually stimulate but not to reward artistic interest (such as provocative lingerie ads). In general, it is good to keep in mind that the domain of erotic art only constitutes a small subsection of the much larger class of items that are called erotic (erotic massages, erotic games, erotic toys, etc.). Erotic art also seems to fall within the broader category of sexually themed art. All works of erotic art have a sexual theme, it could be argued, but not the other way around: many artworks with a sexual theme are not works of erotic art. Ian McEwan’s On Chesil Beach has already been mentioned. Another example might be Tracey Emin’s Is Anal Sex Legal? (1998), which simply consists of that question writ large in pink neon light. (The piece is usually exhibited together with its complement, Is Legal Sex Anal? also from 1998).

Sexually themed art should be distinguished from sexually stimulating art, i.e., art that stimulates its target audience sexually, even though it may not have had the aim to do so. While some may find it difficult to think of any examples in this category, Sircello argues on phenomenological grounds that everything that is truly beautiful, and hence every work of art that is truly beautiful, will be experienced as sexually titillating. For instance, when he studies The Burghers of Calais, with its stooped and despondent old men,

the beauty of Rodin’s restless surface leads me … to rub that glorious bronze, and once again comes that warmth in the testicles, that stirring in the penis, that itch in the nipples and the tongue. (1979: 225)


when I inspect the austere and meticulous Zurbaran still life, notice the painstaking precision of its details … (I) feel forthwith those stirrings in the groin. (1979: 225)

However, while Sircello judges his arousal to be “neither abnormal nor idiosyncratic” and to be fully “appropriate and natural” (1979: 226) not everyone might agree with that assessment.

The counterpart of sexually stimulating art is failed erotic art (or as Levinson 2006 would have it “nominally erotic art”): art that aims but does not succeed in stimulating its target audience sexually (see also Mag Uidhir 2010). Anti-erotic art, on the other hand, is art that aims to induce negative sexual feelings, thoughts, and imaginings in its target audience. Otto Dix’s Old Couple (1923) or George Grosz’s Sex Murder in the Ackerstrasse (1916–7) could serve as illustrations. More recently, feminist artists such as Kiki Smith have explored the dark, violent, abject aspects of sexuality in their work (see, for instance, Smith’s Tale, 1992, and Blood Pool, 1992).

Finally, because censorship and moral policing have often prevented artists from making work that is openly erotic, it is worth drawing attention to the existence of covertly erotic art, that is, art made with the covert intention to stimulate its target audience sexually and that succeeds to some extent in doing so. A good example are the so called “sukashi shunga” (hidden shunga) that were popular in Japan at the beginning of the 20th century. Shunga are woodblock prints, often created by Japan’s leading artists, depicting highly erotic scenes. While there were already regulations in the early 18th century against the distribution of shunga, it was only at the end of the 19th century, in the wake of Japan’s increasing openness towards the West, that censorship laws were really being enforced. As a result, hidden (see-through) shunga prints were designed to escape the strict eye of the censor. What at first sight appear to be beautifully drawn postcards depicting landscapes with some space in the middle and at the corners to write one’s message, when held up to the light, turn out to be sexually explicit lovemaking scenes (Aki 2013: 47). An example of an entirely different kind might be Maria Scanu’s sculpture of Madonna del Naviganti (1999) or Vermeer’s Milk Maid (1657–58). Given that milk maids had a reputation for sexual availability in 17th century Holland, some scholars have argued that the painting has a covert erotic message, with the foot warmer on the floor suggesting feminine desire (because foot warmers would heat not only the feet but everything under a woman’s skirt) and one of the Delft tiles in the scene depicting Cupid, while another tile shows a traveling man possibly suggesting that the maid is thinking of an absent lover (Liedtke 2009).

2. Modern Aesthetics and the Problem of Erotic Art

Are there überhaupt any works of erotic art? This may seem a silly question, especially to anyone who is familiar with art history and with the well-established tradition of erotic art in particular. But to students of modern aesthetics, that is, the philosophy of art and beauty from roughly the beginning of the 18th century to the end of the 19th century, that question will not appear absurd at all.

2.1 The Aesthetic Disenfranchisement of the Erotic

Modern aesthetics famously built a wall between aesthetic pleasure, on the one hand, and sensual or sexual pleasures, on the other hand, leaving precious little room for works that aim to combine the two. The problem becomes clear when we consider Immanuel Kant’s Critique of Judgment (1790), arguably the most central and influential work of that period. According to Kant, a pure aesthetic judgment is based entirely on a feeling of disinterested pleasure, i.e., a pleasure that does not depend on or generate a desire for the object. But since works of erotic art are meant precisely to tap into and stimulate our sexual appetites and desires, it is hard to see how they can be the object of an aesthetic judgment. They are rather primed to be the object of what Kant calls a judgment of the agreeable, based on an “interested pleasure”, in this case the titillation provided by the alluring depictions of attractive bodies and seductive poses. The sensual pleasure offered by such representations is very different from the enjoyment that occurs in an aesthetic experience and which results from the free play of the cognitive faculties of imagination and understanding. According to Kant, it is because aesthetic judgments are grounded not in any interest, but rather in the subjective conditions of cognition, which are shared by all rational beings, that they can lay claim to universality. The pleasure solicited by erotic art can obviously not lay claim to such universality since it will depend on one’s sexual preferences and inclinations.

Kant was not the first to introduce disinterestedness as hallmark of the aesthetic and isolate it as such from what is merely sensually or sexually appealing. Anthony Ashley Cooper, the third Earl of Shaftesbury, is often credited with this insight. In his Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times (1711) Shaftesbury already stated that the response solicited by beauty is one of rational and refined contemplation, far removed from the crude pleasures that we receive through our senses.

A problem that immediately arises for Shaftesbury’s account is the one posed by the “dazzling form” of a beautiful woman (1964 [1711]: 136). Here, beauty and sensual appeal, far from being antithetical, actually seem to go hand in hand. Still, Shaftesbury insists that the two kinds of pleasure are utterly distinct, even though, in this particular case, erotic pleasure may indeed follow in the wake of aesthetic pleasure. One could make a comparison, he writes, with someone who goes from contemplating the beauty of a tree to fantasizing about its tasty fruits. Both activities are pleasurable, but the pleasures involved are very different: one is a disinterested aesthetic pleasure, the other is a pleasure informed by our self-interest. It points to a sensual joy, based on an appetite that we have in common with animals, or “brutes” as Shaftesbury prefers to call them. The contemplation of beauty, by contrast, is unique to us rational beings. That’s because beauty is exclusively an object of the mind.

But can one really draw the distinction in such absolute terms? When we admire an attractive man or woman, isn’t it precisely their beauty that activates the senses and gives rise to certain bodily passions? And if so, doesn’t this prove that the two are intimately linked? Shaftesbury dismisses this line of thought almost out of hand. After all, we wouldn’t say that it is the beauty of the fruit that attracts and brings joy to the prowling animal in search of food; or that it is the beauty of the food served at the dinner table that makes us humans hungry. What whets and satisfies appetite of both humans and animals is not the striking form, but what lies beneath that striking form, that which is mere matter. (Accordingly, the more a mouthwatering dish or body is viewed, the further they are from satisfying by mere view.) Just as it is not the material that makes a sculpture beautiful, but rather the artistic intentions and designs that shape the material, so it is not the body in itself, something that is mere matter, that is beautiful:

What is it you admire but mind, or the effect of mind? Tis mind alone which forms. All which is void of mind is horrid, and matter formless is deformity itself. (1964 [1711]: 132)

Mind is the only true object of beauty. Moreover, it is only through the mind that beauty can be apprehended and appreciated, for if animals can’t know and enjoy beauty precisely because they have only senses, it follows that man can’t conceive or enjoy beauty through his senses (the “brutish part”).

It is evident that, for Shaftesbury, erotic art, which is all about presenting desirable bodies and stirring up sensual pleasures, can have no legitimate place within the realm of the aesthetic. Yet, apart from a brief passage in which he denounces the “self-improving artist” who makes a fortune by “studying bodies” (1964 [1711]: 144), Shaftesbury does not explicitly criticize or attack any kind of art or artist. (Like Kant, his primary focus is not art, but beauty.) Someone who does explicitly take up such a critical stance, however, is Arthur Schopenhauer. If Shaftesbury is the philosopher who inspired Kant to develop the theory of disinterestedness, then Schopenhauer is the philosopher who, inspired by Kant, has taken this notion of disinterestedness and worked it up into a fully-fledged philosophy of art.

This is not the place to discuss all the minutiae of Schopenhauer’s The World as Will and Representation (1818). Crucial, for our purposes, is his concept of “das Reizende”, which will here be translated as “the stimulating.” The stimulating is “that which excites the will by directly presenting to it satisfaction, fulfillment” (Schopenhauer 1969 [1818]: 207). It ought to be shunned at all price in art, says Schopenhauer, because it

draws the beholder down from pure contemplation, demanded by every apprehension of the beautiful, since it necessarily stirs his will by objects that directly appeal to it. Thus the beholder no longer remains pure subject of knowing, but becomes the needy and dependent subject of willing. (Schopenhauer 1969 [1818]: 207)

This is contrary to the aim of art, which is to facilitate will-less contemplation of the Ideas.

Schopenhauer is quite specific about what the stimulating consists in:

In historical painting and in sculpture (it) consists in nude figures, the position, semi-drapery, and whole treatment of which are calculated to excite lustful feeling in the beholder. (1969 [1818]: 207–8)

It is important to note that he does not object to depicting the nude figure as such—after all, “the ancients” did so “almost always free from … fault” (ibid.). What he objects to is a particular treatment of the nude, one which is designed to excite lustful feelings in the beholder. In other words, what he targets and denounces is erotic art. Like Shaftesbury and Kant he is drawn to make a comparison with food. Fruit is admissible as a subject matter for paintings

for it exhibits itself as a further development of the flower, and as a beautiful product of nature through form and colour, without our being positively forced to think of its edibility. (ibid.: 207–8)

But what is not admissible are prepared and served-up dishes, depicted with a high degree of realism. Dutch still life paintings depicting oysters, herrings, crabs, bread, butter, beer, wine, excite the appetite and are objectionable for the exact same reasons as erotic paintings and sculptures, which excite sexual appetite, are objectionable: they stimulate the will and as such put an end to any aesthetic contemplation of the object. Given that the function of art is to facilitate aesthetic experience, it follows for Schopenhauer that “the stimulating … is everywhere to be avoided in art” (ibid: 208; see also Neill 2012).

2.2 The Legacy of Modern Aesthetics

Modern aesthetics has cast a long shadow into the 20th and even the 21st century, and the idea that the aesthetic and the erotic are fundamentally incompatible has proved to be very influential throughout.

Clive Bell, the great champion of aesthetic formalism, inscribes himself neatly in that tradition. In his landmark book, Art (1914), he begins by drawing a sharp contrast between the aesthetic emotion, which is provoked by works of art in virtue of a certain pleasing combination of lines and colors, and sexual feelings and desires which are provoked by sensually appealing bodies. The two could not be more different, he thinks:

let no one imagine, because he has made merry in the warm tilth and quaint nooks of romance, that he can even guess at the austere and thrilling raptures of those who have climbed the cold, white peaks of art. (1961 [1914]: 42)

Nevertheless, Bell acknowledges, as did Shaftesbury, that the two emotions are often confused partly because in everyday speech the word “beauty” is used indiscriminately for items that fall in each of the two categories (beautiful works of art, attractive men and women). To prevent any further confusion, he insists therefore on using the word “significant form,” instead of beauty, for the combination of lines and colors that produces the aesthetic emotion. (Shaftesbury, one will recall, was revisionist in the opposite direction, refusing to employ the word beauty for that which is merely desirable.)

What about those works of art that appeal to our sensual feelings and desires and that are so popular with the man in the street?

The art that they call “beautiful” is generally closely related to the women. A beautiful picture is a photograph of a pretty girl; beautiful music, the music that provokes emotions similar to those provoked by young ladies in musical farces; and beautiful poetry, the poetry that recalls the same emotions felt, twenty years earlier, for the rector’s daughter. (1961 [1914]: 28–29)

Bell has no patience with ignorant folks who seek out pictures, poems, or music for these reasons. They are simply confusing the sensual and the aesthetic. Of course, this does not mean that paintings depicting pretty girls cannot be art. They can, but if they are art, they will be so despite their erotic content. For example, when Manet’s Olympia, a picture of a prostitute, caused a storm of indignation in Paris of the 1860s, Emile Zola defended the painting in terms that Bell would have approved of:

Tell them aloud, dear master, that you are not what they think you are, that a painting is for you a mere pretext for analysis. You needed … clear and luminous tones, and you introduced a bouquet; you needed black tones and you placed in a corner a Negress and a cat. (Zola 1991: 161)

For Bell and his fellow formalists, significant form is the only important artistic criterion. Where it comes to insulating the aesthetic from the erotic, many prominent philosophers in the 20th century have followed in Bell’s footsteps, even when they do not subscribe to his formalism. In The Principles of Art (1938), R. G. Collingwood observes how “the words ‘beauty’, ‘beautiful’, as actually used, have no aesthetic implication” since they often indicate “the satisfaction of some desire or the arousing of some emotion” (1938: 38–41). For Collingwood, a beautiful man or woman ordinarily means one whom we find sexually desirable. And he firmly states that this “has nothing whatever to do with aesthetic experience. It has to do with that other kind of experience that Plato called eros” (1938: 41). Similarly, Monroe Beardsley insisted on a strict divide between the two sorts of responses and revised his theory of aesthetic experience when it was pointed out to him that it did not exclude sexual experiences from the realm of the aesthetic (Beardsley 1982). Edward Bullough famously posited “psychical distance” as a prerequisite for experiencing art and concluded that

explicit references to organic affections, … especially to sexual matters, lie normally below the Distance-limit, and can be touched on by Art only with special precautions. (1969: 403)

Even in the 21st century one will find philosophers who are deeply sceptical about the aesthetic and artistic potential of the erotic. Mohan Matthen, for instance, states that “erotic art tends not to be great art” because

even when erotica are artistic … they have too direct an effect on sexual response, and this distracts the viewer’s attention away from the work itself. (2011: 354)

The more erotic a work of art, the more difficult it is to appreciate aesthetically. Matthen makes this claim in an essay review of The Art Instinct (2009), a book on evolutionary aesthetics written by Denis Dutton, who also claims that eroticism is best avoided in art, though for different reasons than Matthen. While the latter considers the sexual response too distracting, Dutton argues that it is rather too crude and too basic to count as a proper aesthetic response. A high degree of meaning-complexity is the hallmark of all great art, according to Dutton, but while love is complex, “(s)ex itself is just too simple” (2009: 238). As a consequence,

love is the most pervasive theme for representative arts everywhere, (whereas) explicit eroticism does not tend to figure importantly in the greatest masterpieces. (2009: 238)

Just like a bowl of corn syrup and a plate of sugar will never be dinner, Dutton flippantly observes, erotic paintings, novels, and poems will never qualify as art of the highest order. (It is certainly noteworthy that Dutton, who is the antipode of modern aesthetics in doing away with the very notion of a disinterested pleasure and assuming that matters of sexual reproduction are vital in explaining our interest in art and aesthetics, actually finds himself in the company of Schopenhauer, Kant, and Shaftesbury where erotic art is concerned.)

To recapitulate: if (disinterested, contemplative) aesthetic responses are indeed irreconcilable with (interested, bodily) sexual responses, as so many philosophers of art in the past have thought, then there hardly remains any conceptual space for works that aim for both kinds of response. Yet, we do, as a matter of fact, have this longstanding tradition of erotic art, not just in the West but also in many non-Western cultures. How to account for this?

Proponents of modern aesthetics could simply bite the bullet here and argue, as Mohan Matthen does, that erotic art tends not to be great art, or, following Bell, that erotic paintings, books, poems can only attain art status despite their erotic content. But that is a big bullet to bite, by any standard. Not only are there so many outstanding works of erotic art, but the eroticism of these works is also more often than not an integral part of their status and value as art. To be sure, there are nude paintings and sculptures which seem to qualify first and foremost as studies in formal beauty (certain sculptures of Henry Moore come to mind). But anyone who would regard, say, The Naked Maja by Goya (c. 1797–1800) or Les Délassements d’Eros by Gerda Wegener (1925) as a mere formal exercise would entirely misunderstand and fail to appreciate what these works are about. That is why the great majority of aestheticians today prefer the other horn of the dilemma. Instead of denying the existence of genuinely erotic art, they will deny that aesthetic and erotic responses are antithetical and hence reject the basic tenets of modern aesthetics.

2.3 The Aesthetic Rehabilitation of the Erotic

Modern aesthetics and its 20th century formalist and experientialist heirs have been criticized from many sides. But instead of offering a general critique, let us consider briefly some of the philosophers who, in attacking modern aesthetics, have explicitly pleaded for the inclusion of the sexual within the domain of aesthetics.

One of the most vehement early critics was Friedrich Nietzsche. In an oft-quoted passage in On the Genealogy of Morals (1887: III.6) Nietzsche shifts attention to the artist’s point of view to reveal a fundamental flaw in modern aesthetics:

When our aestheticians tirelessly rehearse, in support of Kant’s view, that the spell of beauty enables us to view even nude female statues “disinterestedly” we may be allowed to laugh a little at their expense. The experiences of artists in this delicate matter are rather more “interesting”; certainly Pygmalion was not entirely devoid of aesthetic feeling.

(NB: For Nietzsche’s texts we have relied on the classic edition of Colli & Montinari, 1967–78. On the Genealogy of Morals is abbreviated as GM, The Will to Power is abbreviated as WP, and Twilight of the Idols is abbreviated as TI. The translations we have used are listed in the bibliography)

Pygmalion fell under the spell of the beautiful statue he had created, but his enjoyment was certainly not bereft of any desire. For Nietzsche, the case of Pygmalion is not exceptional, but rather emblematic: “All art works tonically, increases strength, inflames desire” (WP §809). And, as he writes in Twilight of the Idols (1889),

all beauty incites to procreation—… precisely this is the proprium of its effect, from the most sensual regions up into the most spiritual…. (TI IX.22)

To believe, as Schopenhauer, Kant, Shaftesbury seem to have done, that in matters of beauty and art there is such a thing as “immaculate perception” (an aesthetic regard pure of any desire), is simply to deceive oneself.

Far from building a wall between the aesthetic and the sexual, Nietzsche sees them as intimately linked: “The demand for art and beauty is an indirect demand for the ecstasies of sexuality” (WP §805). The two experiences really share the same structure and phenomenology. As with sexual experience, if there is to be “any aesthetic doing or seeing, one physiological condition is indispensable: rapture” (TI IX, 8). And the pleasure that one receives is not a disembodied, cognitive pleasure—a unique kind of experience that would set us apart from animals. No,

art reminds (us) of states of animal vigour: it is on the one hand an excess and overflow of blooming corporeality into the world of images and desires: on the other, an excitation of the animal functions through the images and desires of intensified life. (WP §802)

Thus, while the erotic masterpieces of the past must qualify as regrettable anomalies for someone like Schopenhauer, Nietzsche has no trouble at all in giving them a place.

Within contemporary aesthetics, Alexander Nehamas and Richard Shusterman have made a serious and sustained effort to make room for the erotic within aesthetics and art. In the first few pages of his book Only a Promise of Happiness (2007), Nehamas lays his cards on the table. Mentioning Kant and Schopenhauer as his adversaries, he states uncompromisingly that “the only reaction appropriate to beauty is eros—love, the desire to possess it” (2007: 6). While eros should not necessarily be understood in a sexual sense here, Nehamas does think that erotic encounters provide an instructive model for aesthetic experiences in general:

The most abstract and intellectual beauty provokes the urge to possess it no less than the most sensual inspires the passion to come to know it better. (2007: 7)

Each judgment of beauty is future oriented, is identical with the spark of desire, and contains, in the words of Stendhal, a promise of happiness (Stendhal 1926: 74; Nehamas 2007: 55).

For Nehamas, too, erotic art is not at all a recalcitrant exception in need of explanation. Quite the contrary, it offers the best possible inroad to understanding what beauty and art are all about. It’s not a coincidence that the touchstone work of art, to which Nehamas returns again and again, is Manet’s Olympia. Far from being an exercise in formal beauty, as Zola would have it, this is a painting that is precisely designed

to jolt the audience, especially the men, into acknowledging that what they were enjoying was not a painted canvas or an idealized figure with an edifying message but a naked woman of their own place and time. (Nehamas 2007: 27)

It is erotic in every sense of the word and for Nehamas it does what all great art should do: spark the audience’s desire.

If Nehamas mainly takes issue with the disavowal of desire within modern aesthetics, Richard Shusterman’s main target is the “idealist-rationalist repugnance for the body” which he finds is permeating the entire tradition of Western philosophy (2005: 324; see also Irvin (ed.) 2016). To counter this, Shusterman proposes a new discipline, “somaesthetics,” which aims to study the “experience and use of one’s body as a locus of sensory-aesthetic appreciation and creative self-fashioning” (1999: 302) and which has as one of its main subsidiary ambitions to “(i)mprove our appreciation of the artistry, beauty, meaning that sexual experience can offer” (2008: 85). In several of his essays he argues that sexual experience itself can qualify as an aesthetic experience, since most of the crucial features attributed to aesthetic experiences are also attributable to erotic experiences: they are pursued and valued for their own sake, they are rich in intensity and stand out distinctively from the flow of ordinary humdrum experience, they display harmonies of structure and developing form, they are being subjectively savored but also intentionally directed at an object, they deeply engage thought, feeling, and imagination, and stimulate both body and mind (2007: 57, 2008: 93). Hence, instead of ignoring or disenfranchising the tradition of erotic art, Shusterman pleads for the reassertion of an “ars erotica” which would not just involve a renewed attention for certain works of the past, but would entail the development of genuine erotic art forms that could help increase our understanding of the relation between aesthetics and sex, deliver aesthetically rewarding erotic experiences, and deepen our appreciation of the aesthetic potential of other somatic practices (2007: 57; 2021).

3. Contemporary Aesthetics and the Problem of Pornographic Art

While not everyone will take the aesthetic recuperation of the erotic as far as Shusterman and Nehamas, very few philosophers today will deny the existence and aesthetic legitimacy of erotic art. So, does this mean that the wall between the sexual and the aesthetic has been torn down? Not entirely. It seems more accurate to say that the battle lines have been redrawn. The suspicion towards the erotic may have largely subsided in contemporary aesthetics, but it has been replaced by a very pronounced scepticism of the pornographic. Many philosophers of art, including Roger Scruton, Jerrold Levinson, and Christy Mag Uidhir, deny that there is (or can be) such a thing as pornographic art. In other words, they advocate a strict divide between erotic art and pornography. Some of their scepticism, one cannot fail to notice, bears a significant resemblance to the earlier resistance against erotic art.

Pornographic representations are sexually explicit and rich in anatomical detail, Scruton points out, whereas works of erotic art rely on suggestion and, instead of focusing on certain body parts, will try to capture the individuality, personality, and subjectivity of the represented person. In Titian’s Venus of Urbino (1538), for instance, it is not the sexual organs but the face, as “window to the soul,” that provides the focus of attention (1986: 154, 2005: 11, 2009: 149). A pornographic image, by contrast, “is like a magic wand that turns subjects into objects, people into things—and thereby disenchants them, destroying the source of their beauty” (2009: 163). As part of his project to rehabilitate beauty as the central aesthetic and artistic category, Scruton also appeals to the distinction between “the nude” and “the naked” made famous by Kenneth Clark (1956). The artistic nude constitutes, as the subtitle of Clark’s book indicates, a “Study in Ideal Form”: the body is beautifully shaped and framed by the conventions of art. The people in pornographic images are not nude, but naked. They are deprived of clothes, and as such exposed in an embarrassing way. Furthermore, while the Titian nude retains a detached serenity, pornography arouses the viewer, which is always “an aesthetic defect, a ‘fall’ into another kind of interest than that which has beauty as its target” (2009: 160).

Levinson also wishes to separate erotic art from pornography in terms of the kind of response they call for, yet his argument is markedly different from Scruton’s. Here’s a summary of Levinson’s argument:

  1. Erotic art consists of images centrally aimed at a certain sort of reception (R1).
  2. Pornography consists of images centrally aimed at a certain sort of reception (R2).
  3. R1 essentially involves attention to form/vehicle/medium/manner, and so entails treating images as in part opaque.
  4. R2 essentially excludes attention to form/vehicle/medium/manner, and so entails treating images as wholly transparent.
  5. R1 and R2 are incompatible.
  6. Hence, nothing can be both erotic art and pornography; or at the least, nothing can be coherently projected as both erotic art and pornography; or at the very least, nothing can succeed as erotic art and pornography at the same time. (2005: 239)

Elsewhere in the article Levinson makes it clear that by “R1” he means aesthetic delight or aesthetic experience and that “R2” refers to sexual arousal and release:

the aims of true pornography and the aims of art, erotic art included, are not compatible, but war against one another (…). One induces you, in the name of arousal and release, to ignore the representation so as to get at the represented, the other induces you, in the name of aesthetic delight, to dwell on the representation. (2005: 234)

This has been the single most influential argument in recent debates on the relation between erotic art and pornography, winning many supporters (Matthen 2011; Nanay 2012; Neill 2012) but also attracting a substantial amount of criticism (see, for instance, Kania 2012; Davies 2012; van Brabandt and Prinz 2012; Patridge 2013). While one may want to challenge some of Levinson’s premises (as Maes 2009 does in a systematic way), one could also question whether his rather radical conclusion really follows from said premises. After all, it seems that one can (coherently and successfully) aim at incompatible audience responses, as long as one does not expect these responses to be elicited at the same time, in the same audience (see Maes 2011).

As opposed to key representatives of modern aesthetics, both Levinson and Scruton have no problem acknowledging the existence of erotic art. However, they do object very strongly to the possibility of there being pornographic art, and it’s not hard to discern in their respective objections—which rely on notions such as beauty, contemplation, ideal form, aesthetic experience—the remnants and residual influence of modern aesthetics. This is less obvious in Christy Mag Uidhir’s attempt to draw a line between pornography and art. While Scruton insists on the controversial connection between art and beauty, and Levinson builds his case on the idea that a work of art’s main purpose is to produce an aesthetic experience and draw attention to its own formal features, Mag Uidhir’s argument does not rely on any such substantial claims. He does not even claim that art has or should have a purpose. Mag Uidhir asks us only to accept that if a work of art has a purpose, including perhaps the purpose of sexual titillation as is the case in erotic art, then that purpose must be manner specific. Here’s how he arrives at his exclusivist position (2009: 194):

  1. If something is pornography, then that something has the purpose of sexual arousal (of some audience).
  2. If something is pornography, then that something has the purpose of sexual arousal and that purpose is manner inspecific.
  3. If something is art, then if that something has a purpose, then that purpose is manner specific.
  4. If something is art, then if that something has the purpose of sexual arousal, then that purpose is manner specific.
  5. A purpose cannot be both manner specific and manner inspecific.
  6. Therefore, if something is pornography, then it is not art.

For a purpose to be manner specific, according to Mag Uidhir, is for it to be essentially constituted both by an action (or state of affairs) and a manner, such that the purpose is to perform that action (or bring about that state of affairs) in that particular manner. A purpose is manner inspecific, on the other hand, if failure to perform the action (or bring about the state of affairs) in the prescribed manner does not necessarily constitute failure to satisfy the purpose.

Mag Uidhir’s approach is markedly different from Scruton’s and Levinson’s. Still, regarding the central issue, he aligns himself squarely with other sceptics. He, too, thinks that artists or pornographers attempting to produce something that is both (erotic) art and pornography, in fact attempt the impossible. However, recent critics of Mag Uidhir have raised doubts about his second premise (Davies 2012; Patridge 2013), as well as the general validity of his argument (Maes 2012). These critics belong to a growing number of philosophers who find exclusivists’ arguments unconvincing and argue for the existence of pornographic art as a subclass of erotic art (Kieran 2001, van Brabandt and Prinz 2012, Fokt 2012).

4. Erotic Art vs Pornography: Beyond Aesthetics

Besides aesthetics, there are at least two other areas of academic study where the distinction between erotic art and pornography has been at the centre of serious philosophical debate: feminist theory and art history.

4.1 Erotic Art, Art History, and the Cultural History of Pornography

Art historians who write about erotic art are often quite anxious to draw a strict dividing line between “high brow” erotic art and “low brow” pornography. Kenneth Clark, mentioned earlier, famously stated to the Longford Committee Investigating Pornography:

To my mind art exists in the realm of contemplation … the moment art becomes an incentive to action it loses its true character. (Longford 1972: 280)

This was his main objection to pornography: that it was in essence an incentive to sexual acts. However, as a justification for the radical separation of art and pornography this will not do. For one thing, Clark seems to overlook the fact that there are numerous religious or politically inspired masterpieces that call on people to change their lives or perform certain actions (the Isenheim Altarpiece, 1512–16, or Delacroix’s Liberty Leading the People, 1830, come to mind).

This brings us to another rationale for separating erotic art and pornography that is very popular among art historians (and is somewhat reminiscent of Dutton’s expressed reservations towards eroticism in art). Art is necessarily multi-layered, it is argued, whereas pornography is one-dimensional; it has only one job to do and therefore lacks the formal and structural intricacy, the cognitive complexity, and interpretive openness of art (see, for example, Webb 1975: 6; Mahon 2005: 14; Wallace et al. 2007: 15). But while the Isenheim Altarpiece and Liberty Leading the People may indeed be very complex works, there is good reason to believe that the insistence on the simplicity of pornography is itself the result of an oversimplification. Let us examine this claim in more detail.

(1) A simple purpose? It is tempting to think of pornography as having only one, very rudimentary purpose: sexual arousal of the audience. But a look at very early pornographic works, those that were produced in France and England between 1500 and 1800, shows how misleading that conception is. Almost all pornographic works of that era deliberately used the shock of sex to criticize religious and political authorities (Hunt 1996: 35). With their truth-telling trope they were meant to function as a powerful antidote to the many forms of repression in society and often had the explicit aim to educate people about politics, religion, society, and of course, sex (Lubey 2022). It is not a coincidence that these books were known in 18th century France as “livres philosophiques” (they were considered just as dangerous to society as philosophical treatises) and that the rise in pornography around 1740 coincided with the hey-day of the Enlightenment (Hunt 1996; Darnton 1995). Quite a few of the pornographic novels of that time even carried the term “philosophy” in the title (think of Sade’s La Philosophie dans le Boudoir, 1795) and some of them were actually written by prominent philosophers who were keen to use this extremely popular genre to divulge some of their ideas to the masses (think of Diderot’s Les Bijoux Indiscrets, 1748).

In one of the most notorious examples of the genre, Thérèse Philosophe (1748), written by the philosopher Jean-Baptiste de Boyer, Marquis d’Argens, a great variety of copulations is used to communicate what is in essence a materialist and mechanistic metaphysics. In anonymous bedrooms, bodies brought together by individual need and interest collide just like the atoms of the natural philosophers (Jacob 1996: 160). And the bodies themselves are described as machines powered by the relentless motion inherent in matter, by passions they cannot control:

The arrangement of our organs, the disposition of our fibers, a certain movement of our fluids, all determine the type of passions which work upon us, directing our reason and our will in the smallest as well as the greatest actions we perform. (Thérèse Philosophe, excerpted in Darnton 1995: 100)

Or, as the main character herself observes:

Men and women couple like machines. Love for them is a tingling in the epidermis, a surge of liquids, a rush of particles through the fibers, and nothing more. (Thérèse Philosophe, excerpted in Leemans 2002: 257)

(2) Formal and structural simplicity? Pornography of the enlightenment era also serves to tackle another misconception. It has been argued that, because the main aim of pornographers is to sexually arouse the audience, they are forced to include as many sexually explicit scenes as possible, leaving precious little room for plot development or formal intricacies (Steiner 1975). The pornographer “concocts no better than a crude excuse for a beginning; and once having begun, it goes on and on and ends nowhere” (Sontag 1994: 39). Pornography, as Adorno already noted, lacks the beginning-middle-end form characteristic of literature (Sontag 1994: 39). Yet, again, this gives us far from a waterproof criterion for distinguishing erotic literature from pornography. For instance, the structural complexity of the pornographic novel, Histoire de Dom B… Portier des Chartreux (1741), with its embedded stories and variety of narrators, has often been noted by scholars (Frappier-Mazur 1996: 211). The careful composition of Thérèse, where the author has arranged the parts to maximize the refraction, so that wherever the reader turns he seems to see throbbing sexuality, provides another counterexample (Darnton 1995).

(3) One-dimensional in its effect on the audience? It could be thought that sexual arousal is such a powerful, bodily state that it must block out all other functions, most notably our cognitive faculties. Levinson claims that this is precisely what distinguishes sexual arousal from sexual stimulation, which he thinks is not incompatible with the cognitive activity required for aesthetic appreciation (2005: 232). Other philosophers have challenged this controversial distinction (Blackburn 2006: 52; Maes 2012). Moreover, even if one were to accept the animal-like nature of sexual arousal, that does not mean that it cannot be cognitively rewarding and artistically appropriate. As one commentator of Cleland’s Fanny Hill notes:

The stimulus of reading a scene in Fanny Hill makes in the reader’s own nature the point made in the text. The reader may be moved to reconsider the merits of stoicism, revaluate the powers of the mind to control the body, reread his Descartes and think again of the dividing line between mind and the bête-machine. (Braudy 1991: 85)

(4) Simple to interpret? While questions of interpretation arise frequently in relation to works of erotic art, people rarely seem to have interpretive qualms where pornography is concerned. Indeed, if an interpretation typically attempts to account for those elements in a work whose presence is not immediately obvious to the target audience (Carroll 2009), there may seem no need for an interpretation in the case of pornography since it is all too obvious why such films or novels include one sexually explicit scene after another. Still, here too it is important not to jump to conclusions. There are (at least) two different kinds of interpretative projects one could engage in, each with its own set of lead questions. “What is the work about?” is one question one could ask. Another question is “What does the work reveal about the author or the time, place, culture, society in which it was made?” While the former is central to the discipline of art criticism, the latter question will usually be the starting point of interpretations offered by cultural historians, sociologists, psychoanalysts. These latter interpretations, where pornography is concerned, will be everything but simple given the incredible complexity of the pornographic landscape with its huge catalogue of taboos, body types, sex acts, and other things that get people’s blood flowing. Pornography offers us, in the words of Laura Kipnis, “the royal road to the cultural psyche” (2006: 118) and as such can prove to be a gold mine for interpretations. The other question—What is the work about?—seems less pertinent, especially in relation to the formulaic and repetitive video clips one finds on porn websites. Nevertheless, there are other types of pornography where issues about meaning and “aboutness” do seem highly relevant, such as the philosophical pornography mentioned above and the feminist pornography that will be discussed in the next section.

In closing, it is worth mentioning a thesis recently put forward by Eaton (2018), based on art historical considerations regarding the function of erotic images in 16th-century Italy. Eaton argues that the root of the erotic art/pornography distinction was—at least in that particular context—class. The need for a special category of unsanctioned illicit images arose at the very time when print culture was beginning to threaten elite privilege. What made an erotic representation exceed the boundaries of acceptability, Eaton suggests, was not its extreme libidinosity but, rather, its widespread availability and, thereby, its threat to one of the mechanisms of sustaining class privilege.

4.2 Erotic Art, Feminist Theory, and Objectification

In a short but oft-quoted essay, Gloria Steinem describes what is for her “a clear and present difference”:

Look at any photo or film of people making love, really making love. … there is usually sensuality and touch and warmth, an acceptance of bodies and nerve endings. … Now look at any depiction of sex in which there is clear force, or an unequal power that spells coercion. … The first is erotic: a mutually pleasurable, sexual expression between people who have enough power to be there by positive choice. … The second is pornographic: its message is violence, dominance, and conquest. (Steinem 1995: 31)

This idea that there is an important moral difference between erotic art and pornography, in so far as pornography focuses on sex that is aggressive, emotionless, or alienated, while the focus of erotic art is on love, passion, and equality between partners, has been very influential (see, for example, Ellis 2006: 30; Mahon 2005: 15; Ridington 1989: 27). However, delineating the distinctiveness of erotic art, as opposed to pornography, in terms of a particular content will not in and of itself establish that the latter is immoral, while the former is not. As Theodore Gracyk (1987) has argued, the morally objectionable character of a representation can never be just a matter of represented subject matter. For an artist can decide to depict rape or other aggressive forms of abuse in an attempt to precisely warn and protest against such degradation of women or men (recall the work of Kiki Smith). That is why Helen Longino is careful to define pornography as

verbal or pictorial material which represents or describes sexual behavior that is degrading or abusive to one or more of the participants in such a way as to endorse the degradation. (1980: 43, our emphasis)

Longino is only one of the many authors who have tried to capture what is morally problematic about pornography. But the intricacies of that debate will not concern us here. Our focus is on erotic art, rather than pornography. Still, it is worth considering some of the more basic arguments, because they can be, and have been, put to use in discussions on the distinction between erotic art and pornography.

Perhaps the most straightforward way to argue that pornography is morally objectionable (in a way that erotic art is not) is to argue that it is harmful. The harm that pornography does may occur in the production phase, and take the form of coercion, brutality, violence, or rape. But even if no harm takes place in the making of pornography, and models are treated fairly and with respect, there can still be post-production harms. Some have argued that the pornographic materials themselves constitute harm because, as a form of hate speech, they silence and subordinate women (MacKinnon 1987; Langton 1993, 2009; Maitra 2009). Others have emphasized that exposure to pornographic material may cause harm (Eaton 2007). The latter claim is further refined by specifying the frequency of exposure (isolated/cumulative), the nature of the material (egalitarian/inegalitarian), the kind of harm inflicted (physical/psychological), and whom it is mainly inflicted on (consumer/third party). By systematically eroticizing aspects of gender inequality, inegalitarian pornography is mainly thought to cause harm to a third party, in particular women, through the pernicious effect it has on its consumers (Eaton 2007).

“Exploitation” and “objectification” are terms that are used particularly often to describe what is wrong with pornography. Martha Nussbaum (1995), for instance, has written a seminal essay on different forms of objectification and how they apply to pornography (see also Stock 2015). Artists like Nancy Spero have defined pornography as “stuff that exploits women’s bodies” (quoted in Cembalest 1989: 142). It might be thought, and indeed Spero and others have argued, that these ethical terms may serve to demarcate (erotic) art from pornography—pornography being exploitative or objectifying in a way that (erotic) art is not.

This way of drawing the line is significantly problematized by the emergence of feminist pornography. Examples are films like Skin.Like.Sun (2010, dir. Jennifer Lyon Bell and Murielle Scherre) and When We Are Together, We Can Be Everywhere (2015, dir. Marit Östberg), Molly Kiely’s graphic novel That Kind of Girl (1999), or Dirty Diaries, a collection of Swedish movie shorts (2009). Mutual pleasure and consent are absolutely key in these pornographic works which seem to exhibit none of the moral flaws manifest in mainstream pornography (no exploitation, objectification, or eroticization of gender inequality). What is more, in rejecting sexual repression, self-oppression, and hypocrisy, these works are often said to have a positive, consciousness-raising force (Willis 1995; Taormino et al. 2013; Maes 2017; 2020; Eaton 2017).

But even if one were to disregard this rapidly growing subgenre of pornography, and argue that there is something deeply wrong with any type of pornography, that in itself would still not justify a strict divide between erotic art and pornography. For every plausible account of the relation between moral and artistic value—whether it is autonomism, ethicism, immoralism, or contextualism—will acknowledge that works of art, including works of erotic art, can be deeply morally flawed (Gaut 2007; see also Eaton 2003 for an in depth analysis of Titian’s Rape of Europa, 1562). What is more, it appears that whatever (moral) objection one wants to bring forward against mainstream pornography, it is likely to apply to some erotic art as well (Patridge 2013). First, harm may be inflicted when erotic art is being produced (Brown 2002 tells the harrowing story of Cellini and the Nymph of Fontainebleau). Second, some erotic art may also constitute harm. At least, Langton and MacKinnon’s arguments seem to carry over seamlessly to (certain strands of) erotic art. One of the difficult questions for Langton and MacKinnon—do pornographers possess the appropriate authority to perform the speech acts of silencing and subordinating women?—appears even easier to answer in the affirmative in the case of artists since their perceived authority is much less contentious. Third, some erotic art may cause harm in the same way as pornography, that is, by eroticizing aspects of gender inequality and thus shaping people’s sexual preferences in such a way that sustains the current inequality between genders (Eaton 2012). Finally, a detailed case is made by, respectively, Cooke 2012 and Eaton 2012 that neither exploitation nor objectification is unique to pornography and that both are present in many works of erotic art—a presence that is frequently unacknowledged precisely because critics tend to focus exclusively on pornography and too often consider art to be above (moral) criticism.

To conclude, it does not seem possible to make a clear-cut distinction between erotic art and pornography based on moral or feminist grounds. Critiques of pornography have focused on features that are shared by a much wider class of cultural products and by (some) works of erotic art in particular. This is not necessarily bad news for feminists. On the contrary, feminists could embrace this conclusion as it implies that their critiques are wider ranging than they at first appear to be (see Kania 2012; Mikkola (ed.) 2017; Mikkola 2019).

5. Further questions

Many more philosophical questions remain to be examined in relation to erotic art. The following will likely play an important role in future research on this topic. First, what exactly does it mean for a representation to be voyeuristic and what, if anything, is the difference between voyeurism in artistic and non-artistic representations? The question was already raised in John Berger’s classic Ways of Seeing (1972) and has since then been addressed in Schellekens 2012 and Eaton 2012. The latter also offers a philosophical re-interpretation of the influential but strongly psychoanalytically informed concept of the “male gaze” (Mulvey 1989). To say that a work embodies the male gaze, Eaton submits, is simply to say that it prescribes that its audience perceives the woman represented as primarily a sex object. As such, the tradition of the female nude in Western art promotes sexually objectifying, heteronormative erotic taste, and thereby has insidious effects on gender equality. Following on from this, Lavallee (2016) argues that Eaton’s thesis is mainly based on the experiences of white women and does not pay adequate attention to the lives of nonwhite women. This act of exclusion exposes a more general bias in discussions of female representations in art. Different kinds of bodies have been subjected to different kinds of objectifying construal. Lavallee therefore suggests that the ethics of nudity in art must be extended to take such variation into account (see also Taylor 2016, especially chapter 4).

Second, what is the role of transgression in erotic art? While feminist philosophers have rightly highlighted the moral dangers involved in the production and dissemination of sexual imagery, other philosophers and most notably Georges Bataille (1985, 1986), have argued that norm-breaking, and in particular the violation of social or moral norms about sexual behavior, is indispensable for sexual arousal and provides a basis for other affective states, such as disgust, humor, and awe, which are often in play in sexual encounters and representations. (For a demystified and less radical version of this argument, see Newall 2012. For a general discussion of the role of transgression in art, see Julius 2002).

Third, how does the degree of eroticism of a work of erotic art relate to its goodness as art, and how do the criteria for assessing erotic art differ from those appropriate to assessing art of other sorts? By reflecting on the appreciation and artistic status of art with a non-artistic primary intended function, such as religious, political or erotic art, Davies (2012) makes a good start in answering these questions.

Fourth, there are interesting differences between art forms that are worth investigating. For instance, philosophical discussions of erotic art have often focused on visual art or literature. But Benovsky (2021) draws attention to erotic experiences qua proprioceptive experiences and defends the claim that, under the right circumstances, such experiences can bring about proprioceptive artworks. Adil Mustafa Ahmad notes in relation to Islamic art that

practically all that is perceived as erotic (acceptable, sublime) when described in literature is seen as pornographic (off-putting and vulgar) if projected in painting and sculpture. (Ahmad 1994: 281)

In Western art, too, there appear to be different degrees of permissibility if one compares literature with the visual arts. How to explain this? How to explain, furthermore, the absence, or near-absence, of the genre of erotic art in what are sometimes called the non-representational arts? There seems to be very little erotic architecture and it is not entirely clear whether there is any absolute music that qualifies as erotic. There are erotic dances, of course, but these are rarely performed within an art context or considered as art works.

To illuminate the latter phenomenon it might be helpful to reflect on issues of fictionality and imagination—a fifth important research strand. As Cain Todd (2012) argues, the awareness of fictionality of sexual representations ensures that one’s imaginative engagement implies merely imagined “desire-like” states, whereas the voyeuristic appreciation of a stripper’s erotic dance seems to preclude this sort of engagement, and in virtue of doing so, involves real sexual desire. One might think that, characteristically, arousal-directed imagining towards a sexual representation is de se in that one uses the image as a prop to imagine committing or witnessing certain sexual acts and, indeed, Todd argues that the engagement with sexual imagery can possess certain cognitive values, insofar as it involves the self in de se imaginative projects. But notwithstanding the apparent plausibility of such claims, this is denied by Stock (2012) who argues that enjoying erotica does not always involve imagining something about oneself.

Sixth, if erotic art and pornography are not mutually exclusive, why is there not more art that qualifies as both? Van Brabandt and Prinz (2012) address this question in relation to cinema. Despite the many resemblances between art films and pornographic films—jump cuts, long takes, “Brechtian” acting, a cinema vérité-like grittiness, arousal of strong emotions, an exploration of the extremes of human experience and of the margins of society—they argue that market forces are mainly to be blamed for the lack of overlap between the two. Mari Mikkola (2013), by contrast, builds on recent work in the ontology of artifacts to speculate about the possibility of porno-art—a new class of objects growing out of the extant categories of pornography and art, without being reducible to either one.

Seventh, obscenity and censorship issues will continue to play a key part in research on erotic art. They crop up in philosophical discussions of the nude (Nead 1992; Hammer 1997; Danto 2000; Scruton 2009) and of art that challenges the classical ideal of beauty (O’Hear 1991, Danto 1995, Mey 2007). They are also central to stipulative distinctions between erotic art and pornography (Maes 2012). George P. Elliott, for instance, defines pornography as

the representation of directly or indirectly erotic acts with an intrusive vividness which offends decency without aesthetic justification. (1970: 74–75)

A normative definition of this kind will bring to mind certain legal descriptions of obscenity such as the U.S. Supreme Court’s notorious Miller test, set forth in Miller v. California (1973). This test proposed a three-pronged criterion for obscenity: x is obscene if (1) it is found appealing to the prurient interest by an average person applying contemporary community standards, (2) it depicts sexual conduct, specifically defined by the applicable state law, in a patently offensive way and (3) taken as a whole, it lacks serious literary, artistic, political or scientific value. The Miller test has proved problematic in many respects, one of its most evident flaws being the conflation of two ideas—the pornographic and the obscene (Nussbaum 2004). Recent philosophical attempts to define the obscene have avoided this mistake—allowing for non-pornographic obscenities and obscene erotic art (e.g., Kieran 2002).

Finally, if erotic representations and art works help to shape how we see and engage with bodies, how can they be mobilised to challenge (or perpetuate) oppression based on race, sexual orientation, age, size, and disability? Audre Lorde’s “Uses of the Erotic” (1978) has been a seminal text. But while Davidson (2016), Cahill (2016), Lintott & Irvin (2016), Mikkola (ed., 2017) and Thorneycroft (2021) offer some recent perspectives, much more work still needs to be done on this front.

In sum, it will be clear that any serious thinking about erotic art leads to fundamental questions about the nature of aesthetics, the moral impact and status of representations, and the boundaries of art. As such there can be little doubt that this topic will prove to be fruitful for further philosophical investigation.


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Painting, Sculptures, and Photographs Referenced

Literature and Films Referenced

  • Bell, Jennifer Lyon & Murielle Scherre (directors), 2010, Skin.Like.Sun.
  • de Boyer, Jean-Baptiste, 1748, Thérèse Philosophe.
  • Cleland, John, 1748, Fanny Hill.
  • Diderot, 1748, Les Bijoux Indiscrets.
  • Kiely, Molly, 1999, That Kind of Girl, Seattle: Eros Comix.
  • de Latouche, Jean-Charles Gervaise, 1741, Histoire de Dom B… Portier des Chartreux.
  • McEwan, Ian, 2007, On Chesil Beach, London: Jonathan Cape.
  • Östberg, Marit, 2015, When We Are Together, We Can Be Everywhere.
  • Sade, 1795, La Philosophie dans le Boudoir.
  • Engberg, Mia (producer), 2009, Dirty Diaries, a collection of Swedish movie shorts.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with further suggestions.]


The author would like to acknowledge the helpful suggestions and comments offered in the preparation this article by Anne Eaton, Inger Leemans, Wijnand Mijnhardt, Annelies Monseré, Michael Newall, Katrien Schaubroeck. He also thanks the publisher Palgrave Macmillan for permission to re-use a few paragraphs from his introduction to the book Pornographic Art and the Aesthetics of Pornography (2013).

Copyright © 2023 by
Hans Maes <>

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